Sakya Paṇḍita [sa skya paṇ ḍi ta]

First published Fri Dec 1, 2017

Sakya Paṇḍita (Sa-skya Paṇḍita Kun-dga’ Rgyal-mtshan, 1182–1251, abbreviated Sapaṇ) is one of Tibet’s greatest and most influential philosophers. He is the intellectual giant of the Sakya school of Tibetan Buddhism, famous among Tibetans for his learning—signified in his honorific title meaning “Paṇḍit from Sakya”. His knowledge was broad, but his expertise is most noted in the areas of epistemology (pramāṇa), which included significant contributions in the philosophy of language and the study of debate, and the study of language itself through lexicography, grammar and poetics. He is often counted as one of the “great translators” of Tibet’s later transmission period, and he is credited with initiating sustained study of Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇavārttika and Daṇḍin’s Kāvyādarśa, texts with tremendous intellectual historical importance in Tibet. This entry will provide a summary of his life and works, and then focus on a few key points and arguments in his major philosophical works.

1. Life and Works

Sapaṇ[1] was the fourth of the “Five Great Throneholders” of Sakya (Tib. sa-skya), the monastery that was the seat of the noble Khön clan and the institutional hub for one of the main schools of Tibetan Buddhism. The first of the five was Sapaṇ’s grandfather, Sachen Kunga Nyingpo, and the second and third were his uncles Sonam Tsemo and Drakpa Gyeltsen. His uncles were both celibate monks, so the royal line fell naturally to him, the eldest nephew. Sapaṇ’s biographies contain hagiographical fancy that assimilates his early life to that of the Buddha or other great intellects: His mother dreamed of a crowned Nāga king coming to her when Sapaṇ entered her womb; as an infant he spoke and wrote Sanskrit; as a child he was gentle and compassionate, knew many topics without having studied them, and imbibed the dharma without effort. As he grew (and we enter more realistic history), he received teachings from many great masters both within his family and abroad, and he continued to distinguish himself for his preternaturally quick mastery, sharp discernment, and elegant instruction. In dreams, he had visions confirming his abilities at understanding the works of Vasubandhu and Dignāga.

A major turning point in his life came when the Kashmiri scholar Śākyaśrībhadra arrived in Tibet with an entourage of paṇḍitas from India and Nepal. Sapaṇ went to meet him and established a crucial relationship with these scholars. He was able to hire one of the paṇḍitas, Sugataśrī, as a personal tutor for three years, and then return to study with Śākyaśrī for another five years. It was with these scholars that Sapaṇ came to master the linguistic sciences—Sanskrit grammar, poetics, and metrics—but also, and especially, epistemology (tshad ma). Sapaṇ was said to have had various doubts and questions about the understanding of Dharmakīrti’s philosophy that he had received from his early teachers, which were resolved by his studies under Śākyaśrī. He learned to translate under the tutelage of Sugataśrī, and then together with Śākyaśrī retranslated Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇavārttika into Tibetan.

Before Sapaṇ, Sakya was a renowned center for the study of the Lamdre system of the Hevajra Tantra, rooted in the masterful works and reputation of Sachen Kunga Nyingpo. Sapaṇ established Sakya anew as a leader in the study of epistemology. Sapaṇ engaged in many public, spirited debates with members of rival Tibetan schools and, famously, with visiting Brahmanical paṇḍitas (including one *Harinanda), whom he is said to have defeated (see Hugon 2012 on this event). His personal reputation, and the tantric reputation of Sakya, were surely important factors behind the Mongol prince Köden inviting him to negotiate terms for the Tibetan surrender in 1244. It is not entirely clear just what the terms turned out to be, and Sapaṇ died in the Mongol capital. But just a few years later, Sapaṇ’s nephew Phakpa, whom he had brought with him, was named supreme administrator of a united Tibet under Mongol rule—a position that stayed with the Sakya for a century (Wylie 1977 [2003] and Petech 1990).

Sapaṇ composed many short works, but he is best known for five major works:

  1. Treasury of Aphoristic Jewels (Legs par bshad pa rin po che’i gter; Bosson 1969);
  2. Treasury of Epistemological Reasoning (Tshad ma rigs pa’i gter; Fukuda et al. 1989–1994 and Hugon 2008);
  3. Clear Differentiation of the Three Codes (Sdom gsum rab dbye; Rhoton 2002);
  4. Clarifying the Sage’s Intent (Thub pa’i dgongs pa rab tu gsal; D. Jackson 2015); and
  5. Gateway to Learning (Mkhas pa rnams ’jug pa’i sgo; D. Jackson 1987 and Gold 2007).

The first is a popular collection of pithy sayings and moral instructions (Kolmaš 1978); the others are treated further below. Although it is difficult to summarize his worldview, it is hoped that this survey reveals a philosopher of remarkable consistency, vision and depth.

2. Epistemology and Philosophy of Language: The Treasury of Reasoning

2.1 Introduction to the Work

Sapaṇ’s Treasury of Epistemological Reasoning[2] is one of Tibet’s best known and most consequential philosophical achievements, roundly extolled as a work of genius and validation of Sapaṇ’s reputation as an emanation of Mañjuśrī, the bodhisattva of wisdom. It is an unrivaled touchstone for Tibetan approaches to concept formation, philosophy of language, cognition and perception. Still, the work has an ambiguous legacy. Like the Three Vows, it was mired in controversy from its debut—controversy around a number of its stridently combative positions, but especially, and without end, controversy around its meaning. What’s more, at least some of its advocates were false friends, appropriating the glow of Sapaṇ’s legacy while making only selective use of the work’s masterful exposition of Dharmakīrti and, especially, turning a blind eye to crucial particulars that might call into question their own cherished doctrines.[3] Recent scholarship has begun to reveal the work’s own goals and place it within its intellectual contexts, but the project is complex and ongoing. This section is, of necessity, only a sketch.

The Treasury is staunchly anti-realist about both cognitive and linguistic objects. Nominalism and pragmatism are hardly outside the range of expectation for a Buddhist. Yet Tibetans both before and after Sapaṇ (esp. Chapa before, Tsongkhapa after) have tended to hew to a more intuitive and “moderate” realism—to use Georges Dreyfus’ terminology (1997). Sapaṇ defends a position that is more spare and more severe than most Tibetan epistemologists, and, according to modern scholarship, closer to Dharmakīrti.[4] Buddhist traditions are widely known for their insistence that ordinary beings are uniformly deluded and reality seen correctly by a Buddha is entirely beyond their (our) ken, so the counter-intuitive nature of anti-realism is not at all discomforting to the Indic Buddhist mainstream. Sapaṇ certainly considered his own views more accurate and more authentically Indian than those of his Tibetan adversaries. This self-understanding was, no doubt, buttressed by the fact that he had studied Sanskrit and Indian linguistic sciences with the followers of the Kashmiri scholar Śākyaśrībhadra and that with Śākyaśrī he had retranslated, and thereby rejuvenated the study of, Dharmakīrti’s Pramāṇavārttika. Association with great Indian paṇḍitas gave Sapaṇ the confidence to distinguish his own conservative stance from ideas he disparagingly called “Tibetan” innovations.

Sapaṇ’s main adversaries in his Treasury were adherents of the tradition of Ngok (rngog lugs) centered in Sangpu (gsang-phu) monastery, whose most prominent advocates were Ngog Lotsawa himself and his disciple Chapa Chokyi Senge. As Chapa’s epistemology gained ascendancy, study of the Pramāṇavārttika was apparently eclipsed by that of other writings of Dharmakīrti’s (primarily the Pramāṇaviniṣcaya), and this perhaps had the effect of these thinkers losing sight of the key Buddhist philosophical ingredient for a strong anti-realist view: concept formation via exclusion (anyāpoha).[5] Whatever the cause, the significance of this piece of Buddhist epistemology seems to have been missed or downplayed by Chapa and his followers.[6] Sapaṇ’s Pramāṇavārttika renaissance helped to bring the doctrine of apoha back into the center of Buddhist epistemology and thereby resisted the rising tide of moderate realism. The great Tsongkhapa (1357–1419), more than a century later, rejuvenated moderate realism in Tibet through a new synthesis of epistemology with Madhyamaka.

2.2 Concept Formation in the Treasury

Sapaṇ’s strict nominalism rejects the reality of cognitive and linguistic objects, which makes him an “illusionist” about the mind. Where Daniel Dennett (1991) criticizes the “Cartesian theater” model of the mind, in which images play across a mental screen, Buddhist philosophers criticize the “duality” that constitutes the subject/object binary. The notion of a cognitive object, for this tradition, is intertwined with the false reification of the self, a cardinal Buddhist error. There could only be mental objects if there were mental subjects; viewing subjects and mental objects are attributable, together, to the tendency of ordinary beings mistakenly to project a “self”. Moreover, the utility of concepts for language and thought would require that they be unchanging against the backdrop of the Buddhist view that all things are impermanent; if, as Sapaṇ argues, they were impermanent, they would be mind-dependent, and hence private objects (see Stolz 2006). What needs to be explained, therefore, is not the reality of concepts, but the causes that bring about their seeming to appear and function.

Mahāyāna Buddhists believe that this fundamental error is rooted in beginningless karmic tendencies. Our minds have been conditioned by our previous actions, and we experience the world through their capacities and strictures. Our karmic conditioning provides the conceptual nexus through which we think and communicate with other beings who have similar karma and therefore similar conceptual tendencies. This karmic basis of conceptualization and language, which finds them both to be pragmatically beneficial while fundamentally erroneous, is the lynchpin of Sapaṇ’s philosophical position in the Treasury. Against his contemporaries, who rely upon concepts and linguistic objects being quasi-real entities in order to account for cognition and language, Sapaṇ explains the utility of concepts, and the linguistic entities to which they are tied, with reference to the same process that makes them erroneous: the never-ending causal flow of karma. Like floating hairs that appear due to ophthalmic disease, cognitive objects are nothing but a failure in the system, and have no independent reality.

Sapaṇ is perhaps uniquely attuned to how decisively it is karma that underwrites the doctrine of apoha, the Buddhist approach to concept formation in the light of emptiness. Not even Dharmakīrti, whose epistemology courted Buddhists of the Śrāvakayāna, was willing to be as vividly pragmatist. Be that as it may, Sapaṇ makes constant reference to Dharmakīrti and is reasonably seen to have provided a faithful extension of his views. Above all, Sapaṇ maintains without exception the key ontological distinction in Buddhist epistemology between real, causally effective momentary particulars that are the potential objects of perception, and false conceptual constructions that are the seeming objects of cognition. Where all of reality is divided into these categories, we can see even by the definitions that concepts and abstract objects must be unreal. Chapa and his followers spoke of intermediate categories of various kinds—cognitive and perceptual objects that are not simply momentary bare particulars—and Sapaṇ and his followers targeted them as insufficient to a Buddhist view.

The motivation for these intermediate positions is not difficult to see. With such a strict division between momentary perceptual particulars and erroneous linguistic concepts, it is difficult to explain how we could ever arrive at anything like knowledge. This is where Dignāga’s doctrine of apoha is supposed to help. Although there are no real concepts and no linguistic universals, there are apparent universals that we mistakenly—but pragmatically—superimpose on real things. We create concepts not by identifying some real quality or similarity that is shared across distinct entities, but by ignoring most of their differences and “excluding” non-members of a set from a conceptual field, outside a pragmatically beneficial boundary. A key question that arises to challenge this possibility is, How can a fallacious boundary be pragmatically beneficial? Why, for instance, is a concept or a word recognized and shared by various people, if there is no real similarity among the objects to which it refers? The answer, which as I’ve said Sapaṇ gives more explicitly than any other thinker, is karma. The mistake of superimposing what is falsely taken to be a real general concept on an actually real particular which it is taken to represent works for beings that tend to see things the same way:

With propensities beginninglessly habituated, and having generated the power for an error to appear, on the occasion of the sign, without distinguishing the concepts and the particulars, one imputes the sign, “This is a pot”. Later, if one says, “Pour the water in the pot”, without asking, “Pour the water in the individual pot, or pour it into the concept pot?” one understands the object of engagement to be the very thing itself.[7]

Karma also provides the answer to the question of how an unreal concept can be stable in a changing mind, and across references to distinct, changing entities. The answer is that concepts are no more stable than the “self” is a real, stable entity. Still, due to karma, we have certain tendencies to experience the world in similarly-patterned modes. Through Buddhist practice, it is possible to overcome these; through Buddhist epistemology, it is possible to understand their erroneous yet beneficial applications. This expresses a version of the Buddhist karmic causal theory of meaning that has been noted in Yogācāra thought (see Gold 2006 and Tzohar 2017a, 2017b).

3. Defending the Dharma: A Clear Differentiation of the Three Vows

3.1 Introducing the Work

The Three Vows[8] is a polemical treatise, and it is Sapaṇ’s most controversial work. It is an assemblage of distinct doctrinal arguments directed against Sapaṇ’s Tibetan contemporaries, organized under the rubric of three sets of vows. The categories of vows refer to the three main categories of Buddhist theory and practice: (1) Disciples’ (śrāvaka) monastic vows, (2) Great Vehicle (mahāyāna) or bodhisattva vows, and (3) Mantra/Tantra vows. Before it ever reached Tibet, Buddhism in India had developed through these three forms, each with its own more-or-less distinct philosophical and ritual framework. Even as later systems became preeminent, however, earlier stages of Buddhist practice were kept, integrated into lower rungs in a complex system.[9] Yet although Buddhist intellectuals in India and Tibet took on this systematizing theoretical work, there was never a single institution capable of preventing innovation and experimentation in ritual and doctrine, and over the centuries numerous practices crossed the lines ideally set (often after the fact) between the categories. Consequently, there were evident divergences between idealized systems and their practiced realities, and many conservative institutional leaders in Tibet during the later diffusion period (spyi dar) sought to reign in all errors, but especially those that upset the structured hierarchies of tantric Buddhism.

In the Three Vows, then, Sapaṇ’s central concern was to correct errors in his contemporaries’ theories and practices, so as to preserve the integrity and the effectiveness of the teachings. As mentioned above, Sapaṇ’s linguistic training made him confident that he had a better understanding of authentic, Indian sources than most of his contemporaries. He therefore adopts a critical stance against what he considers Tibetan innovations, but his concerns are not merely clerical, and he is not simply nostalgic or obedient to tradition. Nor, if we take him at his word, is he simply writing for political gain. On the contrary, he provides a vociferous defense of the use of scripture and reasoning to protect Buddhist doctrine, and he emphasizes the unfairness of those who would claim his critiques are motivated by hostility or jealousy (III.625ff.; Rhoton 2002: 178–181). Rather, as he explains near the end of the work, careful and informed analysis is crucial because even practices that closely resemble authentic ones can undermine the teachings, if they fail to properly follow key points (III.432; Rhoton 2002: 152). In this context, he concisely summarizes the “essentials” he considers sacrosanct for each of the three traditions: For the tradition of the Disciples, they are the monastic vows and the four truths; for the Great Vehicle, the thought of enlightenment and the discipline of the perfections; and for the Mantra tradition, the initiation and the two processes of generation and completion. If you get these wrong, practice becomes essentially non-Buddhist and most importantly, ineffective. He sees his critiques as, above all, practical soteriology.

Under this umbrella, Sapaṇ lists ten fallacious doctrines, which he considers a particular threat to the essential teachings in his day:

  1. Disciples’ vows are taken to last until enlightenment;
  2. Mind-only rites for bodhisattvas are given to all;
  3. It is taught that bodhicitta (the bodhisattva’s altruistic mindset) should not be cultivated in meditation through the exchange of self and other;
  4. Initiations are deemed unnecessary for Mantra practice and are substituted with the Vajra Sow blessing;
  5. People have faith in teachers who have not cultivated the two (tantric) processes;
  6. People are instructed not to visualize the guru on top of one’s head;
  7. The Realm of Reality (dharmadhātu) is made into an object of dedication, called “existent virtue”;
  8. Instead of means and emptiness, a state of bare non-elaboration is taught, called “the White Self-sufficient Remedy”;
  9. “Dreamed” bodhicitta;
  10. Abrupt visualization of tutelary deities.[10]

These ten errors are by no means the limit of the topics covered in the Three Vows, but they represent the kinds of issues that motivate the work, and they stand at the center of Sapaṇ’s doctrinal disputes with his adversaries. Many of these are reiterated throughout his works—also appearing, for instance, as topics of discussion in the Sage’s Intent or the Gateway to Learning. Here is not the place to examine each of these, which would take us into some rather arcane particulars. Still, although many of these points enact scholastic in-fighting and might seem on the surface to be doctrinal angel-counting, Sapaṇ’s arguments generally present them as examples of larger concerns. The interesting interpretive question for each, then, is how getting a given idea wrong disrupts the essentials of the teachings, and what this tells us about Sapaṇ’s approach to the doctrine and the controversies of his time. Here I will focus on two critiques (1 & 7) and mention a third (4). I will discuss Sapaṇ’s view of (8) in the section on the Sage’s Intent. These are interesting in themselves, and should be sufficient to introduce Sapaṇ’s argumentative style and his philosophical approach in this work. I have taken extra space for this section of the entry to present (7), which is one of Sapaṇ’s most important arguments, and to discuss the work’s important, repeating defense of moral contextualism.

3.2 Distinguishing Great Vehicle from Disciples’ Vows

One point with which Sapaṇ opens the Three Vows provides an elegant paradigm for what he means by the title’s “Clear Differentiation” of the three vows, or codes.[11] It is a case where Tibetans of his day have “mixed” the Disciples’ vows with the Great Vehicle’s bodhisattva vows. Now, it is clear that Tibetans undertaking monastic vows had commonly paired the oral recitation that constitutes the adoption of monastic vows with a mental component, the generation of a Great Vehicle intention called bodhicitta—the altruistic desire to achieve Buddhahood in order to save all beings from suffering.[12] Sapaṇ voices no complaint about this pairing of mental and physical actions, but he rejects a mistaken conclusion about the duration of the vows that some of his contemporaries apparently derived from it.

Sapaṇ argues that Disciples’ vows (i.e., monastic vows) last until death (when one’s body dies), whereas the bodhisattva vows last beyond death, through subsequent rebirths—as long as one’s mind persists. A counter-argument proposes that, if the altruistic intention is in place when they are recited, the Disciples’ vows should also continue for as long as one’s mind persists.[13] In reply, Sapaṇ says that this contradicts authoritative texts that distinguish between the different rites and rules for upholding the Disciples’ and Great Vehicle vows.[14] Furthermore, he says, if monastic vows lasted from life to life, then gods and babies who were reborn from the mental continua of deceased monks would still be monks. Yet not only are such beings violating the rules of monkhood all the time, they are expressly forbidden from becoming monks! Here we see a widespread mixture of practices leading to an unacceptable doctrinal confusion.

This may seem like a clever analysis without significant practical ramifications. After all, I have no way of knowing whether I took a vow in a previous lifetime, and I cannot inform my future rebirth about whether I have taken a vow in this life. But notice that the vows systems are distinguished by indicating the specific causes and results on the path to liberation. Sapaṇ’s basic point is that Disciples’ vows and Great Vehicle vows operate differently. The practical benefit from such a “differentiation”, then, is the ability to articulate the different paths to liberation clearly and accurately.

This general concern with the operation of the paths leads, in the next section, to a broader definition of karma—action-and-result—and its associated terminology. Sapaṇ begins with the crucial distinction between actions, which are produced and bring about happiness or pain as their result, and the unconditioned, actionless, Realm of Reality or Dharmadhātu. Since wholesomeness is a quality of an action that is determined by the happiness or pain that the action causes, he says, the causeless Dharmadhātu is neither wholesome nor unwholesome. This consequentialism about wholesomeness or virtue, set against a backdrop of an unchanging, literally “inconsequential” ultimate reality, launches the most extensive, detailed argument of the work: the argument against the ultimate reality of virtue.

3.3 Against the Ultimate Reality of Virtue

Like other arguments in the Three Vows, Sapaṇ’s disproof of the ultimate reality of virtue is a targeted critique of his Tibetan contemporaries.[15] In this case, the discussion revolves around a verse from the Vajradhvaja Sūtra, in which there is a dedication of all beings’ virtue in the three times (the quote is something like, “as much as exists in the past, present and future”). Ordinarily, in the Great Vehicle, one altruistically dedicates one’s virtue (or merit)—what we today euphemistically call one’s “good karma”—to all beings, in the hope that one’s own benefits will ripen in them. In this oft-cited scriptural passage, the speaker imaginatively maximizes this intention, and dedicates all the good karma in the universe, for all time, toward this altruistic purpose. Some, Sapaṇ says, mistakenly consider this mass of virtue to be a thing, self-established and eternal, and they say that it is equivalent to the “Sugata-matrix”, the unelaborated ultimate reality. What Sapaṇ believes, on the other hand, is that this idea that it is possible to dedicate ultimate reality—and that, since one only dedicates wholesome karma, the Dharmadhātu is a kind of “existent virtue”—is an error that threatens an essential dharma teaching.

On the surface, then, the argument is a tussle over how to read a passage from scripture and its apparent, maximal dedication of merit. Since the scripture contains the words to recite that enact the bodhisattva vow, it is important from a ritual perspective that one understand the intention behind it. After all, as he argues, the mental intention is the true agent for the engagement of a vow. This in itself would be enough to make the issue soteriologically significant. But what merits extensive treatment is that the idea of “existent virtue” violates a consistent norm in Sapaṇ’s writings, which is the strict separation between conventional and ultimate reality. We have seen this emphasis in his approaches to epistemology and will see it in the doctrine of emptiness as well, but here we see the practical, ritual-cum-ethical application of this stance.

Sapaṇ begins the argument by quoting a wide range of authoritative sources to show that the “Sugata-matrix” is unchanging, that it is equivalent to the Dharmadhātu and the Tathāgata-nature, and that these are all completely devoid of evil and virtue, which are illusory constructions.[16] Near the end of the passage Sapaṇ recommends that the reader study, in particular, the Dharmodgata chapter of the Perfection of Wisdom in 8,000 Lines (I.137; Rhoton 2002: 58). That chapter teaches that suchness, Tathāgata and emptiness are all the same, which is to say they are immobile and unproduced, unrelated to all numbers (including one), unrelated to all concepts whatsoever, and yet greater than—infinitely beyond—anything conceivable. If the Dharmadhātu thus described does not change, it cannot go from being undedicated to dedicated; which means that you cannot dedicate it. Sapaṇ writes that the Vajradhvaja Sūtra’s expressions “as much as” and “exists” (from “as much as exists in the past, present and future”) could not possibly refer to the Dharmadhātu: “As much as” appeals to the rejected idea of number, and, as he cites many sources to show, it is false to say of the ultimate that it either “exists” or “does not exist”. Based on scripture alone, then, this passage could not imply the dedication of the Dharmadhātu. The passage is just saying that we dedicate the actions (the karma) of all beings—just, whatever virtuous actions beings perform. This keeps the dedication ritual firmly in the realm of conventional, changing, illusory, reality.

Sapaṇ cites the possibility that the basis for the idea of “existent virtue” is the Abhidharmasamuccaya of Asaṅga, which does call the Dharmadhātu “virtue”, distinguishing it from the evils of cyclic existence, and using terms such as “natural virtue” and “absolute virtue”. Sapaṇ considers this passage merely figurative. It is like calling people whose hunger is sated, “desireless”—when of course they still have other desires. To call the Dharmadhātu “virtue” is only to refer to the absence of evil—to emptiness itself. But the Dharmadhātu is not itself the cause of well-being, which is how virtue was defined. If the Dharmadhātu caused well-being, all actions would be virtuous, since all things are contained within it. Sapaṇ gives a similarly figurative reading to the Uttaratantra’s discussion of an innately existent Buddhahood; it cannot mean this literally, he says, since otherwise it would be affirming a non-Buddhist belief in an eternal soul.

Ultimate reality’s numberless freedom from conceptual elaborations is, needless to say, a difficult idea to fathom. After all, we could only fathom it by means of concepts. But the notion allows Sapaṇ to reject a number of intermediate proposals, such as the notion that perhaps the dedicatable Sugata-matrix refers only to the animate portion of the Dharmadhātu. As he replies, there are no distinctions and hence no “portions” in the Dharmadhātu! That’s what it means to say that it is free of elaborations.

3.4 Considering Wider Ethical Applications

These considerations bring Sapaṇ to some profound analyses that subtly divide the conceivable, causal reality from the inconceivable, and push the reader to contemplate his deeper message. One of these is stimulated by an opponent’s proposal that even though technically you cannot dedicate the Dharmadhātu, perhaps there is no harm in saying that you dedicate it. This may seem like an elegant appeal to the conventionality of conventional reality, and the general Buddhist emphasis on the intention or the aspiration as the source and cause of virtue. Yet it is just here that Sapaṇ shows his exacting requirement that there be no “mixing” of the Great Vehicle and Disciple’s paths: “That dedication is harmful. Because it involves the perception of an object, it will become a poisonous dedication” (I.111; Rhoton 2002: 55). The point is that bodhisattvas have a different understanding of the dedicatory ritual than Disciples, rooted in the bodhisattva’s understanding that there is no real object that can be dedicated. The compassion that motivates the bodhisattva’s dedication of merit is a universal, ultimate compassion whose nature is inseparable from emptiness. To imagine that the Dharmadhātu as an object is a (non-empty) and hence “dedicatable” thing is to turn a Great Vehicle concept into an ordinary conceptual construction, and thereby poison the altruistic intention.[17]

Perhaps the most important “practical” ethical result of this discussion appears in Sapaṇ’s clear advocacy of moral contextualism. Different systems of vows require different behaviors—and yet within each system, these behaviors are morally significant and genuinely beneficial or harmful. The fact that there are some eighteen different systems of monastic vows, which differ among themselves about countless particulars, does not undermine the validity of each system on its own terms, and does not allow for impromptu mixing and matching. A resonant example Sapaṇ cites is that whereas some systems consider the killing of an unborn fetus an instance of the taking of a human life, other systems do not. But the taking of a human life is one of the principal downfalls (pārājika), an irredeemable infraction of the monastic vows that causes immediate expulsion. And presumably, if you have violated your vows in this way, you cannot simply move to another monastery where killing a fetus is not considered having taken a human life. But more importantly, Sapaṇ explains that the vows, though they differ one from the other, are all approved by the Buddha as sets that serve the function of monastic vows, which is to prevent the vow-holder’s mind from straying into infractions—like a fence around a field. Vows have morally consequential effects upon the mind, and they consist in coherent, Buddha-approved systems.

The final argument from the Three Vows I will mention is in the chapter on Mantra vows, but is clearly connected with the topics already discussed here. One of the issues most important to Sapaṇ—he lists it twice in the final summary lists of essential topics mentioned above, and he also treats it in the Sage’s Intent—is the misuse of Vajravārāhī (Vajra Sow) blessings as a substitute for Mantric initiation. This, he says, is not taught in any of the scriptures. You need a real initiation ritual to practice Mantra—it’s as simple as that! You cannot substitute a blessing for an initiation. He calls the alterations in the dharma “the blessings of demons”—claiming not that his contemporaries are demons, but that they have been deceived.

What irks Sapaṇ the most, it would seem, is what he sees as an attempt to excuse carelessness by appealing to the fact that rituals are only conventional constructions. He concludes the point by saying that all rites belong to conventional reality: Disciples, Great Vehicle, and Mantra rites. If you accept any of the systems, you must accept them in their entirety; you must do all, or none. There is no option to make a distinction between essential and non-essential doctrines based on the distinction between conventional and ultimate. The ultimate simply does not enter into the consideration of whether a rite or ritual—or, for that matter, any karma, any act—is appropriate.[18] The separate systems have each been handed down through valid lineages with their own integrity, valued and delimited always by their conventional utility. The fact that they are not ultimate is not an excuse to experiment or play fast and loose with the rituals and their interpretation. Everything that we can do, everything that we can say, is only conventional; but that fact does not license the blurring of the lines between the effective, well delineated paths taught by the Buddha that can lead us to liberation if we follow them with care.

4. Preserving the True Path: Clarifying the Sage’s Intent

Clarifying the Sage’s Intent (D. Jackson 2015) is a path text, of the genre called Tenrim (bstan rim), “stages of the doctrine”, which lays out in detail the practices and accomplishments for beings on the way from ordinary person to liberated Buddha. It is an elegant and comprehensive approach to the path of the bodhisattva, drawing from Indian sources—especially the Mahāyānasūtrālaṃkāra and the Abhidharmasamuccaya of Asaṅga. Sapaṇ makes creative use of these sources in a variety of ways, and the work is a complex interplay of tradition and innovation. Yet for our purposes, the most significant aspects of the work are not in his construction of the path or his characterizations of bodhisattva practice, but in a number of philosophical excurses. Unlike the Three Vows, the Sage’s Intent is not primarily intended as a polemic text; yet occasionally Sapaṇ feels it necessary to address controversial issues relevant to topics that arise in the course of his descriptions of the bodhisattva path.

As before, it is not possible to work through all of Sapaṇ’s significant arguments, so I will limit myself to a topic that was among his most extensively debated positions, and which is an important theme in this work. The issue is the supposed “White Self-sufficient Remedy”, often translated “White Panacea”—a term used to describe the meditation practice called “Great Seal” or Mahāmudrā. Sapaṇ believes that this term for Mahāmudrā represents a mistaken understanding of the practice, which transmutes a legitimate tantric practice into a misleading and pernicious, fallacious doctrine.[19]

In order to understand why Sapaṇ finds the Self-sufficient Remedy doctrine particularly troubling, it will be useful to notice how quintessentially it brings together so much that Sapaṇ considers wrong with Tibetan Buddhism of his day. Recall that Sapaṇ’s distinctive philosophical view rests upon an unstinting categorical distinction between the conventional and ultimate realities, and we have seen that this has important consequences in his epistemology and his approach to the interpretation of Buddhist ethics and the operation of karma. He often criticizes an apparent knee-jerk decontextualization that others read out of the doctrine of emptiness. Sapaṇ reminds us, again and again, that emptiness does not mean that nothing really matters, or that everything goes. The view of emptiness does not wipe away the conventional. Ultimate reality not relativize all things to it. On the contrary, it requires that actions be deemed meaningful or not, real or not, by virtue of their effectiveness and relevance within specifiable contexts. This is Buddhist contextualism.

The target of Sapaṇ’s attack, then, is the notion that, simply by means of the direct apprehension of the nature of the mind called Mahāmudrā, one attains all of the accomplishments of the path. This one attainment alone is a cure-all, a “self-sufficient remedy”. We can see immediately that this claim for this practice challenges and undermines the importance of the many doctrinal details, practices and contexts of the Buddhist tradition, paring it down to a single visionary experience. In addition, Sapaṇ considers this view a Tibetan invention, not attested in India, that resembles a famously rejected Chinese doctrine associated with the monk Hvashang Mohoyen. The “White Self-sufficient Remedy” is, he believes, an ignorant distortion of the dharma that leads to a nihilistic decline of the teachings. Furthermore, Sapaṇ considers the practice of Mahāmudrā a tantric, not a general Mahāyāna practice, so he rejects the non-tantric form of the teaching circulating in his day. There is reason to believe that this particular “mixing” of general Great Vehicle and specific tantric practices in fact had an Indian precedent, but Sapaṇ seems to have assumed that Indian adepts would have prevented this as a mistake (see Mathes 2008).

From a historical perspective, it is important to distinguish the conceptual implications of the Self-sufficient Remedy claim from its actual use. Not all adherents of the Self-sufficient Remedy view, most likely followers of Gampopa, the founder of the Kagyu school of Tibetan Buddhism, would have taught a practice that actually dispensed with all other rituals and meditations in favor of bare Mahāmudrā practice. On the contrary, Gampopa’s famous five-stage practice includes the cultivation of Mahāmudrā as the fourth stage in a practice that also included: the generation of bodhicitta; deity visualization; guru devotion; and dedication of merit. Gampopa’s is not an instruction on abandoning all other aspects of the path. There were, apparently, differences of opinion even among the adherents of the Self-sufficient Remedy doctrine about whether this meant that Mahāmudrā on its own substituted for all other practices, or Mahāmudrā was in some way ultimately, essentially, equivalent to all other attainments, as their culmination or their peak. If the latter were the case, one might engage in many practices but from the ultimate perspective only reach attainment through Mahāmudrā. In the former case—the proper target of Sapaṇ’s critique—one should only even try to attain Mahāmudrā. Some of Sapaṇ’s contemporaries understood the Remedy as Self-sufficient even to the point of saying that the practitioner did not need to generate bodhicitta or dedicate the merit (D. Jackson 1990: 28).

In the Three Vows Sapaṇ provides a kind of abstract criticism of the logic of calling a practice “self-sufficient” when it is part of a list of five. It is perhaps in response to this point that Padma Karpo, a defender of the Kagyu, called Sapaṇ’s argument a “childish criticism”, depicting it as merely a worry about the meanings of words (D. Jackson 1990: 37). He says that if this is why it is faulty to say that Mahāmudrā is “singularly sufficient”, then it is also faulty to speak of the standard tantric practice as having the “two stages” of creation and completion—presumably, because those two stages also require preparatory bodhicitta generation and subsequent dedication. This does seem to take down at least one, abstract and logical, reading of Sapaṇ’s argument. It portends to give credence to the (rather overblown) claim among Sapaṇ’s later critics that he has read the Self-sufficient Remedy doctrine in bad faith.

But Sapaṇ’s critique is not merely a matter of overly literal numeric quibbles in the application of metaphors. In the Three Vows it is primarily a critique of the claim that a single practice can be causally effective, when in fact all attainments depend upon multiple causes. In the Sage’s Intent Sapaṇ is expansive and detailed in his rejection of many, specific errors. He criticizes the practice’s adherents’ notion of resting in the mind as “original, unaltered and relaxed” (D. Jackson 2015: 492ff). If the mind were simply enlightened in its “unaltered” state, he writes, then the Buddha would never have needed to teach the dharma. Such an ideal, he says, is similar to the non-Mahāyāna traditions of Disciples and Solitary Buddhas, or even simple ignorance. It cannot be a Mahāyāna path, he writes, if it fails to generate compassion and wisdom. He points out that study is necessary to understand the proper target of a meditation on emptiness. If the Mahāmudrā is attempted without prior cultivation of merit and wisdom, he says, there is no way that simply saying “I will meditatively cultivate non-conceptualization” could be effective.

The point that links these various concerns is the overarching worry about moral nihilism, which arises from the claim that all practices can be reduced to one, combined with the unbridled confidence in creative, doctrinal innovation. This allows the practitioner to forego the long and difficult moral training of the bodhisattva in favor of an easy, but delusory, instantaneous quasi-attainment. For fear of prolixity, I will leave off from Sapaṇ’s argument, in which he employs his distinctive approach to the doctrine of emptiness and the two truths. Indeed, although Sapaṇ did not write any works dedicated to the doctrine of emptiness, his view—that, in brief, ultimate truth is beyond all conceptual elaboration—is an important contribution that deserves further study. Suffice it to say that his view is tailor made to prevent both the conceptual reification of emptiness that he criticizes in the Treasury and the nihilism that he criticizes in the Sage’s Intent.

Perhaps the most controversial aspect of Sapaṇ’s critique in the Sage’s Intent was his assimilation of the non-tantric Mahāmudrā view to the doctrine of the famous Chinese monk called Hvashang Mohoyen. Sapaṇ reiterates the story told in the Testament of Ba (discovered among the textual treasures at Dunhuang) that tells of how, during the imperial period, the Chinese monk debated with, and was bested by, the Indian monk Kamalaśīla. Mohoyen did not claim his view to be a “Self-sufficient Remedy”, but he did believe in an easy practice free of cognition that could, on its own, instantaneously produce attainments. Sapaṇ has been criticized for being biased and historically uninformed, but modern scholarship has uncovered evidence of Chinese “Zen” sources for Tibetan views like those he critiqued (D. Jackson 1990, D. Jackson 1994, Kapstein 2000: 75–78 and van Schaik 2015: 175–182).

5. A Buddhist Approach to Scholarship: The Gateway to Learning

In the sections above, we have seen Sapaṇ criticize his contemporaries for their mistaken views and practices, which he believed threatened the integrity and the effectiveness of the Buddha’s teachings. As a result of these writings, he was valorized as a great scholar with deep mastery of Buddhist doctrine, but he was also often criticized and sometimes lampooned for being stodgy, conservative, and self-satisfied. He certainly believed that he had a clearer and more accurate view of the truth of the doctrine than most Tibetans of his time. Yet he believed the reason he was superior was easy to explain: He had studied and internalized the vast intellectual traditions of India, the land of Buddhism’s source. His learning provided him the means and the justification for defending the dharma against other teachers whose understanding was, by comparison, spotty.

In the Gateway to Learning (D. Jackson 1987 and Gold 2007), Sapaṇ made his case for the importance of scholastic learning for Tibetans, and provided a clear program of study so that anyone with sufficient diligence could attain the expertise necessary to be a defender of the dharma like himself. The work is a rare example of a medieval treatise on the goals and means of education, and it is articulated with philosophical precision from a Buddhist perspective and with a remarkable awareness of the social- and historical-locatedness of Tibet of Sapaṇ’s time. The Gateway is divided into three chapters, each dedicated to a category of scholarly learning: composition, exposition, and debate. Over the course of these chapters, Sapaṇ provides introductory sketches of and occasional excurses into the topics that, in his view, make up the model of Indian paṇḍityam and the most important practices of scholarship. The work draws upon the Vyākhyāyukti of Vasubandhu in the first two chapters and the Vādanyāya of Dharmakīrti in the debate chapter, and roughly follows an outline from the Mahāyānasūtrālaṃkāra, but it is unique in its scope, its Buddhist philosophical bent, and its selection of topics precisely targeted to the needs of Tibetans.

Among the most original and significant analyses here is Sapaṇ’s approach to translation and translation theory. A key theme of Tibetan Buddhist self-understanding has always been a keen sense of Tibet’s proximity to India as the source of the dharma, but also its cultural and linguistic distance from India. This is a reason that the great translators (and of course, paṇḍitas) were venerated as a bridge to the original source of the dharma in Sanskrit. Sakya Paṇḍita was himself a translator and he was very much aware of various kinds of shifts and transitions that took place when the dharma moved from Sanskrit into Tibetan language. In the Gateway he explains the choices made by the translators in a way that reveals just how deep a Tibetan interpreter’s knowledge needs to be in order not to be fooled by the translations. It is, in this way, an early application of the cultural studies approach to translation studies (see Bassnett & Lefevere 1999). In his analysis, the translations are shown to embody the cultural distance between India and Tibet, between the true dharma and its likely misinterpretation, which can only be overcome by very precise linguistic expertise.

One example Sapaṇ notes is the use of the Tibetan translation ye shes to distinguish the Sanskrit original jñāna from prajñā. There is nothing in the source term to reflect the ye, which means, for Sapan, that it is a mistake to think of ye shes as “primordial wisdom”—a common reading in certain Tibetan schools. The dharma as translated is, in this way, a minefield of interpretive problems. It is very easy to make mistakes that can lead to false teachings. But it would be wrong to think that this linguistic and cultural distance makes for an essential distinction between the dharma as it originated in its unadulterated form from the mouth of a Buddha, and the dharma as received by Tibetans. Such an essentialization would be to reify linguistic entities in a way that is non-Buddhist. The key to translation is not to uncover some essential nature of meanings embedded in the words. Sapaṇ therefore provides a Buddhist philosophical defense of the possibility of translation.

Sapaṇ draws upon the epistemology of Dharmakirti discussed above, and says that there is no essential relation between words and meanings. Rather, meaning in language depends upon nothing but the speaker’s intention, which is always context-dependent. In the case of the dharma, that means the teacher’s intention to move a particular set of beings forward on the path toward liberation. The key in transmitting the teachings from generation to generation is to preserve, as well as possible, the capacity of the teachings to have that effect. And the only way to do that is to preserve an understanding of the speaker’s specific intentions in using language as expressed in the particular texts we have. Teachers have to know just what the meaning was meant to be, when these words were uttered. So, a detailed understanding of the language of the dharma—the contexts of its origination in the forms that we have it—is inseparable from the larger project of the sangha, to communicate the teachings from generation to generation. The translations, because they are vulnerable to misinterpretation, require special handling and expertise. Sapaṇ says we need a community of experts to protect the teachings and preserve their proper interpretation. We need an interpretive community that can act as a bulwark against the decline of the dharma. Every aspect of the scholar’s toolbox—from elementary Sanskrit language study to literary theory to the regulation of debate methods—is provided with an explanation and justification of the norms of this idealized Buddhist guard.

In the section on debate, Sapaṇ again explained a number of points of particular interest to Tibetans of his time. Of great interest here is his discussion of debate based on scripture, in which he explains strategies for showing contradictions in the Vedas while defending against critics who claim that the Buddhist scriptures are inconsistent. These instructions cohere with Sapaṇ’s stated understanding that debate proper is a competition between adherents of different tenets. Of course, students may practice debate to test their understanding of treatises, but the real reason to engage in debate is to defend the dharma. Here we see debate as a skill that is properly the culmination of the previous trainings from Sanskrit language to poetics, all of which have as their ultimate aim to defend the Buddha’s dharma against its enemies, whether they be indirectly or unintentionally damaging it through misreadings and misrepresentations, or attacking it openly in the promotion of non-Buddhist doctrines. Sapaṇ envisions Tibetans training for a translocal courtly stage, where traditions lived or died by royal decree. Perhaps his own fame and skill as a defender of the dharma contributed to Sakya’s attaining control over a united Tibet under Mongol rule.


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