Units and Levels of Selection

First published Mon Aug 22, 2005; substantive revision Wed Jun 12, 2024

The theory of evolution by natural selection is, perhaps, the crowning intellectual achievement of the biological sciences. There is considerable debate, though, about which entities are selected in an evolutionary process. This article aims to clarify these debates by identifying four distinct, though often confused, theoretical and empirical research questions, as well as two schools of multilevel genetics; the debates themselves are clarified by highlighting which of these four research questions, or their combinations, are central in each debate.

1. Introduction

When we think of evolutionary theory and natural selection, we usually think of, say, a herd of deer, in which some deer are faster than others escaping their predators. These swifter deer will, all things being equal, (on average) leave more offspring, and these offspring will tend to be swifter than other deer. Thus, we get a change in the average swiftness of deer over evolutionary time. In a case like this, the “unit of selection”, often called the “target” of selection, is (at least) the single macro-organism, the individual deer, and the property being selected, swiftness, also lies at the organismic level; it is exhibited by the whole deer, not by either parts of deer, such as cells, or groups of deer, such as herds. But there are other levels of biological organization that have been proposed to be units or targets of selection—levels at which evolution by selection may act to increase the population’s distribution of a given property at that level of biological organization.

But for over forty years, some participants in the “units of selection” debates have argued that more than one issue is at stake.[1] The notions of “replicator” and “vehicle” were introduced, to stand for different roles in the evolutionary process (Dawkins 1976, 1982a,b). The individual deer, above, would be called the “vehicles” and their genes that make them tend to be swifter would be called the “replicators”. The “genic selection” argument proceeded to assert that the units of selection debates should not be about vehicles, as they formerly had been, since Darwin, but about replicators. It was then asserted that the “replicator” subsumes two distinct functional roles, which can be broken up into “replicator” and “interactor”:

Dawkins…has replicators interacting with their environment in two ways—to produce copies of themselves and to influence their own survival and the survival of their copies. (Hull 1980: 318)

The new view would call the individual deer, “interactors” (Hull 1980).[2] However, one philosopher found that the two-part replicator-interactor distinction was still inadequate for addressing key controversies about units, specifically debates about species selection and group selection, (as well as holobionts, later), and so introduced two additional distinct research questions that are also pursued under the rubric of “units or levels of selection”: In a given selection process, “what entity acts as the manifestor of adaptation?”, and “What entity is the beneficiary?” (Lloyd 1988[1994]).

The purpose of this entry is to delineate further the four quite distinct research questions pursued under the rubric of “the units and levels of selection”.[3] (see the entry on biological individuals) In section 2, four distinct research questions are introduced. Section 3 briefly describes a contrast in theoretical and modeling schools that has affected these debates very profoundly, and section 4 returns to the sites of several very confused and confusing, occasionally heated debates and claims about “the” unit of selection. Several leading positions on the issues are analyzed utilizing the proposed taxonomy (or “anatomy”) of distinct questions (Lloyd 1992; 2001; Griesemer 2005) while briefly comparing this analysis to others. The identification and status of these various units of selection, under these four meanings, is still a very active area of disagreement and discussion in both biology and philosophy (e.g., Okasha 2022; Suárez & Triviño 2020; Suárez & Lloyd 2023).

When Damuth and Heisler introduced their statistical tool to help analyze units of selection in experiments, they wrote:

We think that failure to distinguish the various alternative goals of investigations of multilevel selection has both generated needless controversy biological subdisciplines and has impeded unification of the multilevel selection traditions.[4] (1988: 409)

Our analysis in terms of the different “schools” introduced in section 3 is meant to aid such unification and mutual understanding. This entry’s analysis is not meant to resolve any of the conflicts about which research questions are most worth pursuing; moreover, there is no attempt to decide which of the questions or combinations of questions discussed ought to be considered “the” units of selection question in every context.

2. Four Basic Research Questions

Four basic research questions (represented as “RQs” often, throughout) are delineated as distinct and separable. These RQs may be approached differently in the two schools or branches of multilevel selection evolutionary theory, introduced in section 3. As shown in Section 4, these questions are often used in combination to represent “the” units of selection problem. In this Section, we begin by clarifying terms. (See the entry on biological individuals.)

The term replicator, originally introduced in the 1970s as a generalization of the gene, but since modified by philosophers, is used to refer to any entity of which copies are made; it plays a functional role in the selection process (Dawkins 1976, 1982a,b; Hull 1980; Brandon 1982; see §2.2).[5]

The original “replicator” was introduced along with the term “vehicle”, defined as

any relatively discrete entity…which houses replicators, and which can be regarded as a machine programmed to preserve and propagate the replicators that ride inside it. (Dawkins 1982b: 295)

On this view, most replicators’ phenotypic effects are represented in vehicles, which are themselves the proximate targets of natural selection (Dawkins 1982a: 62).

In the introduction of the term interactor in place of vehicle, it was observed that the previous theory has replicators interacting with their environments in two distinct ways: they produce copies of themselves, and they may influence their own survival and the survival of their copies through the production of secondary products that ultimately may have phenotypic expression (Hull 1980). The term “interactor” was suggested for the entities that function in this second process. An interactor denotes that entity which interacts, as a cohesive whole, directly with its environment in such a way that replication is differential—in other words, an entity on which selection acts directly (Hull 1980: 318). The process of evolution by natural selection is

a process in which the differential extinction and proliferation of interactors cause the differential perpetuation of the replicators that produced them.[6] (Hull 1980: 318; see Brandon 1982: 317–318)

In the late 1990s and early 2000s, however, theoreticians, developmental evolutionary biologists, and philosophers thinking about the origins of life expanded the application of the notion of replication described by Dawkins and Hull, and introduced the concept of “reproducer” as a generalization of the notion of “replicator” (Griesemer 1998, 2000a,b,c; see discussion in his 2005, 2016[7]).

In sum, “the units of selection question” is not a single RQ at all, but rather, several distinct, functional, interrelated RQs.

2.1 The Interactor Research Question

The interactor RQ, as introduced above, is: “what organizational level of units or entities are being actively, directly, selected in a process of natural selection?” Or, more traditionally: An interactor is an entity which interacts, as a cohesive whole, directly with its environment in such a way that replication is differential (Hull 1980: 318). As such, this question appears in the oldest forms of the units of selection debates (Darwin 1859; Haldane 1932a,b; S. Wright *1931, *1945). In an early, very influential review on “units of selection”, the purpose of the article was stated: “to contrast the levels of selection, especially as regards their efficiency as causers of evolutionary change” (Lewontin 1970: 7). Similarly, others from the Evolutionary Change school (see §3), assumed that a unit of selection is something that “responds to selective forces as a unit—whether or not this corresponds to a spatially localized deme, family, or population” (Slobodkin & Rapoport 1974: 184).

Questions about interactors focus on the description of the selection process itself, that is, on the interaction between an entity, that entity’s traits, and its environment; these interactions are studied through components of the entity’s fitness and its traits or properties, and on how this interaction may produce evolutionary change. They do not ordinarily focus on the adaptive outcome of this process. (Note that this applies especially to the school of evolution called Evolutionary Change, §3).[8] The interaction between some interactor at a certain level and its environment is assumed to be mediated by “traits” that affect the interactor’s expected survival and reproductive success, i.e., via some aspect of its fitness components of those traits.

Here, the possible and responsive answers to RQs about the interactor include entities possibly at any level of biological organization, including a lineage, a cluster of interacting species—such as a symbiont or holobiont (§4.6), a species, a group, a kin-group, an organism, a gamete, a chromosome, or an allele (Lewontin 1962, 1970; Brandon 1988; Lloyd 2017). Some portion (or ‘component’) of the variance in the expected reproductive success of the interactor is commonly expressed in terms of the value of the trait and genotypic or genic (or other reproducer-level) fitness parameters, that is, in terms of the fitness of combinations of replicators or reproducers. Several technical methods are available for expressing the relevant formal relationships between interactor traits and (genotypic or reproducer) components of trait fitness, including analysis of partial regression, as well as variances, and covariances, discussed further in 4.1.

As explained in the notes, partial regression analysis, i.e., contextual analysis, is most commonly applied today in studies of interactors (that is, in Evolutionary Change school investigations of plain interactors, without further investigation of the unit’s engineering adaptations per se, which is standard).[9] The early introducers of the contextual analysis tools remarked on the valuable potential of contextual analysis for

empirically resolving questions about the importance of group selection in nature. The debate about group selection has [thus far in 1987] relied primarily on theoretical arguments about the causal efficacy of particular group or individual characters that appeared to be correlated with individual fitness. After two decades of speculation, contextual analysis could provide a means for discussing the group-selection issue on a foundation of empirical research. (Heisler & Damuth 1987: 597).

This was prescient: empirical research from both laboratory, field, and breeding experiments soon proved that group multilevel selection of interactors was extremely effective at producing evolutionary change (see summaries in: Wade & Breden 1981; Goodnight & Stevens 1997; Muir 2005; Wade, Bijma, et al. 2010; Wade 2016; Goodnight 2015).

Nevertheless, it has sometimes been objected in the philosophical literature debating units of selection that the notion of interactor is too vague to be useful or applicable (both mistaken and surprising, given the mathematical precision of the statistical methods used for definition and identification); or that the participating entity is not “cohesive” enough to play this functional role in the selection process as assigned (e.g., Booth 2014; Bourrat 2019; Okasha 2022; see §4.5, §4.6).[10]

But note that the researchers using the multilevel models cited above discuss and model the functional role of interactor with very significant precision, as an application of Hull’s original conception in terms of cohesiveness in interaction with their environments, represented as “emergent” fitnesses in relation to multilevel traits and environments that are traceable through statistical tools such as a contextual analysis approach, depending on the selective context (Lloyd 1988 [1994]; Brandon 1990, contrast Sober & Wilson 1998; Okasha 2006; see work of both Adaptationist/KS and Evolutionary Change schools, especially Goodnight, Bijma, Muir, Damuth and Heisler, and Wade; discussed further in §§4.1–4.6).

It is important to see that, in the midst of deciding among the various methods for representing selection processes, these choices have consequences for the empirical adequacy of the selection models.[11]

It is also extremely significant that the “interactor research question” does not involve attributing engineering adaptations, or “benefits” in the adaptive sense, sometimes accumulated through selection over time, to the interactors, or indeed, to any candidate unit of selection. Attributing interaction at a particular level involves only the presence of an entity’s trait at that level with a special relation to genic, genotypic, replicator, or reproducer expected success that is not reducible to interactions at a lower level.

As seen in Sections 4.1–4.6, the most common error made in interpreting many of the interactor-based evolutionary models and model-types is that the presence of an interactor at a level is taken to imply that the interactor is also a manifestor of an adaptation at that level. We will consider a couple of approaches to “units of selection” in Section 4.1 Group Selection, and 4.2 Species Selection, wherein a combination of interactor and manifestor of adaptation functional evolutionary roles are merged from the very start. This conflation of functional roles has also led to confusion in the interpretations of evolutionary transitions (§4.5), as well as holobionts (§4.6).

2.2 The Replicator/Reproducer Research Question

The “replicator Research Question” originally concerned which organic entities met Dawkins’ definition besides the gene. The subsequent, more widely used, meaning in philosophy of the term was: “an entity that passes on its structure directly in replication” (Hull 1980: 318). The term replicator is used in this latter sense, henceforth.

The issue corresponds to a long-standing debate in genetics about how large a fragment of a genome ought to count as a replicating/reproducing unit—something which can be treated separately in evolutionary theory as inheriting traits of interactors (Lewontin 1970; Hull 1980). This debate revolved around linkage disequilibrium and led some biologists to advocate the use of parameters of the entire haploid genome rather than of allele and genotypic frequencies in genetical models, a view far ahead of its time (Lewontin 1974). [12] [13]

The basic point is that with much linkage disequilibrium, individual genes cannot be considered as separately-acting replicators because they do not behave as separate units during reproduction. Although this debate remains pertinent to the choice of state space of genetical model (§§4.3–4.4), it has been eclipsed by concerns about interactors in evolutionary genetics.

Significantly, recent developments in debates about units of selection show that there has also been a profound reconception of the evolution-by-selection process, which has rejected the original role of replicator as misconceived, and too narrow in many circumstances. In its place the role of “reproducer” is proposed, which focuses on the material transference of genetic and other matter, and its development from generation to generation (Griesemer 1998, 2000a,b, 2003, 2005, 2014, 2016; see Forsdyke 2010; §3, §4.1, §4.5, §4.6). On this approach, thinking in terms of reproducers incorporates development into heredity and the evolutionary process. It also incorporates both epigenetic and genetic inheritance within the same framework, and includes the traditional replicators as a subset (Griesemer 1998, 2000c, 2018). A more recent and influential conflicting characterization of “reproducer” disagrees about retroviral reproduction, and what counts as a salient material bond between generations (Godfrey Smith 2009, 2012; Griesemer 2016, 2018).[14]

Griesemer’s functional role of evolutionary reproducer—expanding the replicator—can play a central role, along with a hierarchy of interactors, in work similarly expanding the RQs framework into the units of evolutionary transition (see section 4.5 and the entries on biological individuals, philosophy of macroevolution, and evolutionary game theory).[15]

2.3 The Manifestor-of-Adaptation Research Question

At what level do adaptations occur? Or, “When a population evolves by natural selection, what, if anything, is the entity that does the adapting?” (Sober 1984: 204).

The presence of adaptations at a given level of entity is sometimes taken to be a requirement for something to be a unit of selection, in addition to a usually-silent accompanying requirement that it also be an evolutionary interactor.[16] Moreover, an adaptation at a level is one important sort of “benefit” for entities—whether organismic, familial, or group—resulting from natural selection of those entities at that level (G. C. Williams 1966).

Significantly, though, multilevel, Evolutionary Change school geneticists argued that group selection for “group advantage” should be distinguished from the process of group selection per se, that is, the sole process of selection of interactors at the group or higher level (S. Wright 1980; §3, §4.1). In fact, the combination and blurring of the interactor research question with the question of what entity has adaptations has created a great deal of confusion in the units of selection debates in general (see §§4.1–4.6.)

(The distinction between interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation functional roles has recently been more or less reintroduced by a philosopher from the Adaptationist school [see §3] in work on “Type-1 agents” in evolution by selection (Okasha 2018)[17].)

Some of this confusion between interactor and manifestor of adaptation is a result of a very important but neglected duality in the meaning of evolutionary “adaptation” (in spite of discussions in Brandon 1978, 1990; Burian 1983; Krimbas 1984; Sober 1984; Lewontin 1978; Munson 1971).

Sometimes “adaptation” is taken—by both philosophers and biologists—to signify any trait at all that is a direct result or outcome of a selection process involving entities at that level in the population. In this view, any trait that arises directly from a selection process is claimed to be, by definition, an adaptation, and I call this the “selection-product” version of adaptation.[18]

Sometimes, on the other hand, the term “adaptation” is reserved for traits that provide a “better fit” with the environment through accumulated build-up of modifications in phenotype that intuitively satisfy some notion of “good design” or “improved engineering” that goes beyond the original range of variation in the population.[19] I call this second meaning the engineering definition of adaptation, which is distinct, and sometimes, in tension with the selection-product meaning of the term.

Consider the famous peppered moth case: natural selection is acting on the coloring of the moths, and the population evolves over time, but no “engineering” adaptation emerges; that is, there has been no “accumulated change in” phenotype that goes beyond the original range of variation of the phenotype in the population. Rather, the proportion of dark moths simply increases over time, relative to the industrial environmental conditions, a clear case of evolution by natural selection, on which a good fit to the environment is reinforced. Note that the dark moths lie within the range of variation of the ancestral population; they are simply more frequent now, due to their superior fit with the changed environment.

The dark moths are a “selection-product” adaptation; there has been no accumulated “engineering” of the form, nor long-term change in the formation or function of any phenotypic trait. Contrast this to the cases of Darwin’s finches, in which different species evolved distinct beak shapes specially adapted to their diets of particular seeds (B. R. Grant & P. R. Grant 1989; P. R. Grant 1986). Natural selection here occurred against constantly changing genetic and phenotypic backgrounds in which accumulated selection processes had changed the shapes of the beaks, thus producing “engineering” adaptations due to selection. The finches now possess newly shaped beaks that are new mechanisms beyond the original range of variation in the ancestral population; see Suárez & Triviño 2020 for cases of holobionts as manifestors of adaptation).

Some evolutionary biologists have strongly advocated an engineering definition of adaptation (e.g., G. C. Williams 1966). The basic alternative idea is that it is possible to have evolutionary change result from direct selection favoring a trait without having to consider that changed trait as an (engineering) adaptation, because no accumulated phenotypic “design” change occurred; i.e., the entity is merely an interactor in the evolutionary process.[20]

It is important to see how this biologically-based definition of engineering adaptation differs from the philosophical definitions of “biological function” usually on offer (see entries on teleological notions in biology and adaptationism); I note that the accumulated, engineering adaptation described here fits both prongs of the usual philosophical choices.

In his review of “function”, Colin Allen offers us the two main philosophical accounts of the concept usually used when defining evolutionary adaptation:

Etiological approaches to function look to a causal-historical process of selection; functions are identified with those past effects that explain the current presence of a thing by means of a historical selection process (typically natural selection in the case of biological function).

Systems-analysis approaches invoke an ahistorical, engineering style of analysis of a complex system into its components. Functions of components are identified with their causal contributions to broader capacities of the system.[21] (C. Allen 2002: 375).

Significantly, both the engineering adaptations and selection-product adaptations, introduced above, fall under Allen’s first, etiological approach to function; they both invoke the historical selection process to explain the current presence of a trait. But the engineering adaptations also appeal to design analyses often identified with the systems-analysis notion of function, as well. Thus, engineering adaptations—as the concept is used by leading evolutionary biologists—appeal to both etiological and systems-analysis approaches/definitions of function in the philosophical senses just presented (Lloyd 2021).[22]

Thus, we distinguish between selection and evolution of entities through emergent fitnesses in relation to the phenotypic trait in the context/environment [an interactor], and through emergent engineering phenotypes acting as interactors [the manifestor of adaptation]. One way to put the point, is that the interactor concept is adaptation-neutral.[23]

In sum, when asking whether a given level of entity possesses adaptations, it is necessary to state not only the level of selection in question but also which notion of adaptation—selection-product or engineering—is being used. In fact, this question often differs between the two schools of multilevel selection outlined in Section 3.

2.4 The Beneficiary Research Question

Who benefits from a process of evolution by selection? There are two common interpretations: Who benefits in the long term from such a process? And who gets the benefit of possessing (engineering) adaptations as a consequence of an evolution-by-selection process? As we have addressed the latter question in §2.3, take the first, the issue of the “ultimate beneficiary”.

There are also two obvious answers to this question, i.e., ways of characterizing the long-term beneficiaries of the evolution-by-selection process. One might respond that the species or lineages are the ultimate beneficiaries of the process.

Alternatively, one might say that the lineages characterized on the reproducer/replicator level, that is, the replicating alleles, genomes, or reproducers, are the relevant long-term, or ultimate, beneficiaries. I have not located any authors holding the first view, but, for Dawkins, the latter interpretation is the primary fact about evolution (1976; Ågren 2021a). To arrive at this conclusion, he adds the requirement of agency to the notion of beneficiary (Hampe & Morgan 1988). A beneficiary, by definition, does not simply passively accrue credit in the long term; it must function as the initiator of a causal pathway (Dawkins 1982a,b; revived in Okasha 2018, compare manifestor). Under this definition, the replicator as agent is causally responsible for all the various effects that arise down the biochemical or phenotypic pathway, irrespective of which entities might reap the long-term rewards (Sapienza 2010).

In some recent follow-up work on agency from a philosopher, mentioned in §2.3, the evolutionary phenomenon focused on is agency of

type 1 [which] is a legitimate expression of adaptationism, but it relies on a crucial presupposition. It presupposes that the entity that is treated as an agent exhibits a “unity-of-purpose”,… [i.e.,] its evolved traits contribute to a single overall goal. (Okasha 2018: 5)

Note that both meanings of beneficiary distinguished above are mobilized here: adaptationist goals and features of both traits and genes.

This second and quite distinct, “ultimate”, version of the beneficiary question can be intertwined with the notion of adaptation. The evolution-by-selection process may be said to “benefit” a particular level of interactor, through producing engineering adaptations at that level (e.g., G. C. Williams 1966; Maynard Smith 1976; Eldredge 1985; Vrba 1984).

It is crucial to distinguish the research question concerning the level at which engineering adaptations evolve and accumulate from a selection process, (§2.3), from the question about the identity of the ultimate beneficiaries of that selection process in the Dawkins sense, as here (§2.4). One can think that interactors have adaptations without thinking that those interactors are the “ultimate beneficiaries” of the selection process.[24]

2.5 Summary

Four distinct research questions have been isolated and identified, in this Section, that have appeared under the rubric of “the units of selection question” in evolutionary theory and practice: What is the interactor? What is the reproducer, or more narrowly constrained replicator? What entity manifests accumulated, engineering, adaptations resulting from evolution by selection at a level of biological organization? And what is the ultimate beneficiary? There is an important ambiguity in the meaning of adaptation; which meaning is in play has had significant consequences for both the group selection and species selection debates (see §4.1, §4.2).

Below, the anatomy and applications of this collection of RQs along with their possible and responsive answers, all included under a “units of selection” framework, are analyzed and reviewed. Identifying which specific meaning(s) of the level and unit of selection is being used, alone or in combination, in evolutionary discussions and models, both formal and informal, is a useful initial approach for thinking about both theoretical and experimental research into natural selection processes. When applying this “logic of research questions”[25] analytical method like this—that is, clarifying the variety of RQs in a controversy, and carefully specifying their possible and responsive answers within their wider scientific (as well as social and cultural, although those are not emphasized here) frameworks and contexts. The method is conceived as a tool that integrates knowledge and theory in evolution with the empirical, experimental, practice side of the science. It simultaneously also frames the adaptationist research approach in contrast with other research approaches in evolutionary theory. This “anatomy” framework combined with the “logic of research questions” tool or analysis, is a clear way to understand how the expression “unit of selection” is used in the many different research contexts in which it appears.

Ironically, these same three or four functional evolutionary roles, introduced, defined, and distinguished decades ago (see comprehensive analysis of leading approaches to units in Griesemer 2005[26]), have since been reintroduced or resurrected by a number of different authors under different names and terminology, but in relation to the same or similar debates about units (e.g., Bourrat 2016, 2019, 2021a,b, 2022; Bourrat & Griffiths 2018; Clarke 2016; Stencel & Wloch-Salamon 2018; Godfrey-Smith 2009, 2016; Doolittle & Booth 2017; Doolittle & Inkpen 2018; Inkpen & Doolittle 2021; Lean et al. 2022; Birch 2020; Booth 2014; Okasha 2018, 2022; Gardner 2015a,b,c). It is “ironic”, because these same newer analyses either explicitly reject or neglect the full functional and formal role analysis—or some representation of such—offered earlier.[27] A couple of these re-introductions of needed distinctions are discussed in Section 4 (e.g., Okasha 2022; Doolittle & Booth 2017 and Stencel & Wloch-Salamon 2018: Section 4.6; see Suárez & Lloyd 2023 for further analyses).[28]

Finally, the claim that two meanings of “unit of selection” are distinct does not imply that they cannot be interrelated—that is not the claim here—or that one living being or part cannot simultaneously satisfy two or more functional evolutionary roles; in fact, we often see this (discussed further in §4).

In any case, commenting on the four-pronged “anatomy” analysis of the debates over units of selection, John Maynard Smith wrote in Evolution:

[Lloyd 2001] argues, correctly I believe, that much of the confusion has arisen because the same terms have been used with different meanings by different authors … [but] I fear that the confusions she mentions will not easily be ended. (Maynard Smith 2001: 1497)

In Section 4, a dissection of this anatomy of research questions is used to clarify some of the most visible positions in six debates: (4.1) group selection; (4.2) species selection; (§4.3) genic selection; (§4.4) genic pluralism; (4.5) units of evolutionary transitions in individuality (ETI) and (4.6) holobionts and demibionts. But first we must discuss an extremely influential but usually unrecognized bifurcation in the theory and practices of evolutionary multilevel theory in Section 3.

3. Two Traditions of Research into Multilevel Understanding of Units/Levels of Selection

There is a high-level analysis,[29] that whereas kin selection research questions aim primarily at identifying character states and genic/ kin selection processes that maximize fitness, multilevel and group selection methods aim to understand the effects of selection on interactor trait changes over time (Goodnight 2013, 2015; Wade 2016; Maynard Smith 1974, 1976, 1987, 2001; Futuyma & Kirkpatrick 2017). Here, we introduce both research approaches and priorities. But first, we need some basic tools for our discussion.

As argued and illustrated by several philosophers many decades ago, the structure of evolutionary theory itself may be best understood as an interrelated family of informal and formal model-types or model outlines (Beatty 1980; Lloyd 1983 (proposing informal model-outlines or model-types of Darwinian theory; contra Godfrey Smith’s (2007: 731) rejection of the “semantic view” of scientific theories, explanation, and confirmation, on the basis that it necessitated “mathematization”, which it did not when Beatty and Lloyd used it to analyze Darwin’s informal models), nor later in Lloyd’s 1988 informal models of species selection, applied in Lloyd and Gould 1993 (see §4.2 below); 1984 (analysis of formal genetics models; Lloyd 1988[1994] (arguing for seeing evolutionary biology in terms of families of informal models of organismic, species selection, and group selection models, as well as formal models of population genetics and quantitative genetics of organismic and higher level selection, using the semantic view); Griesemer 1984, (informal and formal evolutionary model-types, using semantic view and their “presentations”, congruent with Godfrey Smith’s later model “construals”, 2007); Griesemer 1991, 2013; Thompson 1989; Ketcham 2018; and biologists Wade & Kalisz 1990; Wagner et al. 2014). Philosophers Downes 1992; and Weisberg 2012, also endorsed a formal and informal model-based approach to evolutionary biology, under different names. One key agreement among all of the above past and present participants in model-based analyses of evolutionary theory, and many more, is that it can be understood as an interrelated group of formal and informal evolutionary models and model-types, where a model-outline or model-type is defined as a basic structure whose shared formal or informal parameters and variables may not all have been assigned values in a given application.[30]

This is all significant for our analysis of units of selection because it is needed to grasp that the basic model-types used by the two different schools we are about to examine are fundamentally used differently in significant ways, and are usually used to answer different research questions (RQs) in evolutionary research.

One more key distinction must be emphasized before proceeding. As discussed in §2.1, §§4.1–4.6, interactors are characterized primarily by their cohesive responses/interactions with (i.e., when they “interact as a whole with”) their environments, both biotic and abiotic (see §2.1, §3, §§4.1–4.6).[31] As we will see below repeatedly, they are very significantly distinguished from manifestors-of-adaptation (§2.3, §3, §§4.1–4.6; see McKenna et al. 2021; Lloyd 1988 [1994]; G.C. Williams 1992). Specifically, any “cohesiveness” in the activities/traits the interactors may exhibit while in these holistic interactions, does not necessarily yield “emergent” engineering adaptations, more widely understood by philosophers as etiological and systems “functions” (see definitions in §2.3, also see §3, §4.1, §4.2). Also please note that Lewontin’s original 3-part “recipe” for a unit of selection to evolve, upon which so much discussion is based, does not mention or include engineering adaptation concepts or results as central. It involves only interactors, as written, even while many, if not most of some sub-communities of,evolutionary researchers are motivated to seek out adaptations of distinct units of selection.

Instead, a standard for a manifestor of adaptation must also be established and explored separately, usually through game theory or other forms of exploring optimality, a notion from engineering and design. The genetics models are then produced separately, needed to produce or maintain the optima, as we shall see below.

3.1 Evolutionary Change School of Multilevel Evolution

Multilevel selection methods for model-building and detection of interactors, such as contextual analysis (§2.1, §4.1, §4.2) and multilevel modeling,[32] arising out of the quantitative genetics tradition, are used to describe the evolutionary processes acting on a population in its current state of traits or fitness; the focus is on evolutionary processes, in contrast to searching for or modeling which level entity might be a manifestor of adaptation.[33] This is often called the “Evolutionary Change” or “Wrightian” school, because of its interest in Sewall Wright’s work on evolution in structured populations, and its emphasis on the effects of epistasis and gene interaction (see below).

Wright found that when populations are subdivided into smaller groups or demes, as many actual biological populations are, this population structure challenges the Fisherian modeling assumption of panmixia (freely mixed, random mating) in the metapopulation (collection of all demes). For example, the evolutionary response to selection on a given combination of genes within a deme depends on the overall migration patterns (e.g., Slatkin 1981b; Uyenoyama & Feldman 1980) and rates within the metapopulation, as well as on the interactions of genes within the demes.

Griffing (1967) highlighted the social or competitive effects organisms have on each other, because when these effects have a genetic component, they provide an additional source of heritable genetic variation within the population.

These effects and processes are referred to as “indirect genetic effects” (IGEs) (Moore, Brodie, & Wolf 1997; Wolf, Brodie et al. 1998; Wolf, Brodie, & Wade 2000) or “associative effects” (Griffing 1967; Muir 2005). They have the potential to accelerate, slow, or even reverse an evolutionary response to selection.[34]

Moreover, traits of an individual’s social environment, such as the aggressiveness of an ant or bee colony when foraging, can directly influence behavior (Sih & Watters 2005; Westneat 2012), and impose multilevel selection.[35]

Hence, modern Evolutionary Change theorists tend to emphasize the importance of epistasis and IGEs, which are explicitly, deliberately, excluded in the Adaptationist methods and models, although they are essential to higher levels of both selection and engineering adaptation (Bijma 2010a,b, 2011, 2014; Bijma, Hulst, & de Jong 2022; Breden & Wade 1991; Wade 2016; Goodnight 2014 (see Other Internet Resources), 2015; contrast, e.g., Gardner & Welch 2011.[36]

3.2 Adaptationist/Kin Selection School of Multilevel Evolution

Kin selection (KS) and inclusive fitness genic model-types[37] arose primarily out of game theory, evolutionary stable strategies (ESS), and classic Fisherian mass genetics, and are used to identify the optimal solution[s] to particular adaptive questions. This research practice is thus usefully labeled the “Adaptationist” approach to multilevel evolution (Goodnight 2015), due to its focus on locating interactors that are also engineering adaptations. The goals are to explain both functional roles—interactor and manifestor of adaptation—by representing them with KS/inclusive fitness genic models.

Any typical Adaptationist/kin selection/inclusive fitness (referred to often below as Adaptationist/KS) school multilevel RQ embodies, at best, two interdependent research questions:

First RQ: Identify an equilibrium or optimal trait at a given level of organization which is an engineering adaptation (often done using engineering-style optimality modeling, see Oster & Wilson 1978; Gardner & Welch 2011.[38]) and which is unlikely to evolve by selection of the lower-level entity traits. The paradigms are “altruistic” or “self-sacrificing” traits at the lower level, lowering self-fitness, but which are “good for the group” or higher-level fitness.

Second, co-ordinated RQ: Characterize a KS or inclusive fitness/genic selection process in which this engineering higher-level-optimal adaptation could have evolved, against the pressures of the lower-level entities’ selective processes.

For example, Gardner & Welch, operating within this Adaptationist/KS school, claim that their simpler, genic-oriented models provide good justification for excluding the non-additive genotypic effects we just discussed in the previous section concerning the Evolutionary Change school—the very same interactions that drive both upper-level selection, and any adaptation that might occur, in the Evolutionary Change multilevel selection models—because such effects “show no correspondence with the optimization program” (2011: 1809), i.e., with the Adaptationist search for optimal gene’s-eye solutions.

Thus, while they acknowledge that

neglect of these epistatic effects will lead to a less complete (and potentially quite inaccurate) account of the evolutionary process (…) the gene’s eye view does function adequately as a theory of adaptation. (2011: 1809; emphasis added)

It is often this conflict of priorities—between searching for optimal adaptations from the gene’s-eye view—vs. searching for accurate accounts of evolutionary processes—that plays a central role in the tensions between the two research schools. We shall discuss examples of these contrasting RQs in §4.1, §4.5 & §4.6.

3.3 Relationships Between Adaptationist/KS and Evolutionary Change Schools of Multilevel Evolution

As Wade and Goodnight summarize the biggest contrasts between the Adaptationist/KS (Fisherian) and Evolutionary Change (Wrightian) schools in evolution, an analysis using the “Logic and pragmatics of Research Questions” tells us that, not only do the two approaches address different RQs, seeking different possible and responsive answers to those RQs (Lloyd 2015; see, e.g., Goodnight 2000), but they also make a variety of different assumptions in building their model-types in addressing those RQs:

…the Wright-Fisher controversy involves the fundamental nature of evolutionary change…[including] its genetic basis (universal epistasis and pleiotropy vs. additive genetic effects), the ecological context in which it takes place (small, subdivided populations vs. large, panmictic populations), and the mechanisms by which it operates (local, mass selection, random genetic drift, and interdemic selection vs. mutation and mass selection). (Wade & Goodnight 1998: 1547)

Thus, the two research approaches to multilevel selection founded on these two distinct schools’ model-types[39] are not at all the same, because they simply do not ask the same RQs, nor use similar model components, values, or assumptions[40] (Goodnight 2000, 2013, 2015; Linksvayer & Wade 2005; Wade 2016; Wade & Kalisz 1990; Rousset 2004; Ketcham 2018).[41]

Rather than being competing approaches, as they have often been treated since the 1960s, the two research schools may today be considered complementary approaches that, when used together, give a clearer picture of social evolution and multilevel theory and genetics than either one can when used in isolation, although there are sound reasons for preferring one approach over another in certain background conditions and population structures (Goodnight 2013: 1547; 2015; Wade 2016). In summing up their analysis, biologists Kramer and Meunier write:

The two theories thus provide different perspectives that might be fruitfully combined to promote our understanding of the evolution in group-structured populations. (Kramer & Meunier 2016: abstract)

But many researchers from the Adaptationist/KS school hold less tolerant attitudes than seeing this “fruitful combination” towards the multilevel selection models—concerned primarily with process—rather than their preferred objective of optimal fitness traits/engineering adaptations.[42]

We shall see, in sections 4.1–4.6, how approaching RQs using one rather than the other research framework and model-types to multilevel selection makes a difference in outcomes.

4. The Anatomy of the Debates

4.1 Group Selection

The legendary near-deathblow in the 1960s to group panselectionism was really about group benefit, not group selection per se (G. C. Williams 1966). The interest was in cases of a genuine group selection (GS, often, henceforth) process among groups, where the groups also, as a whole, benefited from organism-level traits (including behaviors) that seemed disadvantageous to the organism (Wynne Edwards 1962; G. C. Williams 1966; Maynard Smith 1964). But frequently, a group benefit was not necessarily a group engineering adaptation (§2.3, §2.4; G. C. Williams 1966; Brandon 1981, 1985; Brandon & Burian 1984; Sober & Wilson 1998).[43]

Implicit in this discussion of GS processes, is the assumption that being a “unit of selection” at the group level requires two distinct, interrelated but separable evolutionary functions or roles: (1) having the group as an interactor, and (2) having a group-level engineering-type adaptation accumulated from a group selection process. Thus, the entire discussion confuses and combines two distinct RQs, the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation questions, calling this combined set the “unit of selection” question (true for both critics, G. C. Williams 1966; Maynard Smith 1964; and defender, Wynne Edwards 1962; see Borrello 2010).

Thus, the GS issue was understood to hinge on “whether entities more inclusive than organisms exhibit adaptations”. (Hull 1980: 325;[44] Maynard Smith 1976; Ramsey & Brandon 2011) Similarly, paleontological approaches required engineering adaptations combined with interactors, for species and lineages to count as units of selection (§4.2).[45]

Finally, in an argument meant to distinguish GS and kin selection (KS henceforth), it was argued that GS is favored by small group size, low migration rates, and rapid extinction of groups infected with a selfish allele;[46] thus, the ultimate test of the group selection hypothesis will be whether populations having these characteristics tend to show “self-sacrificing” or “prudent” behavior more commonly than those which do not.[47] (Maynard Smith 1976: 282; see Wade 1980a,b, 1985 on kin selection)

Contrary to Adaptationist/KS school theoreticians, Evolutionary Change biologists have produced a wide variety of models, lab, and field experiments that violate all of the Adaptationist/KS school’s “necessary” conditions usually cited for GS to be effective (Matessi & Jayakar 1976: 384; Wade & McCauley 1980: 811; Boorman 1978: 1909; Uyenoyama 1979; Uyenoyama & Feldman 1980; Wade 1976, 1977, 1978, reviewed in 2016; contrast, e.g., Maynard Smith 1964, 1976).

That different researchers reach such disparate conclusions about the theoretical efficacy of GS is largely because they are responding to different RQs, using different model-types with different parameters, and different assumptions from different schools. That they make vastly different generalizations about biological facts has to do, rather, more with ignorance of Evolutionary Change school experiments and findings (e.g., Gardner & Grafen 2009; Gardner 2015a; West, El Mouden, & Gardner 2011; compare Wade 1996, 2016; Goodnight 2015; see below).

For example, many Adaptationist/KS model-types use a specific migration mechanism: they assume that migrating individuals mix completely, forming a “migrant pool” from which migrants are assigned to the future generation randomly. Under this approach, small sample size is needed to get a large genetic variance between populations (Wade 1978: 110; 2016; Slatkin 1981b; Okasha 2006).

In fact, Evolutionary Change models and empirical studies all established that there are many different ways for a group to reproduce, giving rise to many different entities—e.g., propagules, not just genic reproducers—playing the functional role of reproducers in models in which groups are interactors and manifestors of adaptation.[48] This is very different from the gene’s eye view where heritability is strongly tied to gene-level variation (Wade 2016). When comparing kin/genic selection with group/multilevel selection model-types and their assumptions—e.g., the facts about spread of phenotypes—through either migration or reproduction, the devil is in the details.

This is evident in an early, very controversial case focusing on group vs. organismic selection of a virus. Focusing only on the evolutionary interactors, using an Evolutionary Change approach, helps clarify theoretical, methodological, and pragmatic issues that infuse GS debates.[49]

The Myxoma virus was introduced into Australia because it was highly fatal to the out-of-control rabbit population. After some years, however, the rabbits had become resistant, and the virus had become less virulent. The debate focused on whether the avirulence of the virus had evolved primarily from organismic or group selection. It was a challenging problem because both model-types produced the same outcome: decreased virulence (Fenner 1965). In the models, mixed groups with more virulent viruses inoculated into the rabbits spread fewer virulent viruses in the metapopulations of groups, and pure groups of a single type of very virulent virus particles also reproduced less well in the metapopulation, thus producing lower levels of virulence in either case. Both biologists and philosophers took firm stances, claiming either that organismic selection (Futuyma 1979; Alexander & Borgia 1978; Gilpin 1975), or group selection (Lewontin 1970; S. Levin & Pimentel 1981; Sober 1984; Sober & Wilson 1998) was responsible for the observed avirulence.

In a philosophical analysis, it was highlighted that we did not know enough to actually decide this debate about GS (Lloyd 1986, 1988[1994]). Researchers did not agree about the facts regarding the composition of the inoculations of viruses injected: were they homogeneous or heterogeneous—all virulent, benign, or mixed? If the inoculated virus groups were observed to be heterogeneous, then it would be possible to apply appropriate statistical examination to them, as would be expected in the Evolutionary Change approach to GS.

An aspect of the debate about the efficacy of group-level interactors that has received a great deal of consideration in both biology and philosophy, concerns the conceptual and statistical tools necessary for identifying an interactor, as mentioned in Section 2.1.[50] It was proposed to look for genetic or reproducer interaction at the lower level of entities, and coordinated, “emergent” fitness—i.e., relations among the entities, traits (characters), environmental contexts, and fitnesses—at the upper level of entities.[51] Today, such statistical and causal examination uses precisely such contextual analysis in actual multilevel studies (Arnold & Fristrup 1982; Griesemer & Wade 1988; Goodnight 2015; see Bijma 2014 and Wade 2016 for theoretical context). Contextual analysis produces a multilevel multiple partial regression analysis. Earnshaw summarizes its products nicely:

\(w \mathbin{\Delta} z = a\,\textrm{Var} (Z) +b\, \textrm{Var} (z)\), where \(a\) and \(b\) are partial regression coefficients: is the average linear effect of group character on individual fitness when individual character is held constant, and \(b\) is the average linear effect of individual character on individual fitness holding group character constant. (2015: 306)

The higher and lower-level characters are treated as independently having their causal effects on fitness, and they are combined with variances in lower and upper-level characters, to give a change in the organismic (or group) characters. Once such an analysis is done—and only then—can we state what entity-types might be acting as an interactor at a particular level, and explore them causally, in the process. As Damuth and Heisler claimed, their method does not help answer questions about units of selection except empirically.[52]

The key issue highlighted in the Myxoma case was that at the time of the above discussion, no one knew what the composition of the groups was, so no contextual or other statistical analysis could be performed to decide the case.[53] Yet G. C. Williams had discouraged gathering such information using his widely accepted and promulgated “principle of parsimony”:

In explaining adaptations, one should assume the adequacy of the simplest form of natural selection, that of alternative alleles in Mendelian populations, unless the evidence clearly shows that the theory does not suffice. (G. C. Williams 1966: 55; emphasis added).

The following crucial problem with Williams’ principle was made clear: by highlighting the proposed emergent fitness/trait relational definition of an interactor (e.g., applying the suggested additivity criterion using contextual analysis), it

reveals the potential for dogmatic abuse of such sensible-looking advice. “The evidence”, as Williams puts it, is not found, it is created. Not performing analyses of group composition and contribution to the global gene pool virtually guarantees…that no evidence will be found that will reveal the inadequacy of the simpler…. [genic or organismic level] models…. Understanding the structure of selection models and the information needed to perform an adequate comparison reveals quite clearly the dogmatism of Williams’ maxim, as it is usually applied. (Lloyd 1988 [1994: 95])

This critique of G. C. Williams’ parsimony principle and the resulting insistence to obtain the empirical information necessary to perform the needed contextual statistical and causal analyses to answer the question about which entity was an interactor in this context, was, perhaps surprisingly, welcomed by G. C. Williams, citing the above page numbers, when he reviewed the quoted book in the Quarterly Review of Biology: he described Lloyd’s analysis of group selection in this case as “mak[ing] more sense than any other I have seen” (G. C. Williams 1990: 504).

The proposed Evolutionary Change school-style theoretical, methodological and pragmatic requirements for something to be a recognized instance of GS—where groups are interpreted as interactors alone, and not necessarily manifestors of adaptation, as Williams had previously required—were thus accepted by the original arch-critic of group selection. The crucial distinction between the functional evolutionary roles of interactor and manifestor was subsequently used in Williams’ own work (1992) on hierarchical species and lineage selection.[54]

These roles are subsequently conflated again by philosophers Okasha and Paternotte (2012), who give a persuasive analysis of how to identify an evolutionary interactor, much like the above, using contextual analysis plus a linked causal analysis, as recommended by Damuth and Heisler (1988), but conclude—under an Adaptationist/KS school approach—that they have identified an adaptation of the original Williams-engineering variety.[55]

Notably, phenotypic traits involved in group selection processes of interactors are often (usually) not optimal or engineering adaptations of the entities at that upper level, but rather simply selection-product adaptations following from their being interactors at that level.[56] The fact that this feature of Evolutionary Change models is also called “adaptation” has sometimes proved confusing to many (Sober & Wilson 1998; see Lloyd 2008 correspondence with Sober and D. S. Wilson on this issue; Wade 2016; Gordon 2014).[57] But contextual analysis is a good method for answering research questions about both Adaptationist/KS and Evolutionary Change interactors at any given level.[58]

The outcomes of group selection models can also be destructive (but still, selected) traits. Consider, for example, very common phenomena that Wade highlighted as almost completely neglected by the Adaptationist/KS school: these damaging population consequences of artificial and commercial breeding have

received much less theoretical or empirical attention, even though it is the most common situation in the domestication of plants and animals, (Wade 2016: 18)

He cites experimental and field results regarding selection and group-harmful traits, e.g.: cannibalism in flour beetles (Wade 1980b); field work on cannibalism in willow leaf beetle (Breden & Wade 1989); leaf area in plants (Goodnight 1985); egg laying in hens (Muir 1996); and eusocial mortality in hens (Ellen et al. 2008). Wade concludes:

The results of these studies leave little doubt that artificial group selection can curb the evolution of traits good for the individual but harmful to the group. (2016: 18–19; emphasis added)

It is easy to see, in this context, how the requirements for the roles of multilevel interactors, and multilevel manifestors of engineering adaptation, may be conflated and confused. In fact, Heisler and Damuth themselves did not make the relevant distinction, citing Sober’s (1984) two-pronged, conflated, interactor-plus-manifestor, “common fate”[59] definition of group selection as equivalent to their approach (Heisler & Damuth 1987: 588).[60]

Let us take another look at Heisler and Damuth’s contextual analysis, and the Price Eqs. Overall, while many of the suggested techniques to identify interactors have had strengths, no single approach to this aspect of the interactor question has been generally accepted across all researchers working from both schools of evolution, and indeed it remains the subject of debate in biological and philosophical circles, perhaps partly because the Adaptationist school, as well as many philosophers, largely prefer one method—using the Price equations—while the Evolutionary Change school prefers a different one—using multiple regression analyses, in the form of contextual analyses for any and all modeling methods and applications in the field and laboratory experiments (Gardner & Grafen 2009; Gardner 2015a,b,c; Grafen 2009; Queller 1992; Goodnight 2015; see discussions in Wade 1995, Price 1970, 1972; Heisler & Damuth 1987; Damuth & Heisler 1988; Okasha 2006; Earnshaw 2015; Goodnight 2015. 2020; Wade 2016; Ketcham 2018; contrast Bourrat 2021a,b).

Let us take a moment to consider the notion that perhaps these differences in statistical tool use have consequences for the foundational understanding, especially of the Adaptationist/KS school, affecting which of the units RQs are considered central to the practice of evolutionary genetics, which has thus far been referred to as “conflation” and “confusion” of RQs.

Lande, Arnold, and Wade, all at University of Chicago, found that evolution by selection could be best understood if analyzed distinguishing processes of selection from those of heritability. As Wade reviews in his Evolutionary Change-school book on multilevel selection theory and empirical applications, the strength of selection has been shown by breeders to be representable as the covariance between phenotype and relative fitness, )[61] (Robertson 1966; Wade 2016; Lande & Arnold 1983; Ohta 1983). And, with regard to multilevel selection, it was later shown that the covariance between phenotype and fitness

across an entire metapopulation, \(\textrm{CovTotal}(z, w[z])\), can be partitioned into two components (Price 1972):

  1. average individual selection within populations, \(\textrm{CovIndividual}(z,w[z]) = \Sigma j\textrm{Cov}j(z, w[z])/T\); and
  2. group selection among populations, \(\textrm{CovGroup}(Z, W[Z])\).

This simple partitioning gave us a method for empirically comparing the relative strengths of individual and group selection. (Wade 2016: 88)

Recall that the Price EQ, in its single-level form,

\[\Delta z = \textrm{Cov}(\omega i , zi ) + E(\omega i\Delta zi )\]

represents the change in (the mean state of) a character, through the equation with this right-hand side, (where this first term on the right-hand side of the equation is usually called the selection term), which shows the covariance of the character, \(z\), and the reproductive output of the entity manifesting the trait. The second term, often called the transmission-bias term, measures the extent to which the character of the offspring entities, on average, zbar prime, is different from the parent.

One usual way, a simple alternative to the one introduced above, to write about the multilevel representation of the Price EQ is as follows, where \(Z\) is a character-trait of the higher-level collective, \(k\) is an index individual of the collective, and the (relative) reproductive success of the collective is \(\Omega{:}\)

\[\Delta Z = \textrm{Cov}(\Omega k , Zk ) + E(\Omega k \Delta Zk )\]

In this upper-level form, the left-hand term of the right-hand side of the equation is called “the between-higher-level (or between-collective) selection term”, while the far right-hand term is “the within-collective selection term”, conventionally (see, e.g., Sober & Wilson 1998). And whether or not the higher-level trait or fitnesses are aggregate or more complex relationships of the individual/particle level features, is a vexed issue (Okasha 2006; Lloyd 1988[1994]; Hamilton 1975; Sober & Wilson 1998; Gould 2002).

But notice what has happened here, in moving back and forth between the individual level and the multilevel representations of selection using the Price Eq. What is all about heredity—the “transmission-bias term”—right-hand term in the single-layer Price Eq., turns into a selection right-hand term in the two-layer or multilevel Price Eq, and thus, all about a selection process: “the within-collective selection term” (Sober & Wilson 1998); (I thank J. R. Griesemer for bringing this point to my attention; Price was aware of this weakness of his formalism, which is one reason he did not think his “toy” model-type applicable in real biological situations).[62]

Does this mean that we have confused an inheritance process—reproduction—with lower-level selection, in the process of our formalizing and generalizing the theory!? Or…? We might understand the two causal evolutionary processes, of inheritance of individual-level traits, vs. selection of lower-level entities, on distinct levels of organization, as “entangled”.

As Griesemer put it, pointedly:

that’s conflation if you call the expectation term an “inheritance” term but “entanglement” if you treat it as a representation of a hierarchical structure that slices across perspectives (sensu Wimsatt on “interactional complexity” 2007)[63]

Thus, this might be an explanation of why so many researchers from the Adaptationist/KS school do mix together into one thing the requirements for the interactor functional role and the requirements for manifestor-of-adaptation, as documented throughout this entry.

As such, it might provide yet a further argument (see Earnshaw 2015) to abandon the Price EQ formalism as a good way to represent any multilevel selection process, whether KS or GS or species/lineage selection; it predicts the entanglement of causal processes that most analysts are trying to keep distinct! In other words, the tool is inappropriate for the job. Why not use the available tools (contextual analysis and any other causal analytical tools, such as graph theory (Otsuka 2016a, 2019a,b), as the Evolutionary Change biologists do? This remains an open question concerning best methods.

Today, the most urgent questions about the interrelations of genic and multilevel selection models and model-types revolve around two distinct RQs (Research Questions) that are of concern to both schools (Kramer & Meunier 2016). The first concerns the key relationships between the models themselves: including genic, kin-, and inclusive fitness selection models and model-types from the Adaptationist school, and group-, and multilevel selection model-types from the Evolutionary Change school. Let us put it like this:

Are kin selection (KS) as well as inclusive fitness, and group selection (GS) model-types, equivalent, formally (i.e., mathematically), empirically, conceptually, and/or explanatorily?

The kin selectionist or Adaptationist school, tends to say that these two types of models, KS/genic/inclusive fitness and multilevel/GS, are fully formally (i.e., mathematically) equivalent alternatives, and the researchers usually conclude from that ostensible formal equivalence a kind of pragmatic equivalence; for example, ‘use whichever model-type suits your project better’.[64]

The basic prediction of KS theory is that social behavior, especially social behavior that benefits others, should correlate with genetic relatedness or similarity. This is commonly expressed through Hamilton’s rule, \(rb > c,\) where \(r\) is relatedness, \(b\) is the benefit that behavior offers the conspecific, and \(c\) is the cost to the actor.[65] The critics following Hamilton, i.e., claiming that KS is a form of GS, assert that Hamilton’s rule “almost never holds” (Nowak et al. 2010: 1059). Their opponents claim the opposite: that it is incorrect to claim that Hamilton’s rule requires restrictive assumptions, or that it almost never holds. On the contrary, they claim, it holds a great deal of the time (Gardner, West, & Wild 2011). On one philosophical analysis, there are three distinct versions of Hamilton’s rule, and three distinct versions of kin selection theory under discussion; thus the various parties are talking past one another (Birch & Okasha 2015).

Various equivalences and non-equivalences among the key model-types are discussed by researchers from both schools (see Adaptationist/KS works by Foster 2004; Okasha 2006; 2018; and Evolutionary Change books by Wade 1985, 1996, 2016; Simon 2014). Discussions by philosophers such as Earnshaw have highlighted some distinctive non-equivalences in methods (2015), arguing that the methods favored by the Adaptationist/KS school (such as applying the Price Eqs) obscure important relationships (see examples of this in Bourrat 2021a,b; Queller 1992, 2011; discussion in Van Veelen et al. 2009a,b, 2012).

Among the Adaptationist/KS school, the claims to complete “equivalence” of genic, kin selection, inclusive fitness, and multilevel or GS models, are usually taken to signify complete mathematical, conceptual, and explanatory equivalence of the modeled evolutionary systems, a claim contested by Evolutionary Change theorists.

As an illustration of this approach, West et al. describe the Adaptationist/KS school view in vivid detail: arguing that one

…source of confusion is the incorrect idea that inclusive fitness theory or kin selection are … just special cases of, new group selection…. Perhaps most importantly, there is no biological model or empirical example that can be explained with the new group selection approach, that cannot also be understood in terms of kin selection and inclusive fitness. (West, Griffin, & Gardner 2007: 425; emphasis added)[66]

The introduction of this name, “new group selection”, by the Adaptationist/KS school, to refer to the 1970s–2000s’s theoretical and empirical developments of Evolutionary Change theory, distinct from KS, was often accompanied by a complete erasure of the actual history of multilevel selection theory, as descended from and continuous with the work of Sewall Wright, most specifically his work on evolution in structured populations, and especially the evolution of organismic adaptations within demes in such structured populations (1931, 1938, 1945, 1960).

This ahistorical approach is complemented by a replacement, fictional history that includes having multilevel selection theory developed, ab initio and ex nihilo, by Hamilton in the early 1960s. Some examples:

Historically, MLS [multi-level selection] and kin selection theory were developed to address “altruism”: the question of why an organism should engage in behaviours that seem to reduce its own expected reproductive success but which aids that of others (Hamilton 1963, 1964). (Earnshaw 2015: 308)

Hamilton helped to found a field that shows how natural selection can act at any level of biological organization. (Foster 2011: 193; citing D.S. Wilson 1975 and Okasha 2006 for this claim.)

In any case, as well as being contested by some within the Adaptationist/KS school (e.g., Thies & Watson 2021),[67] those who claim full equivalence tend to ignore the applications of the relevant GS models from Evolutionary Change genetic results (e.g., Wade & Breden 1981), which produce easy maintenance of cooperation and altruism through GS and avoid the “cheater fallacy”; instead they argue that “only kin selection allows an easy solution” to evolutionary problems producing cooperation and altruism (West, Griffin, & Gardner 2008; West, El Mouden, & Gardner 2011, see conflicting results below). Group selectionist claims are also e.g., rebutted by Marshall 2011, who gives a particularly succinct summary of this argument, using Price Eq and modifications of Hamilton’s rule, see also Queller 1992, highlighting issues with Price Eq.[68]).

In answer to the equivalence RQs, the Evolutionary Change school tends to say, first, that the model-types are not conceptually or explanatorily equivalent, and sometimes not even mathematically equivalent,[69] or empirically equivalent. For example, mathematical geneticist Feldman et al. note:

[T]he comparison between those fertility models interpretable in terms of individual fitness effects, and the simple symmetric case that cannot be so interpreted, underscores that the simplest interactions between individuals in the process of selection can produce evolutionary conclusions not expected from standard individual fitness [genic] models. (Feldman, Christiansen, & Liberman 1983: 1009)

Moreover, the Evolutionary Change biologists sometimes add, the Adaptationist/KS practitioners may not truly understand the models and structure of the model-types, and therefore think that they are equivalent in a number of ways, when they are not (Lloyd & Feldman 2002; Lloyd, Lewontin, & Feldman 2008; Wade 2016; Goodnight 2015).[70]

When these equivalence RQs about genic and multilevel selection models and model-types are discussed in the philosophical literature, much has depended on citing the work of Dugatkin and Reeve in establishing this formal equivalence (Dugatkin & Reeve 1994; Sterelny 1996a, Sterelny 1996b: 577; Sober & Wilson 1998: 57, 98–99; Sterelny & Griffiths 1999: 168–169, 172; B. Kerr and Godfrey-Smith 2002: 479, 508; Waters 2005: 312; Okasha 2006). However, Dugatkin and Reeve’s very plain prediction of allele frequencies is an extremely simplistic method for assessing formal model or model-type equivalence, which pays little mind to the details of the model and model-types themselves or their dynamics.

Because allelic parameters and the changes in allelic frequencies depend on genotypic fitnesses, the genic model-types claimed to be equivalent to the hierarchical or multilevel model-types are neither parametrically nor dynamically sufficient (Dugatkin & Reeve 1994; compare Bijma & Wade 2008; Simon 2014; Lewontin 1974). Thus, the claimed equivalence seems to be based on conceptual and theoretical errors or mis-identifications.

This citation practice continues in philosophy today, as part of a claim to a metaphysical or epistemic (or methodological) conventionalism, without addressing the empirical and dynamical issues challenging the claimed failures of equivalences in both biology and philosophy (see §4.4).[71]

As an example of theoretical misunderstanding of the genetics and evolutionary models, those supporting the Adaptationist/KS school in the 1970s were taken to task by a founder of evolutionary genetics for mistakenly jumping to the conclusion that because group engineering adaptations might be rare, that “natural selection is practically wholly genic” (S. Wright 1980: 841; Ågren 2021b).[72] This is a fair criticism of the Adaptationist/KS school logic and record; for decades, critics of GS never considered groups as interactors, only as interactors-cum-manifestors, and this mistaken practice continues today in many animal behavior research groups.

Some leading Adaptationist/KS school genic selectionists did later acknowledge the significance of the interactor/manifestor-of-adaptation distinction RQs at the group level (G. C. Williams 1990: 504, above; 1992; Maynard Smith 1987: 123; 2001: 1497), but their distinctions are not widely shared among Adaptationist/KS school advocates. Despite the views of these leading theorists, the Adaptationist school maintains a bias towards using KS to model all selection processes involving collectives, therefore leaving GS effectively replaced by KS.[73] But see Hamilton (1975), the originator of KS theory, who argues the opposite (in contradiction to West, Griffin, & Gardner 2007, 2008, quoted above; also West, El Mouden, & Gardner 2011).

And when we consider the Wrightian, Evolutionary Change approach of multilevel selection model-types’ empirical accomplishments, it may be difficult, at first, to understand the resistance of the Adaptationist/KS school.[74] Overall, the Evolutionary Change school has demonstrated that populations respond rapidly to experimentally imposed group selection, and that very commonly occurring indirect genetic effects (IGEs) are primarily responsible for the strength and effectiveness of group selection experiments, perhaps surprising, considering the many claims of the “full mathematical equivalence” between multilevel selection models and kin/genic selection models of these same systems that do not show such phenomena.[75]

Also significant are the field studies using contextual analysis that have shown that effective and powerful multilevel selection is far more common in nature than previously expected (Goodnight 2013; e.g., Stevens, Goodnight, & Kalisz 1995; Tsuji 1995; Aspi et al. 2003; Eldakar et al. 2010; Wade 2016). Many of these traits are involved in cooperative behaviors, functions integrated at the organismic level, and sometimes group benefits due to group selection (i.e., with group-level manifestors; Davidson et al. 2016; Suárez & Triviño 2020; Seeley 1997); see, for example, Muir’s cooperative chicken evolution by group selection, discussed below (J. Craig & Muir 1996; Muir 2005; Wade, Bijma, et al. 2010; see Shaffer et al. 2016; Fewell & Page 2000). But these results have much bearing on the next RQ.

The other leading Research Question involving GS today, primarily significant for the Adaptationist/KS school, is:

Does or can Group Selection lead to Group Adaptation?[76]

Let us reconsider the two interwoven RQs of a typical Adaptationist/KS school multilevel research problem (section 3):

  • First: Identify an equilibrium/optimal higher-level trait which is an engineering adaptation, i.e., a manifestor-of-adaptation, and which is unlikely to evolve by selection of the lower-level entity traits, that is assumed to oppose it.
  • Second: Characterize a KS or inclusive fitness model/process, in which this engineering upper-level-optimal adaptation could have evolved against the pressures of the lower-level entities’ selective processes.

We can see immediately now why kin selectionists/Adaptationist school practitioners find a common Evolutionary Change approach to higher-level selection unsatisfactory. Because Adaptationist school theorists are primarily interested in detecting and explaining higher-level manifestors of engineering adaptation, then simply modeling the changes of higher-level interactors, as the Evolutionary Change school predominantly aims to do, will be inadequate; it won’t answer either of the RQs stated immediately above.[77]

Many using an Adaptationist/KS school approach persist in conflating GS itself with the combination of the two functional roles (e.g., Ramsey & Brandon 2011). A vivid example of such confusion is the requirement, imposed nearly universally in the Adaptationist School, that selection favoring the higher-level trait of an interactor must always work opposing selection favoring the component or lower-level traits of the interactors making up those groups (Maynard Smith 1976; West, El Mouden, & Gardner 2011; contrast Wade 1978; 2016).[78]

However, because GS model-types allow us to model a very wide variety of processes and systems compared to an Adaptationist/KS approach, including many relevant to the evolution of social behavior, Evolutionary Change theorists have often argued that their theoretical and empirical findings are important for the Adaptationist school to comprehend and use (Goodnight 2015; Goodnight & Stevens 1997). For example, an Evolutionary Change biologist concludes, forcefully, that if we follow Maynard Smith’s distinction between KS and GS:

… then this [experimental, empirical] study illustrates that group selection is more favorable for the evolution of social behaviors than is kin selection. To the extent that morphology, physiology, and development affect the manifestation of social behaviors, then these traits will also be influenced in their evolution by population structure. (Wade 1980b: 854; emphasis added)[79]

This is an instance of the fact that KS usually relies upon different model-assumptions about population structure than intergroup selection (Hamilton 1975; Grafen 1984, 2014; Wade 1980a, 1985); hence, it may be possible to determine which explanation or model is more likely accurately describing the population structure (Wade 2016; Ketcham 2018; for general criticism of pluralism in GS, see Shavit 2005; see also Gordon 2023; Davidson et al. 2016 for an enactment of some of these GS dynamics in ants).[80] In other words, the empirical evaluation of population structure, specifically, in models, can be a crucial part of model evaluation and confirmation.[81]

Another Evolutionary Change school example demonstrates the power of GS and its population structures on both organismic and group traits in recent commercial breeding of the domestic chicken. Chicken breeders had long selected for even tiny improvements (approx. 1%) in egg-laying rates of domesticated hens, which had not recently improved, due to conflict among hens, with high mortality rates; this led to the practice of burning their beaks off. However, when these breeders took a GS approach, selecting hen groups that got along comparatively better, this produced not only “kinder, gentler” hens, but also an improved egg-laying productivity up to 60% in only 6 generations (Muir 1996; Cheng & Muir 2005; Wade, Bijma, et al. 2010). This demonstrated both the group and organismic selective and adaptive power of GS regimes. Colony-level bee and ant adaptations are other good examples of group- or higher-level adaptations arising from higher-level selection processes (see discussion in Seeley 1997; Davidson et al. 2016; Gordon 2014). Lamm and Kolodny (2022) recently proposed a concept of “distributed adaptation”, which we may interpret as group-level engineering adaptations obtained through processes of individual and higher-level selection.[82] Shifting the focus to groups gives access to new sources of genetic, heritable variation available for breeders to manipulate.[83]

Finally, for another crucial but underappreciated contribution from the Evolutionary Change theorists to the Adaptationist/KS school problems, consider the so-called free rider problems with kin and GS, such as those seen or set up by evolutionists puzzling over the evolution of altruism and the purported problems with cheaters to cooperation. Evolutionary Change theorists have repeatedly demonstrated that these free rider problems are pseudo-problems based on misconceptions (Breden & Wade 1991; Wade 2016; see also Bowles & Gintis 2011; Planer 2015; Sterelny 2012; see Lloyd & Wade 2019 on mutualism selected as a runaway process, rather than selfishness).

Take a population mostly made up of altruists that have evolved by GS, e.g., as described by Hamilton 1975. Those from the Adaptationist/KS school claim that such populations are constantly under threat of destruction by cheaters—individuals that enjoy the fitness benefits of altruistic behavior by others, but do not pay the costs by performing it themselves, in Hamilton’s terms.

According to Wade and Breden (1981), a “selfish” mutation is no threat to the population of altruists.[84] Take a population divided into groups with A, an altruistic gene with fitness costs and benefits following Hamilton’s rule. Mutation introduces a mutant copy, a, into the population, and a heterozygous individual carrying this mutation does not behave as altruistically as others, but reaps the fitness benefits from them, and is thus at a selective advantage relative to altruists within its own group. Does this selfish gene spread through the metapopulation, destroying the social system, as claimed by the Adaptationist school? Wade answers:

No it does not. Felix [Breden] and I showed that it spreads if, and only if, \((1/2k)b \textrm{Total} < c\) (Wade & Breden 1981; Breden & Wade 1981). This is the opposite of Hamilton’s Rule, the condition necessary for the existence of the altruistic system in the first place…. Hamilton’s Rule gives the conditions for a single altruist to invade and replace a population of “original” cheaters. As long as it holds, mutant cheaters share the fate of the original cheaters—they are replaced by altruists.[85] (Wade 2016: 146–147)

There is thus an evolutionary equilibrium level of cheaters at a kin selection-mutation balance, analogous to the usual mutation-selection balance, which depends on the strength of group selection. Wade concludes very straightforwardly:

The perception that cheaters are a relentless threat to complex social systems is a fallacyIf Hamilton’s Rule were correctly grasped as the condition necessary for group selection to outweigh opposing individual selection (as Hamilton himself [1975] recognized), the cheater fallacy would have been laid to rest a long time ago. (2016: 147; emphasis added)

As we shall see in Section 4.6, these very biases in the evolutionary dynamics of interaction—in that case, between multi-species consortia, in place of multi-organismic populations—are an important feature of the former’s dynamics, and could contribute to explaining the absence of cheaters from natural mutualisms—established recently, see below—although cheaters are predicted as inevitable by gene-centered conflict theory to cause the strong evolutionary instability of such mutualisms (see, e.g., Foster et al. 2017).

As we have just seen in this section, according to the Evolutionary Change school, the predicted problems with GS and KS model-types from cheaters were based on a fallacy: It turns out that these expected cheaters also could not be found in nature, when those researchers most committed to their existence went to find them, using their best tools. Testing their own “best-studied” and routinely-taught exemplars of cheaters among mutualisms in nature for fulfillment of their own best theoretical requirements for cheaters, Jones and more than a dozen other Adaptationist/KS biologists conclude, in their own words:

We find … there is currently very little support from fitness data that any of these meet our criteria to be considered cheaters. (2015: 1270, emphasis added; see §4.6 for further discussion)

On the other hand, the Evolutionary Change school’s epigenetics community genetics model-type easily explains the experimental results this group found in this failed search for cheaters-in-nature experiment.[86]

Additionally, it may help explain the more frequent origin of mutualisms from parasitic than from free-living systems, an evolutionary trajectory opposite to that predicted by the Adaptationist/KS school’s genome conflict theory.

4.2 Species Selection

Ambiguities about the definition of a unit of selection have also snarled the debate about selection processes at the species level. By the 1970s several leading paleontologists had claimed that species must have higher-level “emergent properties”—by which they meant species-level engineering adaptations—in order to serve as genuine higher-level “units of selection” in a multilevel evolutionary process. Species selection thus succumbed for a time to the same confusions as GS had, conflating these two RQs: Do species function as interactors, playing an active and significant role in evolution by selection? And does the evolution of species-level interactors produce (and assume) species-level engineering adaptations (and, if so, how often)?

See especially, for example, Vrba’s demand for “emergent properties” at the species level, explicitly inspired by Maynard Smith’s demanding analysis of GS (Vrba 1984: 319; Maynard Smith 1976). This amounts to assuming that there must be a group-level engineering adaptation in order to say that group selection can occur, an early-Williams-style objection that both Maynard Smith and Williams later abandoned, as illustrated in §4.1 (G. C. Williams 1990, 1992; Maynard Smith 1987; 2001), but this dual requirement for both interactor and manifestor at a higher level was carried over into early-mid species selection discussions, although not in those terms.

For the early history of the species selection debate, then, asking whether species could be units of selection meant asking a combination of whether they fulfill both the interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation roles, based directly on that argument from GS (Vrba 1983: 388; 1984; Vrba & Gould 1986; Vrba & Eldredge 1984; Eldredge 1985; see also Sober 1984: 367–368; Cracraft 1985: 225).

For example, certain cases are rejected as higher-level selection processes because

frequencies of the properties of lower-level individuals which are part of a high-level individual simply do not make convincing higher-level adaptations. (Eldredge 1985: 133)

Such an “emergent” character may be the result of a selection process at the species level, but it should not be treated as a pre-condition of such a process. As Heisler and Damuth put it:

The issue is not whether some characters are emergent or not; the issue is the relationship between the characters and fitness (Heisler & Damuth 1987). (Damuth & Heisler 1988: 418)

Neither group effects on organismic fitness, nor emergent group characters, are necessary for selection to occur at the level of groups in nature, which may involve any characters of the higher-level group.[87]

Consider the lineage-wide trait of variability. Treating species and lineages as interactors has a long tradition (Dobzhansky 1956; Thoday 1953; Lewontin 1958; Lloyd 1988[1994]; from here on within this discussion, I will just refer to “species” to signify both species and lineages). If species are conceived as interactors (and not necessarily manifestors), then the notion of species selection is not vulnerable to the original anti group-selection objections from the early genic-selectionists (Maynard Smith 1976, 2001; G. C. Williams 1966; 1992), as they later agreed.[88] Thoday’s old idea was that lineages with certain properties of being able to respond to environmental stresses would be selected for, and thus that the trait of variability itself would be selected for and would spread in the population of populations or species. In other words, lineages were treated as interactors. The earlier researchers spoke loosely of “adaptations” where they seemingly meant product-of-selection adaptations.

These early researchers were explicitly not concerned with the effect of species selection on organismic level traits but with the fitness effect on species- and lineage-level characters such as speciation rates, lineage-level survival, and extinction rates of species. Some argued that this sort of case represents a perfectly good form of species selection, using so-called “emergent fitnesses” (Lloyd 1988[1994]),[89] even though some balk at the thought that lineage-level variability would then be considered, under a product-of-selection definition, a species-level adaptation; see discussion in Gould 2002; Ketcham 2018; Grantham 1995). Hautmann noted:

An important argument in favour of the “emergent fitness concept” is that species selection acting on aggregate organismic traits can theoretically oppose selection at the organismic level and is therefore not reducible to this level (Grantham 1995). (2020: 3 of 11)

Paleontologists used this approach to species selection, e.g., in their research on fossil gastropods, looking at relationships between lineage ranges and trait variabilities (Jablonski 1987, 2008; Jablonski & Hunt 2006; Erwin 2000; Sepkoski 2020; see recent study of dynamics of these in Freedberg, Urban, & Cunniff 2021); the approach has also been used in the leading text on speciation (Coyne & Orr 2004).[90] The variabilities associated with increased or variable sized ranges have been explored along these lines, as well.[91]

While species geographic range is well-established as an interactor trait (e.g., Nanninga & Manica 2018), it has been noted that

A variety of other traits [beyond geographic range size] have been examined (reviewed in Coyne & Orr 2004; Jablonski 2008; Dynesius & Jansson 2014), many of which might covary with demographic controls. These results are consistent with links between demography and speciation rates. (Harvey, Singhal, & Rabosky 2019: 83)

Ultimately, the current widely-accepted definition of species selection among the scientists is consistent with an interactor interpretation of a unit of selection (in addition to those just discussed: Vrba 1989; Lieberman & Vrba 2005; Jablonski 2008; 2017a,b; Erwin 2000; Polly et al. 2017; Anderegg et al. 2019; Benito Garzón, Robson, & Hampe 2019).

4.3 Genic Selectionism

One may understandably think that the early genic selectionists were interested in the replicator version of the reproducer question—that is, what entity is the replicator?—because of their claims that the unit of selection ought to be the replicator. This would be a mistake. Rather, the primary interest is in a specific ontological question about benefit (Dawkins 1976, 1982a,b), (§2.4), and the answer to that question dictates the answers to the other three “units” questions delineated in Section 2.

Briefly, because replicators are the only entities that “survive” the evolutionary process, they must be the long-term beneficiaries (Dawkins 1982a,b). What happens in the process of evolution by natural selection happens for their sake, for their benefit. Hence, interactors interact for the replicators’ benefit, and adaptations belong, ultimately, to the replicators. Replicators are the only entities with real agency as initiators of causal chains that lead to the phenotypes; hence, they accrue the credit and are the real units of selection.

This version of the answer to “the” units of selection question amounts to a combination of the beneficiary question plus the manifestor-of-adaptation question—plus the interactor question, because a manifestor must also be an interactor in an evolution-by-selection process. Dawkins’ argument is that people who focus on interactors in isolation—as so many do, who are studying the dynamics of evolutionary change—or on organismic-level adaptations, as many from the Adaptationist/KS and Evolutionary Change schools both do, are laboring under a misunderstanding of evolutionary theory (Dawkins 1976, 1982a,b).

In what follows, two aspects of Dawkins’ specific version of the units of selection problem shall be characterized. I clarify the key issues of interest to Dawkins and relate these to the issues of interest to others.

There are two mistakes that Dawkins is not making. First, he states explicitly that genes or other replicators/reproducers do not “literally face the cutting edge of natural selection. It is their phenotypic effects that are the proximal subjects of selection” (1982a: 47). Thus, he emphasizes that interactors (understood under Hull’s, Brandon’s, and Lloyd’s definition) are necessary for the evolutionary process; it is not necessary to believe that replicators are directly “visible” to selection forces (1982b: 176; contra Gould 1977; Istvan 2013). Moreover, he argues the debate about group versus organismic selection is “a factual dispute about the level at which selection is most effective in nature”, whereas his own point is “about what we ought to mean when we talk about a unit of selection” (1982a: 46).[92] We shall return to this issue in section 4.4, Genic Pluralists.

Second, Dawkins does not specify how large a chunk of the genome he will allow as a replicator; there is no commitment to the notion that single exons are the only possible replicators/reproducers (see §2.2 Replicators/Reproducer Question).[93]

On what basis, then, does Dawkins reject the importance of the research questions about interactors (§2.1, §3, §§4.1–4.6) and/or manifestors (§2.3, §3, §§4.1–4.6)? The answer lies in the particular question in which he is solely interested, namely, What is “the nature of the entity for whose benefit adaptations may be said to exist?”[94]

When Dawkins refers to “adaptations”, he is always referring to engineering adaptations. Moreover, he rejects the notion that the individual organism or group that exhibits the adaptive phenotypic trait can be the “beneficiary” he seeks, (see G. C. Williams 1966; §2.3, §2.4, §3, §§4.1–4.6),[95] because a true unit of selection must also be “the unit that actually survives or fails to survive” the evolution-by-selection process (Dawkins 1982a: 60). Because organisms, groups, and even genomes do not actually survive the evolution-by-selection process, the answer to the survival question must be the replicator/reproducer, Dawkins reasons.[96]

Strictly speaking, this is false, under Dawkins’ definition of a replicator; it is copies of the replicators that survive—or rather, Griesemer’s biologically-continuous reproducers, section 2.2; compare Griesemer (1998, 2000a,b,c, 2003, 2005, 2016) on reproduction and the evolution-by-selection process, which imposes the significant distinction between “replicator” and “reproducer”.

The important point for Dawkins is the claim that replicators—in some formal sense, and reproducers, in the biological sense—are the only long-term survivors of the evolution-by-selection process—and more specifically, the evolution-of-engineering-adaptation process; this automatically answers also the question of who manifests the adaptations.[97]

But there is still a problem with putting the reproducer/replicator at the heart of the process. Although this conclusion is:

there should be no controversy over replicators versus vehicles. Replicator survival and vehicle selection are two aspects of the same process, (Dawkins 1982a: 60)

the genic selectionist does not just leave the vehicle selection debate alone. Instead, the argument is advanced that we do not need the concept of discrete vehicles at all. We shall investigate this idea also in section 4.4 Genic Pluralisms.

It is crucial to notice that Dawkins’ argument against “the vehicle concept”, concerns exclusively an argument against the desirability of seeing the individual organism as the vehicle. The narrowness of this point is lost on the genic pluralists, to their detriment.

Dawkins’ target is explicitly those who hold what he calls the “Central Theorem”, i.e., that individual organisms should be seen as maximizing their own inclusive fitness (1982b: 5, 55). But it is inappropriate always, Dawkins argues, to ask how an organism’s behavior benefits that organism’s inclusive fitness.[98] Dawkins warns, “theoretical dangers attend the assumption that adaptations are for the good of…the individual organism” (1982b: 91). The precise view being criticized by early genic selectionists thus assumes that the individual organism is the interactor, and the beneficiary, and the manifestor of adaptation (Lloyd 1988 [1994]).

These arguments are indeed damaging to the Central Theorem, but they are ineffective against all other approaches that define the functional interactor role more generally, that is, with entities as interactors up and down the biological hierarchy, whether or not these are also seen as engineering adaptations (see §3, §§4.1–4.6). These issues highlight why it is important not to conflate RQs about units of selection with questions about biological individuality[99] (see the entry on biological individuals).

In sum,[100] Dawkins has identified or assumed four distinct meanings of a unit of selection as necessary for something to be a unit of selection—replicator (corrected to reproducer), long-term, ultimate beneficiary, ultimate manifestor of adaptation, and the making (i.e., agency) of its own interactor or vehicle’s traits (including engineering adaptations). The issue of lower-level agency and manifestor of adaptation in this context has been revived recently in philosophical discussion (Okasha 2018).

In Section 4.4, we will consider some relatively more recent work in which genic selectionism is defended through a pluralist approach to modeling. What matters in their final analysis, though, is exactly the same, and that is the search for the ultimate beneficiary of the evolution by selection process. [[please add Links listed in NOTES 99 and 100 for this page]]

4.4 Genic Pluralism

The original genic selectionists had objections (§4.3), to the interactor role in evolution. They admitted that such “vehicles” were necessary for the evolution-by-selection processes, but accorded them no weight as “units of selection”, because they were not the “ultimate beneficiary”. Soon, there appeared to be a new angle available.[101]

“Genic pluralism” attempts to bypass the challenges of the relationships among reproducer and interactor RQs by effectively turning genes into interactors (Waters 1986; Sterelny & Kitcher 1988). There are thus two “images” of natural selection, presented as similar to a “Necker cube”: (1) the usual multilevel one in which selection models are given in terms of reproducer success via a hierarchy of interactors and possibly manifestors, interfacing with their traits’ environments, up and down the biological hierarchy (§3, §4.1). And (2)—here you imagine the flipped image of a Necker cube—is given in terms of replicators [genes or equivalent reproducers] having properties that affect their abilities to leave copies of themselves, while seeing only these “ultimate beneficiaries” in the interactor roles, with genic causal/interactive traits in various layered “environments”.[102] When not done in a special, derivative, way, these latter are usually called interactors, but are now called “genic environments”.

For example, take the claim that

All selective episodes (or, perhaps, almost all) can be interpreted in terms of genic selection. That is an important fact about natural selection. (Kitcher, Sterelny, & Waters 1990: 160)

What exactly is meant by this? We are reminded strongly of many in the Adaptationist school’s claims about the mathematical, explanatory, and pragmatic equivalence of group selection models with kin selection/genic/inclusive fitness models, such as West, El Mouden, & Gardner’s 2011 false claims discussed in §4.1 (Wade 1996; 2016). And indeed, in the philosophical context, much attention is paid to showing that the two model-types in question—genic and Evolutionary Change school’s multilevel ones—can represent certain patterns of selection equally well, once underpinned with all the relevant theoretical, statistical, and empirical information. This is argued for using both specific examples and schema for translating multilevel models into genic ones. We briefly review how this is done, and then ask: But what exactly is accomplished by demonstrating such a translation, theoretically, metaphysically, biologically, or philosophically?

In a classic account of the efficacy of multilevel selection, starting with interdemic selection—the t-allele case that even G. C. Williams acknowledged was group selection—Lewontin & Dunn 1960 and Lewontin 1962 found first, in this t-allele mouse example, that there was allelic selection; Second, they also found genotypic selection; Third, they also found a substantial effect of interdemic selection in the form of group extinction because female mice would often find themselves in groups in which all males were sterile, and the group itself would therefore go extinct. Establishing these facts and relations, then, is how a genuine and empirically robust multilevel, interdemic, plus organismic, plus genic selection model was discovered, empirically explored, and developed (Lewontin & Dunn 1960 and Lewontin 1962).

The key to understanding the genic reinterpretation of this multilevel selection model type is to grasp that the pluralists use a concept of genic environment that their critics ignore. The pluralists explain how to “construct”—actually, reconstruct—a genic model representing the evolutionary causes responsible for the frequency of the t-allele. This is done by treating the information about interactors in the multilevel model (gained using the interactor-identifying tools), as “genic environments” in the new genic-level models.[103]

Something philosophically significant is meant to follow from the claims that multilevel Evolutionary Change or KS models’ interactors can be reformulated or renamed in terms of the genic/replicator level entities and their reconstituted hierarchical properties. These ostensible equivalences between multilevel and genic model-types are actually very controversial, as reviewed in Section 4.1, and have been resisted on a variety of grounds.[104]

But, assuming that the genic reformulated interpretations of the multilevel models’ structures have been accepted, the big payoff—both philosophical and biological—of the genic causal point of view—and note that the causal level is simply assumed in virtue of the allelic state space—is claimed to be:

Once the possibility of many, equally adequate, representations of evolutionary processes has been recognized, philosophers and biologists can turn their attention to more serious projects than that of quibbling about the real unit of selection. (Kitcher, Sterelny, & Waters 1990: 161; emphasis added)

By “quibbling about the real unit of selection”, here, the authors seem to be referring to the large literature in which evolutionists and philosophers have given concrete, empirical evidence and/or proposed standards for something to serve in the significantly distinct theoretical functional roles of an evolutionary interactor (and often also a manifestor of engineering adaptation), or a reproducer/replicator or a beneficiary—all instances of debates about “units of selection”—in an evolutionary causal selection process (§2, §3, §§4.1–4.6). This would, on the face of it, appear to be ordinary scientific practice for evolutionary biologists, but these philosophers would like to put a stop to it.

What interests the pluralist genic philosophers is a proposed equivalence between being able to tell the selection story one way: in terms of the functional, theoretical, roles of interactors, manifestors, and reproducers; and telling the “same” story another way: purely in terms of theoretical “genic agency”.

Significantly, however, neither Dawkins himself, nor Williams, argued to eliminate the role, existence, or importance of evolutionary interactors. Rather, both thought interactors (Dawkins’ vehicles) to be essential to understanding evolution-by-natural-selection processes. Thus, genic pluralists have fundamentally over-reached. The pluralists attack the view that

for any selection process, there is a uniquely correct identification of the operative selective forces and the level at which each impinges. (Waters 1991: 553)

Rather, they claim, “We believe that asking about the real unit of selection is an exercise in muddled metaphysics” (emphasis added; Kitcher, Sterelny, & Waters 1990: 159), because “the causes of one and the same selection process can be correctly described at different levels”, including especially the genic one (Waters 1991: 555; emphasis added).

Moreover, these causal descriptions in purely genic terms, compared to multilevel models, are on equal ontological and empirical footing. Equal, that is, except for when Sterelny and Kitcher make the dogmatic statement that biologists or philosophers make an error to claim

that selection processes must be described in a particular way, and their error involves them in positing entities, “targets of selection”, that do not exist. (Sterelny & Kitcher 1988: 359; emphasis added)

“Targets of selection” are also known as interactors.

Thus, here, the genic pluralists are apparently denying the very existence of interactors in evolutionary selective processes altogether, a position much more radical than Dawkins’ or Williams’.

The pluralists thus are arguing against not only the utility, but also the existence, of any entity filling the functional, causal role of the evolutionary interactor in the evolution-by-selection process. They argue for this conclusion on the basis of their claim that all of these selection processes may be represented using purely their translated models of genic-level causes. But they apparently fail to comprehend that the complete, genic-level story cannot be told without taking the functional role of evolutionary interactors into account; thus the pluralists cannot avoid ‘quibbling about interactors’, as they desire (Dawkins 1982b; Brandon 1982; §4.1).

Recall what the interactor RQ amounts to: What levels of entities interact as a whole with their environment through their traits (at a given level of biological organization) in such a way that it makes a difference to reproducer/replicator success? (§2.1, §4.1). There has been much discussion about how to delineate, identify, and locate interactors among multilayered processes of selection, see above, §2.1, §3, §4.1, §4.2, but each approach generally takes the notion of the interactor as a necessary component to understanding an evolution by selection process, because it (Dawkins’ vehicle) is the locus of causal interaction between the phenotypic downstream product of a reproducer/replicator, and its environment (Dawkins 1976, 1982a,b; G. C. Williams 1966).

Or, put purely in Dawkins’ terms, most replicators’ phenotypic effects are represented in “vehicles” (interactors), which are themselves the “proximate targets of natural selection” (Dawkins 1982a: 62). For Dawkins, and this seems to also go for the genic pluralists, they simply do not want to consider such objects an answer to the essential units RQ, but rather prefer the answer isolating the ultimate beneficiary of the evolution-by-selection process as the sole “real unit of selection” (§2.4, §4.3).

Such a preference for answering the beneficiary question fails, however, to demonstrate that interactors (“targets of selection”) do not exist, as Dawkins knew, and thus they need to be explicitly and fully acknowledged in any complete account. As shown in §4.3, the only “vehicle”/interactor Dawkins was interested in arguing against was the animal behaviorist’s individual organism per se, as “maximizing its inclusive fitness”, in the “Central Theorem”; this is decidedly not a rejection of the general evolutionary functional role of interactors. Thus, this genic pluralists’ misreading of Dawkins is both particularly widespread, and profound.

Note that the pluralists use the identical methods for isolating relevant genic-level environments as others do for the isolating of interactors for multilevel genetic modeling. What, we may ask, is the real difference between the resulting models in the end? The genic pluralists call them “causal alternatives”, but in what sense are they truly different alternatives?

What is different is that the genic pluralists want to tell the causal story—discovered by investigating interactors and reproducers—in terms of genes alone (reproducer/replicators), and never in terms of interactors, despite the fact that these were necessary for the causal analyses. Moreover, they propose doing away with interactors altogether, by renaming or reconfiguring them as the genic-perspective-environments. Are we to believe that renaming certain essential model structures actually changes the metaphysics or meanings of the evolutionary causal model-type?

This issue concerning renaming of model structures is especially confusing in the genic pluralist presentations, because they repeatedly rely on an assumption or intuition that, by using an allelic state space, we are dealing with allelic causes. This assumption is easily traced back to the original genic selectionist views on units of selection (§4.3) that alleles are the ultimate beneficiaries of any long term selection process (G. C. Williams 1966; Dawkins 1976, 1982a,b).

Thus, the genic pluralist argument rests substantially, although almost invisibly, on a commitment regarding the supreme importance of the ultimate beneficiary question (§2.4, §2.3, §2.1; §3; §4.1, §4.3). It is unclear what interest it has for either evolutionary theorizing, model-building, or research, (beyond its corrective use for the “Central Theorem”, §4.3), and a further case for any philosophical or theoretical interest is not clearly made by the genic pluralists. They make a faulty—too radical—argument about the eliminability of interactors, and offer nothing else that Dawkins has not already given.

Thus, while the genic pluralists attempt to dismiss the debates about research involving identifying and finding interactors in selection as mere “quibbles”, and also claim such are without correct and incorrect answers, the genic pluralists need to know not only the research results into the multilevel interactors, but also the correct answers to interactor research questions in order to get their desired correct and accurate “allelic causes” in their genic models. Hence, how interactors are discerned/identified really matters, that is, it makes a metaphysical as well as practical, scientific, and epistemic difference, to them (Lloyd 2005).[105]).[106]

In sum, genic pluralism’s impact has been largely philosophical rather than biological. Within philosophy, critical responses to the genic pluralist position fall into two main categories: pragmatic and causal.

The pragmatic response to genic pluralism primarily notes that in any given selective scenario the genic perspective provides no information that is not available from the multilevel point of view. This state of affairs is taken by critics of this type as sufficient reason to prefer whichever perspective is most useful for solving the problems facing a particular researcher.[107]

The other primary philosophical response to genic pluralism is based on arguments concerning the problematic issues about the causal structure of selective episodes (and these concerns are actually shared by many biologists). While genic pluralism may indeed get the short-term “genetic book-keeping” correct, it does not, except through arbitrary renaming, or a kind of sleight-of-hand, and through blocking visibility of the essential interactor functional role, accurately reflect the evolutionary causal processes that bring about the result in question (see discussion in §4.1; Wimsatt 1980a,b).[108]

Let us summarize the consequences of the genic pluralists’ celebrated genic equivalences and their actual derivativeness, in terms of the science and metaphysics of the processes discussed.

First, the genic pluralists end up offering not, as they claim, a variety of genuinely diverse causal versions of the selection process at different levels. This is because the causes of the multilevel models, determined using ordinary statistical tools and definitions of evolutionary interactors in their functional roles, are simply renamed in the lower-level models, but remain fully intact as relevant evolutionary causes at the full range of higher and lower levels, regardless. Perhaps more importantly, no new allelic causes are introduced; they are simply renamed.

Second, while genic models may be derived from multilevel models, they fail to sustain the necessary supporting methodology. Third, the lack of genuine alternative causal accounts damages the particular claims of pluralism or, at least, of any interesting philosophical variety of theoretical, empirical, or competitive pluralism separate from this anatomy of different RQs. It is taken as given that there are a variety of ways to model many selection processes in population genetics; the key question here concerns specific information structured into those model-types and specific models. For example, a biologist and philosopher investigate various consequences of pursuing research using, alternatively, organismic and trait group models, and their paper is a useful modern application and explanation of Ilan Eschel’s 1972 neighbor selection work (B. Kerr & Godfrey-Smith 2002). But note that the authors help themselves at the start of the paper to all the higher-level causal relationship information they need.[109]

Thus, there are no genuine causal alternatives being presented at the genic level, unless you count renaming model structures as metaphysically or explanatorily significant (Okasha 2011, 2018; Sterelny & Kitcher 1988). It should be noted that this result does not, of course, eliminate the possibility of the genic level acting as interactors in any given case, such as meiotic drive (Lloyd 1986). See discussion in §4.1 and §4.3 on Genic Selectionism.

4.5 Units of Evolutionary Transition in Individuality

The units under analysis so far—be they genes, organisms, or populations—were seen as more or less on the same level of organization, before and after a given evolutionary process. “Evolutionary Transitions in Individuality” (ETI; also MET, “Major Transitions in Evolution”) present a unique set of complications to such assumptions within the units and levels debates. This topic is explored under several entries in the SEP: biological individuals, philosophy of macroevolution, evolutionary game theory. We emphasize its relations to the debates about units below.

New ETI Research Questions

Evolutionary transition is “the process that creates new levels of biological organization” (Griesemer 2000a: 69), such as the origins of chromosomes, multicellularity, eukaryotes, and social groups (Maynard-Smith & Szathmáry 1995: 6–7). These transitions all share a common feature, namely, “entities that were capable of independent replication before the transition can replicate only as part of a larger whole after it” (Maynard-Smith & Szathmáry 1995: 6). The claim is that these newly-reproducing, more-inclusive wholes must involve new evolutionary dynamics collecting and reproducing them over generations of the more-inclusive entities.

ETIs can evolve such new potential levels and units of selection, by creating new kinds of entities having the right sorts of relations among fitness and properties, or successful reproduction.[110] Such a task requires a diachronic perspective, one under which the properties of our currently extant units of selection cannot be presupposed or assumed. As Griesemer writes:

…[A]s long as evolutionary theory concerns [only] the function of contemporary units at fixed levels of the biological hierarchy…, the functionalist approach, [using evolutionary functional causal roles, e.g., of reproducers, interactors, beneficiaries, and manifestors], may be adequate to its intended task. However, if a philosophy of units is to address … problems of evolutionary transition, then a different approach is needed. (2003: 174)

Griesemer introduces and emphasizes the evolutionary functional role of the “reproducer” concept (§2.2) to expand the “replicator” role, which incorporates the processes of development into the units of selection; it is a step toward meeting the goal of addressing ETI, and

…the dependency of formerly independent replicators on the “replication” of the wholes—the basis for the definition of evolutionary transition … is a developmental dependency that should be incorporated into the analysis of units. (Griesemer 2000a: 75)

Thus, the reproducer concept was introduced to encompass such processes, expanding the notion of replicator (Griesemer 1998, 2000c). Griesemer emphasizes both development and materiality in his definition:

The process of reproduction can be analyzed as multiplication of material overlapping propagules that confer the capacity to develop, specified in terms of the minimum notion of development as acquisition of the capacity to reproduce. (2000c: 74)

Thinking in broader terms of reproducers avoids the presupposition of evolved coding mechanisms implicit to the original concept of replicators. In the case of ETI, this allows us to separate the basic development involved in the origin of a new biological level, from the later evolution of sophisticated developmental mechanisms for the “stabilization and maintenance of a new level of reproduction” (Griesemer 2000a: 77; 1998; 2005; 2014; 2016; Grosberg & Strathmann 1998).

We can see that, in their picture of the ETI group of RQs, Maynard Smith and Szathmáry ask an overarching question about units of selection from the Adaptationist/KS school perspective (1995):

Why did not natural selection, acting on entities at the lower level (replicating molecules, free-living prokaryotes, asexual protists, single cells, individual organisms), disrupt integration at the higher-level (chromosomes, eukaryotic cells, sexual species, multicellular organisms, societies)?

In delineating the possible and responsive answers to this RQ according to their preferred practices, Szathmáry and Maynard Smith state clearly their commitment to using a genic-centered approach—specifically, the cheater dynamics of an Adaptationist/KS genic approach (see §4.1 on “cheater fallacy”; also §§4.3–4.6):

The transitions must be explained in terms of immediate selective advantage to individual replicators: we are committed to the gene-centred approach outlined by G. C. Williams (1966), and made still more explicit by Dawkins (1976). (Maynard Smith & Szathmáry 1995: 8)

The notion is that higher levels of entities may be selected—i.e., be interactors, or perhaps even become attributed to genes. The fact that such Adaptationist/KS school researchers seem to be primarily focused on the unique reproductive capacities of the upper-level entity (expanded to, e.g., the multicellular organism, or family, or even superorganism, in ETI), explicitly to the detriment of lower-level entities (see Clarke 2013, 2016, who conflates multilevel selection and evolutionary transitions model-types and processes throughout work on this topic,[111] as do Sukhoverkhov & Gontier 2021;[112] or Okasha 2006, 2022) should not surprise us (e.g., Gardner 2015a,b). What is more surprising is that some insist that such genic adaptation-forming processes are the only major multilevel selection processes that produce or are involved in evolutionary change (contra §4.1, §4.2, §4.6).

On one analysis, the different stages of an evolutionary transition involve different conceptions and model-types of multi-level selection (Okasha 2006, 2015).[113] Under the first stage of multilevel selection (MLS1), the lower-level entities (usually organisms) are the interactors as well as the replicators/reproducers, while in MLS2, both the upper-level collectives as well as the lower-level entities are independent interactors. Thus, the issues surrounding evolutionary transitions involve both the interactor question and the reproducer question, at least. Unfortunately, as mentioned in §4.1, there is conflation of interactor with manifestor in both sources (Okasha 2006; Damuth & Heisler 1988), thus also tying both functional roles in with the reproducer RQ, confusing these issues.

On a different approach, ETI are seen as the appearance of a “new kind of Darwinian populations…. that can enter into Darwinian processes in their own right” (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 122; emphasis added). Both the two-fold and four-fold set of functional roles in evolutionary processes (isolated by either Dawkins & Hull, or Lloyd) are denied or neglected, and it is directly denied that a variety of distinct units of selection RQs exist (§§2.1–2.4, §3):

Questions about the “unit” of selection are not ambiguous; the units in a selection process are just the entities that make up a Darwinian population at that level. (Godfrey-Smith 2009: 111, emphasis added)

The characteristics of “the unit of selection” are then isolated (Godfrey-Smith 2009). In this view, as the essence of the process of natural selection is the existence of parent-offspring similarity between the elements that constitute a Darwinian population, the (“Unitary”[114]) unit of selection must be any element of a population of causally interacting elements where the elements have the capacity of forming parent-offspring lineages with at least a weak degree of parent-offspring similarity (i.e., individuals that have the “capacity to reproduce”, or “reproducers”, under a definition modified from Griesemer; see Godfrey-Smith 2016: 10120). These elements are referred to as Darwinian individuals[115], and to populations composed of Darwinian individuals as Darwinian populations.[116]

Generally, in ETIs, the higher-level entities or populations must engage in reproduction themselves, in which independent reproduction and evolution at the lower-level is suppressed, as Maynard Smith and Szathmáry emphasized. These processes all involve restrictions on the ability of the lower-level entities to function as interactors and replicators/reproducers, and the emergence of upper-level collectives as simultaneous interactors, manifestors, and replicators/reproducers. But that is not how Godfrey-Smith analyzes it.[117]

Thus, there is a variety of philosophical and biological approaches to analyzing ETI on offer, whether in terms of reproducers, multilevel selection, or Darwinian populations. The essential diachronic nature of the problem poses a challenge for modeling, and involves not just the interactor and replicator/reproducer questions, but also the questions of who is the beneficiary of the selection process, whether reproduction at the higher level constitutes a group-level engineering adaptation, and how that new level of coordinated trait emerges.

The clearest issues of interest emerging from these studies seem to be:

  1. that the introduction of the “reproducer” as an expansive concept of replicator was a major innovation (see Griesemer 1998, 2000c, 2003, 2005, with Godfrey Smith introducing a variation on this in 2009, 2016);
  2. the multilevel dynamics claimed to be appropriate in the “Evolutionary Transitions in Individuality” (ETI) tradition, (although the validity of these claims is under challenge), which focus on reproduction of the higher-level entity in coordination with suppression of its lower-level entity parts, seem not to be broadly applicable to multilevel evolution in general; to treat them as such introduces confusion into the debates about the units of selection, as we see in the following section on holobiont evolution.

4.6 Holobionts, and Demibionts

New ideas brought to notions of units of selection have grown out of work from Margulis, Buss, Bordenstein, Thies, O’Malley, Dupré, Griesemer, and evolutionary-developmental biologists such as Rudolf Raff and Scott Gilbert, part of it taken up in ecological community genetics modeling from the Evolutionary Change school, and led to a recent focus on holobionts—a eukaryotic host and its diverse microbial symbionts and associates.[118] An expansive definition of holobionts, going beyond their role as simple symbionts, is currently in wide use:

Microbial symbionts can be constant or inconstant, can be vertically or horizontally transmitted, and can act in a context-dependent manner as harmful, harmless, or helpful. (Theis et al. 2016: 1;[119] see Bruckner & Bordenstein 2012, 2013a,b; Bordenstein & Theis 2015)

Each “individual” human being is accompanied by a community of organisms, some co-evolved for mutual benefit (Gilbert, Sapp, & Tauber 2012; Chiu & Gilbert 2015; Gilbert 2014).[120] Our microbiota (bacteria, viruses, and fungi living in our gut, mouth, and skin) is necessary for our survival and development; often, our species is also needed, in turn, for their survival.[121]

Zilber-Rosenberg and Rosenberg (2008) were the first[122] to claim that holobionts were units of selection, but it was unclear what precisely this claim meant, among the various possible meanings and their combinations discussed in this entry. The holobiont as a unit of selection was also accompanied by loosely-related, agitated debates over whether and how it could be a biological individual[123] (see entries on biological individuals and evolution and development).

Within the decade, discussions of holobionts as “units of selection” appeared in the literature, notably, often objecting to holobionts as units of selection (Moran & Sloan 2015; Douglas & Werren 2016; Queller & Strassmann 2016; Skillings 2016; Burt & Trivers 2006). However, it was rarely clear which exact claim about holobionts as units was being denied—was it about well-defined interactors, manifestors, beneficiaries, reproducers, or some combination? Once specific definitions were introduced into the debates researchers began to offer both claims of filling the functional roles of interactors and manifestors of adaptation selection and evolution among holobionts, and demonstrating the empirical evidence supporting such claims (Griesemer 2005, 2014, 2016; Bouchard 2009, 2010; Lloyd 2017; Gilbert, Rosenberg, & Zilber-Rosenberg 2017; Griesemer 2018; Roughgarden et al. 2018; Suárez & Triviño 2020). But there is a more fundamental theoretical problem, arising from a specific theoretical confusion with ETI (§4.5).

Explicit discussion and clarification of this central theoretical question has been nearly completely neglected in the discussions of holobionts as units:[124] which evolutionary multilevel model-type(s) should we use to represent holobiont evolution? A cross-time-scale emergent hierarchical model-type,[125] like the ETI Maynard Smith/Szathmáry one discussed in Section 4.5, focusing on the emergence of new, higher-level-entity reproduction combined with near-total suppression of the lower-level fitness/trait significance? Or, instead, an ordinary-contemporary-timescale Evolutionary Change multilevel/GS selection model-type, which does not require such suppression, as we discussed in §3 and §4.1? Or both, perhaps?

As was highlighted in 2019 about this very issue in the context of holobiont evolution:

The first confusion involves the attribution of “evolutionary transition”-type, higher-order-entity selection as a necessary precondition for holobiont evolution to have a cooperative, mutualistic dimension (Stencel and Wloch-Salamon 2018). In this view, a host and its loose association of microbes becomes a holobiont only if it first undergoes an evolutionary transition, because the holobiont must be the primary unit of selection in order to permit the evolution of an adaptive mutualism through the reciprocal coevolution of its component species.

The Evolutionary Change school theorists characterizing and critiquing this ETI view continue:

Without the primacy of holobiont-level selection, [it is believed] genomic conflict at lower-levels of selection sustains disharmony among the evolutionary interests of the component species in a holobiont (Moran & Sloan 2015; Douglas & Werren 2016). (Lloyd & Wade 2019: 3–4 of 20, emphasis added)

Under this ETI approach to units of selection (discussed §4.5), that we can now apply to holobiont selection, Maynard Smith and Szathmary’s ETI-style upper-level selection is required first, which success depends upon the total choking-off of lower-level entities through selection at that lower level, or else, it is believed, as explained in §4.1, “cheater” mutations that benefit from, but do not contribute to, the upper-level group—here, the holobiont—are thought to make mutualisms evolutionarily unstable (Stencel & Wloch-Salamon 2018).

In contrast, a multilevel Evolutionary Change GS or hierarchical model-type[126] admitting the possibility of multiple, simultaneous levels of selection at all stages of holobiont evolution, is not dependent upon the prior occurrence of a major evolutionary transition in individuality (ETI), and finds the introduction and necessity of control of the “threat” of “cheater” mutations to be a fallacy (§4.1, §4.5, §3).

This leaves us with at least two distinct theoretical RQs concerning holobionts: (1) how should we conceive and answer questions about whether any parts or combinations of multilevel, multispecies holobiont systems serve as a unit of selection? and (2) which functional roles do such units play? We will gloss several preliminary answers for both RQs here, as well as views of some primary critics.[127]

A holobiont has been claimed to sometimes be an “integrated community of species, [which] becomes a unit of natural selection” (Gilbert, Sapp, & Tauber 2012: 334; Gilbert, Rosenberg, Zilber-Rosenberg 2017). That is, theorists claim that the holobiont can sometimes function as an evolutionary interactor, since it has features that bind it together as a whole in such a way that its traits interact with its biotic and abiotic environments, affecting the relative success of its reproducers, in a selective process.

What ties or “binds” the different species together to produce such an interactor in a selection process? According to pioneering philosophical thought on holobionts and symbionts, it is these species’ common evolutionary fate, the holobiont acting as a “whole”, that characterizes it as an evolutionary interactor, “objects between which natural selection selects” (Dupré 2012b: 160; 2021a,b; see also Dupré & O’Malley 2013; Griesemer 1998, 2000a,b,c; Zilber-Rosenberg & Rosenberg 2008; Suárez 2020 emphasizes the “stability of traits”; Schneider 2021; see Love 2018 et al.).

The details of this biological description are filled out in various instantiations of the model-type. This community can also be described as a “team” undergoing selection (Gilbert, Rosenberg, & Zilber-Rosenberg 2017). Others describe them as “collaborators” or “polygenomic consortia”, which has the advantage of encompassing both competition and cooperation within the holobiont (Dupré & O’Malley 2013: 314; Dupré 2021a,b; Theis et al. 2016; see also Huttegger & Smead 2011, game-theoretic results regarding the range of collaboration). Note that all these descriptions are compatible with being simple interactors at the combined level; and to call them cooperators, and so on, here, does not necessarily involve them in manifestor-style engineering higher-level adaptations, i.e., this does not engage the manifestor-of-engineering-adaptation functional role (§4.1), as Wright made clear, as did Hamilton, and Wade (see Koskella & Bergelson 2020 discussion).[128]

And, anticipating many critics, Evolutionary Change multilevel model-types representing holobionts do not identify a bottleneck, such as vertical transmission, as either a cause or a necessary condition for higher-level selection (e.g., Sober & Wilson 1998; Godfrey-Smith 2009, 2016, see below). Instead, multilevel selection can provide a pathway for the evolution of transmission modes and mating systems that enhance the efficacy of higher-level selection while diminishing that of lower-level selection (§4.1). Evolutionary Change multilevel selection models demonstrate the emergence of holobiont dependencies which precede and attend, rather than follow, mutualistic processes.[129]

In contrast, some philosophers describe cases of ordinary group selection, correctly modeled using perhaps kin-group selection or multilevel GS model-types; they nevertheless describe phenomena in those models as, “key events in an evolutionary transition”, which they are not (Clarke 2016: 41). Because there is no first-time upper-level, multi-cellular or multi-entity event emerging along with these groups of organisms, calling them an ETI, and using ETI-structured model-types to represent them, constitutes a fundamental confusion (see also Herron 2021; Clarke 2013, 2016; Inkpen & Doolittle 2021).[130]

In fact, consideration of the problems with generalizing ETI models to other evolutionary contexts such as holobionts re-invigorates the four-fold taxonomy of the units of selection debates originally introduced as an epistemological and pragmatic anatomy of RQs based on the different types of processes/functions[131] that can affect different forms of biological organization (Dupré 2012a,b, 2021a,b).

For example, take the requirement that one single entity-type simultaneously satisfies three of the key functional evolutionary roles, grounded in an Adaptationist/KS approach (§3; Griesemer 2005; see meiotic drive in §4.4; Lloyd 1986, Hull 1988; Brandon 1988; §3, §§4.1–4.5), which reduces evolution solely to a process that produces engineering-type adaptations. Some see this type of reduction as disconnected from a substantial number of genetic models and biological processes, and one that matches badly with contemporary experimental and theoretical biological practice (§3 & §4).[132]

Given this latter, multilevel theoretical background, and the prominence of debates about it, it seems somewhat surprising that it has often been simply assumed, in the wide-ranging discussion of holobionts, that Maynard Smith and Szathmáry’s Adaptationist/KS, genic modeling approach was the only approach available or appropriate (Moran & Sloan 2015; Douglas & Werren 2016; Queller & Strassmann 2016; Skillings 2016). Alternative Evolutionary Change model-types, especially from community genetics, have been available that make many fewer empirically-unsupported or questionable assumptions—e.g., about “cheaters”—regarding the biological systems in question (§4.1; Koskella & Bergelson 2020; Bijma 2014; Drown & Wade 2014).

Some evolutionary biologists, for example, in applying Williams’ “parsimonious” reductionist methods to holobionts (specifically, mammalian gut microbiota; see §4.1 discussion of Williams’ parsimony principle), are explicit about using Adaptationist/KS school model-types and assumptions, claiming that “the study of [adaptive] function provides a universal logic to understand complex biological systems”[133] (Foster et al. 2017: 2, Box 2).

The holobionts are analyzed as simultaneously filling three evolutionary functional roles: interactors, reproducers, and manifestors of adaptation, in the active search for optima that satisfy their requirements for adaptative, optimal results of cooperation, stability and longevity of multispecies systems that are always potentially fundamentally undermined by cheaters (Foster et al. 2017; they take an explicitly cheater-oriented approach to modeling symbiotic evolutionary systems).[134]

On this Adaptationist/KS approach, it is quite difficult to evolve cooperation or mutualisms, despite mutualisms’ complete penetration and ubiquity in every system ever found in nature; the emphasis in their model-types is on the roles of cheaters and selfish traits.

One result appearing often in Adaptationist/KS school literature, is that challenges to the “stability of transmission”—partner choice of a symbiont—are crucial to its long-term evolutionary success (Kaltenpoth et al. 2014; Douglas & Werren 2016; H. Williams & Lenton 2008).[135]

This objection, that the symbiont or holobiont cannot evolve (as an interactor, but especially as a both an interactor and a manifestor), because transmission is unstable or unreliable—and thus that strong or complete vertical transmission is required—is found very frequently in conference and informal one-on-one discussions of the possibilities of holobionts being units of selection, as well as in the literature on this topic (e.g., Skillings 2016; Godfrey-Smith 2016; Douglas & Werren 2016; Foster et al. 2017; van Vliet & Doebeli 2019).

It has been established, however, through community genetics model-types, that strong or complete verticality of transmission is not, in fact, required for symbiont evolution, nor evolution of mutualism, nor for holobiont evolution or stability, although it may later emerge.[136]

Thus, while we find some researchers fruitfully framing their model-types in the context of ecological modeling practices to better understand microbiome evolution within vertebrates and other complex hosts (e.g., Coyte, Schluter, & Foster 2015; Costello et al. 2012; Ley et al. 2008), others are stuck in unproductive model-types arising from the ETI context, or fundamentals of the Adaptationist/KS school modeling space that may make inappropriate and unproductive assumptions.

Nevertheless, it should be recalled that even under the Evolutionary Change and multilevel selection models, manifestors of adaptation may be found at the holobiont level, as discussed in: Seeley (1997); Wagner et al. 2014; Suárez & Triviño (2020); Dupressoir, Lavialle, & Heidmann (2012); Lamm & Kolodny (2022).

Within the practice of philosophy of biology, on the other hand, when building a theoretical and analytical framework to examine whether or not holobionts are units of selection, there is a tendency to resurrect the anatomy analysis given here by those previously following the “Darwinian individuals” approach, while denying to do so; this can be found in a duo of philosopher & biologist:

We do not in general favor the replicator/interactor model (Hull 1980) as the best or only way to understand selection, but it is worth noting that it can be coherently employed in this context, and in a way that is substantially different from other proposals. Lloyd (201[8]), for example, conceives holobionts as interactors that promote the differential success of the lineages of cells that make them up. We offer an alternative in which holobionts are seen as interactors that promote the differential success of the interaction patterns they instantiate. The replicators in our model are abstract functional relationships, not cell lineages. (Doolittle & Booth 2017: 18–19; emph. added)

Since all the roles in the analysis in question are already abstract and functional,[137] the quoted material represents a misconception; the authors seem to be in complete agreement with the definitions of the anatomy analysis.

Later, with a different philosopher, the biologist promotes a process-centered approach to units of selection (Doolittle & Inkpen 2018; Suarez and Lloyd 2023). They again generalize the functional roles of interactors in selection processes, but seem to misunderstand the function-based tradition in which that project is the norm (Dupré 2012a, 2021a; Nicholson & Dupré 2018; Griesemer 2005).

By 2021, these authors have adopted a particular units RQ as their own, which appears to accept the beginnings of an anatomy analysis: “What are the referring replicators specifically responsible for the differential extinction and proliferation of such higher-level entities?” i.e., of “multi-species communities and ecosystems”. (Inkpen & Doolittle 2021)

But referring to replicators as being causally responsible for the differential reproduction or extermination of any higher-level entity requires their translation into interactors and their traits first, as Dawkins himself recognized and claimed (see §§4.1–4.4). These authors seem to be making the same fundamental omission as the genic pluralists, in thinking that reproducers as ultimate beneficiaries—or as serving foundational roles—are directly exposed to selection forces themselves (§4.3, §4.4).

They thus leave out the names and descriptions of the fully dynamically and explanatorily essential functional parts of the anatomy analysis—beneficiaries, reproducers, interactors, and manifestors of adaptation—even though these authors utilize all four of these functional roles in their theoretical exploration and explanation (Inkpen & Doolittle 2021). Omitting naming them is not an advance in clarity or understanding, it is a confusion echoing those in Section 4.4.

Evolutionary Change modelers thus conclude that applying the ETI model-type to holobionts as units of selection (regarding any of the four distinct units RQs or their combos), as done by the opponents to granting holobionts status as units, is not generally suitable for modeling holobionts, demibionts or symbionts, for reasons that are familiar from the weaknesses of genic interpretations of multilevel model-types generally. For example, such model-types do not fully incorporate relevant gene interaction—e.g., IGE or sources of epistasis—in their models (see Koskella & Bergelson 2020; §4.1; Bijma 2014; S. Wright 1931, 1980; Wade 2016).

Leaving out the necessary gene- or entity-interactions among participant species or higher-level entities, it is no wonder that the ETI-oriented models do not get the empirically or theoretically representative answers about upper-level properties.

There are thus crucial differences between the outcomes of the two schools’ model-types. The community or multilevel genetics model-types (incorporating IGE or epistasis) show how the assumed conflict in the ETI model-type that shows between genomes (e.g., Douglas & Werren 2016; Moran & Sloan 2015), can be self-limiting in the Evolutionary Change model-types, while cooperation and mutualism tend to be self-accelerating, precisely contrary to the predictions of the ETI model-types, i.e., those used by the opponents to holobionts as interactors, reproducers, or manifestors as units of selection (Drown & Wade 2014; Wade & Drown 2015; see theory in Wade 2016).

These very biases in the evolutionary dynamics of interaction between hosts and microbiota are an important feature of holobionts, and could contribute to explaining the absence of cheaters from natural mutualisms, although cheaters are predicted by gene-centered conflict theory to cause the strong evolutionary instability of mutualisms, as mentioned in Section 4.1 (see Foster et al. 2017). Recall from Sections 4.1–4.5 that, according to the Evolutionary Change school, problems with GS and KS model-types from cheaters were a fallacy. Recall also that these cheaters also cannot be found in nature, when those researchers most committed to their existence went to find them.[138]

It is important to see that in addition to filling the functional roles of interactors or manifestors, holobionts can also be reproducers, where the host usually reproduces vertically and the microbiota reproduce vertically, horizontally, or both.[139] This situation has provoked discussion especially among philosophers.[140] Holobionts’ microbiota often reproduce outside the context of the original host organism, and some holobionts, e.g., the Hawaiian bobtail squid and its luminescent bacteria, are not seen as “Darwinian populations” (Godfrey-Smith 2009, 2016), and therefore are judged not to be units of selection under that view (see Booth 2014).

Others instead distinguish between holobionts and “demibionts”. In contrast with the adaptive-neutral concept of the holobiont, a demibiont recognizes the possibility of an asymmetric evolutionary history, in which the combination evolves such that one or more lineages has adapted to the first, but the first has not adapted to the others (see Suárez & Stencel 2020).[141]

This approach contrasts with that of the original reproducer and “Darwinian population” approaches, which would exclude demibionts given the specific requirements concerning reproduction (Griesemer 2000a, 2016; Godfrey-Smith 2016; Booth 2014). The Darwinian population view excludes such holobionts and demibionts, because “it is a mistake to see things that do not reproduce as units of selection” (Godfrey-Smith 2011: 509). Note that this conclusion rests on the merging of the interactor (and manifestor) with the reproducer requirements, and as such will not hold sway over those who do not buy such a confounding of roles (e.g., Dupré & O’Malley 2013; Suárez & Lloyd 2023). This is yet another case wherein distinguishing the interactor RQ from the replicator/reproducer RQ can be “more illuminating”.[142] (Sterelny 2011: 496)

In sum, both the ETI model-type, inappropriately, and the Adaptationist/KS gene-centric, species-centric approach—based in genomic conflict and the threat of “cheaters”—have been predominant in critiques of holobionts as units of selection under all four RQs discussed in this entry, and have been resisted by advocates using Evolutionary Change model-types, whose models fit the available empirical data concerning what is turning out to be the universal partially-coevolutionary systems called holobionts.

5. Conclusion

We should not treat different answers as competitors if they are answering different questions. I offer a framework of four distinct Research Questions to clarify the “units of selection” debates. We separate the classic question about the unit of evolutionary selective interaction (interactor question), from the entity functioning as a replicating/reproducing unit (reproducer question), and also from which entity acquires “engineering” adaptations (manifestor-of-adaptation question). We note the ambiguity in “adaptation”: is adaptation a selection product versus an accumulated “engineering” design? Finally, we consider the ultimate beneficiary, “in the long run”, from the evolution by selection process (beneficiary question). Many misunderstandings—theoretical and empirical—may be avoided by a precise characterization of which of the four units of selection questions, or their combinations, is being addressed, and by which multilevel school’s approach.


  • Abbot, Patrick, Jun Abe, John Alcock, Samuel Alizon, Joao A. C. Alpedrinha, Malte Andersson, Jean-Baptiste Andre, Minus van Baalen, Francois Balloux, Sigal Balshine, et al., 2011, “Inclusive Fitness Theory and Eusociality”, Nature, 471(7339): E1–E4. doi:10.1038/nature09831
  • Ågren, J. Arvid, 2021a, The Gene’s-Eye View of Evolution, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198862260.001.0001
  • –––, 2021b, “Sewall Wright’s Criticism of the Gene’s-eye View of Evolution”, Evolution, 75(10): 2326–2334. doi:10.1111/evo.14334
  • Alexander, Richard D. and Gerald Bargia, 1978, “Group Selection, Altruism, and the Levels of Organization of Life”, Annual Review of Ecology and Systematics, 9: 449–474. doi:10.1146/annurev.es.09.110178.002313
  • Allen, Benjamin, Martin A. Nowak, and Edward O. Wilson, 2013, “Limitations of Inclusive Fitness”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 110(50): 20135–20139. doi:10.1073/pnas.1317588110
  • Allen, Colin, 2002, “Real Traits, Real Functions?”, in Functions: New Essays in the Philosophy of Psychology and Biology, André Ariew, Robert Cummins, and Mark Perlman (eds.), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 373–389.
  • Alves, Davi Mello Cunha Crescente, José Alexandre Felizola Diniz-Filho, and Fabricio Villalobos, 2017, “Integrating Selection, Niche, and Diversification into a Hierarchical Conceptual Framework”, Organisms Diversity & Evolution, 17(1): 1–10. doi:10.1007/s13127-016-0299-x
  • Anderegg, William R. L., Leander D. L. Anderegg, Kelly L. Kerr, and Anna T. Trugman, 2019, “Widespread Drought-induced Tree Mortality at Dry Range Edges Indicates That Climate Stress Exceeds Species’ Compensating Mechanisms”, Global Change Biology, 25(11): 3793–3802. doi:10.1111/gcb.14771
  • Aoki, Kenichi, 1982, “A Condition for Group Selection to Prevail Over Counteracting Individual Selection”, Evolution, 36(4): 832–842. doi:10.2307/2407896
  • Arnold, Anthony J. and Kurt Fristrup, 1982, “The Theory of Evolution by Natural Selection: A Hierarchical Expansion”, Paleobiology, 8(2): 113–129. doi:10.1017/S0094837300004462
  • Aspi, Jouni, Anne Jäkäläniemi, Juha Tuomi, and Pirkko Siikamäki, 2003, “Multilevel Phenotypic Selection on Morphological Characters in a Metapopulation of Silene Tatarica”, Evolution, 57(3): 509–517. doi:10.1111/j.0014-3820.2003.tb01542.x
  • Beatty, John, 1980, “What’s Wrong with the Received View of Evolutionary Theory?”, PSA: Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1980(2): 397–426. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1980.2.192601
  • Benito Garzón, Marta, T. Matthew Robson, and Arndt Hampe, 2019, “ΔTrait SDMs: Species Distribution Models That Account for Local Adaptation and Phenotypic Plasticity”, New Phytologist, 222(4): 1757–1765. doi:10.1111/nph.15716
  • Bijma, Piter, 2010a, “Estimating Indirect Genetic Effects: Precision of Estimates and Optimum Designs”, Genetics, 186(3): 1013–1028. doi:10.1534/genetics.110.120493
  • –––, 2010b, “Multilevel Selection 4: Modeling the Relationship of Indirect Genetic Effects and Group Size”, Genetics, 186(3): 1029–1031. doi:10.1534/genetics.110.120485
  • –––, 2011, “A General Definition of the Heritable Variation That Determines the Potential of a Population to Respond to Selection”, Genetics, 189(4): 1347–1359. doi:10.1534/genetics.111.130617
  • –––, 2014, “The Quantitative Genetics of Indirect Genetic Effects: A Selective Review of Modelling Issues”, Heredity, 112(1): 61–69. doi:10.1038/hdy.2013.15
  • Bijma, Piter, Andries D. Hulst, and Mart C. M. de Jong, 2022, “The Quantitative Genetics of the Prevalence of Infectious Diseases: Hidden Genetic Variation Due to Indirect Genetic Effects Dominates Heritable Variation and Response to Selection”, Genetics, 220(1): iyab141. doi:10.1093/genetics/iyab141
  • Bijma, Piter, William M. Muir, and Johan A. M. Van Arendonk, 2007a, “Multilevel Selection 1: Quantitative Genetics of Inheritance and Response to Selection”, Genetics, 175(1): 277–288. doi:10.1534/genetics.106.062711
  • Bijma, Piter, William M. Muir, Esther D. Ellen, Jason B. Wolf, and Johan A. M. Van Arendonk, 2007b, “Multilevel Selection 2: Estimating the Genetic Parameters Determining Inheritance and Response to Selection”, Genetics, 175(1): 289–299. doi:10.1534/genetics.106.062729
  • Bijma, Piter and Michael J. Wade, 2008, “The Joint Effects of Kin, Multilevel Selection and Indirect Genetic Effects on Response to Genetic Selection”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 21(5): 1175–1188. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2008.01550.x
  • Birch, Jonathan, 2014, “Hamilton’s Rule and Its Discontents”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 65(2): 381–411. doi:10.1093/bjps/axt016
  • –––, 2020, “Kin Selection, Group Selection, and the Varieties of Population Structure”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 71(1): 259–286. doi:10.1093/bjps/axx028
  • Birch, Jonathan and Samir Okasha, 2015, “Kin Selection and Its Critics”, BioScience, 65(1): 22–32. doi:10.1093/biosci/biu196
  • Bock, Walter J., 1980, “The Definition and Recognition of Biological Adaptation”, American Zoologist, 20(1): 217–227. doi:10.1093/icb/20.1.217
  • Bodmer, Walter F., 1965, “Differential Fertility in Population Genetics Models”, Genetics, 51(3): 411–424. doi:10.1093/genetics/51.3.411
  • Bolker, Jessica A., 2000, “Modularity in Development and Why It Matters to Evo-Devo”, American Zoologist, 40(5): 770–776. doi:10.1093/icb/40.5.770
  • Boorman, Scott A., 1978, “Mathematical Theory of Group Selection: Structure of Group Selection in Founder Populations Determined from Convexity of the Extinction Operator”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 75(4): 1909–1913. doi:10.1073/pnas.75.4.1909
  • Boorman, Scott A. and Paul R. Levitt, 1973, “Group Selection on the Boundary of a Stable Population”, Theoretical Population Biology, 4(1): 85–128. doi:10.1016/0040-5809(73)90007-5
  • Booth, Austin, 2014, “Symbiosis, Selection, and Individuality”, Biology & Philosophy, 29(5): 657–673. doi:10.1007/s10539-014-9449-8
  • Bordenstein, Seth R. and Kevin R. Theis, 2015, “Host Biology in Light of the Microbiome: Ten Principles of Holobionts and Hologenomes”, PLOS Biology, 13(8): e1002226. doi:10.1371/journal.pbio.1002226
  • Borregaard, Michael K., Nicholas J. Gotelli, and Carsten Rahbek, 2012, “Are Range-Size Distributions Consistent with Species-Level Heritability? Range-Size Heritability and Srds”, Evolution, 66(7): 2216–2226. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.2012.01581.x
  • Borrello, Mark E., 2010, Evolutionary Restraints: The Contentious History of Group Selection, Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Bouchard, Frédéric, 2009, “Understanding Colonial Traits Using Symbiosis Research and Ecosystem Ecology”, Biological Theory, 4(3): 240–246. doi:10.1162/biot.2009.4.3.240
  • –––, 2010, “Symbiosis, Lateral Function Transfer and the (Many) Saplings of Life”, Biology & Philosophy, 25(4): 623–641. doi:10.1007/s10539-010-9209-3
  • Bourrat, Pierrick, 2016, “Generalizing Contextual Analysis”, Acta Biotheoretica, 64(2): 197–217. doi:10.1007/s10441-016-9280-5
  • –––, 2019, “Evolutionary Transitions in Heritability and Individuality”, Theory in Biosciences, 138(2): 305–323. doi:10.1007/s12064-019-00294-2
  • –––, 2021a, Facts, Conventions, and the Levels of Selection, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781108885812
  • –––, 2021b, “Transitions in Evolution: A Formal Analysis”, Synthese, 198(4): 3699–3731. doi:10.1007/s11229-019-02307-5
  • Bourrat, Pierrick and Paul E. Griffiths, 2018, “Multispecies Individuals”, History and Philosophy of the Life Sciences, 40(2): article 33. doi:10.1007/s40656-018-0194-1
  • Bowles, Samuel and Herbert Gintis, 2011, A Cooperative Species: Human Reciprocity and Its Evolution, Princeton, NJ/Oxford: Princeton University Press.
  • Boyd, Lawrence H. and Gudmund R. Iversen, 1979, Contextual Analysis: Concepts and Statistical Techniques, Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
  • Brandon, Robert N., 1978, “Adaptation and Evolutionary Theory”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, 9(3): 181–206. doi:10.1016/0039-3681(78)90005-5
  • –––, 1981, “Biological Teleology: Questions and Explanations”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, 12(2): 91–105. doi:10.1016/0039-3681(81)90015-7
  • –––, 1982, “The Levels of Selection”, PSA: Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1982(1): 315–323. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1982.1.192676
  • –––, 1985, “Adaptation Explanations: Are Adaptations for the Good of Replicators or Interactors?”, in Evolution at a Crossroads: The New Biology and the New Philosophy of Science, David J. Depew & Bruce H. Weber (eds.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press/Bradford, pp. 81–96.
  • –––, 1988, “Levels of Selection: A Hierarchy of Interactors”, in The Role of Behavior in Evolution, H.C. Plotkin (ed.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 51–71.
  • –––, 1990, Adaptation and Environment, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1999, “The Units of Selection Revisited: The Modules of Selection”, Biology & Philosophy, 14(2): 167–180. doi:10.1023/A:1006682200831
  • Brandon, Robert N. and Richard M. Burian (eds.), 1984, Genes, Organisms, Populations: Controversies over the Units of Selection, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Brandon, Robert N. and H. Frederik Nijhout, 2006, “The Empirical Nonequivalence of Genic and Genotypic Models of Selection: A (Decisive) Refutation of Genic Selectionism and Pluralistic Genic Selectionism”, Philosophy of Science, 73(3): 277–297. doi:10.1086/515416
  • Breden, Felix and Michael J. Wade, 1981, “Inbreeding and Evolution by Kin Selection”, Ethology and Sociobiology, 2(1): 3–16. doi:10.1016/0162-3095(81)90018-2
  • –––, 1989, “Selection Within and between Kin Groups of the Imported Willow Leaf Beetle”, The American Naturalist, 134(1): 35–50. doi:10.1086/284964
  • –––, 1991, “‘Runaway’ Social Evolution: Reinforcing Selection for Inbreeding and Altruism”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 153(3): 323–337. doi:10.1016/S0022-5193(05)80573-9
  • Brucker, Robert M. and Seth R. Bordenstein, 2012, “Speciation by Symbiosis”, Trends in Ecology & Evolution, 27(8): 443–451. doi:10.1016/j.tree.2012.03.011
  • –––, 2013a, “The Capacious Hologenome”, Zoology, 116(5): 260–261. doi:10.1016/j.zool.2013.08.003
  • –––, 2013b, “The Hologenomic Basis of Speciation: Gut Bacteria Cause Hybrid Lethality in the Genus Nasonia”, Science, 341(6146): 667–669. doi:10.1126/science.1240659
  • Bueno, Otávio, Ruey-lin Chen, and Melinda Bonnie Fagan (eds.), 2018, Individuation, Process, and Scientific Practices, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780190636814.001.0001
  • Burian, Richard M., 1983, “‘Adaptation’”, in Dimensions of Darwinism: Themes and Counterthemes in Twentieth Century Evolutionary Theory, Marjorie Grene (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 287–314.
  • –––, 1992, “Adaptation: Historical Perspectives”, in Keller and Lloyd 1992: 7–12.
  • Burt, Austin and Robert Trivers, 2006, Genes in Conflict: The Biology of Selfish Genetic Elements, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press.
  • Buss, Leo W., 1987, The Evolution of Individuality, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Calcott, Brett, 2008, “The Other Cooperation Problem: Generating Benefit”, Biology & Philosophy, 23(2): 179–203. doi:10.1007/s10539-007-9095-5
  • Carotenuto, Francesco, Carmela Barbera, and Pasquale Raia, 2010, “Occupancy, Range Size, and Phylogeny in Eurasian Pliocene to Recent Large Mammals”, Paleobiology, 36(3): 399–414. doi:10.1666/09059.1
  • Carotenuto, Francesco, Mirko Di Febbraro, Alessandro Mondanaro, Silvia Castiglione, Carmela Serio, Marina Melchionna, Lorenzo Rook, and Pasquale Raia, 2020, “MInOSSE: A New Method to Reconstruct Geographic Ranges of Fossil Species”, Methods in Ecology and Evolution, 11(9): 1121–1132. doi:10.1111/2041-210X.13423
  • Cassidy, John, 1978, “Philosophical Aspects of the Group Selection Controversy”, Philosophy of Science, 45(4): 575–594. doi:10.1086/288836
  • Cheng, H. and W. M. Muir, 2005, “The Effects of Genetic Selection for Survivability and Productivity on Chicken Physiological Homeostasis”, World’s Poultry Science Journal, 61(3): 383–397.
  • Chiu, Lynn and Scott F. Gilbert, 2015, “The Birth of the Holobiont: Multi-species Birthing Through Mutual Scaffolding and Niche Construction”, Biosemiotics, 8: 191-210.
  • –––, 2020, “Niche Construction and the Transition to Herbivory: Phenotype Switching and the Organization of New Nutritional Modes”, in Phenotypic Switching: Implications in Biology and Medicine, Herbert Levine, Mohit Kumar Jolly, Prakesh Kulkarni, and Vidyanand Nanjundiah (eds.), London: Academic Press, 459–482. doi:10.1016/B978-0-12-817996-3.00015-3
  • Clarke, Ellen, 2013, “The Multiple Realizability of Biological Individuals”, Journal of Philosophy, 110(8): 413–435. doi:10.5840/jphil2013110817
  • –––, 2016, “A Levels-of-Selection Approach to Evolutionary Individuality”, Biology & Philosophy, 31(6): 893–911. doi:10.1007/s10539-016-9540-4
  • –––, 2018, “Adaptation, Multilevel Selection, and Organismality: A Clash of Perspectives”, in The Routledge Handbook of Evolution and Philosophy, Richard Joyce (ed.), (Routledge Handbooks in Philosophy), New York: Routledge, Taylor & Francis Group, chap. 3.
  • Colwell, Robert K., 1981, “Group Selection Is Implicated in the Evolution of Female-Biased Sex Ratios”, Nature, 290(5805): 401–404. doi:10.1038/290401a0
  • Costello, Elizabeth K., Keaton Stagaman, Les Dethlefsen, Brendan J. M. Bohannan, and David A. Relman, 2012, “The Application of Ecological Theory Toward an Understanding of the Human Microbiome”, Science, 336(6086): 1255–1262. doi:10.1126/science.1224203
  • Coyne, Jerry A. and H. Allen Orr, 2004, Speciation, Sunderland, MA: Sinauer Associates.
  • Coyte, Katharine Z., Jonas Schluter, and Kevin R. Foster, 2015, “The Ecology of the Microbiome: Networks, Competition, and Stability”, Science, 350(6261): 663–666. doi:10.1126/science.aad2602
  • Cracraft, Joel, 1985, “Species Selection, Macroevolutionary Analysis, and the ‘Hierarchical Theory’ of Evolution”, Systematic Biology, 34(2): 222–229. doi:10.2307/sysbio/34.2.222
  • Craig, David M., 1982, “Group Selection Versus Individual Selection: An Experimental Analysis”, Evolution, 36(2): 271–282. doi:10.2307/2408045
  • Craig, J.V. and W.M. Muir, 1996, “Group Selection for Adaptation to Multiple-Hen Cages: Behavioral Responses”, Poultry Science, 75(10): 1145–1155. doi:10.3382/ps.0751145
  • Crossa, José, Paulino Pérez-Rodríguez, Jaime Cuevas, Osval Montesinos-López, Diego Jarquín, Gustavo de los Campos, Juan Burgueño, Juan M. González-Camacho, Sergio Pérez-Elizalde, Yoseph Beyene, Susanne Dreisigacker, Ravi Singh, Xuecai Zhang, Manje Gowda, Manish Roorkiwal, Jessica Rutkoski, and Rajeev K. Varshney, 2017, “Genomic Selection in Plant Breeding: Methods, Models, and Perspectives”, Trends in Plant Science, 22(11): 961–975. doi:10.1016/j.tplants.2017.08.011
  • Crow, J. F. and K. Aoki, 1982, “Group Selection for a Polygenic Behavioral Trait: A Differential Proliferation Model”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 79(8): 2628–2631. doi:10.1073/pnas.79.8.2628
  • Cummins, Robert, 1975, “Functional Analysis”, The Journal of Philosophy, 72(20): 741–764. doi:10.2307/2024640
  • Damuth, John and I. Lorraine Heisler, 1988, “Alternative Formulations of Multilevel Selection”, Biology & Philosophy, 3(4): 407–430. doi:10.1007/BF00647962
  • Darwin, Charles, 1859, On the Origin of Species, London: John Murray.
  • Davidson, Diane W., Alexey Kopchinskiy, Kamariah Abu Salim, Marica Grujic, Linda Lim, Chan Chin Mei, Tappey H. Jones, Dale Casamatta, Lea Atanasova, and Irina S. Druzhinina, 2016, “Nutrition of Borneo’s ‘exploding’ Ants (Hymenoptera: Formicidae: Colobopsis) A Preliminary Assessment”, Biotropica 48(4): 518–527.
  • Dawkins, Richard, 1976, The Selfish Gene, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1982a, “Replicators and Vehicles”, in Current Problems in Sociobiology, King’s College (University of Cambridge) (ed.), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press, 45–64. [Dawkins 1982 available online]
  • –––, 1982b, The Extended Phenotype: The Gene as the Unit of Selection, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • De Mazancourt, Claire, Michel Loreau, and Ulf Dieckmann, 2005, “Understanding Mutualism When There Is Adaptation to the Partner”, Journal of Ecology, 93(2): 305–314. doi:10.1111/j.0022-0477.2004.00952.x
  • De Lisle, Stephen P., Daniel I. Bolnick, Edmund D. Brodie, Allen J. Moore, and Joel W. McGlothlin, 2022, “Interacting Phenotypes and the Coevolutionary Process: Interspecific Indirect Genetic Effects Alter Coevolutionary Dynamics”, Evolution, 76(3): 429–444. doi:10.1111/evo.14427
  • Dobzhansky, Theodosius, 1956, “What Is an Adaptive Trait?”, The American Naturalist, 90(855): 337–347. doi:10.1086/281944
  • –––, 1968, “Adaptedness and Fitness”, in Population Biology and Evolution, Richard C. Lewontin (ed.), Syracuse, NY: Syracuse University Press, pp. 109–121.
  • Doolittle, W. Ford and Austin Booth, 2017, “It’s the Song, Not the Singer: An Exploration of Holobiosis and Evolutionary Theory”, Biology & Philosophy, 32(1): 5–24. doi:10.1007/s10539-016-9542-2
  • Doolittle, W. Ford and S. Andrew Inkpen, 2018, “Processes and Patterns of Interaction as Units of Selection: An Introduction to ITSNTS Thinking”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 115(16): 4006–4014. doi:10.1073/pnas.1722232115
  • Douglas, Angela E. and John H. Werren, 2016, “Holes in the Hologenome: Why Host-Microbe Symbioses Are Not Holobionts”, MBio, 7(2): e02099-15. doi:10.1128/mBio.02099-15
  • Drown, Devin M. and Michael J. Wade, 2014, “Runaway Coevolution: Adaptation to Heritable and Nonheritable Environments: Brief Communication”, Evolution, 68(10): 3039–3046. doi:10.1111/evo.12470
  • Dugatkin, Lee Alan and Hudson Kern Reeve, 1994, “Behavioral Ecology and Levels of Selection: Dissolving the Group Selection Controversy”, in Advances in the Study of Behavior 23, Peter Slater, Jay S. Rosenblatt, Charles T. Snowdon, and Manfred Milinski (eds.), New York: Academic Press, 101–133. doi:10.1016/S0065-3454(08)60352-6
  • Dunbar, R. I. M., 1982, “Adaptation, Fitness and the Evolutionary Tautology”, in Current Problems in Sociobiology, King’s College (University of Cambridge) (ed.), Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press, 9–28.
  • Dupré, John, 2010, “The Polygenomic Organism”, The Sociological Review, 58(supplement 1): 19–31. doi:10.1111/j.1467-954X.2010.01909.x
  • –––, 2012a, Processes of Life: Essays in the Philosophy of Biology, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199691982.001.0001
  • –––, 2012b, “Postgenomic Darwinism”, in Dupré 2012a: 143–160 (ch. 9).
  • –––, 2020, “Life as Process”, Epistemology & Philosophy of Science, 57(2): 96–113. doi:10.5840/eps202057224
  • –––, 2021a, The Metaphysics of Biology, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781009024297
  • –––, 2021b, “Causally Powerful Processes”, Synthese, 199(3–4): 10667–10683. doi:10.1007/s11229-021-03263-9
  • Dupré, John and Maureen A. O’Malley, 2007, “Metagenomics and Biological Ontology”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part C: Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 38(4): 834–846. doi:10.1016/j.shpsc.2007.09.001\
  • –––, 2013, “Varieties of Living Things: Life at the Intersection of Lineage and Metabolism”, in Vitalism and the Scientific Image in Post-Enlightenment Life Science, 1800-2010, Sebastian Normandin and Charles T. Wolfe (eds.), (History, Philosophy and Theory of the Life Sciences 2), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, 311–343. doi:10.1007/978-94-007-2445-7_13
  • Dupressoir, A., C. Lavialle, and T. Heidmann, 2012, “From Ancestral Infectious Retroviruses to Bona Fide Cellular Genes: Role of the Captured Syncytins in Placentation”, Placenta, 33(9): 663–671. doi:10.1016/j.placenta.2012.05.005
  • Dynesius, Mats and Roland Jansson, 2014, “Persistence of Within-Species Lineages: A Neglected Control of Speciation Rates: Perspective”, Evolution, 68(4): 923–934. doi:10.1111/evo.12316
  • Earnshaw, Eugene, 2015, “Group Selection and Contextual Analysis”, Synthese, 192(1): 302–316. doi:10.1007/s11229-014-0569-0
  • Edenbrow, Mat, Bronwyn H. Bleakley, Safi K. Darden, Charles R. Tyler, Indar W. Ramnarine, and Darren P. Croft, 2017, “The Evolution of Cooperation: Interacting Phenotypes among Social Partners”, The American Naturalist, 189(6): 630–643. doi:10.1086/691386
  • Eldakar, Omar Tonsi, David Sloan Wilson, Michael J. Dlugos, and John W. Pepper, 2010, “The Role of Multilevel Selection in the Evolution of Sexual Conflict in the Water Strider Aquarius remigis: Role of Multilevel Selection in Sexual Conflict”, Evolution, 64(11): 3183–3189. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.2010.01087.x
  • Eldredge, Niles, 1985, Unfinished Synthesis: Biological Hierarchies and Modern Evolutionary Thought, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ellen, Esther D., T. Bas Rodenburg, Gerard A. A. Albers, J. Elizabeth Bolhuis, Irene Camerlink, Naomi Duijvesteijn, Egbert F. Knol, William M. Muir, Katrijn Peeters, Inonge Reimert, Ewa Sell-Kubiak, Johan A. M. van Arendonk, Jeroen Visscher, and Piter Bijma, 2014, “The Prospects of Selection for Social Genetic Effects to Improve Welfare and Productivity in Livestock”, Frontiers in Genetics, 5(November): article 377. doi:10.3389/fgene.2014.00377
  • Ellen, Esther D., Jeroen Visscher, Johan A. M. van Arendonk, and Piter Bijma, 2008, “Survival of Laying Hens: Genetic Parameters for Direct and Associative Effects in Three Purebred Layer Lines”, Poultry Science, 87(2): 233–239. doi:10.3382/ps.2007-00374
  • Ellis, Bruce J. and Timothy Ketelaar, 2002, “COMMENTARY: Clarifying the Foundations of Evolutionary Psychology: A Reply to Lloyd and Feldman”, Psychological Inquiry, 13(2): 157–164. doi:10.1207/S15327965PLI1302_05
  • Ereshefsky, Marc and Makmiller Pedroso, 2013, “Biological Individuality: The Case of Biofilms”, Biology & Philosophy, 28(2): 331–349. doi:10.1007/s10539-012-9340-4
  • Erwin, Douglas H., 2000, “Macroevolution Is More than Repeated Rounds of Microevolution”, Evolution and Development, 2(2): 78–84. doi:10.1046/j.1525-142x.2000.00045.x
  • Eschel, Ilan, 1972, “On the Neighbor Effect and the Evolution of Altruistic Traits”, Theoretical Population Biology 3(3): 258–277. doi:10.1016/0040-5809(72)90003-2
  • Feldman, Marcus W., Freddy B. Christiansen, and Uri Liberman, 1983, “On Some Models of Fertility Selection”, Genetics, 105(4): 1003–1010. doi:10.1093/genetics/105.4.1003
  • Fenner, Frank, 1965, “Myxoma Virus and Oryctolagus cuniculus”, in The Genetics of Colonizing Species: Proceedings of the First International Union of Biological Sciences Symposia on General Biology, H. G. Baker and G. Ledyard Stebbins (eds.), New York: Academic Press, 485–501.
  • Fenner, Frank and I. D. Marshall, 1957, “A Comparison of the Virulence for European Rabbits ( Oryctolagus Cuniculus ) of Strains of Myxoma Virus Recovered in the Field in Australia, Europe and America”, Journal of Hygiene, 55(2): 149–191. doi:10.1017/S0022172400037098
  • Fenner, Frank and Gwendolyn M. Woodroofe, 1965, “Changes in the Virulence and Antigenic Structure of Strains of Myxoma Virus Recovered from Australian Wild Rabbits between 1950 and 1964”, Australian Journal of Experimental Biology and Medical Science, 43(S1): 359–370. doi:10.1038/icb.1965.69
  • Fewell, J. H. and R.E. Page Jr, 2000, “Colony-Level Selection Effects on Individual and Colony Foraging Task Performance in Honeybees, Apis Mellifera L”, Behavioral Ecology and Sociobiology, 48(3): 173–181. doi:10.1007/s002650000183
  • Fisher, D. N. and A. G. McAdam, 2017, “Social Traits, Social Networks and Evolutionary Biology”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 30(12): 2088–2103. doi:10.1111/jeb.13195
  • Fisher, Ronald Aylmer, 1930 [1958], The Genetical Theory of Natural Selection, Oxford: The Clarendon Press. Revised edition 1958, New York: Dover Publications.
  • Forsdyke, Donald R., 2010, “The Selfish Gene Revisited: Reconciliation of Williams-Dawkins and Conventional Definitions”, Biological Theory, 5(3): 246–255. doi:10.1162/BIOT_a_00054
  • Fortunato, Laura, and Marco Archetti, 2010, “Evolution of monogamous marriage by maximization of inclusive fitness”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 23(1):149–156.
  • Foster, Kevin R., 2004, “Diminishing Returns in Social Evolution: The not-so-tragic commons”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology 17: 1058–1072.
  • –––, 2011, “The Sociobiology of Molecular Systems”, Nature Reviews Genetics, 12(3): 193–203. doi:10.1038/nrg2903
  • Foster, Kevin R., Jonas Schluter, Katharine Z. Coyte, and Seth Rakoff-Nahoum, 2017, “The Evolution of the Host Microbiome as an Ecosystem on a Leash”, Nature, 548(7665): 43–51. doi:10.1038/nature23292
  • Foster, K. R. and T. Wenseleers, 2006, “A General Model for the Evolution of Mutualisms”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 19(4): 1283–1293. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2005.01073.x
  • Fortunato, Laura and Marco Archetti, 2010, “Evolution of Monogamous Marriage by Maximization of Inclusive Fitness”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 23(1): 149–156. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2009.01884.x
  • Frank, S.A., 2013, “Natural Selection. VIII. History and Interpretation of Kin Selection Theory”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 26(6): 1151–1184. doi:10.1111/jeb.12131
  • Franklin, Ian and R. C. Lewontin, 1970, “Is the Gene the Unit of Selection?”, Genetics, 65(4): 707–734. doi:10.1093/genetics/65.4.707
  • Freedberg, Steven, Caroline Urban, and Brianna M. Cunniff, 2021, “Dispersal Reduces Interspecific Competitiveness by Spreading Locally Harmful Traits”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 34(9): 1477–1487. doi:10.1111/jeb.13912
  • Funkhouser, Lisa J. and Seth R. Bordenstein, 2013, “Mom Knows Best: The Universality of Maternal Microbial Transmission”, PLOS Biology, 11(8): e1001631. doi:10.1371/journal.pbio.1001631
  • Fusco, Giuseppe (ed.), 2019, Perspectives on Evolutionary and Developmental Biology: Essays for Alessandro Minelli, Padua: Padova University Press.
  • Futuyma, Douglas J., 1979, Evolutionary Biology, Sunderland, MA: Sinauer Associates.
  • Futuyma, Douglas J. and Mark Kirkpatrick, 2017, Evolution, fourth edition, Sunderland, MA: Sinauer Associates.
  • Gannett, Lisa, 1999, “What’s in a Cause? The Pragmatic Dimensions of Genetic Explanations”, Biology and Philosophy 14(3): 349–374. doi:10.1023/A:1006583215835
  • Gardner, Andy, 2015a, “The Genetical Theory of Multilevel Selection”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 28(2): 305–319. doi:10.1111/jeb.12566
  • –––, 2015b, “Group Selection versus Group Adaptation”, Nature, 524(7566): E3-E4.
  • –––, 2015c, “More on the Genetical Theory of Multilevel Selection”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 28(9): 1747–1751.
  • Gardner, Andy and A. Grafen, 2009, “Capturing the Superorganism: A Formal Theory of Group Adaptation”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 22(4): 659–671. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2008.01681.x
  • Gardner, Andy and J. J. Welch, 2011, “A Formal Theory of the Selfish Gene”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 24(8): 1801–1813. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2011.02310.x
  • Gardner, Andy, S. A. West, and G. Wild, 2011, “The Genetical Theory of Kin Selection”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 24(5): 1020–1043. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2011.02236.x
  • Ghiselin, Michael T., 1974, The Economy of Nature and the Evolution of Sex, Berkeley, CA, University of California Press.
  • Gilbert, Scott F., 2011, “Symbionts as Genetic Sources of Heritable Variation”, in Transformations of Lamarckism: From Subtle Fluids to Molecular Biology (Vienna Series in Theoretical Biology), Snait B. Gissis & Eva Jablonka (eds.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 283–293. doi:10.7551/mitpress/9780262015141.003.0027
  • –––, 2014, “A Holobiont Birth Narrative: The Epigenetic Transmission of the Human Microbiome”, Frontiers in Genetics, 5(August): article 282. doi:10.3389/fgene.2014.00282
  • –––, 2018, “Health Fetishism among the Nacirema: A Fugue on Jenny Reardon’s The Postgenomic Condition: Ethics, Justice, and Knowledge after the Genome (Chicago University Press, 2017) and Isabelle Stengers’ Another Science Is Possible: A Manifesto for Slow Science (Polity Press, 2018)”, Organisms. Journal of Biological Sciences, 2(1): 43–54. doi:10.13133/2532-5876_3.11
  • –––, 2019a, “Evolutionary Transitions Revisited: Holobiont Evo-devo”, Journal of Experimental Zoology Part B: Molecular and Developmental Evolution, 332(8): 307–314. doi:10.1002/jez.b.22903
  • –––, 2019b, “Towards A Developmental Biology Of Holobionts”, in Fusco 2019: 13–22.
  • –––, 2020a, “Developmental Symbiosis Facilitates the Multiple Origins of Herbivory”, Evolution and Development, 22(1–2): 154–164. doi:10.1111/ede.12291
  • –––, 2020b, “Holobionts Can Evolve By Changing Their Symbionts And Hosts”, in Feral Atlas: The More-Than-Human Anthropocene, Anna L. Tsing, Jennifer Deger, Alder Keleman Saxena, and Feifei Zhou (eds.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Gilbert, Scott F., Thomas C. G. Bosch, and Cristina Ledón-Rettig, 2015, “Eco-Evo-Devo: Developmental Symbiosis and Developmental Plasticity as Evolutionary Agents”, Nature Reviews Genetics, 16(10): 611–622. doi:10.1038/nrg3982
  • Gilbert, Scott F., Eugene Rosenberg, and Ilana Zilber-Rosenberg, 2017, “The Holobiont with Its Hologenome Is a Level of Selection in Evolution”, in Gissis, Lamm, and Shavit 2017: 305–324.
  • Gilbert, Scott F., Jan Sapp, and Alfred I. Tauber, 2012, “A Symbiotic View of Life: We Have Never Been Individuals”, The Quarterly Review of Biology, 87(4): 325–341. doi:10.1086/668166
  • Gilbert, Scott F. and Alfred I. Tauber, 2016, “Rethinking Individuality: The Dialectics of the Holobiont”, Biology & Philosophy, 31(6): 839–853. doi:10.1007/s10539-016-9541-3
  • Gilpin, Michael E., 1975, Group Selection in Predator-Prey Communities, (Monographs in Population Biology 9), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Gissis, Snait, Ehud Lamm, and Ayelet Shavit (eds.), 2017, Landscapes of Collectivity in the Life Sciences, (Vienna Series in Theoretical Biology), Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Glennan, Stuart, 2002, “Contextual Unanimity and the Units of Selection Problem”, Philosophy of Science, 69(1): 118–137. doi:10.1086/338944
  • Glymour, Bruce, 1999, “Population Level Causation and a Unified Theory of Natural Selection”, Biology and Philosophy, 14(4): 521–536. doi:10.1023/A:1006516232674
  • Godfrey-Smith, Peter, 1992, “Additivity and the Units of Selection”, PSA: Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1992(1): 315–328. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1992.1.192764
  • –––, 2007, “The Strategy of Model-Based Science”, Biology & Philosophy, 21(5): 725–740. doi:10.1007/s10539-006-9054-6
  • –––, 2009, Darwinian Populations and Natural Selection, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:osobl/9780199552047.001.0001
  • –––, 2011, “Agents and Acacias: Replies to Dennett, Sterelny, and Queller”, Biology and Philosophy, 26(4): 501–515. doi:10.1007/s10539-011-9246-6
  • –––, 2013, “Darwinian Individuals”, in From Groups to Individuals: Evolution and Emerging Individuality, Frédéric Bouchard and Philippe Huneman (eds.), Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 17–36 (ch. 1). doi:10.7551/mitpress/8921.003.0005
  • –––, 2016, “Complex Life Cycles and the Evolutionary Process”, Philosophy of Science, 83(5): 816–827. doi:10.1086/687866
  • Godfrey-Smith, Peter and Benjamin Kerr, 2002, “Group Fitness and Multi-Level Selection: Replies to Commentaries”, Biology & Philosophy, 17(4): 539–549. doi:10.1023/A:1020583723772
  • Godfrey-Smith, Peter and Richard Lewontin, 1993, “The Dimensions of Selection”, Philosophy of Science, 60(3): 373–395. doi:10.1086/289742
  • Goodnight, Charles J., 1985, “The Influence of Environmental Variation on Group and Individual Selection in a Cress”, Evolution, 39(3): 545–558. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1985.tb00394.x
  • –––, 2000, “Heritability at the Ecosystem Level”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 97(17): 9365–9366. doi:10.1073/pnas.97.17.9365
  • –––, 2012, “Wright’s Shifting Balance Theory and Factors Affecting the Probability of Peak Shifts”, in The Adaptive Landscape in Evolutionary Biology, Erik Svensson and Ryan Calsbeek (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 74–86. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199595372.003.0006
  • –––, 2013, “On Multilevel Selection and Kin Selection: Contextual Analysis Meets Direct Fitness”, Evolution, 67(6): 1539–1548. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.2012.01821.x
  • –––, 2015, “Multilevel Selection Theory and Evidence: A Critique of Gardner, 2015”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 28(9): 1734–1746. doi:10.1111/jeb.12685
  • –––, 2016, “On the Effectiveness of Multilevel Selection”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 39: e99. doi:10.1017/S0140525X15001053
  • –––, 2020, “The Theory of Multilevel Selection”, in The Theory of Evolution: Principles, Concepts, and Assumptions, Samuel M. Scheiner and David P. Mindell (eds.), Chicago/London: The University of Chicago Press, 194–210.
  • Goodnight, Charles J., James M. Schwartz, and Lori Stevens, 1992, “Contextual Analysis of Models of Group Selection, Soft Selection, Hard Selection, and the Evolution of Altruism”, The American Naturalist, 140(5): 743–761. doi:10.1086/285438
  • Goodnight, Charles J. and Lori Stevens, 1997, “Experimental Studies of Group Selection: What Do They Tell US About Group Selection in Nature?”, The American Naturalist, 150(S1): S59–S79. doi:10.1086/286050
  • Gordon, Deborah M., 2014, “The Ecology of Collective Behavior”, PLoS Biology, 12(3): e1001805. doi:10.1371/journal.pbio.1001805
  • Gould, Stephen Jay, 1977, “Caring Groups and Selfish Genes”, Natural History, 86(10): 20–24. Reprinted in his The Panda’s Thumb, New York: Norton, 1980, 85–92.
  • –––, 2002, The Structure of Evolutionary Theory, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press.
  • Gould, Stephen J. and Richard C. Lewontin, 1979, “The Spandrels of San Marco and the Panglossian Paradigm: A Critique of the Adaptationist Programme”, Proceedings of the Royal Society of London. Series B. Biological Sciences, 205(1161): 581–598. doi:10.1098/rspb.1979.0086
  • Gould, Stephen Jay and Elisabeth A. Lloyd, 1999, “Individuality and Adaptation across Levels of Selection: How Shall We Name and Generalize the Unit of Darwinism?”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 96(21): 11904–11909. doi:10.1073/pnas.96.21.11904
  • Gould, Stephen Jay and Elisabeth S. Vrba, 1982, “Exaptation—a Missing Term in the Science of Form”, Paleobiology, 8(1): 4–15. doi:10.1017/S0094837300004310
  • Grafen, Alan,
  • –––, 1984, “Natural Selection, Kin Selection, and Group Selection”, Behavioural Ecology: An Evolutionary Approach, 2nd ed., JR Krebs and NB Davies (eds), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 62–84.
  • –––, 1985a, “A Geometric View of Relatedness”, Oxford Surveys in Evolutionary Biology, Volume 2, Richard Dawkins and Mark Ridley (eds), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 28–89.
  • –––, 1985b, “Evolutionary Theory: Hamilton’s Rule OK”, Nature, 318(6044): 310–311. doi:10.1038/318310a0
  • –––, 2006, “Optimization of Inclusive Fitness”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 238(3): 541–563. doi:10.1016/j.jtbi.2005.06.009
  • –––, 2009, “Formalizing Darwinism and Inclusive Fitness Theory”, Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society B: Biological Sciences 364 (1533): 3135–3141.
  • Grant, B. Rosemary and Peter R. Grant, 1989, Evolutionary Dynamics of a Natural Population: The Large Cactus Finch of the Galápagos, Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Grant, Peter R., 1986, Ecology and Evolution of Darwin’s Finches, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press. Reprinted 1999.
  • Grantham, Todd A., 1994, “Putting the Cart Back behind the Horse: Group Selection Does Not Require That Groups Be ‘Organisms’”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 17(4): 622–623. doi:10.1017/S0140525X0003627X
  • –––, 1995, “Hierarchical Approaches to Macroevolution: Recent Work on Species Selection and the ‘Effect Hypothesis’”, Annual Review of Ecology and Systematics, 26: 301–321. doi:10.1146/annurev.es.26.110195.001505
  • Griesemer, James R., 1984, “Presentations and the Status of Theories”, PSA: Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1984(1): 102–114. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1984.1.192331 [Griesemer 1984 available online]
  • –––, 1998, “The Case for Epigenetic Inheritance in Evolution”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 11(2): 193–200. doi:10.1046/j.1420-9101.1998.11020193.x
  • –––, 2000a, “The Units of Evolutionary Transition”, Selection, 1(1–3): 67–80. doi:10.1556/Select.1.2000.1-3.7 [Griesemer 2000a available online]
  • –––, 2000b, “Development, Culture, and the Units of Inheritance”, Philosophy of Science, 67(S3): S348–S368. doi:10.1086/392831 [Griesemer 2000b available online]
  • –––, 2000c, “Reproduction and the Reduction of Genetics”, in The Concept of the Gene in Development and Evolution, Peter J. Beurton, Raphael Falk, and Hans-Jörg Rheinberger (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 240–285. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511527296.013 [Griesemer 2000c available online]
  • –––, 2003, “The Philosophical Significance of Gánti′s Work”, in The Principles of Life, by Tibor Ganti, Eors Szathmáry and James Griesemer (eds.), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 169–186. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198507260.003.0005
  • –––, 2005, “The Informational Gene and the Substantial Body: On the Generalization of Evolutionary Theory by Abstraction”, in Idealization XII: Correcting the Model. Idealization and Abstraction in the Sciences, Nancy Cartwright and Martin R. Jones (eds.), (Poznan Studies), Amsterdam: Rodopi Publishers, 59–115. [Griesemer 2005 available online]
  • –––, 2013, “Formalization and the Meaning of ‘Theory’ in the Inexact Biological Sciences”, Biological Theory, 7(4): 298–310. doi:10.1007/s13752-012-0065-z
  • –––, 2014, “Reproduction and Scaffolded Developmental Processes: An Integrated Evolutionary Perspective”, in Towards a Theory of Development, Alessandro Minelli and Thomas Pradeu (eds), Oxford University Press, pp. 183–202 (ch. 12). doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199671427.003.0012 [Griesemer 2014 available online]
  • –––, 2016, “Reproduction in Complex Life Cycles: Toward a Developmental Reason Norms Perspective”, Philosophy of Science, 83(5): 803–815. doi:10.1086/687865
  • –––, 2018, “Individuation of Developmental Systems: A Reproducer Perspective”, in Bueno, Chen, and Fagan 2018: 137–164 (ch. 7). [Griesemer 2018 available online]
  • –––, 2019, “Towards a Theory of Extended Development”, in Fusco 2019: 319–334. [Griesemer 2019 available online]
  • Griesemer, James R. and Michael J. Wade, 1988, “Laboratory Models, Causal Explanation and Group Selection”, Biology & Philosophy, 3(1): 67–96. doi:10.1007/BF00127629 [Griesemer and Wade 1988 available online]
  • –––, 2000, “Populational Heritability: Extending Punnett Square Concepts to Evolution at the Metapopulation Level”, Biology & Philosophy, 15(1): 1–17. doi:10.1023/A:1006501313374 [Griesemer and Wade 2000 available online]
  • Griesemer, James R. and William C. Wimsatt, 1989, “Picturing Weismannism: A Case Study of Conceptual Evolution”, in What the Philosophy of Biology Is: Essays for David Hull, Michael Ruse (ed.), (Nijhoff International Philosophy Series 32), Dordrecht: Kluwer, 75–137. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-1169-7_6
  • Griffing, B, 1967, “Selection in Reference to Biological Groups I. Individual and Group Selection Applied to Populations of Unordered Groups”, Australian Journal of Biological Sciences, 20(1): 127–139. doi:10.1071/BI9670127
  • Griffiths, Paul E. and Russell D. Gray, 1994, “Developmental Systems and Evolutionary Explanation”, Journal of Philosophy, 91(6): 277–304. doi:10.2307/2940982
  • –––, 1997, “Replicator II – Judgement Day”, Biology & Philosophy, 12(4): 471–492. doi:10.1023/A:1006551516090
  • Grosberg, R.K. and R.R. Strathmann, 1998, “One Cell, Two Cell, Red Cell, Blue Cell: The Persistence of a Unicellular Stage in Multicellular Life Histories”, Trends in Ecology & Evolution, 13(3): 112–116. doi:10.1016/S0169-5347(97)01313-X
  • Guerrero, Ricardo, Lynn Margulis, and Mercedes Berlanga, 2013, “Symbiogenesis: The Holobiont as a Unit of Evolution”, International Microbiology, 16: 133–143. doi:10.2436/20.1501.01.188
  • Hadfield, Jarrod D. and Alastair J. Wilson, 2007, “Multilevel Selection 3: Modeling the Effects of Interacting Individuals as a Function of Group Size”, Genetics, 177(1): 667–668. doi:10.1534/genetics.107.075622
  • Haldane, J. B. S., 1932a, The Causes of Evolution, London: Longmans, Green and Co..
  • –––, 1932b, “A Mathematical Theory of Natural and Artificial Selection. Part IX. Rapid Selection”, Mathematical Proceedings of the Cambridge Philosophical Society, 28(2): 244–248. doi:10.1017/S0305004100010914
  • Hall, Brian K. (ed.), 1994, Homology: The Hierarchical Basis of Comparative Biology, San Diego, CA: Academic Press.
  • Hamilton, W. D., 1963, “The Evolution of Altruistic Behavior”, The American Naturalist, 97(896): 354–356. doi:10.1086/497114
  • –––, 1964, “The Genetical Evolution of Social Behaviour. II”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 7(1): 17–52. doi:10.1016/0022-5193(64)90039-6
  • –––, 1975, “Innate Social Aptitudes in Man: An Approach from Evolutionary Genetics”, in Biosocial Anthropology, Robin Fox (ed.), (ASA Studies 1), London: Malaby Press, 133–155.
  • Hampe, M. and S.R. Morgan, 1988, “Two Consequences of Richard Dawkins’ View of Genes and Organisms”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part A, 19(1): 119–138. doi:10.1016/0039-3681(88)90022-2
  • Harvey, Michael G., Sonal Singhal, and Daniel L. Rabosky, 2019, “Beyond Reproductive Isolation: Demographic Controls on the Speciation Process”, Annual Review of Ecology, Evolution, and Systematics, 50: 75–95. doi:10.1146/annurev-ecolsys-110218-024701
  • Hautmann, Michael, 2020, “What Is Macroevolution?”, Palaeontology, 63(1): 1–11. doi:10.1111/pala.12465
  • Heisler, I. Lorraine and John Damuth, 1987, “A Method for Analyzing Selection in Hierarchically Structured Populations”, The American Naturalist, 130(4): 582–602. doi:10.1086/284732
  • Herron, Matthew D., 2017, “Cells, Colonies, and Clones: Individuality in the Volvocine Algae”, in Lidgard and Nyhart 2017: 63–83 (ch. 2).
  • –––, 2021, “What Are the Major Transitions?”, Biology & Philosophy, 36(1): article 2. doi:10.1007/s10539-020-09773-z
  • Herron, Matthew D. and Richard E. Michod, 2008, “Evolution of Complexity in the Volvocine Algae: Transitions in Individuality through Darwin’s Eye”, Evolution, 62(2): 436–451. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.2007.00304.x
  • Heslot, Nicolas, Hsiao-Pei Yang, Mark E. Sorrells, and Jean-Luc Jannink, 2012, “Genomic Selection in Plant Breeding: A Comparison of Models”, Crop Science, 52(1): 146–160. doi:10.2135/cropsci2011.06.0297
  • Hölldobler, Bert and Edward O. Wilson, 2009, The Superorganism: The Beauty, Elegance, and Strangeness of Insect Societies, New York: W.W. Norton & Company.
  • Hull, David L., 1980, “Individuality and Selection”, Annual Review of Ecology and Systematics, 11: 311–332. doi:10.1146/annurev.es.11.110180.001523
  • –––, 1988, Science as a Process: An Evolutionary Account of the Social and Conceptual Development of Science, (Science and Its Conceptual Foundations), Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Hull, David L. and Michael Ruse (eds.), 2007, The Cambridge Companion to the Philosophy of Biology, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCOL9780521851282
  • Hunt, Gene, Kaustuv Roy, and David Jablonski, 2005, “Species-Level Heritability Reaffirmed: A Comment on ‘On the Heritability of Geographic Range Sizes’”, The American Naturalist, 166(1): 129–135. doi:10.1086/430722
  • Hurst, Gregory D. D., 2017, “Extended Genomes: Symbiosis and Evolution”, Interface Focus, 7(5): 20170001. doi:10.1098/rsfs.2017.0001
  • Huttegger, Simon M. and Rory Smead, 2011, “Efficient Social Contracts and Group Selection”, Biology & Philosophy, 26(4): 517–531. doi:10.1007/s10539-011-9265-3
  • Huxley, Julian, 1942, Evolution: The Modern Synthesis, New York/London: Harper & brothers.
  • Inkpen, S. Andrew and W. Ford Doolittle, 2021, “Adaptive Regeneration Across Scales: Replicators and Interactors from Limbs to Forests”, Philosophy, Theory, and Practice in Biology, 13: article 1. [Inkpen and Doolittle 2021 available online]
  • Istvan, M.A., Jr, 2013, “Gould Talking Past Dawkins on the Unit of Selection Issue”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part C: Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 44(3): 327–335. doi:10.1016/j.shpsc.2013.05.020
  • Jablonski, David, 1987, “Heritability at the Species Level: Analysis of Geographic Ranges of Cretaceous Mollusks”, Science, 238(4825): 360–363. doi:10.1126/science.238.4825.360
  • –––, 2008, “Species Selection: Theory and Data”, Annual Review of Ecology, Evolution, and Systematics, 39: 501–524. doi:10.1146/annurev.ecolsys.39.110707.173510
  • –––, 2017a, “Approaches to Macroevolution: 1. General Concepts and Origin of Variation”, Evolutionary Biology, 44(4): 427–450. doi:10.1007/s11692-017-9420-0
  • –––, 2017b, “Approaches to Macroevolution: 2. Sorting of Variation, Some Overarching Issues, and General Conclusions”, Evolutionary Biology, 44(4): 451–475. doi:10.1007/s11692-017-9434-7
  • Jablonski, David and Gene Hunt, 2006, “Larval Ecology, Geographic Range, and Species Survivorship in Cretaceous Mollusks: Organismic versus Species-Level Explanations”, The American Naturalist, 168(4): 556–564. doi:10.1086/507994
  • Jones, Emily I., Michelle E. Afkhami, Erol Akçay, Judith L. Bronstein, Redouan Bshary, Megan E. Frederickson, Katy D. Heath, Jason D. Hoeksema, Joshua H. Ness, M. Sabrina Pankey, Stephanie S. Porter, Joel L. Sachs, Klara Scharnagl, and Maren L. Friesen, 2015, “Cheaters Must Prosper: Reconciling Theoretical and Empirical Perspectives on Cheating in Mutualism”, Ecology Letters, 18(11): 1270–1284. doi:10.1111/ele.12507
  • Kaltenpoth, Martin, Kerstin Roeser-Mueller, Sabrina Koehler, Ashley Peterson, Taras Y. Nechitaylo, J. William Stubblefield, Gudrun Herzner, Jon Seger, and Erhard Strohm, 2014, “Partner Choice and Fidelity Stabilize Coevolution in a Cretaceous-Age Defensive Symbiosis”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 111(17): 6359–6364. doi:10.1073/pnas.1400457111
  • Keller, Evelyn Fox and Elisabeth Anne Lloyd (eds.), 1992, Keywords in Evolutionary Biology, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Kellert, Stephen H., Helen E. Longino, and C. Kenneth Waters (eds.), 2006, Scientific Pluralism, (Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 19), Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Kerr, Benjamin and Peter Godfrey-Smith, 2002, “Individualist and Multi-Level Perspectives on Selection in Structured Populations”, Biology & Philosophy, 17(4): 477–517. doi:10.1023/A:1020504900646
  • Kerr, Peter, June Liu, Isabella Cattadori, Elodie Ghedin, Andrew Read, and Edward Holmes, 2015, “Myxoma Virus and the Leporipoxviruses: An Evolutionary Paradigm”, Viruses, 7(3): 1020–1061. doi:10.3390/v7031020
  • Ketcham, Ryan, 2018, “Equivalence, Interactors, and Lloyd’s Challenge to Genic Pluralism”, in Multilevel Selection and the Theory of Evolution, Ciprian Jeler (ed.), Cham: Springer International Publishing, 71–98. doi:10.1007/978-3-319-78677-3_4
  • –––, 2019, “Task Allocation and the Logic of Research Questions: How Ants Challenge Human Sociobiology”, Biological Theory, 14(1): 52–68. doi:10.1007/s13752-018-0308-8
  • –––, 2024, “What is the Additivity Criterion for?”, Michael R. Dietrich and Samuel R. Ketcham (eds.), Philosophy, Feminism, and Science: Critical Perspectives on the Work of Elisabeth A. Lloyd, Pittsburgh, Pittsburgh University Press.
  • Kitcher, Philip, Kim Sterelny, & C. Kenneth Waters, 1990, “The Illusory Riches of Sober’s Monism”, The Journal of Philosophy, 87(3): 158–161. doi:10.2307/2026634
  • Koskella, Britt and Joy Bergelson, 2020, “The Study of Host–Microbiome (Co)Evolution across Levels of Selection”, Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society B: Biological Sciences, 375(1808): 20190604 (8 pages). doi:10.1098/rstb.2019.0604
  • Kramer, Jos and Joël Meunier, 2016, “Kin and Multilevel Selection in Social Evolution: A Never-Ending Controversy?”, F1000Research, 5(April): 776. doi:10.12688/f1000research.8018.1
  • Krimbas, Costas B., 1984, “On Adaptation, Neo-Darwinian Tautology, and Population Fitness”, in Evolutionary Biology, Volume 17, Max K. Hecht, Bruce Wallace, and Ghillean T. Prance (eds.), Boston, MA: Springer US, 1–57. doi:10.1007/978-1-4615-6974-9_1
  • Laiolo, Paola and José Ramón Obeso, 2012, “Multilevel Selection and Neighbourhood Effects from Individual to Metapopulation in a Wild Passerine”, PLoS ONE, 7(6): e38526. doi:10.1371/journal.pone.0038526
  • Laland, Kevin N., Tobias Uller, Marcus W. Feldman, Kim Sterelny, Gerd B. Müller, Armin Moczek, Eva Jablonka, and John Odling-Smee, 2015, “The Extended Evolutionary Synthesis: Its Structure, Assumptions and Predictions”, Proceedings of the Royal Society B: Biological Sciences, 282(1813): 20151019. doi:10.1098/rspb.2015.1019
  • Lamm, Ehud and Oren Kolodny, 2022, “Distributed Adaptations: Can a Species Be Adapted While No Single Individual Carries the Adaptation?”, Frontiers in Ecology and Evolution, 10(February): 791104 (13 pages). doi:10.3389/fevo.2022.791104
  • Lancichinetti, Andrea and Santo Fortunato, 2009, “Community Detection Algorithms: A Comparative Analysis”, Physical Review E, 80(5): 056117. doi:10.1103/PhysRevE.80.056117
  • Lande, Russell and Stevan J. Arnold, 1983, “The Measurement of Selection on Correlated Characters”, Evolution, 37(6): 1210–1226. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1983.tb00236.x
  • Lee, Yun Kyung and Sarkis K. Mazmanian, 2010, “Has the Microbiota Played a Critical Role in the Evolution of the Adaptive Immune System?”, Science, 330(6012): 1768–1773. doi:10.1126/science.1195568
  • Lehmann, Laurent, Laurent Keller, Stuart West, and Denis Roze, 2007, “Group Selection and Kin Selection: Two Concepts but One Process”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 104(16): 6736–6739. doi:10.1073/pnas.0700662104
  • Leigh, Egbert G., Jr, 1977, “How Does Selection Reconcile Individual Advantage with the Good of the Group?”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 74(10): 4542–4546. doi:10.1073/pnas.74.10.4542
  • Levin, Bruce R. and William L. Kilmer, 1974, “Interdemic Selection and the Evolution of Altruism: A Computer Simulation Study”, Evolution, 28(4): 527–545. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1974.tb00787.x
  • Levin, Simon and David Pimentel, 1981, “Selection of Intermediate Rates of Increase in Parasite-Host Systems”, The American Naturalist, 117(3): 308–315. doi:10.1086/283708
  • Lewontin, Richard C., 1958, “A General Method for Investigating the Equilibrium of Gene Frequency in a Population”, Genetics, 43(3): 419–434. doi:10.1093/genetics/43.3.419
  • –––, 1962, “Interdeme Selection Controlling a Polymorphism in the House Mouse”, The American Naturalist, 96(887): 65–78. doi:10.1086/282208
  • –––, 1970, “The Units of Selection”, Annual Review of Ecology and Systematics, 1: 1–18. doi:10.1146/annurev.es.01.110170.000245
  • –––, 1974, The Genetic Basis of Evolutionary Change, (Columbia Biological Series, no. 25), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1978, “Adaptation”, Scientific American, 239(3): 212–230. doi:10.1038/scientificamerican0978-212
  • –––, 1979, “Fitness, Survival and Optimality”, in Analysis of Ecological Systems, David J. Horn, Gordon R. Stains, and Rodger D. Mitchell (eds.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 58–68.
  • Lewontin, Richard C. and L. C. Dunn, 1960, “The Evolutionary Dynamics of a Polymorphism in the House Mouse”, Genetics, 45(6): 705–722. doi:10.1093/genetics/45.6.705
  • Ley, Ruth E., Catherine A. Lozupone, Micah Hamady, Rob Knight, and Jeffrey I. Gordon, 2008, “Worlds within Worlds: Evolution of the Vertebrate Gut Microbiota”, Nature Reviews Microbiology, 6(10): 776–788. doi:10.1038/nrmicro1978
  • Li, C. C., 1967, “Fundamental Theorem of Natural Selection”, Nature, 214(5087): 505–506. doi:10.1038/214505a0
  • Lidgard, Scott and Lynn K. Nyhart (eds.), 2017, Biological Individuality: Integrating Scientific, Philosophical, and Historical Perspectives, Chicago, IL: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Lieberman, Bruce S. and Elisabeth S. Vrba, 2005, “Stephen Jay Gould on Species Selection: 30 Years of Insight”, Paleobiology, 31(s2): 113–121. doi:10.1666/0094-8373(2005)031[0113:SJGOSS]2.0.CO;2
  • Linksvayer, Timothy A. and Michael J. Wade, 2005, “The Evolutionary Origin And Elaboration Of Sociality In The Aculeate Hymenoptera: Maternal Effects, Sib-social Effects, And Heterochrony”, The Quarterly Review of Biology, 80(3): 317–336. doi:10.1086/432266
  • –––, 2009, “Genes with Social Effects Are Expected to Harbor More Sequence Variation within and between Species”, Evolution, 63(7): 1685–1696. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.2009.00670.x
  • Lloyd, Elisabeth A., 1983, “The Nature of Darwin’s Support for the Theory of Natural Selection”, Philosophy of Science, 50(1): 112–129. doi:10.1086/289093
  • –––, 1984, “A Semantic Approach to the Structure of Population Genetics”, Philosophy of Science, 51(2): 242–264. doi:10.1086/289179
  • –––, 1986, “Evaluation of Evidence in Group Selection Debates”, PSA: Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1986(1): 483–493. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1986.1.193148
  • –––, 1987, “Confirmation of Ecological and Evolutionary Models”, Biology & Philosophy, 2(3): 277–293. doi:10.1007/BF00128834
  • –––, 1988 [1994], The Structure and Confirmation of Evolutionary Theory (Contributions in Philosophy, 37), New York: Greenwood Press. Paperback edition with new preface, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1994.
  • –––, 1992, “Unit of Selection”, in Keller and Lloyd 1992: 334–340.
  • –––, 2001, “Units and Levels of Selection: An Anatomy of the Units of Selection Debates”, in Thinking About Evolution (Historical, Philosophical, and Political Perspectives, vol. 2), Rama S. Singh, Costas B. Krimbas, Diane B. Paul, and John Beatty (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 267–291 (ch. 13).
  • –––, 2005, “Why the Gene Will Not Return”, Philosophy of Science, 72(2): 287–310. doi:10.1086/432425
  • –––, 2007, Reprint of edited version of 2001, in A Cambridge Companion to Philosophy of Biology, Eds David L Hull and Michael Ruse, Cambridge UP.
  • –––, 2008, “An open letter to Elliott Sober and David Sloan Wilson regarding their book Unto Others: the Evolution and psychology of unselfish behavior”, in EA Lloyd, Science, Politics, and Evolution, New York/Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 95–105.
  • –––, 2015, “Adaptationism and the Logic of Research Questions: How to Think Clearly About Evolutionary Causes”, Biological Theory, 10(4): 343–362. doi:10.1007/s13752-015-0214-2
  • –––, 2017, “Holobionts as Units of Selection: Holobionts as Interactors, Reproducers, and Manifestors of Adaptation”, in Gissis, Lamm, and Shavit 2017: 351–367.
  • –––, 2021, Adaptation, (Elements in the Philosophy of Biology), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781108634953
  • Lloyd, Elisabeth A. and Marcus W. Feldman, 2002, “COMMENTARY: Evolutionary Psychology: A View From Evolutionary Biology”, Psychological Inquiry, 13(2): 150–156. Published with a rebuttal: Ellis and Ketelaar 2002. doi:10.1207/S15327965PLI1302_04
  • Lloyd, Elisabeth A. and Stephen Jay Gould, 1993, “Species Selection on Variability”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 90(2): 595–599. doi:10.1073/pnas.90.2.595
  • Lloyd, Elisabeth A., Richard C. Lewontin, and Marcus W. Feldman, 2008, “The Generational Cycle of State Spaces and Adequate Genetical Representation”, Philosophy of Science, 75(2): 140–156. doi:10.1086/590196
  • Lloyd, Elisabeth A. and Michael J. Wade, 2019, “Criteria for Holobionts from Community Genetics”, Biological Theory, 14(3): 151–170. doi:10.1007/s13752-019-00322-w
  • Love, Alan C., 2016, “Explaining the Origins of Multicellularity: Between Evolutionary Dynamics and Developmental Mechanisms”, in Multicellularity: Origins and Evolution, Karl J. Niklas and Stuart A. Newman (eds.), Cambridge, MA: MIT press, 279–295.
  • Love, Alan C., Otavio Bueno, Ruey-Lin Chen, & Melinda Bonnie Fagan, 2018, “Individuation, Individuality, and Experimental Practice in Developmental Biology”, Individuation, process, and scientific practices, Otavio Bueno, Ruey-Lin Chen, and Melinda Bonnie Fagan (eds.) 2018: 165–191 (ch. 8).
  • Love, Alan C. and Ingo Brigandt, 2017, “Philosophical Dimensions of Individuality”, in Lidgard and Nyhart 2017: 318–348 (ch. 13).
  • Margulis, Lynn, 1991, “Symbiogenesis and Symbionticism”, in Margulis and Fester 1991: 1–14 (ch. 1).
  • Margulis, Lynn and René Fester (eds.), 1991, Symbiosis as a Source of Evolutionary Innovation: Speciation and Morphogenesis, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Marín, César, 2021, “Spatial and Density-Dependent Multilevel Selection on Weed-Infested Maize”, Genetic Resources and Crop Evolution, 68(3): 885–897. doi:10.1007/s10722-020-01031-1
  • Marshall, James A.R., 2011, “Group Selection and Kin Selection: Formally Equivalent Approaches”, Trends in Ecology & Evolution, 26(7): 325–332. doi:10.1016/j.tree.2011.04.008
  • Matessi, C. and S.D. Jayakar, 1976, “Conditions for the Evolution of Altruism under Darwinian Selection”, Theoretical Population Biology, 9(3): 360–387. doi:10.1016/0040-5809(76)90053-8
  • Maynard Smith, John, 1964, “Group Selection and Kin Selection”, Nature, 201(4924): 1145–1147. doi:10.1038/2011145a0
  • –––, 1974, “The Theory of Games and the Evolution of Animal Conflicts”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 47(1): 209–221. doi:10.1016/0022-5193(74)90110-6
  • –––, 1976, “Group Selection”, Quarterly Review of Biology, 51(2): 277–283. doi:10.1086/409311
  • –––, 1978, “Optimization Theory in Evolution”, Annual Review of Ecology and Systematics, 9: 31–56. doi:10.1146/annurev.es.09.110178.000335
  • –––, 1980, “Models of the Evolution of Altruism”, Theoretical Population Biology, 18(2): 151–159. doi:10.1016/0040-5809(80)90046-5
  • –––, 1984, “The Population as a Unit of Selection”, in Evolutionary Ecology, 23rd British Ecological Society Symposium, Bryan Shorrocks (ed.), Oxford, UK: Blackwell, pp. 195–202.
  • –––, 1987, “Evolutionary Progress and Levels of Selection”, in The Latest on the Best: Essays on Evolution and Optimality, John Dupré (ed.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 219–230.
  • –––, 1991, “A Darwinian View of Symbiosis”, in Margulis and Fester 2019: 26–37 (ch. 3).
  • –––, 2001, “Reconciling Marx and Darwin”, Evolution, 55(7): 1496–1498. doi:10.1111/j.0014-3820.2001.tb00670.x
  • Maynard Smith, John and Eörs Szathmáry, 1995, The Major Transitions in Evolution, Oxford/New York: W.H. Freeman Spektrum.
  • Mayr, Ernst, 1976, Evolution and the Diversity of Life, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 1978, “Evolution”, Scientific Amen, 239(3): 46–55. doi:10.1038/scientificamerican0978-46
  • –––, 1982, “Adaptation and Selection”, Biologisches Zentralblatt, 101: 161–174.
  • McAdam, Andrew G., Dany Garant, and Alastair J. Wilson, 2014, “The Effects of Others’ Genes: Maternal and Other Indirect Genetic Effects”, in Quantitative Genetics in the Wild, Anne Charmantier, Dany Garant, and Loeske E. B. Kruuk (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 84–103 (ch. 6). doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199674237.003.0006
  • McAdam, Andrew G., Quinn M. R. Webber, Ben Dantzer, Jeffrey E. Lane, and Stan Boutin, 2022, “Social Effects on Annual Fitness in Red Squirrels”, Journal of Heredity, 113(1): 69–78. doi:10.1093/jhered/esab051
  • McCauley, David E. and Michael J. Wade, 1980, “Group Selection: The Genetic and Demographic Basis for the Phenotypic Differentiation of Small Populations of Tribolium castaneum”, Evolution, 34(4): 813–821. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1980.tb04020.x
  • McFall-Ngai, Margaret, Michael G. Hadfield, Thomas C. G. Bosch, Hannah V. Carey, Tomislav Domazet-Lošo, Angela E. Douglas, Nicole Dubilier, Gerard Eberl, Tadashi Fukami, Scott F. Gilbert, et al., 2013, “Animals in a Bacterial World, a New Imperative for the Life Sciences”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 110(9): 3229–3236. doi:10.1073/pnas.1218525110
  • McGlothlin, Joel W., Allen J. Moore, Jason B. Wolf, and Edmund D. Brodie III, 2010, “Interacting Phenotypes and the Evolutionary Process. III. Social Evolution”, Evolution, 64(9): 2558–2574.
  • McGlothlin, Joel W. and Laura F. Galloway, 2014a, “The Contribution of Maternal Effects to Selection Response: An Empirical Test of Competing Models”, Evolution, 68(2): 549–558.
  • McGlothlin, Joel W., Jason B. Wolf, Edmund D. Brodie III, and Allen J. Moore, 2014b, “Quantitative Genetic Versions of Hamilton’s Rule with Empirical Applications”, Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society B: Biological Sciences, 369(1642): 20130358.
  • McKenna, Kenneth Z., Günter P. Wagner, and Kimberly L. Cooper, 2021, “A Developmental Perspective of Homology and Evolutionary Novelty”, in Current Topics in Developmental Biology 141, Cambridge, MA: Academic Press, 1–38. doi:10.1016/bs.ctdb.2020.12.001
  • Meincke, Anne Sophie and John Dupré (eds.), 2020, Biological Identity: Perspectives from Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Biology, New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9781351066389
  • Michod, Richard E. and Matthew D. Herron, 2006, “Cooperation and Conflict during Evolutionary Transitions in Individuality”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 19(5): 1406–1409. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2006.01142.x
  • Michod, Richard E. and Denis Roze, 1999, “Cooperation and Conflict in the Evolution of Individuality. III. Transitions in the Unit of Fitness”, in Mathematical and Computational Biology: Computational Morphogenesis, Hierarchical Complexity, and Digital Evolution, Chrystopher L. Nehaniv (ed.), (Lectures on Mathematics in the Life Sciences 26), Providence, RI: American Mathematical Society, 47–92.
  • –––, 2001, “Cooperation and Conflict in the Evolution of Multicellularity”, Heredity, 86(1): 1–7. doi:10.1046/j.1365-2540.2001.00808.x
  • Mitchell, Sandra D., 1987, “Competing Units of Selection?: A Case of Symbiosis”, Philosophy of Science, 54(3): 351–367. doi:10.1086/289388
  • Molter, Daniel J., 2019, “On Mycorrhizal Individuality”, Biology & Philosophy, 34(5): article 52. doi:10.1007/s10539-019-9706-y
  • Moore, Allen J., Edmund D. Brodie, and Jason B. Wolf, 1997, “Interacting Phenotypes and the Evolutionary Process: I. Direct and Indirect Genetic Effects of Social Interactions”, Evolution, 51(5): 1352–1362. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1997.tb01458.x
  • Moran, Nancy A. and Daniel B. Sloan, 2015, “The Hologenome Concept: Helpful or Hollow?”, PLOS Biology, 13(12): e1002311. doi:10.1371/journal.pbio.1002311
  • Morowitz, Harold J., 1992, Beginnings of Cellular Life: Metabolism Recapitulates Biogenesis, (Bio-Origins Series), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Morrison, Monica Ainhorn, 2021, “The Models are Alright: a Socio-Epistemic Theory of the Landscape of Climate Model Development”, PhD thesis, Indiana University.
  • Muir, William M., 1996, “Group Selection for Adaptation to Multiple-Hen Cages: Selection Program and Direct Responses”, Poultry Science, 75(4): 447–458. doi:10.3382/ps.0750447
  • –––, 2005, “Incorporation of Competitive Effects in Forest Tree or Animal Breeding Programs”, Genetics, 170(3): 1247–1259. doi:10.1534/genetics.104.035956
  • Munson, Ronald, 1971, “Biological Adaptation”, Philosophy of Science, 38(2): 200–215. Reprinted in Topics in the Philosophy of Biology, Marjorie Grene and Everett Mendelsohn (eds), (Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science 27), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, 330–350. doi:10.1086/288354 doi:10.1007/978-94-010-1829-6_15
  • Mutic, Joshua J. and Jason B. Wolf, 2007, “Indirect Genetic Effects from Ecological Interactions in Arabidopsis Thaliana”, Molecular Ecology, 16(11): 2371–2381. doi:10.1111/j.1365-294X.2007.03259.x
  • Nanay, Bence, 2011, “Replication Without Replicators”, Synthese, 179(3): 455–477. doi:10.1007/s11229-009-9702-x
  • Nanninga, Gerrit B. and Andrea Manica, 2018, “Larval Swimming Capacities Affect Genetic Differentiation and Range Size in Demersal Marine Fishes”, Marine Ecology Progress Series, 589: 1–12.
  • Nicholson, Daniel J. and John Dupré (eds.), 2018, Everything Flows: Towards a Processual Philosophy of Biology, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198779636.001.0001
  • Nicholson, Jeremy K., Elaine Holmes, James Kinross, Remy Burcelin, Glenn Gibson, Wei Jia, and Sven Pettersson, 2012, “Host-Gut Microbiota Metabolic Interactions”, Science, 336(6086): 1262–1267. doi:10.1126/science.1223813
  • Nowak, Martin A., Corina E. Tarnita, and Edward O. Wilson, 2010, “The Evolution of Eusociality”, Nature, 466(7310): 1057–1062. doi:10.1038/nature09205
  • –––, 2011, “Nowak et al. Reply”, Nature, 471(7339): E9–E10. doi:10.1038/nature09836
  • Odling-Smee, John and Kevin N. Laland, 2011, “Ecological Inheritance and Cultural Inheritance: What Are They and How Do They Differ?”, Biological Theory, 6(3): 220–230. doi:10.1007/s13752-012-0030-x
  • Ohta, Kuniyoshi, 1983, “Hierarchical Theory of Selection: The Covariance Formula of Selection and Its Applications”, Japanese Journal of Biometrics, 4: 25–33. doi:10.5691/jjb.4.25
  • Okasha, Samir, 2004a, “Multi-level Selection, Covariance and Contextual Analysis”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 55(3): 481–504. doi:10.1093/bjps/55.3.481
  • –––, 2004b, “Multilevel Selection and the Partitioning of Covariance: A Comparison of Three Approaches”, Evolution, 58(3): 486–494. doi:10.1111/j.0014-3820.2004.tb01672.x
  • –––, 2006, Evolution and the Levels of Selection, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199267972.001.0001
  • –––, 2011, “Reply to Sober and Waters”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 82(1): 241–8. doi:10.1111/j.1933-1592.2010.00474.x
  • –––, 2015, “The Relation Between Kin and Multilevel Selection: An Approach Using Causal Graphs”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 67(2): 435–470. doi:10.1093/bjps/axu047
  • –––, 2018, Agents and Goals in Evolution, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198815082.001.0001
  • –––, 2022, “The Major Transitions in Evolution—A Philosophy-of-Science Perspective”, Frontiers in Ecology and Evolution, 10(February): 793824. doi:10.3389/fevo.2022.793824
  • Okasha, Samir and Jun Otsuka, 2020, “The Price Equation and the Causal Analysis of Evolutionary Change”, Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society B: Biological Sciences, 375(1797): 20190365. doi:10.1098/rstb.2019.0365
  • Okasha, Samir and C. Paternotte, 2012, “Group Adaptation, Formal Darwinism and Contextual Analysis: Group Adaptation, Formal Darwinism and Contextual Analysis”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 25(6): 1127–1139. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2012.02501.x
  • O’Malley, Maureen A., 2017, “From Endosymbiosis to Holobionts: Evaluating a Conceptual Legacy”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 434(December): 34–41. doi:10.1016/j.jtbi.2017.03.008
  • O’Malley, Maureen A. and John Dupré, 2007, “Size Doesn’t Matter: Towards a More Inclusive Philosophy of Biology”, Biology & Philosophy, 22(2): 155–191. doi:10.1007/s10539-006-9031-0
  • O’Malley, Maureen A., Ingo Brigandt, Alan C. Love, John W. Crawford, Jack A. Gilbert, Rob Knight, Sandra D. Mitchell, and Forest Rohwer, 2014, “Multilevel Research Strategies and Biological Systems”, Philosophy of Science, 81(5): 811–828. doi:10.1086/677889
  • O’Malley, Maureen A. and Russell Powell, 2016, “Major Problems in Evolutionary Transitions: How a Metabolic Perspective Can Enrich Our Understanding of Macroevolution”, Biology & Philosophy, 31(2): 159–189. doi:10.1007/s10539-015-9513-z
  • Oster, George F. and Edward O. Wilson, 1978, Caste and Ecology in the Social Insects, (Monographs in Population Biology 12), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Otsuka, Jun, 2016a, “Causal Foundations of Evolutionary Genetics”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 67(1): 247–269. doi:10.1093/bjps/axu039
  • –––, 2016b, “A Critical Review of the Statisticalist Debate”, Biology & Philosophy, 31(4): 459–482. doi:10.1007/s10539-016-9528-0
  • –––, 2019a, “Ontology, Causality, and Methodology of Evolutionary Research Programs”, in Evolutionary Causation: Biological and Philosophical Reflections, Tobias Uller and Kevin N. Laland (eds.), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 247–264.
  • –––, 2019b, The Role of Mathematics in Evolutionary Theory, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781108672115
  • Otsuka, Jun, Trin Turner, Colin Allen, and Elisabeth A. Lloyd, 2011, “Why the Causal View of Fitness Survives”, Philosophy of Science, 78(2): 209–224. doi:10.1086/659219
  • Oyama, Susan, 1985, The Ontogeny of Information: Developmental Systems and Evolution, Cambridge/New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Oyama, Susan, Paul E. Griffiths, and Russell D. Gray (eds.), 2001, Cycles of Contingency: Developmental Systems and Evolution (Life and Mind), Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Papale, François, 2021, “Evolution by Means of Natural Selection without Reproduction: Revamping Lewontin’s Account”, Synthese, 198(11): 10429–10455.
  • Pie, Marcio R. and Andreas L. S. Meyer, 2017, “The Evolution of Range Sizes in Mammals and Squamates: Heritability and Differential Evolutionary Rates for Low- and High-Latitude Limits”, Evolutionary Biology, 44(3): 347–355. doi:10.1007/s11692-017-9412-0
  • Planer, Ronald J., 2015, “On the Free-Rider Identification Problem”, Biological Theory, 10(2): 134–144. doi:10.1007/s13752-015-0206-2
  • Polly, Paul, Jesualdo Fuentes-Gonzalez, A. Michelle Lawing, Allison Bormet, and Robert G. Dundas, 2017, “Clade Sorting Has a Greater Effect than Local Adaptation on Ecometric Patterns in Carnivora”, Evolutionary Ecology Research, 18(February): 61–95.
  • Pradeu, Thomas, 2010a, “The Organism in Developmental Systems Theory”, Biological Theory, 5(3): 216–222. doi:10.1162/BIOT_a_00042
  • –––, 2010b, “What Is an Organism? An Immunological Answer”, History and Philosophy of the Life Sciences, 32(2–3): 247–267.
  • –––, 2011, “A Mixed Self: The Role of Symbiosis in Development”, Biological Theory, 6(1): 80–88. doi:10.1007/s13752-011-0011-5
  • –––, 2016a, “Organisms or Biological Individuals? Combining Physiological and Evolutionary Individuality”, Biology & Philosophy, 31(6): 797–817. doi:10.1007/s10539-016-9551-1
  • –––, 2016b, “The Many Faces of Biological Individuality”, Biology & Philosophy, 31(6): 761–773. doi:10.1007/s10539-016-9553-z
  • –––, 2018, “Genidentity and Biological Processes”, in Nicholson and Dupré 2018: 96–112. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198779636.003.0005
  • –––, 2019, “Immunology and Individuality”, ELife, 8(April): e47384. [Pradeu 2019 available online]
  • Price, George R., 1970, “Selection and Covariance”, Nature, 227(5257): 520–521. doi:10.1038/227520a0
  • –––, 1972, “Extension of Covariance Selection Mathematics”, Annals of Human Genetics, 35(4): 485–490. doi:10.1111/j.1469-1809.1957.tb01874.x
  • Queller, David C., 1992, “Quantitative Genetics, Inclusive Fitness, and Group Selection”, The American Naturalist, 139(3): 540–558. doi:10.1086/285343
  • –––, 2000, “Relatedness and the Fraternal Major Transitions”, Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society of London. Series B: Biological Sciences, 355(1403): 1647–1655. doi:10.1098/rstb.2000.0727
  • –––, 2011, “Expanded Social Fitness and Hamilton’s Rule for Kin, Kith, and Kind”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 108(supplement 2): 10792–10799. doi:10.1073/pnas.1100298108
  • Queller, David C. and Joan E. Strassmann, 2009, “Beyond Society: The Evolution of Organismality”, Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society B: Biological Sciences, 364(1533): 3143–3155. doi:10.1098/rstb.2009.0095
  • –––, 2016, “Problems of Multi-Species Organisms: Endosymbionts to Holobionts”, Biology & Philosophy, 31(6): 855–873. doi:10.1007/s10539-016-9547-x
  • Raff, Rudolf A., 1996, The Shape of Life: Genes, Development, and the Evolution of Animal Form, Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Raff, Rudolf A. and Elizabeth C. Raff (eds.), 1987, Development as an Evolutionary Process, Proceedings of a Meeting Held at the Marine Biological Laboratory in Woods Hole, Massachusetts, August 23 and 24, 1985, (MBL Lectures in Biology 8), New York: A.R. Liss.
  • Raff, Rudolf A. and Thomas C. Kaufman, 1983, Embryos, Genes, and Evolution: The Developmental-Genetic Basis of Evolutionary Change, New York/London: Macmillan.
  • Ramsey, Grant and Robert Brandon, 2011, “Why Reciprocal Altruism Is Not a Kind of Group Selection”, Biology & Philosophy, 26(3): 385–400. doi:10.1007/s10539-011-9261-7
  • Rees, Tobias, Thomas Bosch, and Angela E. Douglas, 2018, “How the Microbiome Challenges Our Concept of Self”, PLOS Biology, 16(2): e2005358. doi:10.1371/journal.pbio.2005358
  • Ren, Tiantian, Stan Boutin, Murray M. Humphries, Ben Dantzer, Jamieson C. Gorrell, David W. Coltman, Andrew G. McAdam, and Martin Wu, 2017, “Seasonal, Spatial, and Maternal Effects on Gut Microbiome in Wild Red Squirrels”, Microbiome, 5(1): article 163. doi:10.1186/s40168-017-0382-3
  • Rice, Brian R. and Alexander E. Lipka, 2021, “Diversifying Maize Genomic Selection Models”, Molecular Breeding, 41(5): article 33. doi:10.1007/s11032-021-01221-4
  • Robertson, Alan, 1966, “Artificial Selection in Plants and Animals”, Proceedings of the Royal Society of London. Series B. Biological Sciences, 164(995): 341–349. doi:10.1098/rspb.1966.0036
  • Rosenberg, Alexander, 2006, Darwinian Reductionism, or, How to Stop Worrying and Love Molecular Biology, Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Rosenberg, E and I Zilber-Rosenberg, 2020, “The Hologenome Concept of Evolution: Do Mothers Matter Most?”, BJOG: An International Journal of Obstetrics & Gynaecology, 127(2): 129–137. doi:10.1111/1471-0528.15882
  • Roughgarden, Joan, Scott F. Gilbert, Eugene Rosenberg, Ilana Zilber-Rosenberg, and Elisabeth A. Lloyd, 2018, “Holobionts as Units of Selection and a Model of Their Population Dynamics and Evolution”, Biological Theory, 13(1): 44–65. doi:10.1007/s13752-017-0287-1
  • Round, June L., Ryan M. O’Connell, and Sarkis K. Mazmanian, 2010, “Coordination of Tolerogenic Immune Responses by the Commensal Microbiota”, Journal of Autoimmunity, 34(3): J220–J225. doi:10.1016/j.jaut.2009.11.007
  • Rousset, François, 2004, Genetic Structure and Selection in Subdivided Populations, (Monographs in Population Biology 40), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Sampson, Timothy R. and Sarkis K. Mazmanian, 2015, “Control of Brain Development, Function, and Behavior by the Microbiome”, Cell Host & Microbe, 17(5): 565–576. doi:10.1016/j.chom.2015.04.011
  • Sapienza, Carmen, 2010, “Selection Does Operate Primarily on Genes: In Defense of the Gene as the Unit of Selection”, in Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Biology, Francisco José Ayala and Robert Arp (eds.), (Contemporary Debates in Philosophy 12), Chichester, UK/Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 127–140.
  • Sariola, Salla and Scott F. Gilbert, 2020, “Toward a Symbiotic Perspective on Public Health: Recognizing the Ambivalence of Microbes in the Anthropocene”, Microorganisms, 8(5): 746. doi:10.3390/microorganisms8050746
  • Sarkar, Sahotra, 1994, “The Selection of Alleles and the Additivity of Variance”, PSA Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1994(1): 3–12. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1994.1.193006
  • –––, 2008, “A Note on Frequency Dependence and the Levels/Units of Selection”, Biology & Philosophy, 23(2): 217–228. doi:10.1007/s10539-007-9092-8
  • Schneider, Tamar, 2021, “The Holobiont Self: Understanding Immunity in Context”, History and Philosophy of the Life Sciences, 43(3): article 99 (23 pages). doi:10.1007/s40656-021-00454-y
  • Seeley, Thomas D., 1997, “Honey Bee Colonies Are Group-Level Adaptive Units”, The American Naturalist, 150(S1): S22–S41. doi:10.1086/286048
  • Şencan, Sinan, 2019, “A Tale of Two Individuality Accounts and Integrative Pluralism”, Philosophy of Science, 86(5): 1111–1122. doi:10.1086/705523
  • Sepkoski, David, 2020, Catastrophic Thinking: Extinction and the Value of Diversity from Darwin to the Anthropocene, (Science.Culture), Chicago, IL: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Shaffer, Zachary, Takao Sasaki, Brian Haney, Marco Janssen, Stephen C. Pratt, and Jennifer H. Fewell, 2016, “The Foundress’s Dilemma: Group Selection for Cooperation among Queens of the Harvester Ant, Pogonomyrmex californicus”, Scientific Reports, 6(1): 29828. doi:10.1038/srep29828
  • Shanahan, Timothy, 1997, “Pluralism, Antirealism, and the Units of Selection”, Acta Biotheoretica, 45(2): 117–126. doi:10.1023/A:1000377821347
  • Shavit, Ayelet, 2005, “The Notion of ‘Group’ and Tests of Group Selection”, Philosophy of Science, 72(5): 1052–1063. doi:10.1086/508119
  • Shavit, Ayelet and Roberta L. Millstein, 2008, “Group Selection Is Dead! Long Live Group Selection?”, BioScience, 58(7): 574–575. doi:10.1641/B580702
  • Shelton, Deborah E. and Richard E. Michod, 2014a, “Levels of Selection and the Formal Darwinism Project”, Biology & Philosophy, 29(2): 217–224. doi:10.1007/s10539-013-9420-0
  • –––, 2014b, “Group Selection and Group Adaptation During Major Evolutionary Transition: Insights from the Evolution of Multicellularity in the Volvocine Algae”, Biological Theory, 9(4): 452–469. doi:10.1007/s13752-014-0159-x
  • –––, 2020, “Group and Individual Selection during Evolutionary Transitions in Individuality: Meanings and Partitions”, Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society B: Biological Sciences, 375(1797): 20190364. doi:10.1098/rstb.2019.0364
  • Sih, Andrew and Jason V. Watters, 2005, “The Mix Matters: Behavioural Types and Group Dynamics in Water Striders”, Behaviour, 142(9–10): 1417–1431. doi:10.1163/156853905774539454
  • Simon, Burton, 2014, “Continuous-Time Models of Group Selection, and the Dynamical Insufficiency of Kin Selection Models”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 349(May): 22–31. doi:10.1016/j.jtbi.2014.01.030
  • Skillings, Derek, 2016, “Holobionts and the Ecology of Organisms: Multi-Species Communities or Integrated Individuals?”, Biology & Philosophy, 31(6): 875–892. doi:10.1007/s10539-016-9544-0
  • Slatkin, Montgomery, 1972, “On Treating the Chromosome as the Unit of Selection”, Genetics, 72(1): 157–168. doi:10.1093/genetics/72.1.157
  • –––, 1981a, “A Diffusion Model of Species Selection”, Paleobiology, 7(4) : 421–425. doi:10.1017/S0094837300025471
  • –––, 1981b, “Populational Heritability”, Evolution, 35(5): 859–871. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1981.tb04949.x
  • Slatkin, Montgomery and Michael J. Wade, 1978, “Group Selection on a Quantitative Character”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 75(7): 3531–3534. doi:10.1073/pnas.75.7.3531
  • Slobodkin, Lawrence B. and Anatol Rapoport, 1974, “An Optimal Strategy of Evolution”, The Quarterly Review of Biology, 49(3): 181–200. doi:10.1086/408082
  • Smith, Eric Alden, 1994, “Semantics, Theory, and Methodological Individualism in the Group-Selection Controversy”, Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 17(4): 636–637. doi:10.1017/S0140525X00036414
  • Smith, Subrena E., 2017, “Organisms as Persisters”, Philosophy, Theory, and Practice in Biology, 9: article 14. doi:10.3998/ptb.6959004.0009.014
  • Sober, Elliott, 1980, “Holism, Individualism, and the Units of Selection”, PSA: Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1980(2): 93–121. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1980.2.192588
  • –––, 1984, The Nature of Selection: Evolutionary Theory in Philosophical Focus, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • –––, 1990, “The Poverty of Pluralism: A Reply to Sterelny and Kitcher”, The Journal of Philosophy, 87(3): 151–158. doi:10.2307/2026633
  • Sober, Elliott and Richard C. Lewontin, 1982, “Artifact, Cause and Genic Selection”, Philosophy of Science, 49(2): 157–180. doi:10.1086/289047
  • Sober, Elliott and David Sloan Wilson, 1994, “A Critical Review of Philosophical Work on the Units of Selection Problem”, Philosophy of Science, 61(4): 534–555. doi:10.1086/289821
  • –––, 1998, Unto Others: The Evolution and Psychology of Unselfish Behavior, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Spencer, Hamish G. and Judith C. Masters, 1992, “Sexual Selection: Contemporary Debates”, in Keller and Lloyd 1992: 294–301.
  • Spencer, Hamish G., Martyn Kennedy, and Russell D. Gray, 1995, “Patch Choice with Competitive Asymmetries and Perceptual Limits: The Importance of History”, Animal Behaviour, 50(2): 497–508. doi:10.1006/anbe.1995.0264
  • Stanford, P. Kyle, 2001, “The Units of Selection and the Causal Structure of the World”, Erkenntnis, 54(2): 215–233. doi:10.1023/A:1005641025742
  • Stencel, Adrian and Javier Suárez, 2021, “Do Somatic Cells Really Sacrifice Themselves? Why an Appeal to Coercion May Be a Helpful Strategy in Explaining the Evolution of Multicellularity”, Biological Theory, 16(2): 102–113. doi:10.1007/s13752-021-00376-9
  • Stencel, Adrian and Dominika M. Wloch-Salamon, 2018, “Some Theoretical Insights into the Hologenome Theory of Evolution and the Role of Microbes in Speciation”, Theory in Biosciences, 137(2): 197–206. doi:10.1007/s12064-018-0268-3
  • Sterelny, Kim, 1996a, “Explanatory Pluralism in Evolutionary Biology”, Biology & Philosophy, 11(2): 193–214. doi:10.1007/BF00128919
  • –––, 1996b, “The Return of the Group”, Philosophy of Science, 63(4): 562–584. doi:10.1086/289977
  • –––, 2004, “Symbiosis, Evolvability and Modularity”, in Modularity in Development and Evolution, Gerhard Schlosser and Günter P. Wagner (eds.), Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press, 490–516 (ch. 22).
  • –––, 2011, “Darwinian Spaces: Peter Godfrey-Smith on Selection and Evolution”, Biology & Philosophy, 26(4): 489–500. doi:10.1007/s10539-010-9244-0
  • –––, 2012, The Evolved Apprentice: How Evolution Made Humans Unique, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. doi:10.7551/mitpress/9780262016797.001.0001
  • Sterelny, Kim and Paul E. Griffiths, 1999, Sex and Death: An Introduction to Philosophy of Biology, (Science and Its Conceptual Foundations), Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Sterelny, Kim and Philip Kitcher, 1988, “The Return of the Gene”, The Journal of Philosophy, 85(7): 339–361. doi:10.2307/2026953
  • Sterner, Beckett, 2015, “Pathways to Pluralism about Biological Individuality”, Biology & Philosophy, 30(5): 609–628. doi:10.1007/s10539-015-9494-y
  • Stevens, Lori, Charles J. Goodnight, and Susan Kalisz, 1995, “Multilevel Selection in Natural Populations of Impatiens capensis”, The American Naturalist, 145(4): 513–526. doi:10.1086/285753
  • Strassmann, Joan E. and David C. Queller, 2011, “Evolution of Cooperation and Control of Cheating in a Social Microbe”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 108(supplement 2): 10855–10862. doi:10.1073/pnas.1102451108
  • Strassmann, Joan E., David C. Queller, John C. Avise, and Francisco J. Ayala, 2011, “In the Light of Evolution V: Cooperation and Conflict”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 108(supplement_2): 10787–10791. doi:10.1073/pnas.1100289108
  • Suárez, Javier, 2018, “‘The Importance of Symbiosis in Philosophy of Biology: An Analysis of the Current Debate on Biological Individuality and Its Historical Roots’”, Symbiosis, 76(2): 77–96. doi:10.1007/s13199-018-0556-1
  • –––, 2020, “The Stability of Traits Conception of the Hologenome: An Evolutionary Account of Holobiont Individuality”, History and Philosophy of the Life Sciences, 42(1): article 11. doi:10.1007/s40656-020-00305-2
  • Suárez, Javier and Elisabeth A. Lloyd, 2023, Units of Selection (Elements in the Philosophy of Biology), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/9781009276429
  • Suárez, Javier and Adrian Stencel, 2020, “A Part-dependent Account of Biological Individuality: Why Holobionts Are Individuals and Ecosystems Simultaneously”, Biological Reviews, 95(5): 1308–1324. doi:10.1111/brv.12610
  • Suárez, Javier and Vanessa Triviño, 2020, “What Is a Hologenomic Adaptation? Emergent Individuality and Inter-Identity in Multispecies Systems”, Frontiers in Psychology, 11(March): 187. doi:10.3389/fpsyg.2020.00187
  • Sukhoverkhov, Anton V. and Nathalie Gontier, 2021, “Non-Genetic Inheritance: Evolution above the Organismal Level”, Biosystems, 200(February): 104325 (6 pages). doi:10.1016/j.biosystems.2020.104325
  • Szathmáry, Eors, 1999, “The First Replicators”, in Levels of Selection in Evolution, Laurent Keller (ed.), (Monographs in Behavior and Ecology), Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 31–52.
  • Szathmáry, Eors and John Maynard Smith, 1993, “The Origin of Genetic Systems”, Abstracta Botanica, 17: 197–206.
  • Theis, Kevin R., Nolwenn M. Dheilly, Jonathan L. Klassen, Robert M. Brucker, John F. Baines, Thomas C. G. Bosch, John F. Cryan, Scott F. Gilbert, Charles J. Goodnight, Elisabeth A. Lloyd, Jan Sapp, Philippe Vandenkoornhuyse, Ilana Zilber-Rosenberg, Eugene Rosenberg, and Seth R. Bordenstein, 2016, “Getting the Hologenome Concept Right: An Eco-Evolutionary Framework for Hosts and Their Microbiomes”, MSystems, 1(2): e00028-16. doi:10.1128/mSystems.00028-16
  • Thies, Christoph and Richard A. Watson, 2021, “Identifying Causes of Social Evolution: Contextual Analysis, the Price Approach, and Multilevel Selection”, Frontiers in Ecology and Evolution, 9(December): 780508 (14 pages). doi:10.3389/fevo.2021.780508
  • Thoday, John M., 1953, “Components of Fitness”, Symposia of the Society for Experimental Biology, 7: 96–113. [Thoday 1953 available online (pdf)]
  • Thompson, Paul, 1989, The Structure of Biological Theories, (SUNY Series in Philosophy and Biology), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Traulsen, Arne, 2010, “Mathematics of Kin- and Group-Selection: Formally Equivalent?”, Evolution, 64(2): 316–323. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.2009.00899.x
  • Triviño, Vanessa and Javier Suárez, 2020, “Holobionts: Ecological Communities, Hybrids, or Biological Individuals? A Metaphysical Perspective on Multispecies Systems”, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science Part C: Studies in History and Philosophy of Biological and Biomedical Sciences, 84: 101323. doi:10.1016/j.shpsc.2020.101323
  • Tsuji, Kazuki, 1995, “Reproductive Conflicts and Levels of Selection in the Ant Pristomyrmex pungens: Contextual Analysis and Partitioning of Covariance”, The American Naturalist, 146(4): 586–607. doi:10.1086/285816
  • Tyler, Anna L., Folkert W. Asselbergs, Scott M. Williams, and Jason H. Moore, 2009, “Shadows of Complexity: What Biological Networks Reveal about Epistasis and Pleiotropy”, BioEssays, 31(2): 220–227. doi:10.1002/bies.200800022
  • Uyenoyama, Marcy K., 1979, “Evolution of Altruism Under Group Selection in Large and Small Populations in Fluctuating Environments”, Theoretical Population Biology, 15(1): 58–85. doi:10.1016/0040-5809(79)90027-3
  • Uyenoyama, Marcy K. and Marcus W. Feldman, 1980, “Theories of Kin and Group Selection: A Population Genetics Perspective”, Theoretical Population Biology, 17(3): 380–414. doi:10.1016/0040-5809(80)90033-7
  • Van der Steen, W. J. and H. A. Van der Berg, 1999, “Dissolving Disputes over Genic Selectionism”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 12(1): 184–187. doi:10.1046/j.1420-9101.1999.00021.x
  • van Fraassen, Bas C. van, 1980, The Scientific Image, Oxford: Clarendon Press. doi:10.1093/0198244274.001.0001
  • van Veelen, Matthijs, 2009a, “Group Selection, Kin Selection, Altruism, and Cooperation: When Inclusive Fitness is Right and When it Can be Wrong”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 259(3): 589–600. doi:10.1016/j.jtbi.2009.04.019
  • –––, 2009b, “Does it Pay to be Good? Competing Evolutionary Explanations of Pro-Social Behaviour”, The Moral Brain: Essays on the Evolutionary and Neuroscientific Aspects of Morality, 185–200.
  • van Veelen, Matthijs, Julián García, Maurice W. Sabelis, and Martijn Egas, 2012, “Group Selection and Inclusive Fitness Are Not Equivalent; the Price Equation vs. Models and Statistics”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 299(April): 64–80. doi:10.1016/j.jtbi.2011.07.025
  • van Veelen, Matthijs, Shishi Luo, and Burton Simon, 2014, “A Simple Model of Group Selection That Cannot Be Analyzed with Inclusive Fitness”, Journal of Theoretical Biology, 360(November): 279–289. doi:10.1016/j.jtbi.2014.07.004
  • van Vliet, Simon and Michael Doebeli, 2019, “The Role of Multilevel Selection in Host Microbiome Evolution”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 116(41): 20591–20597. doi:10.1073/pnas.1909790116
  • Vehrencamp, Sandra L. and Jack W Bradbury, 1984, “Mating Systems and Ecology”, in Behavioural Ecology: An Evolutionary Approach, second edition, John R. Krebs and Nicholas B. Davies (eds.), Sunderland, MA: Sinauer, pp. 251–278.
  • Veigl, Sophie J., Javier Suárez, and Adrian Stencel, 2022, “Rethinking Hereditary Relations: The Reconstitutor as the Evolutionary Unit of Heredity”, Synthese, 200(5): article 367. doi:10.1007/s11229-022-03810-y
  • Vrba, Elisabeth S., 1983, “Macroevolutionary Trends: New Perspectives on the Roles of Adaptation and Incidental Effect”, Science, 221(4608): 387–389. doi:10.1126/science.221.4608.387
  • –––, 1984, “What Is Species Selection?”, Systematic Zoology, 33(3): 318–328. doi:10.2307/2413077
  • –––, 1989, “Levels of Selection and Sorting with Special Reference to the Species Level”, Oxford Surveys in Evolutionary Biology, Volume 6, Paul H. Harvey (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 111–168.
  • Vrba, Elisabeth S. and Niles Eldredge, 1984, “Individuals, Hierarchies and Processes: Towards a More Complete Evolutionary Theory”, Paleobiology, 10(2): 146–171. doi:10.1017/S0094837300008149
  • Vrba, Elisabeth S. and Stephen Jay Gould, 1986, “The Hierarchical Expansion of Sorting and Selection: Sorting and Selection Cannot Be Equated”, Paleobiology, 12(2): 217–228. doi:10.1017/S0094837300013671
  • Waddington, C. H., 1956, “Genetic Assimilation of the Bithorax Phenotype”, Evolution, 10(1): 1–13. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1956.tb02824.x
  • Wade, Michael J., 1976, “Group Selections among Laboratory Populations of Tribolium”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 73(12): 4604–4607. doi:10.1073/pnas.73.12.4604
  • –––, 1977, “An Experimental Study of Group Selection”, Evolution, 31(1): 134–153. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1977.tb00991.x
  • –––, 1978, “A Critical Review of the Models of Group Selection”, Quarterly Review of Biology, 53(2): 101–114. doi:10.1086/410450
  • –––, 1979, “Sexual Selection and Variance in Reproductive Success”, The American Naturalist, 114(5): 742–747. doi:10.1086/283520
  • –––, 1980a, “Kin Selection: Its Components”, Science, 210(4470): 665–667. doi:10.1126/science.210.4470.665
  • –––, 1980b, “An Experimental Study of Kin Selection”, Evolution, 34(5): 844–855. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1980.tb04023.x
  • –––, 1985, “Soft Selection, Hard Selection, Kin Selection, and Group Selection”, The American Naturalist, 125(1): 61–73. doi:10.1086/284328
  • –––, 1994, “The Biology of the Imported Willow Leaf Beetle, Plagiodera versicolora (Laicharting)”, Novel Aspects of the Biology of Chrysomelidae: 541–547.
  • –––, 1995, “The Ecology of Sexual Selection: Mean Crowding of Females and Resource-Defence Polygyny”, Evolutionary Ecology, 9(1): 118–124. doi:10.1007/BF01237701
  • –––, 1996, “Adaptation in Subdivided Populations: Kin Selection and Interdemic Selection”, in Adaptation, Michael R. Rose and George V. Lauder (eds.), San Diego, CA: Academic Press, 381–405.
  • –––, 2000, “Opposing Levels of Selection Can Cause Neutrality: Mating Patterns and Maternal-Fetal Interactions”, Evolution, 54(1): 290–292. doi:10.1111/j.0014-3820.2000.tb00029.x
  • –––, 2007, “The Co-Evolutionary Genetics of Ecological Communities”, Nature Reviews Genetics, 8(3): 185–195. doi:10.1038/nrg2031
  • –––, 2014, “Genotype-by-Environment Interactions and Sexual Selection: Female Choice in a Complex World”, in Genotype-by-Environment Interactions and Sexual Selection, John Hunt and David Hosken (eds.), Chichester, UK: John Wiley & Sons, Ltd, 1–18. doi:10.1002/9781118912591.ch1
  • –––, 2016, Adaptations in Metapopulations, Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Wade, Michael J., Piter Bijma, Esther D. Ellen, and William Muir, 2010, “Group Selection and Social Evolution in Domesticated Animals: Group Selection and Social Evolution”, Evolutionary Applications, 3(5–6): 453–465. doi:10.1111/j.1752-4571.2010.00147.x
  • Wade, Michael J. and Felix Breden, 1981, “Effect of Inbreeding on the Evolution of Altruistic Behavior by Kin Selection”, Evolution, 35(5): 844–858. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1981.tb04948.x
  • Wade, Michael J. and Devin M. Drown, 2016, “Nuclear–Mitochondrial Epistasis: A Gene’s Eye View of Genomic Conflict”, Ecology and Evolution, 6(18): 6460–6472. doi:10.1002/ece3.2345
  • Wade, Michael J. and Charles J. Goodnight, 1998, “Perspective: The Theories of Fisher and Wright in the Context of Metapopulations: When Nature Does Many Small Experiments”, Evolution, 52(6): 1537–1553. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1998.tb02235.x
  • Wade, Michael J. and James R. Griesemer, 1998, “Populational Heritability: Empirical Studies of Evolution in Metapopulations”, The American Naturalist, 151(2): 135–147. doi:10.1086/286107 [Wade and Griesemer 1998 available online]
  • Wade, Michael J. and Susan Kalisz, 1990, “The Causes of Natural Selection”, Evolution, 44(8): 1947–1955. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1990.tb04301.x
  • Wade, Michael J. and David E. McCauley, 1980, “Group Selection: The Phenotypic and Genotypic Differentiation of Small Populations”, Evolution, 34(4): 799–812. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1980.tb04019.x
  • Wagner, Günter P., 2015, “Evolutionary Innovations and Novelties: Let Us Get down to Business!”, Zoologischer Anzeiger: A Journal of Comparative Zoology, 256(May): 75–81. doi:10.1016/j.jcz.2015.04.006
  • –––, 2016, “What Is ‘Homology Thinking’ and What Is It For?”, Journal of Experimental Zoology Part B: Molecular and Developmental Evolution, 326(1): 3–8. doi:10.1002/jez.b.22656
  • Wagner, Günter P., Koryu Kin, Louis Muglia, and Mihaela Pavli, 2014, “Evolution of Mammalian Pregnancy and the Origin of the Decidual Stromal Cell”, The International Journal of Developmental Biology, 58(2–3–4): 117–126. doi:10.1387/ijdb.130335gw
  • Waldron, Anthony, 2007, “Null Models of Geographic Range Size Evolution Reaffirm Its Heritability”, The American Naturalist, 170(2): 221–231. doi:10.1086/518963
  • Walsh, Denis M., Tim Lewens, and André Ariew, 2002, “The Trials of Life: Natural Selection and Random Drift”, Philosophy of Science, 69(3): 452–473. doi:10.1086/342454
  • Warrener, Anna, 2023, “The Multifactor Pelvis: An Alternative to the Adaptationist Approach of the Obstetrical Dilemma”, Evolutionary Anthropology: Issues, News, and Reviews 32 (5): 260–274.
  • Waters, C. Kenneth, 1986, “Models of Natural Selection from Darwin to Dawkins”, Ph.D. dissertation, Indiana University.
  • –––, 1991, “Tempered Realism about the Force of Selection”, Philosophy of Science, 58(4): 553–573. doi:10.1086/289640
  • –––, 2005, “Why Genic and Multilevel Selection Theories Are Here to Stay”, Philosophy of Science, 72(2): 311–333. doi:10.1086/432426
  • Watson, Richard A. and Eörs Szathmáry, 2016, “How Can Evolution Learn?”, Trends in Ecology & Evolution, 31(2): 147–157. doi:10.1016/j.tree.2015.11.009
  • Wein, Tanita, Devani Romero Picazo, Frances Blow, Christian Woehle, Elie Jami, Thorsten B.H. Reusch, William F. Martin, and Tal Dagan, 2019, “Currency, Exchange, and Inheritance in the Evolution of Symbiosis”, Trends in Microbiology, 27(10): 836–849. doi:10.1016/j.tim.2019.05.010
  • Weinig, Cynthia, Jill A. Johnston, Charles G. Willis, and Julin N. Maloof, 2007, “Antagonistic Multilevel Selection on Size and Architecture in Variable Density Settings”, Evolution, 61(1): 58–67. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.2007.00005.x
  • Wenseleers, Tom, Andy Gardner, and Kevin R. Foster, 2010, “Social Evolution Theory: A Review of Methods and Approaches”, in Social Behaviour: Genes, Ecology and Evolution, Tamás Székely, Allen J. Moore, and Jan Komdeur (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 132–158. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511781360.013
  • West, Stuart A., Claire El Mouden, and Andy Gardner, 2011, “Sixteen Common Misconceptions about the Evolution of Cooperation in Humans”, Evolution and Human Behavior, 32(4): 231–262. doi:10.1016/j.evolhumbehav.2010.08.001
  • West, Stuart A. and Andy Gardner, 2013, “Adaptation and Inclusive Fitness”, Current Biology, 23(13): R577–R584. doi:10.1016/j.cub.2013.05.031
  • West, Stuart A., A. S. Griffin, and Andy Gardner, 2007, “Social Semantics: Altruism, Cooperation, Mutualism, Strong Reciprocity and Group Selection”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 20(2): 415–432. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2006.01258.x
  • –––, 2008, “Social Semantics: How Useful Has Group Selection Been?: Group Confusion”, Journal of Evolutionary Biology, 21(1): 374–385. doi:10.1111/j.1420-9101.2007.01458.x
  • West-Eberhard, Mary Jane, 1992, “Adaptation: Current Usages”, in Keller and Lloyd 1992: 13–18.
  • Westneat, David F., 2012, “Evolution in Response to Social Selection: The Importance of Interactive Effects of Traits on Fitness”, Evolution, 66(3): 890–895. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.2011.01490.x
  • Whitham, Thomas G., Gerard J. Allan, Hillary F. Cooper, and Stephen M. Shuster, 2020, “Intraspecific Genetic Variation and Species Interactions Contribute to Community Evolution”, Annual Review of Ecology, Evolution, and Systematics, 51: 587–612. doi:10.1146/annurev-ecolsys-011720-123655
  • Williams, George C., 1966, Adaptation and Natural Selection: A Critique of Some Current Evolutionary Thought, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1985, “A Defense of Reductionism in Evolutionary Biology”, Oxford Surveys in Evolutionary Biology, Volume 2, Richard Dawkins and Mark Ridley (eds), Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press, 1–27.
  • –––, 1990, “Review of The Structure and Confirmation of Evolutionary Theory, by Elisabeth A. Lloyd”, The Quarterly Review of Biology, 65(4): 504–504. doi:10.1086/416987
  • –––, 1992, Natural Selection: Domains, Levels, and Challenges, (Oxford Series in Ecology and Evolution 4), New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Hywel T. P. and Timothy M. Lenton, 2008, “Environmental Regulation in a Network of Simulated Microbial Ecosystems”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 105(30): 10432–10437. doi:10.1073/pnas.0800244105
  • Wilson, David Sloan, 1975, “A Theory of Group Selection”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 72(1): 143–146. doi:10.1073/pnas.72.1.143
  • –––, 1980, The Natural Selection of Populations and Communities, Menlo Park, CA: Benjamin Cummings.
  • –––, 1983, “The Group Selection Controversy: History and Current Status”, Annual Review of Ecology and Systematics, 14: 159–187. doi:10.1146/annurev.es.14.110183.001111
  • –––, 1997, “Biological Communities as Functionally Organized Units”, Ecology, 78(7): 2018–2024. doi:10.1890/0012-9658(1997)078[2018:BCAFOU]2.0.CO;2
  • Wilson, David Sloan and Robert K. Colwell, 1981, “Evolution of Sex Ratio in Structured Demes”, Evolution, 35(5): 882–897. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1981.tb04952.x
  • Wilson, David Sloan and Edward O. Wilson, 2007, “Rethinking the Theoretical Foundation of Sociobiology”, The Quarterly Review of Biology, 82(4): 327–348. doi:10.1086/522809
  • Wilson, Edward O., 2008, “One Giant Leap: How Insects Achieved Altruism and Colonial Life”, BioScience, 58(1): 17–25. doi:10.1641/B580106
  • –––, 2012, The Social Conquest of Earth, New York: W.W. Norton.
  • Wilson, Edward O. and Martin A. Nowak, 2014, “Natural Selection Drives the Evolution of Ant Life Cycles”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 111(35): 12585–12590. doi:10.1073/pnas.1405550111
  • Wilson, Robert A., 2003, “Pluralism, Entwinement, and the Levels of Selection”, Philosophy of Science, 70(3): 531–552. doi:10.1086/376784
  • Wimsatt, William C., 1980a, “Reductionistic Research Strategies and Their Biases in the Units of Selection Controversy”, in Scientific Discovery: Case Studies, Thomas Nickles (ed.), (Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science 60), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, 213–259. doi:10.1007/978-94-009-9015-9_13
  • –––, 1980b, “Units of Selection and the Structure of the Multi-Level Genome”, PSA: Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association, 1980(2): 122–183. doi:10.1086/psaprocbienmeetp.1980.2.192589
  • –––, 1997, “Aggregativity: Reductive Heuristics for Finding Emergence”, Philosophy of Science, 64(S4): S372–S384. doi:10.1086/392615
  • –––, 2007, Re-Engineering Philosophy for Limited Beings: Piecewise Approximations to Reality, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Wolf, Jason B., 2003, “Genetic Architecture and Evolutionary Constraint When the Environment Contains Genes”, Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences, 100(8): 4655–4660. doi:10.1073/pnas.0635741100
  • Wolf, Jason B., Edmund D. Brodie III, James M. Cheverud, Allen J. Moore, and Michael J. Wade, 1998, “Evolutionary Consequences of Indirect Genetic Effects”, Trends in Ecology & Evolution, 13(2): 64–69. doi:10.1016/S0169-5347(97)01233-0
  • Wolf, Jason B., Edmund D. Brodie III, and Allen J. Moore, 1999, “Interacting Phenotypes and the Evolutionary Process. II. Selection Resulting from Social Interactions”, The American Naturalist, 153(3): 254–266. doi:10.1086/303168
  • Wolf, Jason B., Edmund D. Brodie, and Michael John Wade (eds.), 2000, Epistasis and the Evolutionary Process, Oxford/New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Woodward, James, 1993, “Capacities and Invariance”, in Philosophical Problems of the Internal and External Worlds: Essays on the Philosophy of Adolf Grünbaum, John Earman, Allen I. Janis, Gerald J. Massey, and Nicholas Rescher (eds.), (Pittsburgh-Konstanz Series in the Philosophy and History of Science), Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 283–328.
  • Wright, Larry, 1978, “The Ins and Outs of Teleology: A Critical Examination of Woodfield”, Inquiry, 21(1–4): 223–237. doi:10.1080/00201747808601859
  • Wright, Sewall, 1931, “Evolution in Mendelian Populations”, Genetics, 16(2): 97–159. doi:10.1093/genetics/16.2.97
  • –––, 1938, “Size of Population and Breeding Structure in Relation to Evolution”, Science, 87(2263): 430–431.
  • –––, 1945, “Tempo and Mode in Evolution: A Critical Review”, Ecology, 26(4): 415–419. doi:10.2307/1931666
  • –––, 1980, “Genic and Organismic Selection”, Evolution, 34(5): 825–843. doi:10.1111/j.1558-5646.1980.tb04022.x
  • –––, 1984, Evolution and the Genetics of Populations, Volume 4: Variability Within and Among Natural Populations, Chicago: Chicago University Press.
  • Wynne-Edwards, Vero Copner, 1962, Animal Dispersion in Relation to Social Behavior, Edinburgh: Oliver and Boyd.
  • Zacaï, Axelle, Emmanuel Fara, Arnaud Brayard, Rémi Laffont, Jean-Louis Dommergues, and Christian Meister, 2017, “Phylogenetic Conservatism of Species Range Size Is the Combined Outcome of Phylogeny and Environmental Stability”, Journal of Biogeography, 44(11): 2451–2462. doi:10.1111/jbi.13043
  • Zilber-Rosenberg, Ilana and Eugene Rosenberg, 2008, “Role of Microorganisms in the Evolution of Animals and Plants: The Hologenome Theory of Evolution”, FEMS Microbiology Reviews, 32(5): 723–735. doi:10.1111/j.1574-6976.2008.00123.x

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2024 by
Elisabeth Lloyd <ealloyd@indiana.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free