Philosophy of Macroevolution

First published Mon Jun 3, 2019

Macroevolution refers (most of the time, in practice) to evolutionary patterns and processes above the species level. It is usually contrasted with microevolution, or evolutionary change within populations. This customary way of drawing the macro/micro distinction is not perfect, however, because species sometimes consist of multiple populations. Some evolutionary processes, such as the spread of a trait from one population to another, might count as within-species processes but not within-population processes. Population genetics (see entry), which emerged during the modern synthesis of the early- to mid-twentieth century, explains within-population microevolutionary change in terms of natural selection, genetic drift, mutation, and migration.

One question that looms over philosophical work on macroevolutionary theory is how macroevolution and microevolution are related. One view, which is closely associated with the modern synthesis, is that macroevolutionary patterns are fully explicable in terms of microevolutionary processes. On this view, macroevolution is “nothing but” successive rounds of microevolution (a formulation due to Grantham 2007). Stephen Jay Gould pejoratively referred to this kind of view as “extrapolationism” (Gould 2002). This issue links up with more general philosophical questions about the potential reduction of higher-level biological phenomena to lower levels (Oppenheimer & Putnam 1958; Fodor 1974; Kitcher 1984; Sarkar 1992, Rosenberg 1997).

During the paleobiological revolution of the 1970s and 1980s, a number of paleontologists sought to establish paleontology’s status as an evolutionary discipline, with something to say about evolutionary theory. This shift was reflected in the decision to use the term ‘paleobiology’ (Sepkoski & Ruse 2009). For some of these scientists of the 1970s and 1980s, the disciplinary autonomy of paleobiology was closely linked to ideas about macroevolution. As Steven Stanley (1975) put it, their thought was that macroevolution is “uncoupled” from microevolution, and that macroevolutionary patterns sometimes require explanation in terms of macro-level processes. One early move in this direction was the construction of the MBL model (Gould, Raup, Sepkoski, Schopf, and Simberloff 1977), a computer simulation of macroevolutionary processes that explicitly ignored microevolutionary factors such as natural selection (Sepkoski 2012). Today, this approach is sometimes known as the “hierarchical expansion” of evolutionary theory, and it remains the focus of quite a bit of theoretical work (see, e.g., Eldredge, Pievani, Serrelli, & Temkin 2016).

Since the 1970s, theorizing about macroevolution has focused on several important ideas: punctuated equilibria, species selection, hierarchical theory, historical contingency, passive vs. driven evolutionary trends, major evolutionary transitions, and more recently the zero-force evolutionary law (or ZFEL) defended by McShea and Brandon (2010). One philosophical challenge is to understand the relationships among these ideas; another is to work out what they might mean for the relationship between macro- and microevolution.

The fossil record is the chief source of empirical evidence concerning macroevolutionary patterns, and so macroevolutionary theory is closely associated with paleontology. In addition to questions of macroevolutionary theory per se, there are also epistemological questions about how paleontologists infer pattern from process, and how they correct for biases in the fossil data (Bokulich forthcoming). In addition, the distinction between macroevolution and microevolution sometimes mirrors the distinction between paleontology, with its focus on the fossil record, and neontology, with its focus on observable, extant populations. For this reason, metaphysical questions about the relationship between macro- and microevolution are sometimes difficult to disentangle from epistemological questions about what sorts of things can be inferred from different evidence bases.

1. Punctuated Equilibria

The classic paper on punctuated equilibria (PE) was co-authored by Niles Eldredge and Stephen Jay Gould (1972), although Eldredge (1971) was originally responsible for the idea. Their (1972) presentation of PE draws heavily on themes from Thomas Kuhn’s (1962) work, as they present PE as a new paradigm to rival traditional Darwinian gradualism (Turner 2011b: chapter 2). Far from challenging the modern synthesis in that early work, they present PE as a straightforward consequence of allopatric speciation (speciation driven by isolating geographic change). Eldredge and Gould reasoned that if speciation were typically allopatric, then it would tend to happen fairly rapidly in geological terms, and new species would be geographically distant from parent species. Consequently, in the fossil record, one should not expect to see very many cases where a fossil series documents a clear and gradual transition from one species to another. Eldredge and Gould also argued that most morphological change occurs in (geologically) rapid spurts during speciation events and that new species, once they arise, typically exhibit stasis.

When Eldredge and Gould (1972) introduced punctuated equilibria, the received view of expected morphological change via evolution was that of phyletic gradualism. This is a notion that can be traced all the way from Darwin’s Origin of Species to, for instance, Simpson (1970). In accepting phyletic gradualism, paleontologists had long had to accept that the incompleteness of the fossil record was significantly responsible for the lack of (ideally expected) geological documentation of gradual transformation in the majority of fossilized speciation events. What Eldredge and Gould uniquely realized, however, was that the expectation of phyletic gradualism clashed not only with what the fossil record actually showed, but also with what the dominant model of (allopatric) speciation predicted. So they developed PE: an alternative view of morphological evolution (and stasis) intended to synthesize what allopatric speciation projected with what the fossil record depicted.

In the Origin of Species, Darwin had attributed the lack of fossil series exhibiting gradual morphological transition to the incompleteness of the fossil record. He thought of speciation and morphological evolution as gradual processes (though he did acknowledge variation in evolutionary rates), and thought that they often happen under the geological radar. As he put it: “Nature may almost be said to have guarded against the frequent discovery of her transitional or linking forms” (Darwin 1859 [1964: 292]). Eldredge and Gould were, in contrast, proposing that the fossil record is more complete than it seems, and that we should take the rapid appearance of new species more or less at face value. As they eventually put it, in designing the theory of punctuated equilibrium they were “hoping to validate our profession’s primary data as signal rather than void” (Gould & Eldredge 1993: 223). One epistemological issue in play here is whether the absence of evidence—in this case, the absence of evidence of gradual evolutionary change—is really evidence of absence (Sober 2009; Currie & Turner 2017).

The ensuing debate about punctuated equilibria proved to be complex and contentious. Gould, in particular, made increasingly bold and controversial claims on behalf of PE during the 1980s, and he tended to see PE as the opening wedge for a more ambitious critique of the modern synthesis. Notoriously, Gould also flirted with non-Darwinian accounts of speciation, such as Richard Goldschmidt’s (1940) idea that new species arise from “hopeful monsters” (Gould 1977). The stasis claim of PE was also controversial, especially since Gould took it to mean that cumulative, directional natural selection is a less significant factor in evolution than many had thought. The reasoning was that if directional natural selection were the dominant driver of evolutionary change, then you would not expect to see such clear patterns of stasis in the fossil record. PE elicited a great deal of opposition from biologists and philosophers who were more committed to a selectionist picture of evolution (Dawkins 1986; Dennett 1995; and see Sterelny 2001a for a useful guide to the controversy).

In the meantime, PE also inspired new empirical research in paleontology, with scientists doing statistical analysis of large fossil samples to try to assess the relative importance of stasis vs. gradual directional change. This research continues to get more sophisticated, and as it happens, PE has fared reasonably well, empirically (J. Jackson & Cheetham 1999; Hunt 2007; Uyeda, Hansen, Arnold, & Pienaar 2011).

One other philosophical issue raised by PE concerns the explanation of evolutionary stasis (Turner 2017). Eldredge and Gould never really offered a very clear account of the mechanism(s) that could maintain stasis, a fact that critics often seized upon (e.g., Coyne & Charlesworth 1996). They did propose that species might be homeostatic systems. To make matters worse, there is a mismatch between the fossil evidence (where stasis is common) and studies of extant populations that show lots of directional evolutionary change (Price, Grant, Gibbs, & Boag 1984; Endler 1986; Lenski & Travisano 1994; Harshman & Hoffmann 2000), a puzzle sometimes called the “paradox of stasis” (Hendry 2007). Many evolutionary biologists (e.g. Estes and Arnold 2007) are quick to attribute stasis at larger scales to well-known processes such as stabilizing selection and/or habitat tracking, but Kaplan (2009) raises some critical questions about that move. And Sterelny (2001b) has pointed out that cases of “coordinated stasis” in the fossil record pose special explanatory challenges. Coordinated stasis is a pattern where a whole ecological assemblage seems to persist without change for millions of years. Stasis, the idea at the heart of PE, remains an issue of considerable theoretical and empirical interest in paleontology (Lidgard & Hopkins 2015; Lidgard & Love 2018).

2. Species Selection

If punctuated equilibria (PE) was the first innovative idea about macroevolution to emerge during the 1970s, species selection followed close on its heels. Just how the two ideas are related is itself a topic of some philosophical interest (Turner 2010). According to Eldredge and Gould (1972), driven or directional change is only part of the theoretical story about the evolution of morphology; it is not, perhaps, even a geologically common narrative. Directional selection is selection that changes a population, pushing its distribution of traits from one pattern of trait expression to another. More typical, according the Eldredge and Gould, are cases of either non-directional change or even stasis. Like directional selection, nondirectional selection also changes a population, but not towards any particular distribution of traits—it just moves a population from one pattern to another. Stabilizing selection is selection that keeps a population the same, nudging it back to its trait distribution pattern whenever it starts to stray away. PE as originally formulated favors stabilizing selection, suggesting that both individuals and species are inherently stable homeostatic systems—systems that are “amazingly well-buffered to resist change and maintain stability in the face of disturbing influences” (Eldredge & Gould 1972: 114). On this view, whatever the mechanisms that “resist change and maintain stability” are, they are in conflict with and must be overcome by directional natural selection in order for natural selection to successfully push for or “force” directional change. Whether natural selection is properly thought of as a force is itself an interesting philosophical issue (Sober 1984; Walsh 2000; Matthen & Ariew 2002; Walsh, Lewens, & Ariew 2002; Bouchard & Rosenberg 2004; Stephens 2004; Brandon 2006; Millstein 2006; Filler 2009). Setting that question aside, however, allows us to consider the suggestion that species might be homeostatic systems which “resist change by self-regulation” (Eldredge & Gould 1972: 114)—as this is a suggestion rife with implications for macroevolutionary theory.

At first, the idea that species are homeostatic systems may have been a way of addressing critics of PE, who wondered what sort of biological mechanisms could maintain stasis over long stretches of geological time. However, it is a short step from thinking of species as homeostatic systems to thinking of them as the sort of thing that could be a unit of selection. Eldredge and Gould thought that variation introduced amongst organisms is typically isolated within the population and constrained by stabilizing selection, unless geographic separation creates the conditions for rapid evolutionary change. During allopatric speciation events, the adaptive forces negate the stabilizing ones effectively enough to disrupt the stasis of the species and cause the formation of a new lineage. Eventually though, the stabilizing forces (re)assert themselves upon the emergent species and (re)establish stasis. Most biologists think of stabilizing selection as an ordinary microevolutionary process (Schmalhausen 1949); however, the suggestion that a species is a homeostatic system makes it look like some form of stabilizing selection might be operating (in some sense) as a mechanism that maintains equilibrium at the level of populations.

When modeling how these interactions generate macroevolutionary patterns, PE presents the dominant (i.e., equilibrium) state as one of population-level morphological stasis—a state in which speciation attempts often occur but generally fail to take. These periods of stasis are occasionally interrupted (i.e., punctuated) by periods of population-level morphological change—periods of successful speciation. This bifurcated model (depicting states of both stasis and change) is one in which species behave a little bit like organisms: speciation begins to look like reproduction, and extinction begins to look like death. Crucial to this picture is the claim that once a new species comes into existence, it mostly exhibits stasis. The analogy is by no means perfect (Havstad 2016 in Other Internet Resources), but it did open up a new field of theoretical exploration. What if the differential speciation and extinction of whole lineages is a lot like the differential survival and reproduction of individuals in a population? PE may not logically imply species selection, but it does point in that direction by suggesting that species resemble organisms in relevant ways—for instance, by having comparable integration and cohesion, enough for populations to block directional change in favor of stasis.

Initially, Eldredge and Gould (1972) were quite explicit that they did not see their model as entailing a new type of selection. They straightforwardly wrote “we postulate no ‘new’ type of selection” (Eldredge & Gould 1972: 112). But in 1975, the paleontologist and evolutionary theorist Steven M. Stanley dubbed Eldredge and Gould’s population-level selection process a form of species selection, and by 1977 the inventors of PE concurred. They wrote that they nonetheless understood species selection as representing “no more than the operation of natural selection at higher levels” (Gould & Eldredge 1977: 139), but still, this interpretation presents a challenge to one typical way of instantiating the dominant model of natural selection.

Regarding the dominant model: classically and summarily described (see Godfrey-Smith 2007), evolution occurs when individuals in a population accumulate a change to the degree that this change becomes a feature in the population. On this view, natural selection requires variation, fitness, and heritability (Lewontin 1970; though see Brandon 1990). When all three of these things coincide within populations, and change resultantly accumulates, evolution occurs. Proponents of species selection argue that these three conditions are met at the species level.

But on a typical way of instantiating this rather abstract model of natural selection, one can identify what plays the role of the individuals in this model (organisms) and what plays the role of the populations (species). This popular view treats organisms as the units of selection and species as the units of evolution. Species evolve, owing to the differential survival and reproduction of organisms. This emphasis on organism-level selection and species-level evolution is another which dates back to Darwin’s Origin of Species, although Darwin also countenanced family selection (Darwin 1859), sexual selection (Darwin 1871) and group selection (Stauffer 1975). Some early proponents of the modern synthesis (e.g., Mayr 1942, 2001) also shared this basic picture in which selection acts on organisms, while species evolve. To propose that selection occurs at the level of species as opposed to that of organisms, is to suppose that not only can organisms act as the units of selection but that species can too.

So, if the proper way to understand natural selection casts organisms as the units of selection, and species as the unit of evolution, then Gould and Eldredge’s model of PE challenges that view. Alternatively, if the proper way to understand natural selection merely names biological individuals as the units of selection and biological populations as the unit of evolution, and species can be biological individuals too, then Gould and Eldredge’s model of PE is not really a challenge to the model of natural selection, it is just a new instance of it. This is because the notion of biological individual (see entry) is more expansive than that of biological organism; biological individuals include but are not limited to biological organisms. Biofilms, coral reefs, insect colonies, obligate symbionts, siphonophores, slime molds, and viruses are just a few of the many biological entities that we might want to consider as individuals, although they are not organisms (see Buss 1983; J. Wilson 1999; Clarke 2010, 2013; and R.A. Wilson & Barker 2013, among others). If species are themselves individuals (Ghiselin 1974; Hull 1976), then the traditional evolutionary theorist may be able to accommodate species-level selection—in this sense, it is just another flavor of individual-level selection. Note that is it is very easy for this dispute to become an instance of what the philosopher John Beatty (1997) calls a “relative significance” debate—one in which proponents move from arguing about whether something is possible (species acting as the unit of selection) to whether that thing is significant (as opposed to a mere oddity).

Many of these issues—such as how to understand stabilizing mechanisms and selection, what biological individuals are, whether species are individuals, and whether species-level selection is reducible to individual-level selection—are ongoing. In the decades since Eldredge and Gould first outlined the theory of punctuated equilibria, various biological theorists have attempted to provide definitive and irreducible examples of species-level selection—ones that cannot be recreated at lower levels such as that of the organism. Species-level traits like range size (where a species may be wide-ranging even though its organisms are not; see Jablonski 1987) and rate of speciation (where a species may be slow to “reproduce” although its organisms are not; see Vrba 1987) are especially promising candidates. In addition to the issue of providing definitive examples of irreducible species selection, there is also the issue of providing a satisfactory definition of the concept itself. The biologist Elisabeth Vrba (1984) posits that all proposed definitions of species selection ought to identify causes, be restricted enough for testing, and employ a concept of selection that is consistent with how selection is understood to act at other levels as well. See Vrba (1984), Cracraft (1985), Grantham (1995), Jablonski (2008), and Turner (2011b: chapters 4 and 5) for further discussion of species selection.

3. Hierarchical Theory

It is worth noting that several discussions of species selection pre-date Eldredge and Gould’s (1972) proposal (e.g., Fisher 1929, Wright 1956; Lewontin 1970). However, it is the ensuing discussion of stabilizing selection prompted by PE—in combination with a contemporaneous uptick in discussion of kin selection, group selection, and altruism (Haldane 1932; Wright 1945; Wynne-Edwards 1962; Hamilton 1963; Maynard Smith 1964; Boorman & Levitt 1973; E.O. Wilson 1973; Levin & Kilmer 1974; D.S. Wilson 1975; Wade 1978)—which transforms these macroevolutionary sparks into an ongoing, hierarchical conflagration (see Gould 1980b, 1982, 2002; Vrba & Eldredge 1984; Cracraft 1985; Eldredge 1985; Grantham 1995; and Eldredge, Pievani, Serrelli, & Temkin 2016, among others). Indeed, some theorists see the paleobiological revolution as contributing to a “hierarchical expansion” of evolutionary theory.

Evolutionary theorists often distinguish between the unit of selection (Williams 1966; Franklin & Lewontin 1970; Lewontin 1970) and the unit of evolution (Williams 1966; Hull 1978; Ereshefsky 1991). Expanding the category of what can act as a unit of selection leads directly into a corresponding expansion of what can act as a unit of evolution. This is how a hierarchical theory of evolution is theoretically generated: when theoreticians consider not just organisms or individuals as the unit of selection (see entry) but also species and (kin) groups, and genes (for instance), they are also and correspondingly considering not just species or populations as the unit of evolution but also clades, and cultures, and cells or perhaps organisms (respectively). Each proposed unit of selection incurs another, higher-level candidate for the unit of evolution. Hierarchical evolutionary theory is just the name for theories of evolution that admit of different units of selection and evolution than that of (merely and respectively) organisms or individuals and species or populations. Hierarchical theorists see evolutionary processes (especially selection processes) unfolding simultaneously at different biological levels and temporal scales.

Hierarchical thinking about evolution is perhaps best illustrated with an example. It has already been noted that one way of explaining morphological stasis is stabilizing selection. Stabilizing selection is a well-understood Darwinian mechanism that operates on organisms in a population. Here, organisms are the units of selection while species are the units of evolution. But Sheldon (1996) introduced another potential explanation of stasis, which he called the “plus ça change” model. Sheldon observed that in times of environmental turmoil, ecological generalists usually have lower extinction risk, while ecological specialists are more prone to extinction. Perhaps surprisingly, then, a pattern of stasis in the fossil record might be due to the persistence of ecological generalists during times of environmental upheaval. This model appeals to species selection, or to the differential extinction and persistence of whole species, rather than to stabilizing selection processes occurring within those species. Hierarchical theorists hold that evolutionary patterns (like stasis) can be generated and sustained by processes operating at different biological levels.

Altogether, hierarchical evolutionary theory is potentially inclusive of macroevolutionary processes (such as species selection), along with paradigmatic microevolutionary processes (such as organism-level selection), sub-microevolutionary processes (such as genic selection), and even super-macroevolutionary processes (like clade selection). Lewontin (1970) considers the possibility of the following acting as units of selection: molecules, cell organelles, cells themselves, gametes, individuals (this is the term he uses), kin groups, populations, species, communities of species, and phyla. Williams (1966) and Dawkins (1976) are often credited with developing the notion of genic selectionism. Debate over genic selectionism—a theory within which genes are both the units of heredity and the units of selection—has led to further philosophical discussion regarding what counts as a replicator as opposed to an interactor (Hull 1980; Brandon 1988, 1990; Lloyd 1988; Griffiths & Gray 1994, 1997; Sterelny 1996; Sterelny, Smith, & Dickison 1996; Godfrey-Smith 2000; Griesemer 2000; Nanay 2002). Various biologists (e.g., Mayr 1963; Gould 1980a; Lewontin 1991) have ardently disputed the claim that genes act as direct targets of selection. Philosophers of biology have taken positions both pro (e.g., Sterelny & Kitcher 1988; Waters 1991) and con (e.g., Sober & D.S. Wilson 1994; Lloyd 2005) on the topic of genic selectionism.

Philosophical discussions of genic selection, clade selection, other units of selection, and the hierarchical theory of evolution are extensive and ongoing (in addition to works already cited, see Wimsatt 1980; Kitcher, Sterelny, & Waters 1990; Sober 1990; Godfrey-Smith & Lewontin 1993; Stanford 2001; Glennan 2002; R.A. Wilson 2003; Walsh 2004; Waters 2005; and Okasha 2006, among others). Another interesting, relatively recent, and somewhat related development is the proposal of a further, even-more-extended evolutionary synthesis, or EES (Jablonka & Lamb 2005; Pigliucci & Müller 2010; Laland et al. 2014; though see Wray et al. 2014). Proponents of EES contend that phenomena such as developmental bias (Arthur 2004), niche construction (Odling-Smee, Laland, and Feldman 2003), phenotypic plasticity (West-Eberhard 2003), and non-genetic inheritance processes like social learning and cultural transmission (Hoppitt & Laland 2013) challenge evolutionary theory as standardly understood. Opponents contend that the now-traditional theoretical framework constructed via the modern synthesis can accommodate all these phenomena and more. See Pigliucci and Finkelman (2014) for a discussion of the philosophical implications of the EES debate.

4. Theory Accommodation and Change

One meta-scientific issue raised by these macroevolutionary disputes is just how much a scientific theory can flex and change before it either becomes a different theory altogether, or it becomes a bad scientific theory (via too much of what Popper [1974] would call ad hoc revisionism).

As an illustrative example, consider punctuated equilibrium, which has certainty been articulated in many and varying ways. The two initial publications by Eldredge (1971) and Eldredge and Gould (1972) are undoubtedly the founding ones, but there are other crucial moments in the development of the theory (e.g., Gould & Eldredge 1977, 1983, 1986, 1993; Eldredge & Gould 1988; Gould 2002). At times the shifting nature of PE has been a target of criticism (e.g., Levinton 1986; Coyne & Charlesworth 1997; see Eckhardt 1986 for a particularly entertaining visit from “the shade of Francis Galton”).

Another dynamic theoretical dimension of PE, hierarchical theory, and the like is how radically these scientific notions are perceived—even by their own creators. In 1982, for instance, Gould first asked and then answered:

What would a fully elaborated, hierarchically based evolutionary theory be called? It would neither be Darwinism, as usually understood, nor a smoothly continuous extension of Darwinism, for it violates directly the fundamental reductionist tradition embodied in Darwin’s focus on organisms as units of selection. (1982: 386)

But in 2002, Gould wrote

I do believe that the Darwinian framework, and not just the foundation, persists in the emerging structure of a more adequate evolutionary theory. (2002:3)

He devoted much of the extensive efforts of his Structure of Evolutionary Theory to defending an interpretation of Darwinian evolutionary theory as resting on a revisable “tripod of necessary support” (Gould 2002: 586)—one whose three critical supports were challenged by proposed expansions to evolutionary theory, but which nonetheless could be buttressed via integration with these challenges, rather than replacement by them. In short, the later Gould argues that Darwinian evolution traditionally emphasizes organismic selection, adaptationism, and extrapolationism; that punctuated equilibria, stabilizing selection, and species selection challenge the first of these supports, developmental and other constraints challenge the second, and major evolutionary transitions challenge the third; but that all three of these challenges can be accommodated by a revised but still Darwinian conception of evolutionary theory.

Note that efforts to retain (or reject) the Darwinian label show up in other contexts as well—for instance, in discussions of adaptationism (e.g., Gould & Lewontin 1979) and the neutral theory of molecular evolution (Dietrich 1994). Darwin himself declared that “He who rejects these views [his] on the nature of the geological record, will rightly reject my whole theory” (1859 [1964: 342]). Whether or not Darwin’s emphatic claim is correct is still an open question. Additional philosophical resources on theoretical and conceptual change in science include but are by no means limited to Kuhn (1962), LaPorte (2004), and M. Wilson (2006).

5. Issues of Rhetoric and Risk

From October 16th to 19th of 1980, a conference on the subject of macroevolution was held at the Field Museum of Natural History in Chicago, Illinois. Shortly thereafter—in the November 21, 1980 issue of Science—an exciting report on some events of the conference was published (Lewin 1980). The report was entitled “Evolutionary Theory under Fire”, and it prompted a cascade of responses in the Letters section of Science—an exchange of scientific correspondence that continued for almost two decades. Whatever the motives behind the headlining of the report, it is empirically evident that the chosen title was inflammatory.

The February 21, 1981 issue of Science included no fewer than 5 separate contributions (in order of printing: Futuyma et al. 1981; Templeton & Giddings 1981; Carson 1981; Olson 1981; Armstrong & Drummond 1981). The February 4, 1983 issue of Science contained a letter by critics of PE (Schopf & Hoffman 1983) and a reply (Gould 1983). In the March 11 issue of that same year both prior parties were accused of prolonging a fruitless discussion of a “philosophically intractable” and dubious “pseudoquestion” (Grant 1983: 1170). In April, one correspondent wrote in agreement with Grant (Schoch 1983) and another chided him for failing “to explore and appreciate the latest blooming in the desert of dogma” (Maderson 1983: 360). To put it mildly, and purely descriptively: many of the responses elicited by the original report were impassioned and emotive.

In the February 14, 1986 issue of Science, the original reporter on the macroevolutionary conference fanned the flames with another piece, one entitled “Punctuated Equilibrium is Now Old Hat” (Lewin 1986). In March, Jeffrey Levinton registered an ardent objection to Lewin’s characterization of the theory as widely accepted, as well as to PE in general (Levinton 1986). In April, Gould responded (Gould 1986), and in May, Robert Eckhardt responded to Gould’s response (Eckhard 1986). Throughout these exchanges and related ones, many interesting meta-scientific charges were laid and lobbed. Questions of “where is the evidence?” as well as accusations of dogma, religionism, revisionism, sloganeering, and vagueness abounded.

So did references to creationism, specifically. The very first batch of letters in response to Lewin’s initial piece included one objecting strongly to the choice of title (Armstrong & Drummond 1981). The correspondents wrote that “this article is undoubtedly destined to enter the out-of-context arsenal that has become a mainstay of recent creationist literature” (Armstrong & Drummond 1981: 774). Incidentally, the correspondents were correct about this (e.g., Meyer 1994; Parker 2006).

And in the March 10, 1995 issue, a different journalist for Science published another piece, this one entitled “Did Darwin Get It All Right?” (Kerr 1995). By May 5, a scientist had written in to protest the use of such an inflammatory headline (McInerney 1995), referencing Lewin’s original piece (from 1980). McInerney wrote that Lewin’s earlier piece had “provided a gold mine for subsequent creationist propaganda” (1995: 624). He bemoaned the fact that another such headline had just been published by Science, and recommended that “a journal representing some 130,000 scientists be a bit more judicious in its choice of headlines” (1995: 624).

These references to a wider social context—the one in which such ardent macroevolutionary debate is being held—raise interesting issues that have perhaps been somewhat neglected by philosophers of science (though see the entry on the social dimensions of scientific knowledge). Do the scientists involved in this dispute, and the scientific journalists reporting on it, have a responsibility to consider the (unintended yet foreseeable and potentially avoidable) uses to which their headlines might be put (by creationists and other parties)? Some scientific correspondents evidently think they do. And if such responsibility exists, does it fall upon the shoulders of the scientist qua scientist—or upon the shoulders of the scientist qua citizen, or scientist qua educator? Philosophers focusing on the relation between science and value have done some relevant work on questions like these, usually while focusing on other scientific domains—work which could be applied to macroevolutionary instances and issues (e.g., Rudner 1953; Hempel 1960; Longino 1990; Douglas 2000, 2009; Kourany 2010).

These are not the only issues of provocative linguistic expression awaiting further exploration by philosophers of macroevolution. Questions of what it means to sit “at the high table” (Maynard Smith 1984; Sepkoski 2014) or to “replay life’s tape” (Gould 1989; Beatty 2006; Sepkoski 2016) are perhaps more familiar to philosophers of biology, but still worth exploring.

6. Historical Contingency

Stephen Jay Gould (1989) famously argued that evolutionary history is contingent. George Gaylord Simpson (1963) foreshadowed that claim when he suggested that paleontology is a distinctively historical science that seeks to understand “configurational change”. Gould claimed that if we could rewind the tape of history to some point in the deep past and play it back again, the outcome would probably be different.

Gould’s thinking about contingency has had significant impacts in both philosophy and biology. In philosophy, for instance, John Beatty (1995) argued that the contingency of evolutionary history implies that there are no distinctively biological laws, an argument that served as a touchstone for much of the subsequent debate about laws in biology (Brandon 1997; Mitchell 1997, 2000, 2002; Sober 1997; Giere 1999; Shapiro 2000; Woodward 2000, 2001, 2004; Elgin 2003, 2006; and Hamilton 2007; for important precursors to Beatty 1995, see Smart 1963; Ruse 1970; Cartwright 1983; van Fraassen 1989; and Rosenberg 1994). More recently, Beatty (2016) has argued that the contingency of evolutionary history is closely connected to narrative modes of explanation. His suggestion is that narrative explanations are especially well suited to historically contingent series of events. McConwell (2017) argues that the contingency of evolutionary history explains why we should be pluralists about biological individuality. In biology, on the other hand, Gould’s argument about contingency, particularly his thought experiment concerning rewinding and playing back the tape of history, helped to inspire research in long-term experimental evolution (e.g., Travisano, Mangold, Bennett, & Lenski 1995). In addition to fueling interest in understanding the Cambrian explosion, Gould’s work also instigated something of a backlash from other scientists convinced that selection-driven convergence is the hallmark of evolutionary history (e.g., Conway Morris 2003). This debate concerning contingency and convergence sometimes also has theological overtones. Conway Morris has at least hinted that he sees convergentism about evolution as cohering especially well with theism. This contrasts with Gould’s well-known view that science and religion should be regarded as “non-overlapping magisteria” (Gould 1997).

There is some question about just what Gould meant by the term ‘contingency’. Some philosophers read him as meaning that downstream outcomes are sensitive to small changes in upstream conditions (Ben-Menahem 1997; Inkpen & Turner 2012). On this reading, contingency comes in degrees, and in contrast with historical insensitivity to changes in upstream conditions, which we could think of as historical convergence or robustness. When, for example, Sterelny (1995, crediting F. Jackson & Pettit 1992) talks about “robust process explanations”, he means explanations that show how an outcome would have resulted from a wide range of upstream conditions.

Beatty (2006), however, has shown that there are two different senses of ‘contingency’ in play in Gould’s work. In addition to what Beatty calls contingency as causal dependence—basically, sensitivity to initial conditions—there is a second form of contingency that Beatty initially called contingency as unpredictability, but now calls contingency per se (Beatty 2016). These two senses of contingency correspond with two versions of the famous thought experiment that Gould (1989) deployed. Sometimes, Gould imagines rewinding the tape of history, tweaking an upstream variable, and then playing the tape back. On other occasions, he talks about playing the tape back from the same initial conditions. Beatty (2016) thinks that both senses of ‘contingency’ are important, and he takes it that the second sense—contingency per se—must commit us to some sort of causal indeterminism. On the other hand, Turner (2011a) has tried to give an account of this second sense of contingency that is neutral with respect to determinism. His suggestion is that what Gould really cared about was random or unbiased macroevolutionary sorting. Processes such as coin tosses, or random genetic drift, can be random or unbiased (in a sense) without violating causal determinism. One way to think about this is by adopting a frequentist conception of probability: the outcome of a coin toss could be causally determined by small-scale physical influences, but the outcome is still random or unbiased in the sense that over a long series of trials, the ratio of heads to tails will approximate 50:50. This account is closely allied with Sepkoski’s (2016) suggestion that Gould’s metaphor of replaying the tape of history was rooted in his work on simulations of macroevolution in the 1970s. Turner (2015) has also argued that there is a connection between contingency, thus understood, and the notion of a passive evolutionary trend.

McConwell and Currie (2017) have added further complexity to the discussion by arguing that there is an important difference between abstract, source-independent accounts of contingency and source-dependent accounts. The notion of sensitivity to initial conditions is a good example of what they mean by a source-independent account: it gives an abstract characterization of historical or biological processes without saying what the source of contingency is. Does the source have something to do with genetic drift? With mutational ordering? Or something else entirely? McConwell and Currie argue that in order to establish the autonomy of macroevolutionary theory, a source-dependent account is required.

Some commentators have noted that Gould’s defense of evolutionary contingency sits in tension with his arguments, in the 1970s and early 1980s, for a more “nomothetic” paleobiology (e.g., Raup & Gould 1974). A more nomothetic paleobiology would seem to place the emphasis on laws and predictability. However, contingency is thought by some to mean that there are no distinctively biological laws (Beatty 1995). Haufe (2015) addresses this puzzle by arguing that Gould was interested in developing a “nomothetic” science of macroevolution involving generations at large spatial and (especially) temporal scales, but that this is compatible with saying that contingency reigns at other scales. One other larger theme that may help to unify some of Gould’s thinking is his skepticism about the power of natural selection, which is the classic example of a micro-evolutionary process (see also Gould & Lewontin 1979). One way to limit the importance of natural selection is to insist on the autonomy of macroevolutionary theory, and to show that natural selection is insufficient to explain certain larger scale patterns. Another way is to insist that evolutionary history is contingent, since one would expect selection to produce convergent outcomes.

Thus, philosophers have done a lot of work on challenging conceptual questions about the various senses of ‘contingency’ and their relationship to other macroevolutionary ideas. One problem lurking in the background of this discussion is empirical: how can scientists even tell whether evolutionary history is contingent or (say) convergent? Conway Morris (2003) assembles a whole catalog of examples of evolutionary convergence in an effort to provide counterevidence against Gould’s contingency thesis. One important issue here is to find a principled way of distinguishing cases of convergent evolution (where unrelated lineages subject to similar selection pressures evolve similar traits) from parallel evolution (where lineages with similar traits to start with follow similar evolutionary trajectories) (Pearce 2012). Another issue is that one can multiply convergences by giving coarser-grained descriptions of the traits in question—for example, by counting agriculture in humans and some ant species as the same trait (Sterelny 2005). Powell & Mariscal (2015) argue that not all of the putative examples of convergence really tell against the contingency thesis, and they try to specify more clearly what would actually count as evidence against contingency.

In developing his initial claim about evolutionary contingency, Gould (1989) made much of the Burgess Shale fauna, exquisite Cambrian fossils from western Canada first described by the American paleontologist Charles Doolittle Walcott in the early 1900s. Gould was writing in the wake of what some call the “first reclassification” of the Burgess fossils, when work by British paleontologist Harry Blackmore Whittington and students Derek Briggs and Simon Conway Morris had placed many of the strange forms in their own phyla, with the idea that each phylum represented a unique body plan. Most of those Burgess phyla went extinct, but some (including a likely ancestor of chordates) persisted. But what if that sorting had happened differently? Since 1989, scientists Graham Budd, Allison Daley, and others using cladistic methods of classification (which were slow to be adopted by paleontologists) have reclassified the Burgess fauna yet again, placing many of the strangest ones in stem groups of existing clades (such as arthropods). So one further philosophical question is whether and to what extent this change in taxonomic practice matters to the argument that Gould tried to make about contingency (Brysse 2008).

There is a closely related debate about the status of phyla. Some cladists see phyla as being nothing terribly special. Like any higher taxa, phyla must be monophyletic, but from a cladistic perspective there is nothing about the taxonomic rank of phylum that has any particular importance to macroevolutionary theory. Others have argued that lower ranks like order and class are evolutionarily meaningful in a way that phyla are not (e.g., Holman 1989). Gould (1989), however, drawing upon German paleontological tradition, saw phyla as corresponding to stable morphological body plans (or Baupläne). This connects closely with his argument about contingency: if different Cambrian phyla had persisted, downstream evolutionary history would have involved modification of totally different body plans. Some scientists have recently tried to revive the idea that there is something special about the role of phyla in macroevolution (Levin, et al. 2016; though see Hejnol & Dunn 2016).

Finally, historical contingency is a counterfactual notion, and although this issue has not gotten as much attention as it deserves, there is a nascent philosophical literature on historical counterfactuals (Tucker 2004: 227ff; Nolan 2013; Radick 2016; Zhao 2017 in Other Internet Resources). The debate about historical contingency can be construed as a disagreement about the truth of various historical counterfactuals. Gould claimed that if things in the Cambrian had been slightly different, there would be no vertebrates today, let alone humans, while other convergentists claim that humanlike cognitive abilities, language, tool use, and sociality would have evolved even if other things had been different in the past—for example, if the non-avian dinosaurs had not gone extinct.

7. Passive vs. Driven Trends

Paleontologists have long been interested in documenting and explaining larger-scale evolutionary trends in the fossil record (McShea 1998). Perhaps the classic example of a macroevolutionary trend, and one that paleontologists have studied extensively, is Cope’s rule of size increase. Paleontologists routinely distinguish within-lineage trends (e.g., average size increase within a single lineage) from among-lineage trends (e.g., increase in the average size of mammals over the Cenozoic). The latter are distinctively macro-level patterns. While it might be tempting to think that trends such as evolutionary size increase are generally attributable to natural selection, Stanley (1973) pointed out that these trends could be merely statistical phenomena. Suppose that a clade, such as mammals, starts out at or near a fixed lower boundary on body size. And suppose that evolutionary size increases and decreases are equally probable. As the clade evolves, the mean body size might do a “random walk” away from the fixed boundary—an idea that Gould (1996) later popularlized. Many scientists also think of this as a passive diffusion model of evolutionary change.

The notion of a passive trend is closely related to other themes of macroevolutionary theory. Gould, in particular, was enthusiastic about the possibility that Cope’s rule might be a passive trend. If that were the case, then it would mean that evolutionary size increase is not attributable to natural selection. What’s more, if we explain size increase by supposing it to be a passive trend, then the explanation need not reference any micro-level causes. The fixed boundary in the state space could be maintained by developmental constraints—another favorite theme of Gould’s. And finally, a trend resulting from a random walk away from a fixed boundary would not seem to be progressive at all. To the extent that larger-scale evolutionary trends are passive, chance looks like a more significant factor in evolutionary history, and selection looks like a less significant one.

McShea (1994) gave one widely-cited formulation of the distinction between passive and driven trends, and also suggested several approaches for determining, empirically, whether a trend is passive or driven. One such approach is the stable minimum test: track, say, the body size of the smallest members of the clade. If that increases steadily over time, it is a signal that the trend is driven. Paleobiologists now routinely try to determine whether trends are passive or driven, though this work can sometimes encounter underdetermination issues (Turner 2009). Body size has received a lot of empirical attention, in part because it is easy to estimate from fragmentary fossil remains, and partly for the simple reason that it is a trait that every animal has.

In addition to its role in the development of macroevolutionary theory and its influence on scientific research, the passive/driven distinction raises a number of philosophical issues. As noted already, the notion of a passive trend links up with a traditional set of questions about the role of chance or randomness in evolution (Millstein 2000). Indeed, the passive/driven distinction looks a lot like the distinction between random genetic drift and selection in population genetics. Drift could be construed as a passive trend in gene frequencies. Grantham (1999) argues that the notion of a passive trend points toward a certain sort of explanatory pluralism: a trend that is best explained as a stochastic phenomenon at the macro-level could receive a more deterministic explanation at a lower level, and those explanations need not conflict. Turner (2014) suggests that the notion of a passive trend poses a challenge to popular interventionist ideas about causal explanation. Explaining a trend by showing that it is passive could turn out to be a non-causal explanatory strategy.

One issue that remains under-explored, philosophically, is how the distinction between passive vs. driven larger-scale trends might intersect with philosophical disagreements about whether neo-Darwinian evolutionary theory is best understood as a causal theory (a view given its canonical formulation by Sober 1984) or a statistical theory (Matthen and Ariew 2002; Walsh, Lewens, and Ariew 2002). There may be some question about whether it is best to understand the passive/driven distinction as a distinction between trends generated by different causal mechanisms, vs. a distinction between different sorts of statistical phenomena.

8. The Zero-Force Evolutionary Law

Many paleobiologists have assumed that driven trends must be driven by natural selection. For example, if body size increase is driven, surely that means that larger body size has conferred some survival or reproductive advantage (Hone & Benton 2005). McShea (2005) and McShea and Brandon (2010) have forcefully challenged that assumption. McShea (2005) argues that increase in structural complexity is a driven trend, but one that need not be driven by selection. That is because increasing structural complexity might just be the zero-force condition for evolving systems, an idea that McShea and Brandon (2010) develop in great detail. McShea and Brandon’s zero-force evolutionary law—or ZFEL—has elicited critical responses from other philosophers (Barrett, et al. 2012). Whereas traditional evolutionary thinkers, from Darwin on down, assumed that natural selection would have to explain complexity increase, McShea and Brandon see complexity increase as the default expectation, and they invoke selection to explain deviations from that default expectation—such as cases of eye loss in cave-dwelling species. They treat eye loss in cave dwellers as a case where natural selection favors a reduction in structural complexity. Alternatively, O’Malley, Wideman, & Ruiz-Trillo (2016) consider the potentially wide-ranging and macroevolutionary role of simplification in conferring “adaptive” advantage.

McShea and Brandon also argue that the ZFEL has the virtue of giving a unified account of both micro- and macro-evolutionary phenomena. They invoke the ZFEL to explain a wide variety of different patterns, ranging from complexity increase in the history of animal life, as represented by the fossil record, to increasing genomic heterogeneity over time. Whatever one thinks about their claim that the ZFEL is “biology’s first law”, their project raises a question worth exploring: is it reasonable to think that explanations of macroevolutionary patterns should take fundamentally the same form as explanations of patterns at vastly different spatiotemporal scales? How much does scale matter?

The ZFEL also raises some fundamental philosophical questions about the structure of evolutionary theory. How, for example, should we determine what counts as the default expectation, or zero-force condition, for an evolutionary system (Gouvêa 2015)? Is there any way to distinguish empirically between theories that disagree about the default expectation? Is there even a fact of the matter about what the default expectation should be? These questions about default expectations for evolutionary systems may link up with larger questions about the function of null hypotheses in scientific reasoning. These questions about default assumptions in macroevolutionary theory also prompt comparison with questions about, for instance, neutral theory in molecular evolution (Kimura 1983) and in community ecology (Hubbell 2006). For relevant philosophical discussion, see e.g., Dietrich (1994); Bausman and Halina (2018).

9. Major Evolutionary Transitions

If one way to think about the larger picture of the history of life on Earth is to focus on evolutionary trends (size increase, complexity increase, etc.), another approach is to focus on major transitional events in the history of life (Maynard Smith & Szathmáry 1995; Szathmáry & Maynard Smith 1995). The point of departure for most work on major transitions has been Szathmáry and Maynard Smith’s (1995: 228) list of game-changing alterations in evolutionary history:

  • Replicating molecules to populations of molecules in compartments
  • Unlinked replicators to chromosomes
  • RNA as gene and enzyme to DNA and protein (genetic code)
  • Prokaryotes to eukaryotes
  • Asexual clones to sexual populations
  • Protists to animals, plants, and fungi (cell differentiation)
  • Solitary individuals to colonies (non-reproductive castes)
  • Primate societies to human societies (language)

One of Maynard Smith and Szathmáry’s insights is that the very mechanisms of evolution—the way evolution works—have changed over the course of evolutionary history (Calcott & Sterelny 2011).

One philosophical concern about the theory of major transitions is that the original list was something of a mixed bag (McShea & Simpson 2011). For example, some of the transitions, like the evolution of eukaryotes and the evolution of multicellularity, seem to involve jumps in part/whole complexity. But others, like the evolution of sexual reproduction, do not. So it is not clear at all that these are transitions of the same kind. Indeed, Maynard Smith and Szathmáry suggest that the transitions have three features: (1) changes in the way that information is stored and transmitted; (2) new division of labor; and (3) individuals that could once reproduce independently can no longer do so after the transition. Criterion (3), in particular, links the issue of major transitions to the larger debate about the nature of biological individuality. One potential problem, though, is that not all the transitions on the original list satisfy all three criteria. For example, the shift from primate societies to human societies clearly involves (1) and (2), but not (3). To complicate things further, Szathmáry (2015) revisits the original list of transitions and proposes some changes.

Related to this worry that the major transitions do not comprise a unified type of evolutionary event, some theorists (e.g., O’Malley 2014) argue that other significant events should be count as major transitions. O’Malley & Powell (2016) think that the biological oxygenation of Earth is a major transition, and Currie (forthcoming) makes the case for treating mass extinctions as major transitions.

A second philosophical concern is that Maynard Smith and Szathmáry’s original idea looks a bit teleological, and in a way that likely raises the hackles of some scientists and philosophers (e.g., Dawkins 1986; Dennett 1995). The transitions in Szathmáry and Maynard Smith’s (1995) list all seem like necessary steps on the way to the evolution of humans, and cynically, one might wonder if their relation to the later appearance of humans is what makes the transitions “major”. Relatedly, one might wonder if the idea of major transitions comes a little too close to reviving pre-evolutionary thinking about the great chain of being. This also connects with traditional questions about evolutionary progress (Ruse 1997). While some of the concepts surveyed in this entry—especially passive trends and historical contingency—might seem like threats to the belief in evolutionary progress, the theory of major transitions coheres well with progressivist views about evolution.

In spite of these potential concerns, however, the major transitions really are historical events that pose distinct explanatory challenges. Arguably, our picture of macroevolution will not be entirely complete without tackling some of those challenges.

It is noteworthy that neither Maynard Smith nor Szathmáry are paleontologists, and so there may be a bit of a disconnect between their original proposal and the way that many paleontologists have come to think about major transitions. Several of the transitions from the original list must have occurred way back in the deep past; the fossil record is not likely to give us much insight into the origin of eukaryotes, for instance. Molecular tools may be able to shed some light on macroevolutionary queries about the deep past, however (O’Malley 2016). And paleontologists sometimes take a much broader (and looser) view of major transitions, such that any major evolutionary novelty would count as a major transition. For instance, the evolution of placentation in mammals, or the evolution of feathers in archosaurs, might count as major transitions on this broader view. Currie (forthcoming) draws a distinction between theory-driven approaches to major transitions and phenomena-driven approaches. Paleontologists tend to fall in the latter camp, since they usually begin by thinking about major morphological or phenotypic changes that show up in the fossil record.

10. The (Dis)unity of Macroevolutionary Theory

One significant and remaining challenge in the philosophy of macroevolution is to work out how the various ideas about macroevolution surveyed above may or may not fit together. What exactly is the relationship between punctuated equilibria and species selection? Or between PE and the major transitions? Or between species selection and historical contingency? Or between contingency and the major transitions? Do (some, all of) these ideas weave together to form a unified picture of evolution at large scales? Or do they represent something more like a heterogeneous grab bag of scientific ideas that are more or less useful in different contexts? A further question is how the relative (dis)unity of macroevolutionary theory might bear on the longstanding question of how macroevolution is related to microevolution.

Finally, the investigation of macroevolution challenges the purported distinction between the experimental and historical sciences (Sober 1993; Cleland 2001). Investigation in this domain is historical and often emphasizes the deep past, to be sure, but it also involves theoretical and prospective modeling, making predictions about what the models will or will not find, making predictions about what paleontologists will or will not find, running bottle and other kinds of experiments, simulations, and more. The scientific study of macroevolution is a philosophically rich and challenging field with many deposits to mine.


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