Sextus Empiricus

First published Fri Jan 17, 2014; substantive revision Fri Jul 12, 2019

Sextus Empiricus was a Pyrrhonian Skeptic living probably in the second or third century CE, many of whose works survive, including the Outlines of Pyrrhonism, the best and fullest account we have of Pyrrhonian skepticism (a kind of skepticism named for Pyrrho (see entry on Ancient Skepticism)). Pyrrhonian skepticism involves having no beliefs about philosophical, scientific, or theoretical matters—and according to some interpreters, no beliefs at all, period. Whereas modern skepticism questions the possibility of knowledge, Pyrrhonian skepticism questions the rationality of belief: the Pyrrhonian skeptic has the skill of finding for every argument an equal and opposing argument, a skill whose employment will bring about suspension of judgment on any issue which is considered by the skeptic, and ultimately, tranquillity.

1. Life

Sextus Empiricus was a Pyrrhonian Skeptic living probably in the second or third century CE, many of whose works survive, including the Outlines of Pyrrhonism, which is the best and fullest account we have of Pyrrhonian skepticism. (Book I of that work consists of Sextus’ codification of the nature of Pyrrhonian skepticism, which he contrasts with the outlooks of other schools of philosophy.) Fittingly, we know little or nothing about the life of Sextus Empiricus, including when and where he lived. Best estimates put him anywhere between 100 CE and the first half of the third century CE (House 1980), but it has been suggested that he was already well known by the end of the second century (Barnes 2000: xii). Sextus is called ‘Empiricus’ because he belonged to the Empirical School of Medicine (Deichgräber 1965: 40–1). There were three main schools of medicine, the Rationalists, the Empiricists, and the Methodists. Confusingly, even though Sextus was an Empiricist, he actually states in Outlines of Pyrrhonism I 236 that while Pyrrhonism is very similar to the Empirical School of Medicine, Pyrrhonists ‘might rather adopt’ Methodism. This is a standing puzzle for interpreters of Sextus (see section 3.7 below).

2. Works

2.1 Surviving Works

The surviving works are grouped under two headings.

2.1.1 Outlines of Pyrrhonism (Pyrrhoniae Hypotyposes)

(This is usually referred to by the abbreviation PH.) Works of Classical literature were normally divided into ‘books’ (Plato’s Republic is in ten books, Aristotle’s Physics is in eight, etc.); PH is in three books. They are not given separate titles by scholars, and are just referred to as PH I, II, and III. PH I is a complete description of Pyrrhonian Skepticism, stating what it is that makes one qualify as a Pyrrhonian skeptic (the possession of a certain skill) and what the pay-off for being a Skeptic is (tranquillity), detailing the various ‘Modes’ of argumentation that the Skeptic deploys (mastery of which constitutes the skill which defines the skeptic) and the various phrases the Skeptic uses to indicate his characteristic state of mind, namely epochê or ‘suspension of judgment’, and differentiating Pyrrhonian Skepticism from other philosophical schools with which it might seem to have affinities. In PH II and III, Sextus lays out the positions of Dogmatic philosophers on issues of logic (PH II), and physics and ethics (PH III), complete with Skeptical counterarguments to those positions: essentially, we see Sextus in PH II and III exercising the Skeptical skill which he had described in PH I. (With Sextus’ description of Pyrrhonian Skepticism, compare that in DL (Diogenes Laërtius) IX 61–116; for discussion of the differences, see the papers in Vogt 2015.)

2.1.2 Against the Mathematicians (Adversus Mathematicos)

(This is usually referred to by the abbreviation M.) The work is in eleven books, referred to as M I, II, III, etc. These books have separate titles:

M I:
Against the Grammarians
Against the Rhetoricians
Against the Geometers
Against the Arithmeticians
M V:
Against the Astrologers
Against the Musicians
Against the Logicians
M IX & X:
Against the Physicists
Against the Ethicists

The word in the title translated ‘Mathematicians’ more literally means ‘learned’ (think of the suffix ‘-math’ in ‘polymath’), so some people translate the title ‘Against the Professors’; Blank (1998: xvi) suggests ‘Against the Professors of the Liberal Studies’; Cooper (2012: 429) suggests ‘Against the Theoreticians’; Bett 2018 translates the title ‘Against Those in the Disciplines’. (Mathematics in a stricter sense is the target of M III and IV.) In fact, not all eleven books united under the title Against the Mathematicians belong together: we are dealing here with two works. As is clear from the way M I opens and M VI closes, M I–VI constitute a complete work—the work which strictly speaking bears the title Against the Mathematicians (Blank 1998: xvi). The remaining books, M VII–XI, also go together. Their contents shadow very closely the contents of PH II (M VII & VIII) and III (M IX–XI), expanding on them as appropriate (PH is, after all, just an ‘outline’). Janacek 1963 argues that M VII–XI form part of a larger work which was a lengthy elaboration of all the parts of PH; if this is right, then we have lost the book or books of that work which correspond to book I of the Outlines. (The observation that the larger work was an elaboration of PH is non-committal as to the order of composition of the two works. Janacek thought M was written after PH; against this, see Bett 1997: appendix C, and Schofield 2007: 321 n. 57.) The loss of the part corresponding to PH I is greatly to be regretted, since much of the philosophical interest surrounding Pyrrhonian skepticism comes out of Sextus’ description of it in PH I (indeed, most of this entry concerns PH I). Even though M VII–XI do not belong to the same work as M I–VI, it is customary amongst scholars to refer to all eleven books as M I–XI (Bett 2012: x).

(When scholars cite passages from PH and M, they usually include the book number and section number within that book, so ‘PH I 13’ means book one of PH, section 13.)

2.2 Lost Works

The ancients do not refer to their books using titles in the way we do. Often, Sextus refers to the books we know as PH or M using other descriptions. For instance, at M VI 52 he says:

that sound is non-existent has been proved by us in our skeptical commentaries (en tois skeptikois hypomnêmatois), from the evidence of the Dogmatists,

which is pretty clearly a reference to M VIII 131, and at M VI 61 he says:

that time is nothing we have already established in our Pyrrhonian writings (en tois Pyrrhôneiois)’,

which is either a reference to PH III 136–50 or M X 169–247 (Brochard 1887: 319–20). Most of Sextus’ references to his own works can be explained this way. However, a couple of times Sextus refers to his writings in ways which suggest that there are some treatises we no longer have (in addition to the part of M corresponding to PH I):

  1. M VII 202: ‘medical commentaries’ (ἰατρικὰ ὑπομνήματα); presumably the same as M I 61: ‘empiric commentaries’ (ἐμπειρικὰ ὑπομνήματα);
  2. M VI 55, ‘the commentaries on the soul’, and X 284 ‘in the writings on the soul’.

3. The nature of Sextus’ Pyrrhonism (PH I)

3.1 What do Skeptics do, and where do they get their name?

When you investigate whether P, there are three possibilities: (i) you discover something (you find that the reasons for believing one of P and not-P outweigh any reasons for believing the other), or (ii) you deny that it is possible to discover whether P, or (iii) you find that so far, the reasons for believing that P and the reasons for believing that not-P balance each other out, and so you keep on investigating (PH I 1). So-called ‘Dogmatic’ philosophers think they make discoveries when they investigate; ‘Academic’ skeptics assert that no discovery can be made; Pyrrhonists carry on investigating and searching for the truth (I 3). (For the sincerity of this last claim, see Palmer 2000 and Perin 2006.) This, continues Sextus, is why Skeptics get their name (I 7): ‘to investigate’ in Greek is skeptesthai, and so skeptikos means something like ‘one who is disposed to investigate’, ‘investigator’.

If Pyrrhonian Skeptics are still investigating any matter you like, there is no distinctive set of beliefs which mark them out as a school. Amongst the things Platonists believe is the proposition that the only truly real things are Forms (and their discovery of this is what their investigation into the question ‘what is there?’ culminated in), and amongst the things Aristotelians believe is the proposition that the soul is the actuality of the living body as such (and their discovery of this is what their investigation into the question ‘what is the soul?’ culminated in). Holding these beliefs is partially constitutive of what it is to be an Aristotelian or a Platonist. Skeptics have not yet found answers to those questions, because they are still investigating them. It follows that to be a Skeptic is not to subscribe to a set of beliefs in the way that members of the other Philosophical Schools do. Yet there must be something about them that makes them count as Skeptics. What, then, is Skepticism? Sextus’ answer is that it is an ability or skill (I 8), not a set of beliefs.

Sextus presents scepticism as a kind of philosophy, distinguished from others not by the content of its doctrines (there are none), but apparently by its attitude to philosophical problems and theses. (Striker 2001: 114; cf. Morison 2011: 265–9)

3.2 What is the Skeptical ability or skill?

Scepticism is an ability to set out oppositions among things which appear and are thought of in any way at all, an ability by which, because of the equipollence in the opposed objects and accounts, we come first to suspension of judgment and afterwards to tranquillity. (I 8)

Sextus tells us that the distinctively Skeptical ability is the one which enables its possessor to set out oppositions of such a sort that suspension of judgment ensues (tranquillity, we learn later, will follow ‘fortuitously’—see 3.3 below). The sort of opposition which will achieve this is one where ‘none of the conflicting accounts takes precedence over any other as being more convincing’ (I 10) (this is the elucidation of ‘equipollent’). So, a Skeptic is someone who has the ability to find, for any given argument in favour of a proposition P, a conflicting argument (i.e., one whose conclusion is a proposition which cannot be true together with P—call it P*) which is equally convincing.

This connects with investigation in the following way: when one investigates whether P, one assembles arguments or considerations in favour of P, and arguments or considerations against (i.e., arguments whose conclusions conflict with P). One assesses whether P or not-P on the basis of weighing up these arguments, and seeing which side carries more weight:

You pursue an inquiry insofar as you draw up possible solutions to the problem it addresses, consider what reasons might be adduced in favour of the different solutions, and attempt to assess the force of those reasons in order to pick out the correct solution. (Barnes 2000: xx)

Note then that ‘x suspends judgment as to whether P’ does not merely mean that x neither believes P nor believes that not-P. For if P is a proposition that x has never given any thought to, then it might be true that x neither believes P nor believes that not-P. President Obama neither believes that my mother’s name is ‘Judith’ nor believes that it isn’t, but he is not a skeptic about whether my mother’s name is ‘Judith’. To count as suspending judgment (in the Skeptic’s sense) whether P, it is at least necessary to have given the question whether P some thought. As Barnes 2000: xix, puts it:

x is sceptical with regard to the proposition that P if and only if (i) x has considered whether or not P, and (ii) x does not believe that P, and (iii) x does not believe that not-P.

Note further that Sextus

assembles arguments in favour of an affirmative answer, and arguments in favour of a negative answer. The two sets of arguments exactly balance one another. Ἐποχή [suspension of judgment] supervenes—ἐποχή directed towards the proposition that P. (Barnes 1982: 59)

This means that considering whether or not P requires that one consider both sides of the question whether P, i.e., that one considers arguments in favour of P and arguments in favour of not-P (or, more generally, of something incompatible with P; see PH I 10). It would not be enough, for instance, to look at one argument in favour of P and then reject that argument as invalid; while doing so would indeed leave one neither believing P nor not-P (assuming one had no further evidence either way), one would not have considered both sides of the question, since one would not yet have considered any arguments in favour of not-P. (This condition will be important later when we consider the Modes of Skepticism—see below, 3.5.2.)

3.3 Tranquillity

How does it come about that someone acquires the skeptical skill? Sextus offers an answer in PH I 12. People have become Skeptics because they are seeking tranquillity. Certain people (‘men of talent’ in Annas and Barnes’ translation; ‘smart and energetic people’ in Cooper’s nice gloss (2012: 282)) are ‘troubled by the anomaly in things’ (I 12) and want to take away this ‘trouble’, i.e., become tranquil (the word translated ‘tranquillity’ is etymologically related to the word translated ‘trouble’, and more literally means ‘lack of trouble’). Presumably Sextus has in mind that one might be troubled by the various discrepancies that the world offers, such as this one (taken from PH III 202): ‘among us, tattooing is thought to be shameful and a dishonour, but many Egyptians and Sarmatians tattoo their babies’. By considering these two facts, one has both the impression that tattooing is bad and the impression that it is good: those who pay attention to such anomalies will be ‘puzzled as to which of them they should rather assent to’ (PH I 12 again). So begins the quest for finding the answer and ridding oneself of the irksome ‘trouble’ that such questions induce. Sextus seems to be explaining how it is that someone could come to be investigating questions with the sort of single-mindedness the skeptic has, a single-mindedness which results in the intense scrutiny of all sides of a question. This will in turn explain how it is that anyone would end up with the skeptical skill: this intense scrutiny will lead the scrutiniser to develop skill at coming up with considerations speaking to both sides of a question and evaluating them for convincingness.

(For a slightly different take on what Sextus is up to in PH I 12, see Cooper 2012, who interprets Sextus as telling us about his ‘original skeptic predecessors’ (283) or ‘proto-skeptics’ (285), who came upon the skeptical skill as a result of their reflections, ‘as something then for later worriers to avail themselves of’ (282 n.76). In other words, Sextus is primarily offering ‘a narrative history of the experiences of those who became the first to practice the skeptic philosophy’ (288), rather than an account of how anyone at any time might find themselves becoming a skeptic.)

So if we are smart and energetic we seek intellectual tranquillity, or freedom from the troubles which come from being assailed by the many contradictions the world seems to offer. Sextus elaborates further in PH I 25–30 that ‘the aim of the Skeptic is tranquillity in matters of opinion’ (I 26). But whereas to begin with, ‘Skeptics were hoping to acquire tranquillity by deciding the anomalies in what appears and is thought of’ (I 29), they found themselves unable to settle the questions they were investigating and ended up suspending judgment (because of their Skeptical skill). But rather than this making them even more troubled, they discovered—to their surprise—that in fact tranquillity followed after all! They did not find the answers they had been looking for, because the Skeptical skill will preclude you from finding such answers; nonetheless, tranquillity did ensue. Sextus illustrates this fortuitousness with a story about Apelles the painter:

he was painting a horse and wanted to represent in his picture the lather on the horse’s mouth; but he was so unsuccessful that he gave up, took the sponge on which he had been wiping off the colours from his brush, and flung it at the picture. And when it hit the picture, it produced a representation of the horse’s lather. (PH I 28)

You search for tranquillity, and it will come, just not in the way you were expecting. More succinctly, Sextus says that tranquillity follows suspension of judgment ‘as a shadow follows a body’ (I 29; for the same image, cf. DL IX 107). The idea behind the shadow image seems to be that tranquillity will indeed follow suspension of judgment, but it is not the thing you were expecting. So, burning with curiosity, you engage in the investigation whether P, expecting to find tranquillity when you discover whether P; you end up not discovering whether P but rather suspending judgment whether P, and much to your surprise, tranquillity still follows. Striker finds in Sextus’ imagery the message that ‘Skeptical tranquillity can only be reached if one does not try for it’ (1990a: 193).

Will being a Pyrrhonian Skeptic bring you tranquillity, as Sextus advertises? Two objections have been brought against it.

(1) Striker (1990a) argues that Sextus is guilty of an inconsistency. Sextus obviously does not think there is such a thing as the goal of life (no self-respecting Pyrrhonian Skeptic could have such a theoretically loaded view). But then how can Sextus talk consistently of the goal of the Skeptic being tranquillity?

Such is the penalty of arguing, on the one hand, that there is no such thing as a goal of life […], and on the other, that Pyrrhonism is the only way to it. (Striker 1990a: 193)

Striker’s charge might be overstretched, since Sextus would characterise himself as suspending judgment over the question whether there is a goal of life (rather than as rejecting that there is such a thing), but the tension she points to still remains. Additionally, Striker argues against Sextus that there is a psychologically crucial ingredient in tranquillity that is missing from the Pyrrhonist’s version, namely ‘the thought that one has or can easily get all the goods one might need’ (ibid). That thought is missing because of course the Skeptic does not have any beliefs about what is good or bad, and indeed Sextus himself touts Pyrrhonism as having the advantage over other philosophies, and over the belief systems of ordinary people, that Pyrrhonists

shed the additional opinion that each of these things [sc. feelings such as hunger, thirst, etc. that we cannot avoid in virtue of being human] is bad in its nature. (PH I 30; cf. Frede 1979: 22)

This prompted Striker to conclude:

The Pyrrhonists would have done better, I believe, to stay out of the competition for guides to the happy life, and limit themselves to the field of epistemology. (1990a: 193)

Perhaps, though, the tranquillity that Sextus promises is only supposed to be intellectual tranquillity, freedom from the trouble or anxiety that having an unanswered question in your life brings. It can’t promise you freedom from your back pain or an irrational fear of death.

(2) Myles Burnyeat raises a different objection to Sextus’ claim that the Skeptic will find tranquillity:

ataraxia is hardly to be attained if he is not in some sense satisfied—so far—that no answers are forthcoming, that contrary claims are indeed equal. (1980: 56)

In other words, in order to settle back into intellectual tranquillity, the Skeptic must have some belief along these lines: no enquiry will ever produce an answer. He must become a global skeptic, and not just a local one. However, in the opening sentences of PH Sextus seems to preclude the possibility that Pyrrhonian skeptics espouse such a global belief in the impossibility of discovery when he contrasts the Pyrrhonian Skeptics, who ‘are still investigating’, with other, dogmatic, skeptics, who hold that the truth ‘cannot be apprehended’ (PH I 2). And quite apart from the apparent unavailability of this particular belief to the Skeptic, there is also the general worry that the Skeptic has no beliefs whatsoever (thus precluding him from believing that no enquiry will ever produce an answer). It is to this question that we shall turn next. But note that if it turns out that the Skeptic can have beliefs, and that the belief that no enquiry will ever produce an answer is one of the beliefs available to the skeptic, then we might be able to answer Burnyeat’s objection (for more on this see below, 3.6).

3.4 Does the Skeptic have any beliefs?

Since Skeptics spend their time taking the dogmatists to task for settling on their beliefs too quickly and not persevering in their enquiries, it is a natural question to wonder whether the Skeptics themselves have any beliefs—if so, they seem open to the very charges they level at the dogmatists. There are two ways in which the Skeptics might appear to have beliefs. First, they offer a wealth of counterarguments to the positions of the dogmatists. Where the dogmatists argue that P, the Skeptic argues that not-P. It can easily appear that the Skeptic is in fact endorsing the conclusion, i.e., that he holds that not-P on the basis of those arguments. But we should distinguish between two cases of arguing something, say, C: on the one hand, offering an argument with conclusion C and endorsing C, and on the other, offering an argument with conclusion C and letting the argument stand as a counter-argument to an argument with the opposite conclusion. Presumably, the Skeptic is doing the second. Still, you can see how the misunderstanding might have arisen (for more on this, see section 4.2 below). A second way the Skeptics might appear to have beliefs is that they went about their everyday lives in the way we all do, eating, drinking, sleeping, and avoiding oncoming wagons and dangerous-looking dogs, etc.—surely to act in this way requires having beliefs about the way the world is? This was a common charge levelled against the Skeptics by their opponents in antiquity (see Vogt 1998: 2010).

Sextus turns to the question of whether the skeptic has any beliefs in a very famous—and much debated—passage, PH I 13 (in Annas and Barnes’ translation):

When we say that Skeptics do not hold beliefs, we do not take ‘belief’ in the sense in which some say, quite generally, that belief is acquiescing in something; for Skeptics assent to the feelings forced upon them by appearances—for example, they would not say, when heated or chilled, ‘I think I am not heated (or: chilled)’. Rather, we say that they do not hold beliefs in the sense in which some say that belief is assent to some unclear object of investigation in the sciences; for Pyrrhonists do not assent to anything unclear.

The question of how to interpret this little paragraph, and thus settle the question of whether the Skeptic has any beliefs, is the question that much contemporary scholarship concerning Sextus has focussed on (see for instance the papers collected in Burnyeat and Frede 1997; with Fine 2000; Barnes 2007; Perin 2010b), yet there does not seem to be a consensus.

3.4.1 Yes, the Skeptic has beliefs

In 1979, Michael Frede argued that

the sceptics thought that even if one suspended judgment on all matters, at least suspended judgment in the sense in which they recommend that one suspend judgment, one would still have many beliefs and views, quite enough, at any rate, to lead a worthwhile life. (Frede 1979: 3)

Frede took himself to be arguing against what he terms the ‘usual interpretation of Pyrrhonian scepticism’, namely that the Skeptic ‘has no view or beliefs about anything’ (1). Frede argues that in PH I 13,

Sextus distinguishes between a wider (koinoteron) and a narrower sense of ‘belief’; and only beliefs in the narrower sense count as dogmatic. (8–9)

So confident is Frede of this analysis that he concludes:

there can be no doubt whatsoever that, according to Sextus, a serious Pyrrhonean skeptic can have beliefs. (9)

The question for Frede is how to understand what Sextus says in I 13 when he characterizes the first kind of belief (dogma) which he says the skeptics can have. Frede argues that what is meant is that the Skeptic

accepts the judgment of phantasia; at least, he raises no objection against its verdict; if it says things are thus or thus, he does not challenge this. (18)

(Phantasia here refers to the faculty of our soul which produces in us impressions of how things are. In PH I 13, Sextus says that Skeptics assent to ‘the feelings forced upon them by appearances’; one could also translate this as follows: ‘the feelings forced upon them by an exercise of phantasia’.) In other words, the Skeptic, like everyone, has impressions which represent the world as being a certain way, and these are forced upon the Skeptic, so there is no avoiding them, and these impressions in turn have a certain pull which inclines the Skeptic to assent to them and which he does not counteract. Texts such as I 13, I 22, and I 29–30 emphasize that the impressions are forced on us. Other texts emphasize that impressions bring with them a pull which is sufficient to cause assent, e.g., I 19:

we do not overturn anything which leads us, without our willing it, to assent in accordance with a passive appearance,

or I 193:

we do yield to things which passively move us and lead us necessarily to assent’ (my emphases).

The second kind of belief referred to in I 13, the kind which the Skeptic cannot have, is a belief which Frede characterizes as one which ‘involve[s] an assumption or claim about one of the nonevident objects of scientific inquiry ’ (18). These beliefs are not forced upon one, but arise through the rational weighing up of evidence on either side of a question. Frede’s (and Sextus’) characterization of these beliefs as being ‘about one of the nonevident objects of scientific enquiry’ might make it seem as though it is beliefs with a certain content that will not be entertained by the skeptic, but in fact Frede has something different in mind:

As far as the second part of our passage is concerned, it says only that the sceptic may not have beliefs of a certain kind, viz., philosophical or scientific ones which depend on reasoned grounds. (19)


[a]ny belief, whatever its content may be, can be a dogmatic belief; conversely, every belief can be an undogmatic one. (ibid)

Roughly speaking, Frede is proposing that the difference between the kinds of belief a Skeptic can have and the ones the Skeptic cannot have is a difference in the way the beliefs are formed. If the belief that p has been formed ‘on reasoned grounds’—‘as a result of marshalling arguments or considerations in favour of p’ (Morison 2011: 266), or perhaps as a result of simply thinking that there are such grounds without having yet marshalled them—then this belief counts as a belief of the sort the Skeptic cannot have, and if the belief that p has been formed not on the basis of the marshalling of arguments, but just because that is how things strike the person who forms the belief, then this belief counts as a belief of the sort the Skeptic can have. (See Perin 2010a and b for doubts about whether this interpretation can be extracted from Sextus’ text.) [See the supplementary document Interpreting Frede.]

Examples of the kind of belief the Skeptic could have, following Frede’s interpretation, are ones such as the following:

  1. (a) The belief that it is day outside, where this belief is formed immediately from the perceptual appearance to you that it is day outside. Contrast: someone believing that it is day outside on the basis of performing a calculation about the sun’s position at that precise time relative to their position on the earth (Morison 2011: 267). Or again, contrast someone who believes that it is day outside because they run through an argument such as this in their heads: my senses are reliable; it appears right now to my senses that it is day outside; therefore it must be day.
    (b) The belief that 1+1=2, where this belief is formed as a result of it just striking your intellect that 1+1=2. Contrast: believing that 1+1=2 as a result of running through the proof in Principia Mathematica.
  2. The belief that you should eat something right now, where this belief is formed immediately from the feeling you have of being hungry. Contrast: someone, an athlete perhaps, who weighs up the pros and cons of having something to eat now, and decides that they should, because on balance, the pros outweigh the cons.
  3. The belief that the Stoic God exists, where this belief is formed simply from acculturation; ‘imagine someone who has been raised by the Stoics and who thus has the Stoic concept of God’ (Frede 1979: 23). Contrast: a philosopher who believes that the Stoic God exists, formed as a result of running through and accepting the proofs the Stoics give of the existence of this sort of God.
  4. The belief that you should make the table in this way, where this belief is formed from your craft-experience. Imagine the apprentice carpenter who simply follows the example set by his teacher, without actually holding that the way his teacher does things is the correct one. Or perhaps you make the table this way just because every time you have made a table this way it has stayed upright. Contrast: the master-carpenter who has an account of why pieces of wood stick together better this way than any other way, and who believes on this basis that you should make the table this way accordingly.

These examples are deliberately chosen in order to reflect the fourfold sources of appearances guiding our actions that Sextus relates in PH I 21–24, which Frede will take to be a fourfold source of beliefs open to the Skeptic, providing him with the wherewithal to lead an ordinary life:

By nature’s guidance we are naturally capable of perceiving and thinking. By the necessitation of feelings, hunger conducts us to food and thirst to drink. By the handing down of customs and laws, we accept, from an everyday point of view, that piety is good and impiety bad. By teaching of kinds of expertise we are not inactive in those expertises which we accept. (I 24)

Frede’s interpretation provides a neat way to sidestep the traditional charge levelled against the Pyrrhonian Skeptics, namely that they will not be able to lead a recognisably human life, thanks to their suspension of judgment on all matters. The trick is to see that the Skeptics can hold beliefs, but just in an ordinary everyday way (‘from an everyday point of view,’ as he says in the passage above), i.e., not as a result of marshalling arguments and evidence in favour of those beliefs, as philosophers and scientists do.

Many other texts in Sextus suggest that in fact, the Pyrrhonian Skeptic does have beliefs. Here are some.

  • we accept (παραλαμβάνομεν), from an everyday point of view, that piety is good and impiety bad (PH I 24).
  • we accept (ἀκούομεν) that there are such things as numbers (PH III 151).
  • in line with his [sc. the skeptic’s] ancestral customs and laws, he says (λέγων) that there are gods and does everything that tends to worship of and reverence towards them (M IX 49).
  • But in fact we ourselves judge (ἔγνωμεν) this way, assuming fire from smoke, a previous wound from a scar, death from previous trauma to the heart, and oil from a previous headband (M VIII 157).

3.4.2 No, the Skeptic doesn’t have beliefs

Frede’s proposal was rejected by Jonathan Barnes and Myles Burnyeat, who argued that Pyrrhonian Skepticism involves rejecting all beliefs. Barnes followed Galen in using the term ‘rustic’ for the skeptic who rejects every belief, and coined the term ‘urbane’ for the kind of skeptic Frede describes, the one whose skepticism still allows him to have beliefs (Barnes 1982: 61). One challenge for these interpreters who think Sextus is a rustic skeptic is to explain how the type of dogma that the skeptic does allow himself in I 13 won’t count as a belief. According to Burnyeat, what is going on when the Skeptic assents in accordance with the appearances is that he is merely ‘acknowledging that this is indeed how the thing appears to one at the moment’ (Burnyeat 1980: 43); but Skeptics and dogmatists dispute ‘whether any proposition or class of propositions can be accepted as true of a real objective world as distinct from mere appearance’ (30). ‘Statements which record how things appear cannot be described as true or false’ (31), since

the true, if there is such a thing, is what conforms with the real, an association traditional to the word alethes since the earliest period of Greek philosophy. (30)

Hence the pronouncements of the Skeptic that things appear thus-and-so do not represent the beliefs of the Skeptic as to how things are, but only record how things appear to him.

Jonathan Barnes has a slightly different interpretation of the pronouncements of the Skeptic: when the Skeptic sees the tower in the distance and it appears round to him, he

may utter the sentence “The tower seems round”: he thereby expresses his πάθος, but he does not state that he is experiencing a certain πάθος (he does not state anything at all). (1982: 66; his emphases)

What is the Skeptic doing, then, if he is not stating anything? He is avowing something:

it is plain that avowals and confessions were supposed by the Pyrrhonists to be speech acts of a different kind from statements or affirmations. (65)

His avowals ‘express πάθη and do not evince beliefs’ (66). His pronouncement is like saying ‘ouch!’: one does not express one’s belief that one is in pain in saying ‘ouch!’, but rather one simply expresses one’s pain (ibid).

Barnes and Burnyeat have the same goal: to deny that any utterances the Skeptic makes which have the form ‘X appears F’ commit the Skeptic to having any beliefs. In other words, they attempt to show that assenting to the ‘feelings forced upon them by appearances’ (I 13) need not involve having a belief in our sense of the term (even though Sextus says that this is a way of having a dogma). It is important to see that Barnes and Burnyeat do not arrive at this position by interpreting I 13 alone; rather they have an argument that the Skeptic can’t have any beliefs, and they interpret I 13 in the light of that. That argument is sketched below (section 4.1), since it turns on the use they make of Sextus’ discussion of the criterion of truth (which occupies a large part of PH II and all of M VII).

What do Barnes and Burnyeat say about the kind of life the Skeptic leads? How can the Skeptic respond to the charge that he cannot lead a recognisably human life unless he has beliefs? Barnes 1982: 79–89 attempts an interpretation of PH I 21–4 according to which the fourfold observances of everyday life don’t commit the Skeptic to any beliefs whatsoever: hunger and thirst ‘alone suffice to drive the Skeptic—like any other man or animal—to food and drink’ (82);

Teaching a man medicine… is like training him to ride: you are attempting to impart a power or skill to him; you are not trying to give him any beliefs; (83)

the Skeptic ‘drives on the right because that is the custom—not because he believes that it is the custom’ (84); etc.

Many texts in Sextus suggest that the Skeptic does not have any beliefs. Here are some.

  • The chief constitutive principle of Skepticism is the claim that to every account an equal account is opposed; for it is from this, we think, that we come to hold no beliefs (μὴ δογματίζειν) (PH I 12).
  • in uttering these phrases [the Skeptical phrases: see below 3.6] they say what is apparent to themselves and report their own feelings without holding opinions (ἀδοξάστως), affirming nothing about external objects (PH I 15).
  • we say all this [i.e., about the fourfold sources of appearances governing actions, listed in PH I 21–4] without holding any opinions (ἀδοξάστως) (PH I 24).

3.4.3 Yes again.

Finally, it is worth noting another position that some scholars have taken: when Skeptics acknowledge that things appear thus-and-so to them, they quite simply do have beliefs, namely ‘beliefs about the ways things appear to him to be’ (Perin 2010b: 161, following Fine 2000: 104). The skeptic does indeed have beliefs: Burnyeat was wrong to say that acknowledging that things appear to you thus-and-so is not a way of holding something to be true, and Barnes was wrong to try to dodge the commitments the skeptic incurs when he utters sentences such as ‘honey seems sweet to me’, by talking of avowals. Rather, Perin and Fine argue, the skeptic has exactly the belief you would expect, given that he says things like ‘honey seems sweet to me’: the belief that things appear thus-and-so to him (in this instance, the belief that honey appears sweet to him). It is important to note that the beliefs such interpreters attribute to the Skeptics are nothing like the beliefs that Frede’s interpretation allows to the Skeptic. Frede’s position allows the Skeptic to have ordinary beliefs such as ‘it is day outside’, ‘I am hungry’, ‘the library closes at 6.00 p.m.’, etc., whereas the interpreters under discussion allow to the Skeptic only beliefs such as ‘it seems to be daytime outside’, ‘I feel hungry’, ‘the library appears to close at 6.00 p.m.’, etc.

Some texts in Sextus suggest the Fine/Perin view. Here is one. PH I 19–20 (in the Annas and Barnes translation):

When we investigate whether existing things are such as they appear, we grant (δίδομεν) that they appear, and what we investigate is not what is apparent but what is said about what is apparent—and this is different from investigating what is apparent itself. For example, it appears to us that honey sweetens (we concede (συγχωροῦμεν) this inasmuch as we are sweetened in a perceptual way).

3.4.4 An assessment

Here is PH I 13 again:

When we say that Skeptics do not hold beliefs, we do not take ‘belief’ in the sense in which some say, quite generally, that belief is acquiescing in something; for Skeptics assent to the feelings forced upon them by appearances—for example, they would not say, when heated or chilled, ‘I think I am not heated (or: chilled)’. Rather, we say that they do not hold beliefs in the sense in which some say that belief is assent to some unclear object of investigation in the sciences; for Pyrrhonists do not assent to anything unclear.

[See the supplementary document The example from PH I 13.]

The way to make progress is to see how the three interpretations sketched in (3.4.1)–(3.4.3) differ in the way they interpret the phrase ‘Skeptics assent to the feelings forced upon them by appearances’ in PH I 13. The ‘feelings’ in question are the states (pathê) that the faculty of phantasia puts one in when it represents the world as being a certain way (so when my faculty of phantasia represents the world as being one in which P, I am thereby in the state of being appeared to that P). When X is in that state, X has the impression or appearance that P. The question which concerns us is this: what does it mean to assent to this feeling, i.e., this impression or appearance? According to Frede, assenting to this feeling is a matter of believing the world to be as the state represents it as being. Or, more punchily, assenting to the feeling forced upon one by appearances entails accepting the content of that state. For Barnes and Burnyeat, to assent to the appearance that P is a matter of acknowledging that one is in the state of being appeared to that P. What gets acknowledged or accepted is that one is in that mental state, not the content of the state. Both Barnes and Burnyeat think that to make such an acknowledgment does not amount to having a belief—it’s just an acknowledgment that one is in a certain internal state. Fine and Perin agree with Barnes and Burnyeat that the Skeptics acknowledge that they are in a certain mental state (rather than accepting the content of the state), but Fine and Perin are prepared to say that the skeptic does thereby believes something, namely that it appears to him that P, and that this belief is the only kind of dogma the Skeptic has.

In deciding this debate, one has to keep two issues apart (see e.g., Fine 2000: 81). One is how to interpret Sextus’ characterisation of the kind of dogma which is acceptable to the skeptic (does it involve accepting that one is in a certain mental state, or is it an acceptance of the way the world is, etc.); the other is whether a dogma of the acceptable kind deserves to be called a belief, given what that English term connotes. The second of these points is a matter of philosophical definition, but the first is a properly interpretational dispute. Barnes and Burnyeat claim that the acceptable kind of dogma, on their analysis, is not a belief in any acceptable sense of the word ‘belief’: for me to acknowledge that I am currently having a perceptual experience of a tree outside my window (to acknowledge that it appears to me that there is a tree outside) is no way of believing that there is a tree outside. Striker points out that this is not so obvious, since according to Barnes and Burnyeat, the Skeptic’s actions are governed by these acknowledgments, and there is

a much weaker, dispositional sense [sc. of the word ‘belief’], according to which it is sufficient for the ascription of a belief to an agent if she acts or behaves in a certain way. (Striker 2001: 119)

Hence she is inclined to think ‘it is a matter of terminological choice whether we want to speak of belief here or not’ (ibid). In other words, given the Barnes/Burnyeat interpretation of what a dogma is, she thinks it is a matter of terminological choice whether we call it a ‘belief’. But what we are interested in here is the larger question of just what it means to have a dogma of the acceptable kind.

So who is right about what the acceptable kind of dogma is? Who is right about the interpretation of the phrase ‘Skeptics assent to the feelings forced upon them by appearances’? Presumably Sextus intends us to understand the phrase in the light of its philosophical background. Frede claims:

“assenting to such impressions” cannot mean “assenting to the claim that one is affected in this way, that one has such impressions” (1979: 20),

thereby flatly denying the interpretation of Barnes and Burnyeat. Unfortunately, he doesn’t say why the phrase cannot mean this. But his reason is not hard to find. Sextus is using Stoic terminology and is deliberately casting the issue using Stoic terms. And for the Stoics, to assent to the impression that P is a matter of judging that P:

To accept or give assent to a thought or impression is to have the belief that the proposition which forms the content of the impression is true. (Frede 1983: 153)

The issue is thoroughly uncontroversial in Stoic scholarship; see, for instance, Sandbach 1975: 88:

The man may say ‘There appears to be an apple, and I assent: there is an apple’.

(For the same diagnosis of Frede’s train of thought, see Fine 2000: 101.) The point is that no one reading Sextus’ text in the light of the philosophical usage of the terms he uses would think that assenting to the impression that P meant anything other than believing that P. Specifically, no one would think that it meant acknowledging or judging that one has the impression that P. So purely as a matter of philosophical usage, to talk of assenting to an impression that P, as Sextus does, requires us to understand that assent as the having of a belief that P. (Note that this is not a linguistic point about the Stoics’ use of the word dogma, since they don’t use that word in these contexts, but rather a philosophical point about what assenting to an impression must amount to for the Stoics.) If this is right, then philosophical philology alone rules out the reading that Burnyeat and Barnes and Perin and Fine want. (For a different view on the origins of Sextus’ language in PH I 13, but one which arrives at the same conclusion, see Barney 1992.)

In I 13, Sextus gives two senses of the verb translated ‘to have beliefs’ (δογματίζειν), and he does so by means of distinguishing two meanings of the word ‘belief’ (δόγμα). One meaning is broader (koinoteron) than the other. So the first meaning should encompass the second. Sextus clearly intends this to be so: in the first sense of dogma, a dogma is assent to anything, and in the second sense it is assent to a certain subclass of things (‘some unclear object of investigation in the sciences’). In arguing that the Skeptic has dogmata in the first sense, Sextus simply needs to show that the Skeptic does assent to something. And this he does by telling us which things the Skeptic assents to: he assents to the ‘feelings forced upon him by appearances’. When Sextus says what it is that the Skeptics don’t assent to, we are told that it is the ‘unclear objects of investigation in the sciences’. If it’s right that the talk of assenting to impressions is Stoic, then it could sound as though here Sextus is talking about assent to a different kind of thing here, something more like a proposition. It could sound as if Sextus means to differentiate between the type of thing that the Skeptic assents to (appearances) and the type of thing he doesn’t assent to (objects of investigation, i.e., propositions). Indeed, it may be that this lies behind the interpretations of Barnes, Burnyeat, Perin, and Fine: what the Skeptic can assent to are his own impressions, but not to matters of fact! But on closer inspection, Sextus does describe the object of this second kind of assent in epistemological or psychological terms: the forbidden kind of dogma involves assenting to ‘unclear objects of investigation in the sciences’. So it is not difficult to put this in terms of impressions: Sextus is saying that the forbidden kind of dogma involves assenting to impressions which are not clear. Why should the impressions garnered during the course of an investigation in the sciences be unclear? For a Pyrrhonist such as Sextus, the answer is obvious: any impression that P which comes to him during his investigation will be counterbalanced by an impression that not-P (or some other conflicting impression). These impressions or appearances do not carry with them any pull because they are always countermanded by another equal and opposite impression. Thus, to assent to one of these impressions is to go beyond appearances; it is no longer a matter of responding, passively and without an act of the will, to the weight or pull of the appearances, but rather a matter of going beyond how things appear; in such cases, one’s assent is instead dictated by certain theoretical commitments one has (or, more broadly, by one’s accepting something as a reason for assenting to the non-apparent thing).

Verdict: the Skeptic does have beliefs. He assents to certain appearances, namely those that aren’t accompanied by equal and opposing appearances. When he assents to those appearances, he is not endorsing them as being the correct ones in the light of this or that theory, or in the light of this or that reason for assenting, but merely passively responding to their pull. In I 13 Sextus dresses this point up in Stoic garb, presumably in order to send the message that the Stoics have to acknowledge the existence of the kinds of belief the Skeptic has. And the examples of beliefs that the Skeptic would end up with are indeed the ones that Frede gives, such as me believing now that it is day, on the basis of having a (perceptual) impression that it is light outside, an impression which is not countermanded by any countervailing impressions and which exerts a pull all of its own towards assent. [See the supplementary document Revisiting the texts which appeared to support interpretations 3.4.2 and 3.4.3.]

Thus, the weight of evidence seems to favour the Frede interpretation (although sometimes it can also seem as though the rational thing to do is to suspend judgment in the face of these equally strong competing interpretations).

3.5 Modes

By far the longest single discussion in PH I concerns the modes of Skepticism (I 31–186) (see Annas and Barnes 1985; Barnes 1990a,b; Striker 1993; Hankinson 1995: chapters 9 and 10; Perin 2006: 354–8; Woodruff 2010; Morison 2011, 2018; Bullock 2016). These are announced as being means by which the Skeptic comes to suspension of judgment (I 35). Recall that the Skeptic achieves his characteristic state of suspension of judgment (epochê), with respect to some proposition or other, by assembling arguments or considerations on both sides (PH I 12). The Skeptic needs techniques or tools to bring this suspension about. The modes divide into four groups, the Ten Modes, the Five Modes, the Two Modes, and the Eight Modes. (Presumably the Skeptic can employ methods other than the modes for bringing about suspension of judgment. For extended analysis of one such method, that of ‘reversal’, see Castagnoli 2010: ch. 14.)

3.5.1 The Ten Modes (PH I 35–163)

This charming group of modes, attributed by Sextus in PH I 36 to unnamed ‘older skeptics’, but in M VII 345 to Aenesidemus (fl. first century BCE; see Schofield 2007; Hankinson 2010), gets the longest treatment of all the groups of modes:

  1. The mode depending on the variations among animals (I 40–78);
  2. The mode depending on the differences among humans (I 79–90);
  3. The mode depending on the differing constitutions of the sense-organs (I 91–99);
  4. The mode depending on circumstance (I 100–117);
  5. The mode depending on positions and intervals and places (I 118–23);
  6. The mode depending on admixtures (I 124–28);
  7. The mode depending on the quantities and preparations of existing things (I 129–34);
  8. The mode deriving from relativity (I 135–40);
  9. The mode depending on frequent or rare encounters (I 141–44);
  10. The mode depending on persuasions and customs and laws and belief in myths and dogmatic suppositions (I 145–62).

The point of the Ten Modes is to provide us with propositions to use against dogmatists who make their usual rash claims about the way the world is. They exploit the relativity at the heart of appearances to undermine these claims. There is a pattern underlying them, since they each supply us with two propositions: x (a thing) appears F in (situation) S, and x appears F* (i.e., something incompatible with F) in another situation S* (Annas and Barnes 1985: 24). Here are some representative examples:

  • perfume appears very pleasant to humans but intolerable to dung-beetles and bees (first mode, PH I 55);
  • the same honey appears sweet to me, but bitter to people with jaundice (fourth mode, PH I 101);
  • the same tower appears from a distance round, but from close at hand square (fifth mode, PH I 118);
  • the poets represent the gods as committing adultery and indulging in homosexual acts, while with us the law forbids these things (tenth mode, PH I 159).

What does the Skeptic do with the pair of propositions generated by an application of the Ten Modes? Annas and Barnes suggest the Skeptic propounds to himself instances of the following schema (1985: 25):

There are oppositions:

x appears F in S
x appears F* in S*

but the appearances are equipollent, i.e.,

we cannot prefer S to S* or vice versa;

Hence we arrive at suspension of judgment, i.e.,

we can neither affirm nor deny that x is really F or really F*.

(For similar stories, see Hankinson 1995: 156; Striker 1993: 120.) This is an unattractive interpretation as it stands. The Skeptic surely cannot endorse premiss (3); this is a dogma of the forbidden kind. Also, the Skeptic’s suspension of judgment is not a conclusion to any argument (in the logical sense of the term), but something that happens to us when we are confronted by equal and opposing arguments (see e.g., Barnes 1982: 59). So an alternative interpretation would be to suppose that the Ten Modes are devices for generating precisely such equal and opposing arguments, and not merely a pair of propositions (Morison 2011: 287–93). What would the two opposing arguments be? Schematically, they would be as follows:

x appears F in S x appears F* in S*
Therefore, x is F Therefore, x is F*

In the case of the application of the fourth mode that we saw above, it would generate these two arguments:

Honey is perceived to be sweet by healthy people
Therefore, honey is sweet
Honey is perceived to be bitter by jaundiced people
Therefore, honey is bitter

Arguments (1) and (2) are opposing arguments because their conclusions conflict, and they are equal because (2) matches (1) in argumentative strategy:

The second argument makes exactly the same move as the first: where the first called upon a fact concerning how honey is perceived, so did the second. (Morison 2011: 292)

Suspension of judgment will follow for the Skeptic, since he is confronted by two equal and opposing arguments (and because the arguments are equal, he doesn’t need to say to himself any premiss such as premiss (3) of Annas and Barnes’ argument given above). Thus, the Ten Modes are devices for generating an equal and opposing argument in response to a dogmatist’s attempt to show how things are based on how they are perceived in some situation or other.

3.5.2 The Five Modes (PH I 164–77)

Sextus’ presentation of the Five Modes is brief and elliptical, which is much to be regretted, since philosophically they are the most interesting of all the modes. They are attributed here to ‘the more recent Skeptics’, but Diogenes Laërtius tells us that the modes were invented by Agrippa (DL IX 88), who probably lived at the end of the first century BCE. Here is the complete text of Sextus’ presentation (PH I 164–9):

[164] The more recent Skeptics offer the following five modes of suspension of judgment: first, the mode deriving from dispute; second, the mode throwing one back ad infinitum; third, the mode deriving from relativity; fourth, the hypothetical mode; fifth, the reciprocal mode. [165] According to the mode deriving from dispute, we find that undecidable dissension about the matter proposed has come about both in ordinary life and among philosophers. Because of this we are not able either to choose or to rule out anything, and we end up with suspension of judgment. [166] In the mode deriving from infinite regress, we say that what is brought forward as a source of conviction for the matter proposed itself needs another such source, which itself needs another, and so ad infinitum, so that we have no point from which to begin to establish anything, and suspension of judgment follows. [167] In the mode deriving from relativity as we said above, the existing object appears to be such-and-such relative to the subject judging and to the things observed together with it, but we suspend judgment on what it is like in its nature. [168] We have the mode from hypothesis when the Dogmatists, being thrown back ad infinitum, begin from something which they do not establish but claim to assume simply and without proof in virtue of a concession. [169] The reciprocal mode occurs when what ought to be confirmatory of the object under investigation needs to be made convincing by the object under investigation; then, being unable to take either in order to establish the other, we suspend judgment about both.

The reference in the discussion of the Mode of Relativity (Ι 167) is a reference back to PH I 39 where Sextus tells us that all Ten Modes of Aenesidemus can be put under the generic heading of ‘relativity’ (not to be confused with the eighth of the Ten Modes, also known as the Mode of Relativity—although it seems as though Sextus himself made precisely that confusion; Annas and Barnes 1985: 142–3; for more on this difficult mode, see Brennan and Lee 2014). So one of the Five Modes is an umbrella mode for all of the Ten Modes, which, as we have seen, were best thought of as devices for generating equal and opposing arguments to arguments put forward by dogmatists which depend upon how things are perceived in this or that situation.

The Mode of Dispute is also a device for generating equal and opposing arguments, this time arguments which appeal to the authority of either ordinary life or some philosopher. For an example of this mode in operation, look at PH II 18:

Of those who have discussed standards, some have asserted that there is one (e.g., the Stoics and certain others), some that there is not (among them, Xeniades of Corinth and Xenophanes of Colophon who says: ‘but belief is found over all’); and we suspend judgment as to whether there is one or not.

Sextus imagines someone arguing for the philosophical position that there is a ‘standard’ (more on that below) on the basis of the fact that the Stoics say there is one; the Skeptic would counter that one could equally well argue that there is no standard, since Xeniades and Xenophanes say there isn’t one. The mode of dispute codifies a tactic in the Skeptic’s ongoing fight with dogmatists: it is a weapon to be deployed when the dogmatist employs an argument from authority. (For a different view on what the mode of dispute is, see Barnes 1990a: ch. 1.)

It is the three remaining modes which are the most interesting. To see how they work, consider the following fact. When the dogmatist produces an argument for a claim, P, either he produces (or gestures at) an argument which goes on forever—an infinite regress—or not. To produce an infinite regress would mean that in offering grounds for his claim P, he gives grounds, Q, and then for that he offers grounds, R, and so on, without ever repeating himself. If he doesn’t produce an infinite regress, he produces an argument which stops somewhere. In other words, in offering grounds for his claim P, he gives grounds, Q, and then for that he offers grounds, R, etc. and this chain of grounds terminates somewhere. Now there are two possibilities, either this chain terminates in the same claim with which it started (P), or it doesn’t. The first of those two cases is a case of a circular argument—an argument for the conclusion P which eventually appeals to P as its own ground. The second case is a case of an argument which starts from unsupported propositions (first principles, or axioms, perhaps), which function as the ‘anchor’ for the proposition P we are trying to prove. Thus, there are exactly three possibilities for the form an argument propounded by a dogmatist might take: an infinite regress, a reciprocal or circular argument, or one which terminates in a hypothesis.

The usual interpretation of the modes of infinite regress, reciprocality, and hypothesis, is that they codify Sextus’ condemnation of each of these three forms of argument. So, in by far the best and fullest treatment of the Five Modes to date, Barnes 1990a, we are told that Sextus thinks that infinitely regressive arguments are ‘bad arguments’ (1990a: 43). To be sure, ‘Sextus usually leaves unspoken the thought that infinite regressions are Bad Things’ (44), but, says Barnes (ibid), Sextus does offer us one reason for why they are bad: ‘we have no point from which to begin to establish anything’ (PH I 166). The interesting philosophical question here is this: why should recognition of a bad argument for the conclusion that P encourage us to suspend judgment on whether P? If I argue that the world will end tomorrow on the grounds that Nostradamus says so, your recognition that this is a terrible argument for its conclusion hardly makes you suspend judgment on the question of whether the world will end tomorrow! Barnes’ answer is this:

If the only consideration offered in support of a given claim leads to an unacceptable epistemological regression, then we must suspend judgment on the claim. (1990a: 42; Barnes’ emphasis)

Barnes points out that Sextus often lays out an argument and then says that the skeptic will suspend judgment as far as that argument goes (ὅσον ἐπὶ τούτῳ); the idea is that Sextus uses that formula to capture the fact that if such-and-such an argument is all you had to go on, you suspend judgment. (See Frede 1979: 10–11; 1984: 133; and Brunschwig 1990 for more on this phrase.)

Thus Barnes thinks that the mode of Infinite Regress generates suspension of judgment in the face of an infinitely regressive argument by dint of the Skeptic’s condemnation of that type of argument as defective. Barnes extends this analysis to the cases of reciprocality and hypothesis too, claiming that Sextus rejects reciprocal arguments as ‘bad arguments’ (1990a: 65; his emphasis) and hypothetical arguments as ‘valueless’ (99). On this interpretation, then,

reciprocal arguments are bad arguments; and if the only reason we have for accepting or rejecting P is a bad argument, then we should neither accept nor reject P but suspend judgement; (65–6)

If the only thing that can be said for or against P is that some Dogmatist has hypothesized it, and if hypothesizing that P does not establish or warrant belief in P, then we should suspend judgement over P. (99)

Barnes’ interpretation of what these three modes accomplish is unsatisfactory for a couple of reasons. First, it seems very unlikely that Sextus would allow himself to condemn these three types of argumentation as bad or valueless: isn’t this just the type of dogma that everyone agrees the Skeptic can’t have? Second, condemning this or that argument that a Dogmatist gives for a conclusion P, and suspending judgment accordingly on whether P, seems to fall foul of the strictures that Barnes himself places on what Sextan suspension of judgment consists in: after all, Sextus supposedly

assembles arguments in favour of an affirmative answer, and arguments in favour of a negative answer. The two sets of arguments exactly balance one another. Ἐποχή [suspension of judgment] supervenes—ἐποχή directed towards the proposition that P. (Barnes 1982: 59)

Condemning a dogmatist’s argument for P does not involve taking into account any considerations for not-P. (Put it another way, Sextus seems to think that Pyrrhonists suspend judgment in the face of an argument for P and an opposing argument for not-P—not when they face an argument for P and considerations which undercut that argument—for this distinction in epistemology, see entries on Defeasible Reasoning and Evidence.) Third, Sextus never comes out and says that reciprocal and hypothetical arguments are actually bad arguments. In fact, strictly speaking, he doesn’t even say that infinitely regressive arguments are bad; he merely says that in such an argument, ‘we have no point from which to begin to establish anything’ (PH I 166), which could be taken as a straightforward description of what an infinitely regressive argument is, rather than philosophical condemnation of it.

There are several responses possible to these objections. One could claim that Sextus is simply confused; his employment of the Five Modes is incompatible with his brand of Pyrrhonian Skepticism (no doubt because they derived from Agrippa and weren’t original to Sextus). Or, in response to the first objection, one could deny that Sextus is condemning these types of argument in propria persona, and that he instead is taking the criticisms levelled by certain dogmatists against these three types of arguments and using them against those dogmatists who persist in propounding arguments in those forms: Sextus’ Five Modes are

a way of showing his dogmatic opponents that they ought to suspend judgment, given their epistemological standards. (Striker 2004: 16)

Another option would be to take the second objection seriously, and seek an interpretation according to which these three modes function like the other two members of the Five (and like the Ten Modes) as devices for generating equal and opposing arguments (an approach suggested by Morison 2011: 293–4, and worked out in detail in Morison 2018). This latter approach seems promising in the light of those texts where Sextus explicitly envisages the Skeptic responding to the Dogmatists’ use of hypotheses by coming up with opposing hypotheses which would in turn generate opposing conclusions (PH I 173; M VIII 370; M III 8; M VII 315; etc.; see Barnes 1990a: 100–109).

Sextus himself thought that the Five Modes had universal application: ‘That every object of investigation can be referred to these modes we shall briefly show as follows’ (PH I 169). Unfortunately, what follows (PH I 170–77) is far from clear, and doesn’t take the form one expects, namely the observation that any argument whatsoever must have one of the three forms of hypothesis, reciprocality, or infinite regression. That stretch of text remains mysterious.

3.5.3 The Two Modes (PH I 178–9)

The Two Modes probably also come from Agrippa (Barnes 1990b: 213), and represent an attempt ‘to have a neat sceptical system compounded out of three of the Five [Modes]: dispute, reciprocity and regression’ (Barnes 1990b: 215). But Barnes finds the omission of the Mode of Hypothesis philosophically troubling, given that it ‘is a mode of the first importance to the Pyrrhonists’ (1990a: 119), and most discussions of the Five Modes mention the system of the Two Modes only in passing, especially since Sextus never employs them explicitly during his discussions of dogmatic philosophical positions.

3.5.4 The Eight Modes (PH I 180–86)

For these, see Hankinson 1995: 213–17.

They are modes in accordance with which we bring the Dogmatists to a halt by raising puzzles about their particular causal explanations—we do this because they pride themselves on these especially. (PH I 180)

These modes suggest lines of attack that the Skeptic could adopt in response to those arguments of the Dogmatists which attempt to discern causes. For instance,

according to the second [mode], some people often give an explanation in only one way, although there is a rich abundance enabling them to explain the object of investigation in a variety of ways. (PH I 181)

The idea here is that the Skeptic can apply pressure to the Dogmatist’s attempted explanation by pointing out that there is an equally good alternative explanation. Sextus himself suggests that the Eight Modes are superseded by the Five Modes (PH I 185), and like the Two Modes, Sextus does not employ them explicitly during the course of his writings.

3.6 The Skeptical Phrases (PH I 187–209)

As a Skeptic, what do you say when suspension of judgment comes upon you in the face of all the arguments and counterarguments you frame in the course of your investigations? Sextus offers the following options:

  1. ‘No more’ (PH I 188–91), which is an expression intended to capture the Skeptic’s state of mind when ‘I do not know which of these things I should assent to and which not assent to’ (191) (for extended discussion, see Castagnoli 2010: 256–77);
  2. ‘Perhaps’, ‘Maybe’, and ‘Possibly’ (194–5), short for ‘perhaps it is and perhaps it isn’t’ (194);
  3. ‘I suspend judgment’ (196), capturing the Skeptic’s state of mind when ‘I cannot say which of the things proposed I should find convincing and which I should not find convincing’ (ibid);
  4. ‘I determine nothing’ (197), capturing the fact that ‘I now feel in such a way as neither to posit dogmatically nor to reject any of the things falling under this investigation’ (ibid);
  5. ‘Everything is undetermined’ (198–9), short for ‘Those of the matter investigated by the Dogmatists which I have considered appear such to me that none of them seems to me to exceed in convincingness or lack of convincingness what conflicts with it’ (199);
  6. ‘Everything is inapprehensible’ (200), short for ‘I suppose that up to now I have not apprehended any of these things because of the equipollence of their opposites’ (ibid);
  7. ‘I have no apprehension’ and ‘I do not apprehend’ (201);
  8. ‘Opposed to every account there is an equal account’ (202–5), short for ‘To every account I have scrutinized which purports to establish something in dogmatic fashion, there appears to me to be opposed another account, purporting to establish something in dogmatic fashion, equal to it in convincingness or lack of convincingness’ (203).

Sextus makes clear that in uttering these phrases, the Skeptic is engaging in a particular form of ‘non-assertion’ (PH I 192–3; see Stough 1984). The phrases all represent how things appear to the Skeptic, so, for instance, Sextus insists that when the Skeptic says ‘I suspend judgment’, he reports only how the arguments appear to him: ‘we say what appears to us about them, when they make an impression on us’ (196). This might appear to settle the question of the beliefs of the Skeptic, since it does seem as though the Skeptic, in saying what appears to him, states the content of these appearances, and not just that things appear thus-and-so (see above, 3.4). However, Sextus also tells us that the Skeptic ‘takes ‘is’ in the sense of ‘appears to me’’ (I 198; cf. I 135), so the question is not so easily settled after all. One thing is worth noting: if Frede is right about the beliefs of the Skeptic, then one of the beliefs of the Skeptic is that ‘Everything is inapprehensible’ (I 200). If this is the kind of belief that the Skeptic can have, then it can’t be a belief held as a matter of assembling reasons on either side, but must instead be a belief that he has on the basis of his multiple experiences of coming to suspension of judgment, rather than on the basis of having a philosophical argument to that effect (Frede 1984: 138–9). This opens up the possibility that the Skeptic can in fact have the belief that Myles Burnyeat says is necessary for the Skeptic to attain tranquillity (see above, 3.3).

3.7 Difference between Pyrrhonism and other schools (PH I 210–41)

Sextus differentiates Pyrrhonian Skepticism from the philosophy of Heraclitus (210–12), Democritus (213–14), the Cyrenaics (215) (see especially Fine 2000, 2003), and Protagoras (216–19), from Academic Skepticism (220–35) (see Striker 1981, 2010; Ioppolo 2009), and Medical Empiricism (see Allen 2010). As stated above, this last section is particularly puzzling, since Sextus, who was part of the Empiricist School of Medicine (hence his name), seems rather to align Pyrrhonian Skepticism with the Methodist School of Medicine, since the form of Empiricism associated with the Empirical school ‘makes affirmations about the inapprehensibility of unclear matters’ (PH I 236)—presumably the sorts of theory-laden affirmations which the Skeptic would not allow himself (see 3.6 above)—whereas the Methodists adhere more to the fourfold observances of everyday life that Sextus discussed in I 21–4 (see 3.4 above). To mitigate the tension, Allen suggests that ‘Sextus’ remarks can be read as criticizing a certain tendency in Empiricism rather than an unqualified repudiation of the school’ (2010: 246), stressing that Sextus’ endorsement of Methodism is not as wholehearted as it might seem:

the medical persuasion of the Methodics has some affinity with Scepticism—not absolutely but more so than the other medical schools and in comparison with them. (PH I 241)

4. PH II and III; M VII–XI

PH I is like a manifesto: it tells you what Pyrrhonism is and why it is preferable to other philosophical persuasions. By contrast, PH II and III show Sextus putting into practice the skeptical skill: they are stuffed full of dogmatic arguments accompanied by skeptical counterarguments (and sometimes just skeptical counterarguments on their own—see below).

The contents of PH II and III closely shadow those of M VII–XI. For a table comparing M VII and VIII with PH II (and relevant passages in M I–VI), see Bett 2005: 193–5; for a similar table comparing M IX and X to PH III (and relevant passages in M I–VI), see Bett 2012: 161–64; for discussion of the comparisons between M XI to PH III (and relevant passages in M I–VI), see Bett 1997. To get an idea of the scope of PH II and III, and thereby the corresponding parts of M, here is the list of contents of PH II and III (based on Annas and Barnes 2000: 66 and 142):

  • PH II 1–12: Can Skeptics investigate what the Dogmatists talk about?
  • PH II 13: Where should the investigation of Dogmatism begin?
  • PH II 14–17: Standards (or criteria)
  • PH II 18–21: Is there a standard of truth?
  • PH II 22–47: That by which
  • PH II 48–69: That through which
  • PH II 70–79: That in virtue of which
  • PH II 80–84: Truths and Truth
  • PH II 85–96: Is anything true by nature?
  • PH II 97–103: Signs
  • PH II 104–133: Are there any indicative signs?
  • PH II 134–143: Proof
  • PH II 144–192: Are there any proofs?
  • PH II 193–203: Deductions
  • PH II 204: Induction
  • PH II 205–12: Definitions
  • PH II 213: Division
  • PH II 214: The division of a word into significations
  • PH II 215–18: Whole and part
  • PH II 219–27: Genera and species
  • PH II 228: Common attributes
  • PH II 229–59: Sophisms
  • PH III 1: The part concerned with physics; Active principles
  • PH III 2–12: God
  • PH III 13–16: Causes
  • PH III 17–29: Is anything a cause of anything?
  • PH III 30–37: Material Principles
  • PH III 38–55: Are bodies apprehensible?
  • PH III 56–62: Blending
  • PH III 63: Motion
  • PH III 64–81: Local motion
  • PH III 82–4: Increase and decrease
  • PH III 85–96: Subtraction and addition
  • PH III 97: Transposition
  • PH III 98–101: Whole and part
  • PH III 102–108: Natural change
  • PH III 109–114: Generation and destruction
  • PH III 115–18: Rest
  • PH III 119–35: Place
  • PH III 136–50: Time
  • PH III 151–67: Number
  • PH III 168: The ethical part of philosophy
  • PH III 169–78: Good, bad and indifferent things
  • PH III 179–238: Is anything by nature good, bad or indifferent?
  • PH III 239–249: Is there an expertise in living?
  • PH III 250–51: Is expertise in living found among people?
  • PH III 252: Can expertise in living be taught?
  • PH III 253–58: Is anything taught?
  • PH III 259–65: Are there any teachers and learners?
  • PH III 265–73: Is there a way of learning?
  • PH III 273–9: Does expertise in living benefit its possessor?
  • PH III 280–81: Why do Skeptics sometimes deliberately propound arguments of feeble plausibility?

Notice the division of the discussions into the traditional Stoic division of philosophy (Ierodiakonou 1993) into Logic (PH II), Physics (PH III 1–167), and Ethics (PH III 168–279).

4.1 The criterion of truth

The most important part of PH II is the long discussion of the ‘criterion’ (or ‘standard’, as Annas and Barnes translate it) of truth (see especially Striker 1974: 1990b; Brunschwig 1988). Not only is it philosophically extremely rich, but it plays a crucial role in the dialectic of the contemporary scholarly debate as to whether the Pyrrhonian skeptic can have beliefs. The notion of a criterion of truth was central to the epistemologies of both the Stoics and Epicureans:

The problem of the criterion of truth… is the problem of how we discover or ascertain the truth—the truth that we need to find in order to attain knowledge. (Striker 1990b: 151)

The Epicureans and the Stoics had slightly different candidates for what the criteria of truth would be.

Epicurus’ criteria were taken to be primitive truths, that is, ones that had to be accepted without proof or further argument; (Striker 1990b: 152)

these are the truths delivered by sense-impressions, preconceptions, and feelings (DL X 31), which would then be used to work out the truth of non-primitive propositions. The Stoics thought that the criteria of truth were special kinds of impressions, so-called ‘cognitive impressions’, which were of such a nature so as to guarantee their own truth (roughly speaking, they ‘come about from what is’ (DL VII 46) and are clear and distinct (see Frede 1983: 164)); they could also be used to work out the truth of other, unclear, matters. These two conceptions of the criterion, the Epicurean and the Stoic, were christened the ‘adelic’ and ‘prodelic’ conceptions by Brunschwig (1988: 230–233). (The terms ‘adelic’ and ‘prodelic’ derive from the Greek words adêlon and prodêlon, meaning ‘unclear’ and ‘clear’ respectively; thus, the ‘adelic’ conception of the criterion of truth is the one which emphasizes the role of the criterion in the discovery of unclear things, whereas the ‘prodelic’ conception is the one which emphasizes that those truths delivered by the criterion are clearly true.) Brunschwig shows in detail that Sextus conflates the two in his arguments against the criterion, although he acknowledges that this conflation does not dent the force of the objections that Sextus brings.

Some of the flavour of Sextus’ objections to the criterion can be gleaned from the following passage (PH II 74–5):

[74] Nor can we say that the soul apprehends external existing objects through its sensory feelings inasmuch as the feelings of the senses are similar to the external existing objects. For how will the intellect know whether the feelings of the senses are like the sense-objects, given that it does not itself come into contact with the external objects and that the senses make clear to it not the nature of these objects but their own feelings, as we deduced from the modes of suspension? [75] Just as someone who does not know Socrates but has looked at a picture of him does not know whether the picture is like Socrates, so the intellect, studying the feelings of the senses but not observing the external objects, will not know whether the feelings of the senses are like the external existing objects. Therefore it cannot rely on similarity to judge them.

Roughly speaking, Sextus is pointing out to the Epicureans and the Stoics, both of whom attach great weight to the deliverance of the senses, that there is no way that one’s intellect can distinguish amongst impressions those ones which are faithful to the way the world is: one only has access to one’s impressions, and not the external world, so one cannot discern which of one’s impressions are faithful to the external world, and assent to them alone. The intellect is impotent when it comes to deciding whether perceptual impressions are to be an adequate criterion. (Sextus might be misunderstanding the Stoic position here; see Frede 1983.)

At the end of Sextus’ discussion in PH II, he clearly signals, as one would expect, that he suspends judgment on whether there are criteria of truth:

You must realize that it is not our intention to assert that standards of truth are unreal (that would be dogmatic); rather, since the Dogmatists seem plausibly to have established that there is a standard of truth, we have set up plausible-seeming arguments in opposition to them, affirming neither that they are true nor that they are more plausible than those on the contrary side, but concluding to suspension of judgement because of the apparently equal plausibility of these arguments and those produced by the Dogmatists. (PH II 79; cf. M VII 444)

How does Sextus’ treatment of the criterion contribute to the debate between scholars over the question of whether the Skeptic has any beliefs? The answer is that both Jonathan Barnes and Myles Burnyeat have used Sextus’ discussion of the criterion as a means of securing the conclusion that the Skeptic has no beliefs at all. Recall that in PH I 13, Sextus says there are two meanings of the word dogma, according to the first of which the Skeptic does have dogmata, and according to the second of which, the Skeptic does not have dogmata. All commentators are in agreement that the second kind of dogma is roughly to be understood as a ‘philosophico-scientific’ opinion or tenet (Barnes 1982: 67), even if the parties to the debate have a slightly different understanding of what a ‘philosophico-scientific tenet’ is (Morison 2011: 265–7). The question is what kind of belief (if any kind at all) the first kind of dogma is. According to Barnes and Burnyeat, this first kind of dogma is something like the Skeptic’s acknowledgment of his occurrent state of being appeared to in a certain way. Clearly, according to Barnes and Burnyeat, this leaves a gap in Sextus’ presentation:

what attitude does he take to ordinary beliefs? The sentences of breakfast-time, bath-time, and bed-time—‘The butter’s hard’, ‘The water’s cold’, ‘The springs are protruding’—do not express scientific δόγματα, nor yet do they serve in avowals. If we are concerned to discover the scope of ἐποχή in PH, it is precisely such humdrum sentences which will most exercise us; yet of them Sextus says nothing. (Barnes 1982: 75–6)

Both Barnes and Burnyeat end up claiming that these ordinary everyday beliefs actually end up being discarded along with the dogmata in the second sense. They argue this by claiming that Sextus does not have a criterion of truth: the Skeptic

needs a criterion of truth, to determine which [of conflicting appearances] he should accept. But the sceptic then argues, often at some length, that there is no intellectually satisfying criterion we can trust and use—this is the real backbone of the discussion. (Burnyeat 1980: 29)

Barnes puts it as follows:

we cannot affirm that the water is tepid unless we have a criterion of truth—a way of judging that the πάθος with which the water affects us corresponds to the actual state of the water; (1982: 77)

But the thesis that there is a criterion of truth is itself a δόγμα—indeed, it is a perfect specimen of those philosophico-scientific tenets which the Greeks called δόγματα; (78)

Ordinary beliefs are not δόγματα… Nonetheless, in rejecting δόγματα the Pyrrhonist must reject ordinary beliefs; for the possession of ordinary beliefs presupposes the possession of at least one δόγμα—the δόγμα that there is a criterion of truth. (ibid) (Cf. Burnyeat 1984: 115n. 36)

Barnes’ argument, however, is fallacious (for more detailed discussion, see Schwab 2013, whose main points are summarised here). There are two fundamental flaws. First, the Hellenistic theory of the criterion of truth was never supposed to be a theory about how beliefs in general are formed, only beliefs which meet the condition of being suitable for conferring knowledge. But second, and more importantly, one needs to distinguish between suspending judgment on whether there is a criterion of truth, and failing to have a criterion of truth. Since the deliverances of the natural capacity of perception are criteria of truth according to the Epicureans, there is nothing one can do, short of putting one’s eyes out, to bring it about that one lacks this criterion of truth; merely suspending judgment on whether there is such a thing as a criterion of truth won’t do the job. Similarly, since it is cognitive impressions, according to the Stoics, which are criteria of truth, there is nothing one can do to bring it about that one lacks these criteria of truth, short of damaging one’s capacity for forming impressions (one’s phantasia); merely suspending judgment on whether there is a criterion of truth won’t do the job. Barnes actually acknowledges this flaw in his argument in a footnote:

The Pyrrhonian may possess a criterion even if he himself does not believe that he does; and in that case he is in a position to judge that p (1982: 78n. 76)

In short, Barnes’ and Burnyeat’s appeal to the discussion of the criterion of truth is unconvincing as an attempt to show that for the Pyrrhonian Skeptic, ordinary beliefs are off limits. The urbane interpretation is still standing.

4.2 Negative dogmatism in M VII–XI?

Another pressing philosophical issue raised by M VII–IX is the alleged difference in the skepticism evident in M XI (‘Against the Ethicists’) as compared to PH. There can be no doubt that in M, Sextus is much more willing to give the counterargument to the Dogmatists’ positions without laying out the corresponding positive arguments that the Dogmatists gives. This lends an air of negative dogmatism to M. However, this is merely stylistic: there is also no doubt that Sextus frequently emphasizes in M that we shouldn’t take his arguments dogmatically, e.g., at M VII 444; VIII 159, 476 (Frede 1973: 808), or that the upshot of his argumentation is that one should suspend judgment e.g., M VII 443; VIII 298; IX 137: 191–2; X 168 (Bett 1997: xxix). But there are some passages in ‘Against the Ethicists’ which are harder, at least at first sight, to bring into line with the doctrine of suspension of judgment in PH. Sextus stresses in the ethical section of PH III that one should suspend judgment as to whether anything is good or bad by nature (e.g., PH III 235), and so it is no surprise that ‘M XI argues for the conclusion that nothing is by nature good or bad’ (Bett 1997: xiv)—so much one would expect by way of counterarguments to the Dogmatists’ positive arguments. But Sextus gets perilously close to saying that the skeptic should embrace the conclusions of these counterarguments (Bett 1997: xiv):

  • the freedom ‘from the trouble associated with the opinion that something bad or good is present’ will ‘come to him from his thinking nothing good or bad by nature’ (M XI 118; my emphasis);
  • ‘when reason has established that none of these things is by nature good or by nature bad, there will be a release from disturbance and a peaceful life will await us’ (M XI 130; my emphasis);
  • ‘It will only be possible to avoid this [sc. trouble], then, if we show to the person who is disturbed on account of his avoidance of the bad or his pursuit of the good, that there is not anything either good or bad by nature’ (M XI 140; my emphasis).

The way to avoid saddling Sextus with an inconsistency is to see that Sextus is not suggesting that the Skeptic must believe that nothing is good or bad by nature, but rather that the Skeptic must have equally convincing arguments up his sleeve that conclude that nothing is by nature good or bad—once we have managed that, ‘there will be a release from disturbance and a peaceful life will await us’. (For pushback against this, see Bett 2018: 13n. 24.)

5. M I–VI

The six books of M I–VI, taken together, constitute an attack on the liberal arts. For their general aim, see Barnes 1988. The most important feature of M I–VI, which can be misleading, is that in them, there is often the appearance of negative dogmatism, i.e., of claims that this or that art doesn’t exist. Take for example M I 90: ‘So let this stand to show the non-existence of grammar, at least on the grammarians’ conception of it’. Bett 2018: 11–15 urges us to view such moments as traces of a previous stage of Pyrrhonism. Alternatively, rather than interpret this as occasional departures from Sextus’ over-arching plan to induce suspension of judgment (which is in any case still present in texts such as M I 6), one could take these apparent statements of negative dogmatism to be ‘the equipollent counterpoise to the technicians’ arguments’ (Blank 1998: l, summarising Barnes 1988: 72–7). (See above 4.2 for a similar story about M XI.)

M I 1–40 is a highly general introduction to all six works, and then Against the Grammarians starts properly at I 41. For this work, see Blank 1998. Against the Grammarians is much the longest of the six books, standing at 320 sections. There is discussion of the question ‘What is Grammar?’ (57–89), an attack on the ‘expert’ part of grammar, i.e., the part concerned with letters, parts of speech, etc. (99–247), and an attack on the part of grammar which concerns poets and prose-writers (270–320), i.e., the part which deals with the interpretation of poetry, and which Sextus argues is useless because it makes no contribution to human flourishing.
Against the Rhetoricians is shorter, at only 113 sections. It considers various definitions of what rhetoric is, what benefit rhetoric is to individuals or to cities, what the goal of rhetoric is, and what the parts of rhetoric are, all with a view to attacking its status as an art.
Against the Geometers stands at 116 sections. It takes geometers to task for their employment of hypotheses in establishing theorems, and then attacks the hypotheses themselves, such as the definitions of body, point, line (particularly the definition of the line as ‘length without breadth’), and angle. For this work, see Dye and Vitrac 2009.
Against the Arithmeticians has a mere 34 sections. This work outlines the extraordinary views of the Pythagoreans concerning the power of numbers, and then seeks to undermine them by arguing that Platonic notion of a monad or unit (‘the One’) is ‘inconceivable’ (17), adding as an aside that the notion of a dyad doesn’t fare much better (21–22), and by attacking the principles of addition and subtraction (23–33). ‘But if number is conceived as subsisting through addition, as I said, and subtraction, and we have shown that neither of these exists, one must declare that number is nothing’ (34). The work thus has a clear structure: presentation of arguments in favour of the existence of numbers (from the Pythagoreans), followed by presentation of arguments against the existence of numbers.
Against the Astrologers, in 106 sections. Sextus attacks not astronomy (1), which is one thing the term ‘astrology’ referred to in classical times, but ‘the casting of nativities’ (Bury’s translation of the term γενεθλιαλογία in section 2) and horoscopes. The first half of the work involves Sextus laying out the basics of the Chaldean theory of prognostication, and the second half contains his counterarguments, including fascinating observations about the difficulty of establishing when someone is conceived, the difficulty of establishing when they are born (‘is it when the child begins to emerge into the cold air, or when it has emerged a little, or when it is deposited on the ground?’, M V 65), and the difficulty of using accurate time-keeping devices to detect which astronomical phenomena are occurring at what time.
Against the Musicians is in 68 sections. For this work, see Greaves 1986; Bett 2013. Sextus attacks the standing of music as a science, by questioning whether it is useful for happiness (7–37) and by questioning whether it is a science at all (38–68), just as he did in the case of grammar (a comparison Sextus himself makes at section 4). In the first part, Sextus assembles arguments in favour of music being useful for happiness (7–18) and arguments against (19–37); the second part consists wholly of the arguments against the existence of music as a suitable subject for theoretical discourse, with Sextus leaving unstated the arguments in favour.

6. References for the later history of Sextus’ writings

For the fascinating story of the rediscovery of Sextus’ writings in the Renaissance, see Floridi 2002 and 2010.


Primary Texts

  • Annas, J., and J. Barnes, 2000, Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Scepticism (Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, second edition.
  • Bett, R., 1997, Sextus Empiricus: Against the Ethicists (Clarendon Later Ancient Philosophers), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2005, Sextus Empiricus: Against the Logicians (Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2012, Sextus Empiricus: Against the Physicists, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2018, Sextus Empiricus: Against Those in the Discplines, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Blank, D., 1998, Sextus Empiricus: Against the Grammarians (Clarendon Later Ancient Philosophers), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bury, R.G., trans., 1939–49, Sextus Empiricus (Loeb Classical Library), 4 volumes, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Greaves, D. D., 1986, Sextus Empiricus: Against the Musicians (Greek and Latin Music Theory), Lincoln and London: University of Nebraska Press.
  • Mates, B., 1996, The Skeptic Way: Sextus Empiricus’s Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Secondary Literature

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  • Barnes, J., 1982, “The Beliefs of a Pyrrhonist”, Proceedings of the Cambridge Philological Society, N.S. 28: 1–29; reprinted in Burnyeat and Frede 1997: 58–91 (page references to reprint).
  • –––, 1988, “Scepticism and the Arts”, in R. J. Hankinson (ed.), Method, Medicine, and Metaphysics: Studies in the Philosophy of Ancient Science, Apeiron, 21(2): 53–77.
  • –––, 1990a, The Toils of Scepticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1990b, “Some Ways of scepticism”, in S. Everson (ed.), Epistemology (Companions to Ancient Thought I), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 204–224.
  • –––, 2000, “Introduction”, in Annas and Barnes 2000: xi–xxxi.
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  • Bett, R. (ed.), 2010, The Cambridge Companion to Ancient Scepticism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2013, “A Sceptic Looks at Art (But Not Very Closely): Sextus Empiricus on Music”, International Journal for the Study of Skepticism, 3: 155–81.
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  • Burnyeat, M. F. and M. Frede (eds.), 1997, The Original Sceptics: A Controversy, Indianapolis: Hackett.
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  • –––, 1983, “Stoics and Skeptics on Clear and Distinct Impressions”, in Burnyeat 1983: 65–93; reprinted in Frede 1987: 151–76 (page references to reprint).
  • –––, 1984, “The Sceptic’s Two Kinds of Assent and the Question of the Possibility of Knowledge”, in R. Rorty, J. B. Schneewind, and Q. Skinner, Philosophy in History: Essays on the Historiography of Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 255–78; reprinted in Burnyeat and Frede 1997: 127–51 (page references to reprint).
  • –––, 1987, Essays in Ancient Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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  • –––, 2010, “Aenesidemus and the rebirth of Pyrrhonism”, in Bett 2010: 105–19.
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  • Morison, B., 2011, “The Logical Structure of the Sceptic’s Opposition”, Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, XL (Essays in Memory of Michael Frede), 265–95.
  • –––, 2018, “The Sceptic’s Modes of Argumentation”, in T. Bénatouïl and K. Ierodiakonou (eds.), Dialectic after Plato and Aristotle, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 283–319.
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  • –––, 2010a, The Demands of Reason: An Essay on Pyrrhonian Scepticism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
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