First published Mon Oct 4, 2021

The classical Indian philosophy of Advaita Vedānta articulates a philosophical position of radical nondualism, a revisionary worldview which it derives from the ancient Upaniṣadic texts. According to Advaita Vedāntins, the Upaniṣads reveal a fundamental principle of nonduality termed “brahman,” which is the reality of all things. Advaitins understand brahman as transcending individuality and empirical plurality. They seek to establish that the essential core of one’s self (ātman) is brahman. The fundamental thrust of Advaita Vedānta is that the ātman is pure non-intentional consciousness. It is one without a second, nondual, infinite existence, and numerically identical with brahman. This effort entails tying a metaphysics of brahman to a philosophy of consciousness.

This philosophical tradition finds its most sustained early articulation in the works of the preeminent Advaita Vedāntin, Śaṅkarācārya (hereafter Śaṅkara), who flourished during the eighth century CE. Śaṅkara endeavored to communicate nonduality through systematized theories of metaphysics, language, and epistemology. He also incorporated specific methods of philosophical teaching, along with learning methods of listening, reflection, and contemplation. His philosophy and methods comprise a teaching tradition intended to culminate in a direct liberating recognition of nonduality that is synonymous with liberation or freedom (mokṣa). Śaṅkara is one of the most widely known and influential Indian philosophers from the classical period, and the most authoritative philosopher of Advaita Vedānta. He is revered by Advaita Vedānta’s teaching tradition and monastic lineages, and continues to influence virtually all contemporary lineages today. For comprehensive accounts of Śaṅkara’s philosophy readers may consult Potter 1981; Mayeda 1992; Comans 2000; Suthren Hirst 2005; Ram-Prasad 2002; Isayeva 1992; Rambachan 2006; and Deutsch 1969.

1. Life and Works

There are several different dates ascribed to Śaṅkara. Early scholars placed him from 788–820 CE. Nakamura (1983: 48–88) argues for an earlier date of 700–750 CE, and discusses the various dating theories at length. Potter (1981: 14–15, 116–119) places him from the late seventh to early eighth centuries CE due to the dating of a contemporaneous Advaitin named Maṇḍanamiśra (see Thrasher 1979 on Maṇḍanamiśra’s dating). There are no dependable historical records of Śaṅkara’s life beyond his written works which provide few biographical clues. Scholars are also not clear about his religious identity. According to the Advaita Vedānta tradition itself, he was Śaiva (a devotee of the deity Śiva); but several scholars believe he was Vaiṣṇava, a devotee of the deity Viṣṇu (see Clark 2006: 159–170 for an overview of these theories). Hagiographical accounts of his life, the Śaṅkaravijayas (Conquests of Śaṅkara), were composed several centuries after his death. They describe him as being born in Kalāḍi, located in modern day Kerala. He became a renouncer at a young age, left his family to pursue liberation, and spent his life travelling around the sub-continent while teaching his pupils, engaging in philosophical debate, and composing his works. He supposedly died at the young age of thirty-two. (See Bader 2000 for a discussion of Śaṅkara’s life according to his hagiographies).

Śaṅkara was a systematizer of Advaita Vedānta, not a founder. He viewed himself as part of a long lineage of teachers. Śaṅkara’s teacher was named Govinda; and according to tradition, Govinda’s teacher was Gauḍapāda (sixth century CE), who composed the Gauḍapādakārikās (Verses of Gauḍapāda) on the Māṇḍūkya Upaniṣad. The historical record of Advaita Vedānta is obscure prior to Gauḍapāda (see Nakamura 2004 for his extensive work on pre-Śaṅkara Vedāntins). Advaita Vedāntins trace their lineage back through Bādarāyaṇa (ca. first century BCE), who authored the Brahmasūtras (The Aphorisms on Brahman), to the individuals in Upaniṣadic narratives, and ultimately to īśvara (roughly “God”) as Viṣṇu-Nārāyaṇa or the teaching form of Śiva known as Dakṣināmūrti. By this lineage they claim the authority of Upaniṣadic teachers, Kṛṣṇa, and Bādarāyana as their own. The corresponding texts of the Upaniṣads, Bhagavadgītā, and Brahmasūtras constitute Advaita Vedānta’s triple canon (prasthānatrayī).

From a historical standpoint, Śaṅkara’s textual works define his identity. He composed our earliest complete extant commentaries on the Brahmasūtras, Bhagavadgītā, and the ten principal Upaniṣads consisting of the Īṣā, Kena, Kaṭha, Praṣna, Muṇḍaka, Māṇḍūkya, Aitareya, Taittirīya, Chāndogya, and Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upanisads. Śaṅkara’s commentary on the Māṇḍukya is part of his extensive commentary on the Gauḍapādakārikās’ explanation of the Māṇḍūkya. Śaṅkara also composed an independent work titled the Upadeśasāhasrī (A Thousand Teachings). There are hundreds of other texts attributed to Śaṅkara, but their authorship is questionable and most were likely composed in later centuries by monastic heads who held a “Śaṅkarācārya” title. (See Potter 1981: 115–117; Hacker 1995; and Mayeda 1965a, 1965b, and 1967 for discussions of Śaṅkara’s likely works, as well as Hacker’s criteria for determining their authenticity. See Sundaresan 2002 for some critiques and expansion of Hacker’s criteria).

Śaṅkara was an exegete, philosopher, and teacher. His primary commitment was to establish his philosophy of nondual brahman as the subject matter of the Upaniṣads, and to systematize Advaita exegesis by harmonizing the diverse and potentially contradictory passages between Upaniṣadic texts. One must note however, that Śaṅkara does not attempt to prove nonduality solely through independent reasoning. Such an endeavor is not possible in his opinion because nonduality is not subject to logical proofs (see Murty 1959 on the role of reason for Śaṅkara). He accepts nonduality based on the Upaniṣad’s authority alone. Nonetheless, he was an original philosopher who constructed novel arguments to make sense of the Upaniṣads, defend his positions, and critique his philosophical adversaries. Śaṅkara also shaped a pedagogical method to approach texts as a means of knowledge. At the same time, he left several open questions and ambiguities in his writing, in part due to the different source texts of his commentaries and the voluminous amount of his work. This has led to different interpretations and several intra-Advaitin philosophical disputes in the post-Śaṅkara tradition (see Potter 2012).

Śaṅkara purportedly established the earliest monastic system in Brahmanical religion, including the Daśanāmī (Ten Names) renouncer orders (see Clark 2006 on these orders) as well as four or five principle monasteries (maṭhas) across the subcontinent (see Cenkner 1983 on maṭhas). Many Śaṅkara-identifying lineages, along with the principle monasteries, and several smaller monasteries, hermitages, and learning institutions continue to flourish today in the living Advaita Vedānta tradition. An unbroken lineage beginning with Śaṅkara’s direct disciples, such as Padmapāda and Sureśvara, continued to develop, defend, and expand upon his philosophy into the modern period. At present, Śaṅkara’s Advaita Vedānta extends far beyond its orthodox cultural and geographical confines. Its streams of thought continue to evolve due to the encounter with different philosophical, theological, and socio-political contexts; yet the tradition as a whole demonstrates a significant degree of philosophical continuity from past to present.

2. Metaphysics

Śaṅkara’s metaphysical arguments defend Upaniṣadic propositions claiming that existence is “one only, without a second” (ChU 6.2.1). He follows the general Upaniṣadic model that all known objects are compounded permutations of a set of primary elements. This is modeled as threefold, consisting of fire, water, and earth (ChU 6.2.3); or as five-fold, consisting of space, air, fire, water, and earth (TaiU 2.1.1; see BrSūBh 2.3.1–12 for reconciling these two different models). The elements emerge successively from undifferentiated existence, at first in subtle (i.e., non-perceptible) form. They then undergo a process of division and recombination, so that each element includes portions of the others, to evolve into the coarse (i.e., perceptible) “great elements” (mahābhūtas). Perceptual objects are in fact derivative products that lack existence independent of these primary elements. These elements, however, do not constitute an elemental foundationalism, nor do they bottom out in an atomic foundationalism, because they are ultimately ontologically dependent on something else, namely pure existence (brahman) (BrSūBh 2.2.15–17). Brahman is the nondual ground underlying all objects, the single foundation (adhiṣṭhana) on which the entire universe depends. All objects point back to this independent ground and possess no existence apart from it. Śaṅkara argues that this foundational existence has no dependence on a second thing. It is self-established, irreducible, immutable, and free of space, time, and causation.

According to Śaṅkara, a corollary of his position on nondual existence is that the world we perceive is less-than-real or illusory in some way in comparison to its ground. Though objects exist within existence, their forms are merely concepts that we represent with names (see BrSūBh 2.1.14 and ChUBh 6.1.4). They are cognitive constructions; however, in Śaṅkara’s view this construction is an epistemic error of attributing independent reality to objects, not an ontological subjective idealism of individuals mentally projecting the world. His commentary on BrSū 2.2.28–31, for example, affirms that we must assume perceptual realism and rejects Buddhist Yogācāra idealism. By knowing nondual existence, one knows the reality of all things in the universe, and recognizes their forms as merely names. The immediate epistemic recognition of one’s consciousness as numerically identical with this ground of nondual existence is Śaṅkara’s philosophical goal. This recognition is synonymous with liberation (mokṣa), and entails an absolute metaphysical wholeness by which the individual’s mind is freed from psychological suffering.

2.1 Existence, Reality, and Causation

Throughout his commentaries Śaṅkara employs two related criteria, dependence and persistence, to determine what is real. He defines the real as that which does not change its nature, whereas what is unreal does change (see, e.g., GKBh 2.6; TaiUBh 2.1.1). The primary distinction here is change. Something which persists is more real than what is transient because what is transient is subject to negation. His canonical illustration is a clay pot. One may shape a substantial cause such as clay into new names and forms, from a lump to a pot to a plate. With each new form, the former is destroyed, yet the clay continues through each. This example illustrates his foundational discriminative reasoning of continuity and discontinuity, which determines the relationship of what persists and what does not persist between two things (see §4.3 below). Accordingly, the clay persisting through causation is relatively more real than the non-persisting lump, pot, and plate forms, because clay is not negatable. In this illustration, clay is analogous to brahman, the underlying existence of the universe, and the pot is analogous to objects.

Śaṅkara also incorporates the persistence argument to show that one term (clay) is independent of another (pot)—clay is more real based on independence in causation. The pot form arises out of the clay cause, is sustained by clay, and resolves back into clay upon its destruction. The pot depends on clay for its being. Its form and mass possess no objective existence apart from its clay substance. Therefore, the clay is more real based on a hierarchy of dependency. This hierarchical relationship reveals an asymmetrical dependence—pot form depends upon clay substance for its being, but clay substance does not depend on the particular pot form. Śaṅkara draws several important conclusions from this:

  1. the metaphysical ground possesses more reality than the grounded effect;
  2. the effect is wholly reducible to its causal ground; and
  3. therefore the effect is not different than its ground.

(See ChUBh ch. 6 and BrSūBh 2.1.15–20 for Śaṅkara’s understanding of cause and effect; see Potter 1981: 65–7 for a summary of his views on causality).

Everything in the universe undergoes constant change; however, according to Śaṅkara, objects cannot simply come into being and go out of being. They must depend on something else, some existent cause, for their being. Śaṅkara argues that prior to universe emergence, when all objects, time, and space, are unmanifest, only primordial undifferentiated existence exists (see ChUBh 6.2.1–2 for example). This existence is a single potential cause free of form; but even after the universe emerges, there is still just that single cause. It persists through all objects and causation, like the clay persists through its changing forms. He concludes that every object, including the universe itself, is a temporal artifact, simply a name (nāma) and form (rūpa). The entire universe is not different from brahman, and its form is less real than brahman. All forms are less real than existence itself. Foundational existence is transitive, lending existence to objects, like the clay to each of its forms. Furthermore, the relationship is asymmetrical—pure undifferentiated existence does not depend on objects, but objects depend on existence. Objects borrow their existence from this metaphysical ground and lack any independent being apart from it. They are not different than their cause, and therefore their names and forms are only provisionally real appearances.

In considering Śaṅkara’s position, it is questionable where to locate the given existence possessed by objects in everyday propositions like, “this pot exists”, “this seed is”, or “the shirt is”. How would one isolate the object’s existence within its particular form? For Śaṅkara, this question is misguided and unanswerable because form does not delimit existence. When one encounters a form and seeks its existence in the locus of its substantial cause, one encounters another form that decomposes into further forms. For example, the existence of a shirt depends on its causal cloth substance; however, cloth existence depends on threads, thread existence depends on fibers, and fibers are composed of further subtle causes, ad infinitum. Similarly, we may view the pot beyond the boundaries of an illustration—clay is the material cause of the pot, but has further causes, like minerals and water, which themselves depend on a descending chain of subtler causes.

Reductions of wholes to aggregates of parts, forms to further forms, properties to other properties, effects to causes, or names to further names are infinite. They never bottom out in a metaphysical foundation. The proposition that an object’s form delimits existence crumbles because the regress defers an object’s existence to the next ontological level, an unending descent into subtler causes or further mereological parts. Therefore, attempting to isolate stable independent existence as delimited by a given form is a receding horizon. The form’s existence is self-evident at each point, but forever out of objective reach. Śaṅkara argues that this non-finding of existence in a form or as a form should not lead to positing the emergence of objects (e.g., properties, forms, wholes, etc.) from non-existence somewhere in the chain of dependency (a position he interprets as Vaiśeṣika philosophy). Nor should one conclude that if no unchanging ultimate essence can be objectified, then everything must be empty of essential existence, and therefore no metaphysical foundation ultimately exists (see ChUbh 6.2.1–2). He considers this latter position, which he construes as the Madhyamika Buddhist, to be counter-intuitively nihilistic. It also conflicts with his premises that existence is self-evident and that it persists even as something evolves or devolves. Decomposition chains do not reveal any disruption of existence, only disruption of forms.

The philosophical upshot of Śaṅkara’s metaphysic is that no form or object constitutes the fundamental ground of existence. This explains why one cannot isolate existence itself through hierarchical descension or ascension in the realm of causation and objects. If this very effort is misguided, then the non-finding of existence in an object does not entail an absolute absence of existence, nor the object’s emergence from non-existence. He rejects the presupposition that objects possess a property of existence, or that the object delimits existence in spatial-temporal ways. Existence is formless and nondual in reality. Therefore, in light of Śaṅkara’s theory of causation, one cannot attribute independent reality to an object. Objects are divisible, derivative, dependent, and transient. They are merely names, nominalist wholes that lack any independent being. By negating the reality of their name and form one discovers that objects are in fact numerically identical to formless existence. If this existence is not bound by space or time, which are also forms, it must be nondual. (See Śaṅkara on BrSū 2.1.15, ChU 6.2.2, and BhG 2.16 for further discussion of these points).

2.2 The Appearance of the Universe

Śaṅkara’s philosophy is perhaps most infamous for undermining the reality of the universe and its ultimate value. His philosophical adversaries pejoratively labeled him a māyāvādin—“one who argues the world is illusory (māyā)”. While this epithet is not exactly incorrect, it misrepresents his intention as centered on world negation, and ignores the fact that he infrequently uses the term “māyā” (see Hacker 1995 on his use of this term). Śaṅkara places great emphasis on moral virtues and acting for the good of the world (see BhGBh ch.3 for example and §4.1 below). Furthermore, the world is a pedagogical necessity as the instrumental means to discover nonduality (on this, see Suthren Hirst 2005). His goal is not to negate the axiological value of the world and intersubjective life (see Rambachan 2006 for a development of this point). Rather, his focus is simply brahman. The world is a dependent effect of brahman and therefore not other than brahman, and brahman is not a cosmogonic construction. This metaphysical view possesses epistemic value for liberation, along with is positive psychological byproducts such as cessation of suffering and the deepest happiness.

Given Śaṅkara’s absolute nonduality, how can he explain the world’s emergence in the first place? Later Advaitins developed cosmogonic defenses to neutralize philosophical rivals, including theories of māyā as a creative material cause equated with beginningless ignorance. Whether or not we can accurately read such theories into Śaṅkara is contested by academic and traditional scholars (see Comans 2000: 263–7; Doherty 2005; and Satchidanandendra 1964 [1989]). The more pertinent point though is that Śaṅkara does not require a definitive cosmogonic story of world causation for his philosophical goal of knowing brahman. He employs cosmologies as models that map the empirical order in order to point back obliquely to nonduality as already present as one’s most primitive self-existence. These models may be dropped after serving their purpose (see, e.g., GKBh 4.4.2; BrSūBh 3.2.21, 2.1.27, and 4.3.14). Furthermore, an airtight philosophical causal account for a less-than-real world is not possible. One strength of his position is a remarkable flexibility in accommodating contemporary scientific cosmologies. It is more accurate to read Śaṅkara as ambivalent towards the world. His approach is analogous to a dream character attempting to discover the waking ground of their dreamscape. Analyzing the dream’s causation and illusoriness may be part of a method, but is not the goal. The dream’s illusoriness is only seen upon awakening and recognizing the dream’s waking foundation.

Still, the empirical universe presents an ontological difficulty for Śaṅkara because he is an epistemic realist. He accepts that external objects are not individual subjective illusions because we perceive these effects with intersubjective agreement. The world is thus independent of mind and not wholly unreal. One may therefore argue that he contradicts himself or falls into an excluded middle (see Fost 1998). The universe either exists or does not exist, is real or unreal, and cannot be both simultaneously. His solution is to argue for a third ontological space—that the universe is an objective but less-than-real appearance. This appearance, akin to a magic trick, is māyā. All objects are unreal in that they are transient and dependent; yet are not non-existent like the horn of a hare or self-contradictory like a square circle. His understanding of what is unreal as a less-than-real appearance does not contradict what is real. The universe of names and forms holds a unique ontological position as indeterminable (anirvacanīya) as brahman or something else other than brahman (BrSūBh 2.1.14, 2.1.17; GK 2.34; see Comans 2000: 239–246 on indeterminability). It is not identical to brahman (even though reducible to brahman), but is not different either—it does not constitute a second reality. One may thus view māyā as a postulate by elimination to account for the world’s ontological inexplicability, intended to direct one toward the unity of reality. In Śaṅkara’s final philosophical position, there is only brahman without parts, attributes, or causation.

2.3 Two-Tiered Reality

For Śaṅkara, the existence of the phenomenal empirical world alongside that of nondual brahman is in fact an illusory false reality. They are one, not two. Yet the world’s indeterminable appearance sets up a two-tiered (or two truths or two orders) approach to reality: (1) The conventional intersubjective empirical reality (vyāvahārikasattā) that comprises the universe; and (2) the ultimate reality (pāramārthikasattā) of nondual existence that is brahman. This hierarchy of two orders and their asymmetrical relationship avoids their mutual contradiction. A conscientious reader must understand this distinction and be mindful that Śaṅkara toggles his perspective between the two. This distinction is also foundational for comprehending his views on consciousness and his philosophical methods intended to culminate in mokṣa, more on which below.

The empirical order is a provisional ontology, whereas the ultimate reality is a final ontology. From the provisional empirical perspective, our universe is well founded like the pot is founded in clay. No object depends on itself, and its dependence is transitively descending to the foundation of nondual existence. The universe’s relationship with this ground is dependent and asymmetrical. This relationship collapses however at the ultimate order of nondual reality. For example, Śaṅkara can provisionally speak of the relationship of pot and clay (akin to the empirical standpoint); but from the perspective of cause and effect identity, there is only clay (i.e., the absolute standpoint). The pot form is a mere property, not a substantive. Despite its name and function, Śaṅkara does not ultimately attribute pot form to clay because it possesses no being apart from the clay substantive and is less real. Similarly, the order of ultimate reality is nondual existence alone, with no second things like properties.

One cannot count two things, existence and object or existence and property, as equally existing across two orders of reality. Nor does causation cross between two orders. In fact, from the ultimate perspective, the world (including the individual) is never truly born because nonduality is not subject to causation. It has no parts, is not bound by time or space, and is changeless (BrSūBh 2.1.14). Similarly, the pot-space which appears to be delimited by the walls of the pot does not delimit space itself—it is never truly born from infinite space (GKBh 3.3–9). Therefore, the ultimate reality perspective excludes any dependence relations to make sense of metaphysical grounding. (See GKBh 2.32–33, 3.3–9 for discussions of brahman as that which has no birth (ajāti) as the universe).

The clay-pot example falls short of adequately illustrating the two orders of reality. Śaṅkara’s more apt illustration is our phenomenal worlds of waking and dreaming, by which he can pump the intuition that there is no objective causation between the two states. For example, the dreamscape or an object like a dream clay-pot, is well founded in the dreamer’s cognition born of waking perceptual memory. This ontological dependence is asymmetrical. The dream pot depends on the memory of a waking pot cognition, but not vice versa; however, the dreamer cannot discover that causation solely from within the dream’s objective reality no matter how hard they reductively squeeze the dream pot. The dream pot’s ground is in the waking state, and discovering that waking reality simultaneously falsifies the dream world. After awakening, there is no dream to speak of, no level playing field for causation across the two orders. Similarly, discovering the metaphysical ground of the empirical universe transitions to the ultimate reality of nondual existence, in which there is no world of forms to question and no levels of hierarchy remaining. (See Ram-Prasad 2002 on Śaṅkara’s use of the dream analogy).

In this way, even though Śaṅkara assumes realism at the empirical level in terms of veridical cognition, he negates it metaphysically from the absolute level. This leads him to a position of non-realism (Ram-Prasad 2002). From the empirical standpoint, these two orders seem to exist simultaneously and possess an asymmetrical relationship—the world is dependent upon brahman for its existence, yet brahman has no dependence on the world even though immanent in it. Only from the absolute standpoint does empirical reality collapse into brahman. The ultimate reality perspective metaphysically devours the world, all of its causation, and even its status as an appearance. From the nondual standpoint there is only brahman. Brahman never undergoes genuine transformation (pariṇāma) into the world, just as a rope mistaken to be a snake does not actually transform into a snake. Nor is the snake separate from the rope.

2.4 Īśvara (God)

Though Śaṅkara dismisses empirical reality from the metaphysical standpoint of nonduality, the universe still possesses value in its identification with īśvara (usually translated as “God” or “Lord” for lack of a more suitable English term). Śaṅkara is ambiguous at times in differentiating īśvara from brahman, and uses several terms synonymously for both such as the “highest lord” (parameśvara); but he generally distinguishes īsvara as the lower (apara) brahman qualified with attributes (i.e., the universe), from the higher (apara) brahman that is absolute nonduality (BrSūBh 4.3.14). Following his readings of the Upaniṣads, Śaṅkara identifies īśvara as both the material and intelligent causes of the universe (BrSūBh 1.1.2). Īśvara emanates the universe through a cosmic causal power (māyāṣakti), and is the very process of becoming itself, a beginningless cycle of universe manifestation, sustenance, and dissolution. This process is an auto-cosmogony, making īśvara the material of the universe. As nothing but īśvara, the whole universe is sentient and self-aware. (See Ram-Prasad 2013; Comans 2000; Hacker 1995; and Warrier 1977 for further discussions of īśvara).

Following his reading of the Māṇḍūkya Upaniṣad, Śaṅkara likens the universe’s unmanifest state to īśvara in a cosmic state of deep dreamless sleep. Manifestation occurs when īśvara, as the intelligent cause, visualizes the universe through memory of past universes. This projective ontological capacity of īśvara is analogous to an individual’s process of dreaming. Dreaming utilizes memory to project a dream world that is not separate from one’s mind (BṛUBh 4.3.10). The universe is similarly an effortless manifestation of īśvara’s knowledge, and possesses no existence apart from īśvara. The universe’s ongoing manifestation is concurrent with īśvara’s perception of it like the dreamscape is concurrent with the dreamer’s perception. The universe’s very existence depends on īśvara knowing it, for īśvara’s knowing is its very projection into objective existence.

As the material cause, īśvara takes form as the universe through a processual cosmogony of subtle elements that undergo a process of grossification, first into elements and then into objects. On the level of subtle elements, īśvara functions as a cosmic mind named Hiraṇyagarbha, whose unrestricted intelligence pervades the universe. This cosmic mind is enlivened by its fundamental ground of consciousness-existence (brahman). On the level of coarse element composition, the perceptible universe is akin to īśvara’s physical body or brain. In this form īśvara is named Virāt. Śaṅkara’s view of the universe at the empirical level, with its universal mind and fundamental nature as consciousness, parallels some contemporary iterations of panentheism and panpsychism, particularly top-down cosmopsychism; however, his ultimate view of nondual brahman collapses any questions about the individual derivation or instantiation of nondual consciousness. (See Gasparri 2019; Vaidya 2020; and Albahari 2019 for comparisons of Advaita Vedānta and cosmopsychism).

Individuals are microcosms homologous to the īśvara macrocosm; however, they are part and parcel of the universe. They are ontologically dependent on īśvara and lack any objective ontological power of projection beyond subjective projections like dreaming and imagination. While the individual has a part to whole relationship with īśvara from the mind-body standpoint, ultimately there is only numerical identity between the individual and īśvara from the standpoint of existence identified as pure consciousness. Īśvara is the “knower of the field” (kṣetrajña)—the core of subjectivity present in all living beings and identified with brahman as pure consciousness (BhGBh 13.2).

3. Consciousness, Mind, and Personal Identity

Śaṅkara does not intend his position that existence exists without objective location to be a paradox or a kind of obscurantist mysticism (see §2.1 above). He believes the world is mysterious in that it is indeterminable, but not so existence itself. His crucial point is that the singular place to discover existence without objectifying it is within the foundation of our own phenomenal experience—as consciousness itself. Śaṅkara analyzes consciousness (cit or caitanyam) through both perspectives of his two orders of reality. From the provisional empirical order, consciousness is a witnessing presence (sākṣin) by which all mental cognition is revealed as known. The absolute perspective strips consciousness of all relational properties, including intentionality and its status as a witness, leaving only the intrinsic self-illuminating nature of consciousness remaining. He identifies this pure non-intentional consciousness as numerically identical with nondual existence, which is brahman.

3.1 Witnessing Consciousness

From the standpoint of individual experience, witnessing consciousness is the locus of one’s subjective being, the basic sense of self-existence, and the foundation of self-identity. It is the glue that unifies disparate forms of experience like waking, dreaming, and different modes of perception, and it accounts for memory and diachronic personal identity (BrSūBh 2.3.31; BṛUBh 4.3.7). This consciousness is distinct from an autobiographical sense of self constructed through recollective memory traces. Śaṅkara distinguishes witnessing consciousness from the mind, mental qualities, and cognitive modes. Consciousness is not composed of physical materials, structures, or processes, whereas the mind is composed of inert subtle matter. Consciousness is not an emergent property of the brain and body, which are composed of inert coarse matter, because that which is inert cannot give rise to sentiency. (See Ram-Prasad 2001a on Advaita’s consciousness and contemporary physicalism).

Witnessing consciousness always accompanies cognition (see, e.g., BṛUBh 1.4.10; KeUBh 1.2, 2.4). When one’s mind assumes the form of intentional objects, the cognition is immediately manifested as known in the presence of witnessing consciousness. Consciousness illumines cognitions directly with infallible access and without the mediation of another mental mode. It reveals first order states of cognition, including sense perception and internal states such as affect and imagination; as well as second order states such as introspection and meta-cognitive monitoring. Yet the witness is not itself a meta-function of the mind, such as an inner sense, a higher order cognition, or an introspective awareness that deliberately recognizes the fact of one’s experience. The witness is not a separate substantial entity at all according to Śaṅkara, nor does it possess agency in revealing cognition as a knower. It is intransitive and receptive, simply the passive witnessing itself (BṛUBh 1.4.10; TaiUBh 2.1.1; KeUBh 2.4). Only the mind possesses object directed intentionality, not witnessing consciousness. (See Gupta 1998 and Fort 1984 on witnessing consciousness. See Albahari 2009; and Fasching 2011 and 2012 for contextualizing witnessing consciousness in contemporary philosophy of mind).

Śaṅkara understands consciousness as immediately evident, yet outside the scope of any means of knowledge. As the illuminating background of all phenomenal states, witnessing consciousness is the presupposition of all epistemological knowing. It is intrinsically first-personal. Consciousness is therefore not objectifiable (KeUBh 2.1). This conclusion further entails that it is unaffected by what it illumines and remains untouched by mental states. Consciousness does not undergo any causation whatsoever because causation must presuppose its object-hood status.

Śaṅkara views witnessing consciousness as invariable despite the fluctuations of mental modes. One foundational argument for this is his analysis of waking, dreaming, and deep dreamless sleep states based on the Bṛhadāraṇyaka and Māṇḍūkya Upaniṣads. He considers these three mental states as exhaustive of human experience, and claims that consciousness persists constantly through all three despite their mutual exclusivity. When awakening from a dream state, though the dream world and dream body discontinue, there is no rupture to the continuity of one’s consciousness. Consciousness continues seamlessly even in deep dreamless sleep where ego and agency resolve into an unmanifest state and subject-object distinctions collapse.

One might object that persistence of consciousness in deep sleep is not possible given the mainstream premise of identifying consciousness as intentional experience. Śaṅkara disagrees with the premise that consciousness is intrinsically intentional. (This was a matter of great debate between Advaita Vedānta and rival philosophies like Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika). He counters that the absence of intentional experience in deep sleep does not entail the lack of consciousness insofar as consciousness is not intrinsically intentional. It exists even in the absence of cognition representing an object. Rejecting his position is difficult because one cannot claim direct perception of unconsciousness in deep sleep, and in that case cannot inductively infer unconsciousness either. Rather than viewing deep sleep as the absence of consciousness, Śaṅkara claims there is simply an absence of objects. Consciousness of the absence of objects is not the absence of consciousness. This is akin to having one’s eyes wide open and seeing but in a pitch-black room. Consciousness simply has nothing to illumine, therefore no intentional experience occurs nor any awareness of one’s self as a knower. This presence of consciousness in deep sleep is possible because it is self-illuminating and exists independently from objects or knowing agents. (See Śaṅkara’s discussions of deep sleep in BṛUBh 4.3, GKBh ch.1, and BrSūBh 3.2.7–10. For further studies see Thompson 2015; Comans 1990; and Sharma 2004).

3.2 Self-Illumination of Consciousness

Witnessing consciousness is elusive because it is unobjectifiable. It escapes our attention because it stands behind cognitive intentionality and cannot attend to itself. One cannot isolate the witness by pulling it to one side and objects to another, for in drawing a line between the two, both become objects of consciousness. Consciousness cannot become an objective content of consciousness. If one infers that this non-finding of consciousness is evidence of its non-existence, Śaṅkara counters that one cannot deny their own consciousness (BrSūBh 2.3.7). Consciousness is self-evident. It cannot admit its own absence or antecedent negation, for any dismissal of consciousness presupposes its very existence. Consciousness thus falls outside the scope of negation.

Śaṅkara defines the intrinsic nature of consciousness as uniquely self-illuminating (svaprakāśa) because it does not require a second awareness for it to be known. Consciousness is intrinsically reflexive, immediate, and self-revealing in all cognition, while simultaneously remaining the non-object of knowledge. It is self-established in that it does not require a means of knowledge to be known, nor any proof or justification for its existence. It is self-disclosing. No second thing mediates its access to itself (see Śaṅkara on BṛUBh 4.3, TaiUBh 2.1.1).

Śaṅkara repudiates rival philosophies such as the Nyāya school which rejects witnessing consciousness and self-illumination in favor of other-illumination (paraprakāśa)—a thesis more akin to contemporary higher order theories. Nyāya argues that a second cognition is required to illumine the first. Śaṅkara’s basic counter-critique is that if a primary cognition requires a second apperceptive cognition to be known, then the second would require a third, etc., leading to a vicious infinite regression fallacy. In that case no perception could ever be known. The self-illumination of witnessing consciousness accounts for the immediacy of cognition without falling into an infinite regress of mental modes (BrSūBh 2.2.28; BṛUBh 4.3.7). There is no need to apprehend the witness because it is self-established. If consciousness cannot become its own object, yet does not require a second, subsequent, or higher order cognition to reveal itself, than an infinite regression fallacy does not arise.

Śaṅkara also critiques the view of some Mahāyāna Buddhist philosophers, Vasubandhu and Dharmakīrti for example, who argue that a given cognition or mental state can simultaneously reveal itself and its object. Their self-illumination thesis is quite similar to Advaita Vedānta but endeavors to be more parsimonious by eliding the witnessing consciousness. Śaṅkara counters that a self-illuminating cognition is incoherent because it is subject to the reflexivity fallacy (BrSūBh 2.2.28). Just as a knife cannot cut itself, so too is cognition unable to objectify itself. A cognition requires a different source of illumination to be known. This is also a matter of direct experience, for we are aware of a cognition’s changes such as its origination and destruction and the arising of a new cognition. A source of illumination distinct from the cognition itself is required to know such changes. Śaṅkara contends that the self-illumination of witnessing consciousness does not similarly fall to a reflexivity fallacy (KeUBh 1.3). Even though consciousness is immediately known, it does not objectify itself. Self-illuminating consciousness does not come into a relationship with itself. It does not entail being subject and object simultaneously, which would be incoherent, for there is no distinction to be made between itself and consciousness of itself. (See Mackenzie 2012; Ram-Prasad 2007; Timalsina 2009; Indich 1980; and Fasching 2021 for further discussions of self-illumination).

3.3 Reflection: Consciousness, Mind, and Personal Identity

As the foundation of experience and presupposition of knowledge, Śaṅkara’s witnessing consciousness precedes his epistemology. The difficulty he faces, however, is how to bridge self-illuminating consciousness, which is unchanging and non-relational, to cognition and intentional experience within the individual knower. He develops a reflection or semblance (pratibimba or ābhāsa) theory of consciousness to address such issues. The deeper purpose of this theory however is to develop an account for individuals superimposing false identities on consciousness (see US ch.18 for Śaṅkara’s most detailed discussion of reflection, as well as BṛUBh 4.3.7 and ChUBh 6.3.2).

For Śaṅkara, īśvara’s emanation into the universe not only indicates that the universe is sentient, but also how living beings come to possess phenomenal consciousness and identify themselves as individuals. Even though the entire universe is sentient, individual sentiency is only expressed under the condition of having a mind. He employs the analogy of reflection to explain the relationship of mind and consciousness, and to provisionally wed intrinsic reflexivity with cognitive intentionality. His theory of reflection is also a novel way of addressing the decombination problem in cosmopsychism—the explanatory gap between universal and individual organism consciousness. (See Albahari 2019 on the decombination problem).

Śaṅkara’s common term for the mind is the “inner instrument” (antaḥkaraṇa). He categorizes the mind in different ways in accordance with his source texts (see BrSūBh 2.3.32 for example), yet consistently distinguishes between two functions:

  1. the intellect (buddhi) which is the mental function of determination and definitive knowing; and
  2. the manas, which includes sensory, affective, and conative functions as well as indecision.

He also includes two additional functions:

  1. the I-notion (ahaṃkāra–literally the “I-maker”,) which is one’s sense of self; and
  2. the power of recollection (citta)

(see, e.g., his commentary on Māṇḍūkya 2. The later Advaita tradition standardized the mind as having this four-fold function). Śaṅkara maintains an Upaniṣadic view that minds are materially constituted by sattva, the subtlest aspect of each primary element. Sattva has a qualitative predominance of lucidity and transparency. It makes the mind akin to the reflective surface of a mirror capable of reflecting light, or like a transparent glass that allows light to pass through while illuminating variations on its surface. Unlike minds, mediums like rocks are inert because of their opacity. They lack enough sattva constitution to be reflective even though they are also fundamentally grounded in consciousness.

Śaṅkara identifies the reflective medium specifically as the buddhi (BṛUBh 4.3.7). Just as light is pervasive but only becomes visible through a reflective medium (because space does not reveal light), so too is consciousness expressed experientially only in the reflective medium of the intellect. The intellect takes on the semblance of consciousness. Consciousness thus appears to be located in one’s mind even though all-pervasive. The mind depends on reflected consciousness for its experience of itself, like we use a mirror reflection to see ourselves. The mind also depends on consciousness to cognize objects, like using the mirror reflection of light to illumine things in darkness. The reflection enables intentionality even though the prototype witnessing consciousness is non-intentional and remains untouched in the appearance of causation.

Reflection is the seed of individuation and the I-notion because mind appears to be the locus of consciousness. Mind becomes the reflexive center of self-identification, manifesting as knower-ship, doer-ship, and enjoyer-ship. The reflection further extends through the sense organs, which are also predominantly sattva, to encompasses the body’s periphery through the sense of touch. This extension forms a constellation of experiential points of reference that circumscribes self-identity as the complex of mind, body, and sense organs (see BṛUBh 4.3.7; ChUBh 8.8.1–2; BrSūBh 2.3.28–30).

Śaṅkara employs another theory, the limitation theory (avaccheda), to help explain the individuation of consciousness. This theory counters potential problems arising from the reflection theory, such as assuming a genuine duality of mind and consciousness, or that consciousness undergoes causation and entry, or that it actually resides locatively in the mind. The limitation theory explains that just as we mistakenly perceive nondual space as delimited by an object—for example, a pot delimiting a pot space—so too do we misunderstand non-dual consciousness as delimited by the mind (see GKBh 3.3–9). The pot space is not a genuine limiting property of space because space is not divisible by the pot form. The pot space is an appearance. It is merely an as though limiting property, a conditioning adjunct (upādhi) that we superimpose on to space to account for particular functions (e.g., containing a liquid). So too, do people mistakenly assume the mind-body-sense complex possesses consciousness and that consciousness is intrinsically intentional. In reality, the mind-body-sense complex is merely an upādhi that does not possess or limit nondual consciousness.

For Śaṅkara, the reflection of consciousness is an as though appearance because all-pervasive consciousness is not subject to movement or change. Consciousness is not like a substance that undergoes modification or entry within time and space. It remains untouched and unaffected, like the prototype image is untouched by its reflection or universal space is unaffected by the pot (BrSūBh 2.3.46). Furthermore, literal entry is also not possible because the reflection is less real than its prototype. Śaṅkara argues that a real thing (consciousness) cannot enter into a less real one (mind) because they are of two different orders of reality. My limited sense of self-identity, what I take to be me, is merely a reflection. It only appears to be my self like a reflected facial image appears to be my face. My actual face, the prototype, is more real than the reflection and does not literally enter the mirror (US 18.85–6). Furthermore, my facial reflection possesses no existence apart from my face. Self-identity with the mind-body-sense organs is similarly virtual, not fully real; yet people remain unaware of this fact because they are mired in self-ignorance and enamored with their reflections.

The intention of the reflection analogy is not to establish a definitive metaphysical process of how one becomes conscious; but rather to reveal consciousness as untouched, and to point out the fundamental epistemological problem of falsely buying into constructed self-identities as if they are fundamental features of reality. This intention parallels his use of cosmogonies to undermine our assumed reality of the world and point back towards the metaphysical ground of existence (see §2.2 above). Similarly, the reflection theory obliquely points back towards the prototype, the witness, which is the ground of pure consciousness underlying the reflection. Recognizing that ground cuts through mistaken self-identities. The reflection analogy thus provides a conceptual framework to discriminate consciousness from all points of reflected identity from within the starting point of our phenomenology. This project is difficult however because consciousness is unobjectifiable, situated elusively behind cognition so to speak, and is transparent to cognition. Consciousness and intellect cannot be separated like a blade of grass from its sheath (BṛUBh 4.3.7). Cognition is also subtly embedded in bodily identity and invariably accompanied by a sense of knower-ship/I-ness and ownership/for-me-ness; however, Śaṅkara claims that embodiment, knower-ship and ownership are all objectifiable cognitions. They are known and therefore not intrinsic to witnessing consciousness.

The distinction of witnessing consciousness from mind and objects appears dualistic from the empirical order perspective but transitions to nonduality from the absolute perspective. Witnessing consciousness is the bridge between the two orders, an ontological primitive that is fundamental to one’s self as well as all reality. Pure consciousness matches the nature of nondual existence as free of name and form. Consciousness is “pure”, in that it is free from any relation, predication, or intentionality. Consciousness is unlike any object because it is unobjectifiable. It is ultimately not even subject to time or space, which are themselves objects of the witness. Like pure existence, consciousness is self-established. It has no parts, is irreducible, and stands outside of causation and dependence relations. Consciousness is a constant unchanging presence, the only continuity of existence persisting through the process of infinite object reductions in searching for an object’s metaphysical ground. It resists qualification, eliminative reduction, or dependence on a second thing.

Śaṅkara’s philosophical conclusion is that non-reducible existence is numerically identical to pure non-intentional consciousness. Consciousness is nondual. It is the intrinsic nature of brahman itself. Consciousness is not simply the witness of one’s experience. It is the ultimate ground comprising an individual’s self-existence, the single self (ātman) of all sentient beings from a blade of grass to īśvara, and the metaphysical foundation of the entire universe.

3.4 Superimposition: The Fundamental Problem of Ignorance

The reflection and limitation theories above point to a fundamental error shared by all beings. If individuation is the apparent delimitation of nondual consciousness, then assuming personal identity is real is actually an error, a manifestation of ignorance. Śaṅkara explains that we falsely identify with “I”, construct the possessiveness of “mine”, and then cling to them. We mutually superimpose consciousness on to our mind-body, and the mind-body on to consciousness (i.e., I am the mind-body, and the mind-body is I). Superimposition is possible even though consciousness is not an object because it is the content of “I” and always immediate in one’s experience. We assume the mind intrinsically possesses consciousness, and that consciousness is subject to the mind-body’s limitations, like one may mistake a scratch in the mirror as actually marring one’s face. Similarly, one may mistake a clear crystal as red due to a red flower placed behind it. Like the crystal or mirror, the mind-body is a conditioning adjunct (upādhi) that provides a locus of individuation. This error conceals one’s fundamental nondual nature, the ground of superimposition, like mistaking a rope for a snake conceals its rope nature. (See Śaṅkara’s seminal discussion of superimposition in his introduction to the BrSū titled, the “Commentary on Superimposition” [Adhyāsabhāṣya]).

The epistemic failure of mutual superimposition is caused by ignorance (avidyā). Śaṅkara identifies avidyā as the root cause of all existential suffering. It produces a baseline of fear and anxiety due to assuming one’s self as a limited being subject to sorrow, sickness, and death. Based on this error, individuals seek wholeness, happiness, and limitlessness through known ends like material gains, social status, hedonic pleasures, or reaching heavenly worlds; however, such endeavors are perpetually bound to fail because results of finite actions are limited, transient, and dependent. They may provide temporary reprieves or happy mental states, but do not provide the limitless wholeness of liberation. Only the direct understanding of one’s self as nondual brahman negates the error of superimposition, and frees one from the beginningless karmic cycle of death, rebirth, and suffering. One’s cluster of mistaken self-identities and the whole psychological scaffolding that perpetuates suffering collapses only by removing the kingpin of ignorance. Then only nondual consciousness remains standing. Upon recognizing this reality, the mind rests in its own intrinsic being with absolute fullness, peacefulness, and tranquility. Śaṅkara’s soteriological project is thus primarily epistemological with several positive psychological repercussions.

Several questions about Śaṅkara’s position on ignorance became contentious in post-Śaṅkara Advaita: Is the locus of ignorance in the individual or brahman? Is ignorance simply misapprehension or does it have a two-fold power of covering and projection? Does it hold both epistemological and ontological powers? Is there a distinction of cosmic root ignorance and secondary individual ignorance? And what is its relationship with māyā? Such questions have caused several intra-Advaita debates as well as philosophical critiques from rival traditions such as Rāmānuja’s Viśiṣṭādvaita Vedānta and Mādhva’s Dvaita Vedānta. (For further discussions of these issues see Potter 1981: 78–80; Ingalls 1953; Comans 2000: 263–7; Doherty 2005; and Grimes 1990).

4. Contemplative Philosophical Methods

According to Śaṅkara, because the individual is nondual brahman in reality, they already are what they seek to be—unlimited, whole, and complete. The difficulty, however, is that one’s felt sense of finite identity contradicts nonduality and engenders a seeming distance between the person and brahman. Mokṣa thus appears to be a future attainment rather than a recognition of present reality. This false premise entices one into action with the intent to gain or become brahman, but one cannot attain anew what is already attained. Action is superfluous to accomplish an already accomplished fact. In fact, the more one attempts to gain, reach, or experience liberation while mistakenly presupposing its distance, the further it recedes like the horizon. This quagmire of action is not intractable though because both bondage and liberation are just figurative—no change occurs in reality. The solution is purely self-knowledge, a radical epistemic shift in perspective by which one simultaneously sheds limited self-identities and recognizes their existence as nondual consciousness. Only this direct immediate recognition of nonduality defeats the error of superimposition. One becomes brahman simply by knowing brahman (MuU 3.2.9). Śaṅkara illustrates this concept of accomplishing the accomplished with the “tenth man story” (TaiUBh 2.1.1). Ten children cross a river and then regroup to count each other. Each child counts only nine, and they sorrowfully conclude that the missing tenth child must have drowned. A passerby sees their plight and states, “you are the tenth!” They then realize they simply forgot to count themselves. The tenth child was never truly lost or gained. (See Comans 2000; Suthren Hirst 2005; and Rambachan 1991 for further discussions of Śaṅkara’s method).

4.1 Action and Meditation

Śaṅkara is ambivalent about actions such as yogic meditation, ritual practice, or ethical duties within his method. On the one hand he strives to undermine the importance of mental or physical action as an independent methodology for liberation. Action is a cause for bondage, not a means of liberation, because it always presupposes the reality of individual agency and contributes to a cycle of further desire and action. Furthermore, any product of action is finite and transient (Potter 1981: 38–41). Śaṅkara views action as having no epistemic fruitfulness independent of a means of knowledge. He draws a critical distinction based on content dependence. Physical actions such as ritual performance or mental actions like imagination or meditation are dependent on an individual’s will. They arise independently of the nature of the thing concerned. Veridical cognition, however, is ultimately dependent on the nature of the object. It is determined by the object through a proper means of knowledge, with no options or alternatives in terms of an agent’s choice. Action is therefore incapable of providing veridical knowledge whatsoever, let alone knowledge of non-duality (BrSūBh 1.1.4). This critique of action collapses any methodological dichotomy of theory and practice, which is intrinsic to both ritual practice and yogic meditation methods. Liberating self-knowledge is not subject to any kind of ritual injunctions. It is not procedural knowledge, nor the result of procedural knowledge. (See Ram-Prasad 2000 on Śaṅkara’s distinction of knowledge and action. See Bader 1990 and Dalal 2016 on his approach to meditation).

On the other hand, Śaṅkara accepts the secondary importance of yogic practices that involve a variety of meditation methods, devotional practices, ascetic austerities, moral psychology, and the development of ethical virtues and action ethics (see Sundaresan 2003 on Yoga in Śaṅkara’s method). They may function as indirect means to liberation. Śaṅkara’s ambivalence towards action is not a contradiction. He recognizes a voluntary element in any knowledge to some degree. One must create the proper conditions to align a means of knowledge. For example, to visually perceive an object one may have to open their eyes and turn their head. Then visual knowledge automatically takes place. Similarly, the Advaitin must possess a prepared mind to recognize brahman. Śaṅkara provides a fourfold set of prerequisite conditions characterizing this qualified student: (1) discrimination between what is transient and eternal; (2) dispassion towards objects of enjoyment; (3) perfecting practices such as the control of the mind and senses; and (4) the desire for liberation (BrSūBh 1.1.1).

Yogic and ethical practices, as well as analyses of the limitations of goals like pleasure, wealth, status, and heaven provide the conditions for self-knowledge by cultivating mental purity (antaḥkaraṇaśuddhi). Mental purity is the removal of epistemic obstructions to knowing brahman, such as greed, anger, selfishness, violence, jealousy, and distraction. It also includes developing positive qualifications such as ethical attitudinal values of equanimity, acceptance, truthfulness, compassion, and benevolence. Mediation practices provide mental stability and focus. These qualifications hone the mind’s capacity to be a proper container for text-sparked knowledge; though, in theory, if a student is already sufficiently qualified, they need not undergo any such practices.

Śaṅkara’s commentary on the Bhagavadgītā provides a rich resource for his yogic methods and ethical virtues. For example, following BhG ch. 2–4, he endorses a yoga of action (karmayoga). Karmayoga is a yogic process that employs a philosophy of action to cultivate emotional growth and world participation. It extends Vedic ritual frameworks of sacrificial contribution and consumption to all actions. All action becomes analogous to devotionally placing ritual oblations into the sacrificial fire as offerings to deities. The Advaitin yogin offers actions altruistically to īṣvara for the benefit of all beings (lokasaṅgraḥ) and the harmonious functioning of the world. Just as the sacrificer equanimously consumes the remnants of sacrificial food offerings as a blessing, sans gustatory pleasure or aversion, so too does the yogin learn to accept the results of their actions with equanimity. Karmayoga intends to free one from the binding attachment of desires caused by the mistaken belief that desired objects possess one’s happiness. It develops internal renunciation, equipoise, gratitude, and benevolence, while releasing one from the anger, sadness, and inner turmoil that arise from thwarted desire. This yogic attitude extends not only externally to society, beings, and world, but also internally to one’s physiology and psychology.

4.2 The Triple Process and the Means of Nondual Knowledge

Śaṅkara embraces particular verbal methods to understand propositions affirming nonduality crystallized in pithy Upaniṣadic sentences. (Post-Śaṅkara Advaitins focused on four such “great sentences” [mahāvākyas]). These methods include continuity and discontinuity (anvaya and vyatireka), secondary indication (lakṣaṇā), and negative language (neti neti). Śaṅkara does not clearly codify these separately, but it may be most accurate to describe his primary method as continuity and discontinuity (see, e.g., GKBh 13.13). Post-Śaṅkara Advaitins often discuss his method as lakṣaṇā instead; however, Śaṅkara appears to view all three as varying iterations of a single method.

Anvaya and vyatireka is a method of discriminative reasoning to determine the relationship of what persists and what does not persist between two things. It reveals whether one term is independent of another. For example, in the analogy of the clay and its forms (see §2.1 above), when a particular form of clay (such as a pot) occurs, then clay occurs (continuity). And when that particular form (pot) is absent (discontinuity) after being shaped into a plate, then clay still occurs. One may apply this method, for example, to consciousness and mental states. Consciousness is continuous through the discontinuous states of waking, dreaming, and deep sleep and never subject to its negative instance of discontinuity. Consciousness itself can never be absent. One cannot escape from one’s own consciousness, nor can one directly separate a particular mental state from consciousness because consciousness itself is not mutually exclusive of anything and not subject to the negative instance of vyatireka. However, separating consciousness and a particular mental state is possible through anvaya and vyatireka because the states themselves are mutually exclusive. For example, dream reality and waking reality are mutually exclusive, pointing to the fact that consciousness is independent of them even as it persists through both. (See Cardona 1981; Satchidanandendra 1964 [1989]; Halbfass 1991: 162–77; Comans 1996: 59–63; and Mayeda 1992: 51–58 on anvaya and vyatireka).

Mahāvākyas like “I am Brahman” (BṛU 1.4.10: ahaṃ brahmāsmi) or “You are that” (ChU 6.8.7: tat tvam asi) are identity statements that form an equation consisting of two or more co-referential terms in grammatical apposition. The equation’s lack of logical congruence—identifying the limited individual (aham) with nondual brahman, or you (tvam) with that (tat) universe for example—contradict syntactical expectancy. This prods the reader to use the anvaya and vyatireka method to resolve the equation. In the case of “You are that”, tvam negates the mediacy of tat as existence external to one’s Self. And tat negates any subjective limitations to the consciousness referred to in tvam. The apposition thus restricts what does not persist between the two terms to reveal what is continuous and numerically identical—namely pure consciousness and undifferentiated existence. The identity statement reveals that you (tvam), the pure consciousness which is the underlying existence of the individual, is that (tat) pure existence which is the metaphysical ground of all objects. Existence and consciousness are one, not two. There is no distinction between the am-ness of one’s self and the is-ness of objects. (See ChUBh ch.6 and US ch.18 for Śaṅkara’s interpretation of “You are that”).

Lakṣaṇā’s indirect implication employs a theory of metonymy which distinguishes between literal denotative meanings and implied connotative meanings. The contradictory juxtaposition of an identity statement such as “You are that” triggers a particular form of secondary implication in which a portion of the primary meaning is rejected while another part is retained. The canonical Advaita example is, “This (person that you see now) is that Devadatta (whom you knew in the past)”. Here, the primary referents of “this” and “that” cannot be identical because “this” and “that” refer to different locations and times, Devadatta in the past somewhere else and Devadatta here and now. The two Devadattas are not completely identical because of their relationships to time and place, nor are they completely separate. The import of the sentence creates a cognition of a single Devadatta substantive that is not connected to a specific time or place. (See Lipner 1997; Bartley 2002: 111–23; Suthren Hirst 2005: 145–51; Kunjunni Raja 1969: 251–54, and the entry on the literal-nonliteral distinction for further discussions of indirect implication).

Neti neti (negative language) literally means “not (this), not (this)”. Its negation targets the discontinuity aspect by stripping away all qualifications to personal identity and the external world. This process removes false superimpositions of body, senses, and mind previously attributed to brahman. Negative language attempts to avoid defining absolute reality as a thing in the world. It denies any nameability of brahman, its grammatical object. This is directly tied to brahman’s unobjectifiable status, for the hermeneutical premise of Śaṅkara’s negative language is the inability of predicates to apply to absolute reality. To give positive predicates would reify the absolute to a finite entity (on this see BṛUBh 2.3.6).

Neti neti negates all properties, conceptions, limitations, and identities attributed to brahman; however, it cannot lose all reference. Passages using negative language may push their object away, allowing the unobjectifiable object to continually slip back and beyond; however, the purpose is not open ended. Negation strips away all false conceptions, including one’s tendency to grasp after the absolute, without lapsing into nihilism or an infinite regression (BrSūBh 3.2.22). What appears to be an illogical infinite regress of negation is harnessed as a semantic force for understanding the absolute. Negative language turns onto itself as well, negating its prior negation and its own referential delimitations. When all conceptions of “I” as “this” or “that” are negated, then one’s self is understood to be nondual consciousness.

Negative language usually constitutes half of a paradox that affirms positive and negative propositions at the same time. Textual instances of negation usually follow positive statements about brahman which provide an explicit positive proposition of continuity. There is a positive assertion of an entity but the negative language strips that entity of any limitations or finite objectivity. This methodology threads the needle of indicating brahman’s presence without objectifying it. It ensures that the reader neither grasps at an object nor falls into nihilism. The negative assertions of neti neti, which follow or imply a positive assertion, parallel the other two methods. Lakṣaṇā and anvaya-vyatireka similarly depend on negation through mutual restriction, while simultaneously indicating the intrinsic nature of brahman without falling into nihilism.

4.3 Self-Knowledge and Living While Liberated

How to exactly define liberation in Śaṅkara’s thought is inherently problematic. He does not provide a precise epistemological account of how knowledge of brahman takes place. Śaṅkara’s conception of liberation removes itself from the boundaries of ordinary discourse, debate, and causal epistemology (See TaiUBh 2.9.1 for example). There is a metaphysical uncertainty about it, for on the one hand a liberating cognition may be able to remove self-ignorance, but on the other it is problematic to reduce ever-present liberation to a cognition which is a product and a temporal event. From the empirical perspective liberation may be inexplicable and indeterminable due to its transition to ultimate nondual reality.

Perhaps the greatest difficulty is describing what Śaṅkara thought about the transition from what appears to be descriptive knowledge to direct knowledge, or from a type of modal knowledge to a knowledge of intrinsic being that is pure consciousness. In his view, understanding the Upaniṣadic identity statement generates a unique cognition revealing the veridical knowledge, “I am brahman”—that one is indiscernible from nondual consciousness, numerically identical with brahman, and the reality of everything. This knowledge removes root ignorance to negate superimposition veiling one’s true nature. It strips all qualifications and relationships from consciousness, deconstructs the I-sense and knower-ship as unreal, and deindividuates the individual from all conditioning adjuncts (see Ram-Prasad 2001b: ch. 4). Then suffering, karma, and rebirth have no locus in which to cling because only nondual consciousness remains.

Nondual knowledge does not entail subject-object distinction like object cognitions because its content is identical to the consciousness illuminating the cognition. Its content is brahman itself (see, e.g., TaiUBh 2.1.1; MuUBh 3.1.2, 4; and BrSūBh 2.1.14). There is no call to apperceive this knowledge for the sake of a truth certifying inference. Extrinsic certification cannot determine its veridicality because intrinsic consciousness (svarūpajñānam) is self-illuminating and cannot be known by a second cognition. Its self-illumination entails its self-certification when directly known. The cognition’s modal form (vrttijñānam), however, is analogous to a self-immolating match. By recognizing its content, it cannibalizes its own modal form. It reveals its own modal appearance as an appearance, which is only brahman. In this process it loses its status as a means of knowledge, akin to a means of knowledge in a dream (BhGBh 2.69).

Śaṅkara uses the analogy of waking up from dreaming to illustrate understanding nonduality and the non-realism of the world (BrSūBh 2.1.14). He does not characterize this as a mystical state of union, an extraordinary oceanic experience, or a state of no mind. In fact, one cannot describe this knowledge as an experiential state because states are objectifiable cognitions. Furthermore, this knowledge ostensibly negates experiential agency. His liberation is a purely epistemic shift that removes false conceptual constructions. From an epistemic perspective, Śaṅkara sees the liberated person as having no more dealings concerned with actions, instruments, and results. They have no more perception of duality, and possess no more self-identity with the mind and body (BṛUBh 2.4.14, 4.5.15); however, from a phenomenal perspective, liberation does not entail an annihilation of one’s experience of the world (BrSūBh 3.2.21). This is like a magician who remains unconfused despite perceiving their own magical illusions. The liberated person recognizes nonduality but continues living as an embodied individual experiencing the world. This lasts according to the ongoing fructification of karma in their present birth (ChUbh 6.14.2). One who is “living while liberated” (jīvanmukti) seamlessly inhabits the apparent paradoxes of being disembodied in the midst of embodiment, of acting while recognizing their non-agency, and of perceiving the world despite deindividuation. (See Fort 1998 on jīvanmukti).

A lucid dream experience is an ideal illustration of Śaṅkara’s liberation, though not found in his work. For experienced lucid dreamers, the recognition that one is dreaming possesses a conviction that completely cuts through the appearance of the dream fabric, but does so without eliminating perceptual dream experience. They are epistemically aware of two orders of reality, waking and dreaming, while phenomenally remaining in the less real dreaming order. The lucid dreamer is deindividuated from the dream body, yet remains embodied within the dream experience. They recognize that the dream is not separate from themselves, that it cannot touch them, and that there is nothing to fear or gain from it. In Śaṅkara’s metaphysical view however, the empirical order is analogous to īśvara’s dream, not one’s own. This view accommodates the universe’s identity with īśvara, along with intersubjective agreement and veridical cognition, without falling into solipsism. The individual is not creating empirical reality, but rather making a mistake about it. Like the dream, empirical reality is not illusory from within its own order of reality. It is known as a virtual appearance only from the more foundational perspective of knowing brahman, analogous to awakening to the reality of the dream. The liberated person is like a finite dream being within īśvara’s cosmic dream who has awakened within the dream. They recognize that the immediate presence of consciousness is the single foundation grounding all objects, the single self of all beings, and the self of īśvara.



Bh bhāṣya (commentary of Śaṅkara)
BhG Bhagavadgītā
BrSū Brahmasūtra
BṛU Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad
ChU Chāndogya Upaniṣad
KeU Kena Upaniṣad
GK Gauḍapāda Kārikā
MuU Muṇḍaka Upaniṣad
TaiU Taittirīya Upaniṣad
US Upadeśasāhasrī

Note that ‘Bh’ is appended to the other abbreviations to indicate Śaṅkara’s commentary on that work (e.g., ‘TaiUBh’). The numbers following an abbreviation (e.g., "TaiU 2.1.1") indicate the chapter, section, and verse.

Śaṅkara’s Texts in English Translation

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  • –––, 1995, Bhagavadgītā with the Commentary of Śaṅkarācārya, Calcutta: Advaita Ashram.
  • –––, 1996, Brahmasūtrabhāṣya of Śrī Śaṅkarāchārya, Calcutta: Advaita Ashram.
  • Madhavananda, Swami, 1993, The Bṛhadāraṇyaka Upaniṣad: with the Commentary of Śaṅkarācārya, Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama.
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  • Nikhilananda, Swami, 2000, The Māṇḍūkya Upaniṣad with Gauḍapāda’s Kārikā and Śaṅkara’s Commentary, Calcutta: Advaita Ashrama.

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Other Internet Resources

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