Richard Sylvan [Routley]

First published Mon Dec 9, 2019

Richard Sylvan (born Routley, 1935–1996) was an Australasian philosopher who was instrumental in starting major schools in: logic (especially paraconsistent and relevant logic), metaphysics (especially Meinongian ontology), and ethics (especially environmental ethics). In a large body of writing, Sylvan urged that, from logic to ecology, we are not now thinking well about big problems—but that we can and must do better. “Philosophers fiddle while the world begins to burn,” he wrote (Hyde 2014, vi). In response, he proposed a highly ambitious and radical philosophical project of re-evaluation, from foundations up, that has had ongoing impact in philosophy (Casati, Mortensen & Priest 2018; Eckert (ed.) 2018; Hyde (ed.) 2019, and Weber (ed.) 2019).

Sylvan is known for proposing and defending some highly controversial views, arguing in favour of inconsistent theories, non-existent objects, and non-human values. Such unorthodox claims were especially unpopular in the time Sylvan was writing, in the latter half of the 20th century. But he thought it was vitally important, for philosophy and for the world, that we take seriously ideas that run against conventions of the time. (As Robert Meyer put it, “To get the counter-suggestible Sylvan to defend some view, one needed first to remark that the view was now utterly discredited”, Meyer 1996.) What were widely thought to be untenable positions, such as Meinongianism, or failed theories, such as Cantor/Frege naïve set theory, attracted Sylvan’s attention for what he thought of as restoration:

A large part of my philosophical life has, so it appears, looking back (and also looking forward) consisted in rehabilitating abandoned philosophical dwellings, habitats, and landscapes. (Preface, Sylvan ms. Philosophical Rehabilitation, quoted in Hyde 2014, 124)

His contributions are all systematically tied together in the service of a single project, around meaning and value, recognizing the legitimacy and status of marginalized entities; for the landscapes he sought to rehabilitate had been, in his view,

laid waste or damaged by predecessors—too many of them, as the predecessors adhered to an entirely defective set of values…(ibid.).

He sought to make these philosophical landscapes viable by improving the way we reason about them, thereby casting them in a new light that showed their deep interconnectedness.

This entry will use the name ‘Sylvan’, even though he did not begin using that name until 1983. All his work published before then uses his original name of ‘Routley’.

1. Life

Sylvan was born in 1935 in Levin, New Zealand. He received his MA in Philosophy from the University of New Zealand (Wellington) in 1957 and the following year completed a first-class Honours degree in mathematics there. His MA thesis, a 385-page work entitled Moral Scepticism was given a mark of 95% by Arthur Prior, though he later commented that this was “not so much a mark as an exclamation mark” (quoted in D. Hyde, Introduction to Eckert (ed.) 2018, xiv). Blackwell agreed to publish a condensed version of the thesis but the required revisions were never undertaken.

In 1959, his teacher George Hughes then employed Sylvan to build a small electro-mechanical computer capable of determining whether input formulae were logical truths, logical falsehoods, or neither—with green, red and amber lights displaying the respective outcomes. He worked out how to build it from scratch using relays and uniselectors discarded by the post office and it was a success, but when run some years later it drew so much power that it blacked out the building it was housed in, ruining several experiments in biology running in the building at the time. The Biology Department insisted that it never be used again (Hyde 2014, 43).

In mid-1959, while bushwalking in Australia, he met Jack Smart (then in Adelaide, later a colleague at the Australian National University and good bushwalking friend thereafter) who encouraged him to go to Princeton for graduate work, as opposed to the then more usual choice of UK universities like Cambridge. At Smart’s urging, “as a brash young man” Sylvan travelled to Princeton with a Fulbright scholarship for doctoral studies under Alonzo Church to “repair and renovate a derelict philosophy of science” (Sylvan 2000a, 7). After two and a half years he was awarded an MA from Princeton University but left before completing his PhD, dissatisfied with the intellectual climate there and subsequent lack of progress on his project. (He later received a PhD from Princeton in 1980 for chapter one of Routley 1980.) He accepted a lectureship at Sydney University in 1962 where he began lecturing undergraduates in logic—introducing modern Russellian theory, displacing John Anderson’s long insistence on Aristotelian theory. There he met Val Plumwood (then Val Macrae, later Val Routley) and, in 1964, they moved to the University of New England where Sylvan joined Len Goddard and a growing department—the first to have begun teaching modern logic in Australia under Goddard in 1957. Goddard and Sylvan founded the first Australian Masters program in logic and formed the Australasian Association of Logic, and with Len Goddard, David Londey, Ross Brady, Malcolm Rennie and Val Plumwood, he developed what became known as the New England Group—working on non-classical logic and paradoxes, among other things—but Goddard left a few years later, returning to St Andrews in Scotland. In 1967, with a year’s sabbatical owing, Sylvan and Plumwood married (with Plumwood taking the name Routley) and they drove from the University to St Andrews to continue work with Goddard (traversing northern Australia, shipping the car from Darwin to Singapore, then overland into India and Pakistan, through the Middle East and Eastern Europe). Upon return, in 1968, Sylvan took a position at Monash University before being appointed to a Senior Fellowship in Philosophy in the Research School of Social Sciences at the Australian National University (ANU) in 1971, where he remained for the rest of his career. With only postgraduate students to supervise, his days teaching undergraduates was at an end. A number of researchers from the New England Group subsequently joined him there and, with the addition of Bob Meyer, Graham Priest, and others, a group re-formed around Sylvan at the ANU—the well-known Canberra Logic Group that went on to pioneering research in non-classical, especially relevant, logic. Through his contribution to the formation of research groups that were both innovative and productive, Sylvan influenced a whole generation of Australian philosophers and logicians. (For more on this history of modern logic in Australia, cf. Routley 1984c, Goddard 1992, and Brady and Mortensen 2014.)

The natural world also fascinated Sylvan. By the time of his death he had purchased, and worked to conserve, five large tracts of rich forest areas—four of which were subsequently bequeathed for conservation.

He took such a delight in nature, not so much the delight that a romantic might take in the overall beauty of it all, but a delight in its richness and complexity, in the detail that he found in the structure of mosses and in the behaviour of insects. … It’s as if in a strange way he was part of it …. (quoted in D. Hyde, Introduction to Eckert (ed.) 2018, xxv).

Within a year of arriving at the ANU (the centre of Australian forestry policy development), he and Plumwood became aware of plans for extensive clearing of “useless” native forest for pine plantations across the country and so began work on a sustained critique of Australian forestry practices (Routley and Routley 1973a) alongside joint work rethinking issues in environmental philosophy. The critical and “pugilistic” style of the book caused an uproar in forestry—with an attempt to suppress its publication (cf. Routley and Plumwood 1986). The repressive nature of the Australian forestry industry was widely understood from within, with one forestry insider commenting, on receipt of a letter from Sylvan early in the project, that: “for an Australian forester, receiving a letter from you is somewhat akin to a new Party member getting a birthday card from Alexander Solzhenitsyn” (Sylvan RSC, Box #45). Closer to home, they were also criticised by some colleagues who, in the days before applied philosophy had come of age, saw their work as “propaganda” rather than scholarly research. Despite resistance though, the book’s successful publication helped reform forestry in Australia, being subsequently described by a leading forestry expert as “monumentally important” and “the most incisive and devastating economic analysis of forestry … ever done in Australia” (Byron 1999, 53). All three editions published through the ANU Press between 1973 and 1975 sold out but by 1975 Sylvan was, remarkably, banned from using the ANU’s Forestry Department Library (the central store for documents relating to the development of national forestry policy) and further, planned editions were effectively stopped.

In 1975, Sylvan and Plumwood realised their dream of moving “off grid” into the temperate rainforest in the coastal ranges east of Canberra where they began building a house from local stone (one of five houses that Sylvan built over his life). Working first from a tent, then a shed, over the subsequent five years it took to build the house they produced much of their key work on relevant logic, neo-Meinongian metaphysics and environmental philosophy—often discussing philosophy while building with graduate students and guests who could be roped in to help. After a productive twenty-year partnership, Sylvan and Plumwood parted ways in 1983, and he married Louise Sylvan (née Merlin). That was also the year he changed his name from ‘Richard Routley’ to ‘Richard Sylvan’ while Val Routley, as she was then known, became Val Plumwood. Sylvan and Plumwood continued to work and correspond on closely related themes in environmental philosophy until Sylvan’s death in 1996.

While his students and research assistants found him supportive and kind, Sylvan’s style sometimes offended his peers. He could be very blunt in his assessment of other’s arguments and his shy demeanour and lack of small talk did little to counteract feelings of rude-dismissal—friend and colleague Bob Meyer commenting that he “was a difficult man; not only did he fail to suffer fools gladly, but he often disdained suffering them at all” (Meyer 1996). Sylvan himself also commented, for example, that his “Critique of Deep Ecology” (Sylvan 1985) would “risk offending many friends in the deeper ecology movement” (i) and, while he remained good friends with chief target Arne Naess, some were, no doubt, offended. It earned him the title ‘the bad boy of deep ecology’ (Orton 2005, Other Internet Resources)—still considered a “deep ecologist” despite the substance of his criticism concluding in his rejecting deep ecology in favour of what he termed “deep green theory”. Some who took offense on reading his response to their work would later go on to befriend and work with Sylvan, having gotten past his blunt exterior. But with opposing-authority there was rarely any rapprochement; his anti-authoritarianism was deep-rooted and his anarchist tendencies manifest—in both academic work and in his behaviour.

His publishing habits also drew attention. Seeking an outlet for longer papers and essays in the late 1970s, and wary of “profiteering” publishers, in the do-it-yourself spirit that infused much of Sylvan’s life he began publishing a number of pre-print series in the Research School of Social Sciences where he worked at the ANU. Beginning with work of the Canberra Logic Group, the “Yellow Series” (as it became known) included over twenty publications by Group members between 1978 and 1985. There followed other Series including work in logic, metaphysics, the philosophy of science and much of his own work in environmental philosophy. In total, there were over fifty such publications of which over half were Sylvan’s own work. The publications ranged from tens of pages to hundreds and could be purchased by post from the department for a few dollars. The largest, at just over one thousand pages (Exploring Meinong’s Jungle and Beyond), for example, was available in hardback for $10. Such anomalous publishing habits meant that a considerable amount of his work is now very hard to access (though, in some cases, republication through more usual channels is underway—e.g., Eckert (ed.) 2018; Hyde (ed.) 2019; and Weber (ed.) 2019).

He died in June 1996 aged 60, while entering a sacred temple in Bali to discuss Hindu philosophy with priests there. (For more details, see Hyde 2014.)

2. Logic

This section describes Sylvan’s work in logic. As in other areas of his philosophy, Sylvan was notable for his staunch defence of highly controversial and radical views—most strikingly, that classical logic is wrong, that non-classical logic is right, and that some contradictions may be true (see: dialetheism). What makes his work worth remembering is that he backed up such claims with rigorous (if contentious) arguments and mathematical details.

Sylvan’s work in logic can be viewed in part as a response to a wide range of paradoxes, such as the paradoxes of self-reference (like the Liar Paradox). He was equally focused on paradoxes of implication, and so was a leading developer of relevant logics, logics characterized by their concern that there be a meaningful connection between the antecedent and consequent of a conditional. These topics would lead him to be one of the founders of the so-called “Australasian school” of paraconsistent logic, logics that tolerate inconsistency without incoherence. He was perennially concerned with the universality of logic. Along with intrinsic interest, his logical research was always motivated by its eventual application to issues in metaphysics, ethics, and beyond.

2.1 Early work

This section describes Sylvan’s work in neutral quantification theory and significance logics. In both cases, he is concerned with granting legitimacy to otherwise discredited or rejected entities—the existence (or lack thereof) of objects that seem like perfectly good subjects of quantification in apparently true sentences; and the status of “nonsensical” sentences that seem like they are essential parts of good reasoning.

2.1.1 Quantification

From his earliest days at Princeton, Sylvan had argued that an adequate philosophy of science required quantification over non-existent objects (numbers, frictionless planes, etc.), and an adequate semantics for fictional discourse was also best pursued along these lines. (Cf. Routley 1965, 1966a, 1979a; Routley and Routley 1973b, 1979a.) For reasons discussed in Section 3 below, he followed Meinong in seeking a theory that includes non-existent objects, and a logic that can handle such objects.

A basic idea here (e.g., in Routley 1980) is to reassess the status of the existential quantifier: \(\exists\). It is commonplace amongst logicians, especially since Russell 1905 and especially Quine’s article “On What There Is”, to read this as ontologically loaded; so if \(\exists x Ax\) is true then some \(x\) exists and has property \(A\). Sylvan urges that we distinguish between particular claims (‘some \(x\) is \(A\)’) and existential claims (‘an existing \(x\) is \(A\)’). With the latter existential reading, it is impossible to claim that some things just do not exist; that amounts to saying something both exists and does not exist, so it exists after all. But with the former particular reading, the claim ‘some things do not exist’ comes out as intended, with its apparent natural language meaning. Because the existential interpretation of the backward ‘E’ symbol has become hopelessly entrenched, Sylvan introduced new symbols, ‘P’ (for particular) and its dual ‘U’ (universal), to act as neutral quantifiers. Thus the logical ground was laid for subsequent work in neo-Meinongian metaphysics (cf. Section 3).

This work, both the metaphysics and logic, led to a number of debates with David Lewis. Lewis (1990) argues that the apparently deep disagreement Sylvan has with ontologically loaded quantification might be dispelled by a translation manual, between his unconventional Meinongian reading and a conventional one (cf. Priest 2005, Section 7.9.):

  • when [Sylvan] says ‘is an object’ this can be replaced by ‘exists’;
  • when [Sylvan] says ‘exists’ this can be replaced by ‘is a concrete object’

If this is right, then it appears Sylvan is in danger of doing little more than quibbling about the use of the word ‘exists’ when it comes to abstract objects. But Lewis is self-critically aware that any misunderstanding may be mutual, and cautions that

To suppose that [Sylvan] mistakes mere terminological difference for profound philosophical disagreement is to accuse him of stupidity far beyond belief (Lewis 1990, 30).

Worry about communication difficulties between classical and non-classical logicians would be voiced by Lewis again, eventually declining to debate at all (Lewis 1999, and cf. Smart 1977).

2.1.2 Significance

With the formation of the New England Logic Group, we find the first instances of Sylvan pursuing the development of non-classical logics as a response to a range of paradoxes. A preliminary aspect to this work was the investigation of the fundamental notion of significance.

Especially in early 20th century philosophy, a popular means of dismissing various philosophical theses (say in metaphysics) was “on the grounds that they are nonsense, nonsignificant, absurd, meaningless, unintelligible, or logically odd” (Goddard and Routley 1973, 1). Such rejections are characteristic of logical positivism, taking a cue from Wittgenstein’s accusation that much of philosophy is “not false, but senseless [unsinnig]” [Tractatus 4.003] and therefore easy to ignore. By the late 1960s, it seemed to Routley and Goddard that Russell and others had succeeded in promoting a “meaninglessness” solution to various paradoxes like the Liar sentence, or the Russell contradiction,

the set \(R\) of all sets that are not members of themselves is a member of itself if and only if it is not a member of itself

According to various Russell/Tarski type theories, sentences are regimented to levels of a hierarchy and restricted in scope about what they can express; then liar-type sentences are, on this sort of solution, “nonsense”. Appeal to non-significance is then meant to avoid paradox. Goddard and Routley are concerned that philosophers have been too eager to condemn theses that “are neither gibberish nor ungrammatical” (4).

In response, Routley (1966b), Brady and Routley (1973), and Goddard and Routley (1973) argue for a logic of significance for the formal study of significance. The ideas here can be summed up in three theses. First, there are grammatically correct natural language sentences, containing only recognized vocabulary (say of English), which “are held to be meaningless” (Goddard and Routley 1973, 2); but “unlike seriously ungrammatical sentences, [they] can figure in valid arguments and can occur as unquoted components of grammatical sentences” (Routley 1969, 367). Second, such sentences require a non-classical and specifically three-valued logic. Meaningless sentences still must have some recognized status—and it is some status other than ‘true’ or ‘false’ (See Haack 1971, 1975, and Bradley 1978 for alternatives). As Brady and Sylvan put it,

We believe that the deep structure of natural languages, and hence of the languages in which philosophical problems are characteristically formulated, will have to be based on an enriched significance logic which has a third value—nonsense or nonsignificance—and not on a classical two-valued logic which only has truth and falsity as its values (Brady and Routley 1973, 211).

Third, all significance logics will need to be based on a common context logic, where a fixed context of use or circumstance determines the ‘significance principles’ of each logic (Cocchiarella 1984; cf. Ripley 2012, 101).

Sylvan and Goddard want a logic that can track (as opposed to simply deny) non-significant sentences, which we may think of as truth-value gaps. Their proposed logic of significance may be understood (see Szmuc and Omori 2018) as being based on a three-valued logic, weak Kleene, given by the following truth tables:

\[\begin{array}{c|c} & \neg \\ \hline t & f \\ \hline n & n \\ \hline f & t \end{array}\]
\[\begin{array}{c|c|c|c} \land & t & n & f \\ \hline t & t & n & f \\ \hline n & n & n & n \\ \hline f & f & n & f \end{array}\]
\[\begin{array}{c|c|c|c} \lor & t & n & f \\ \hline t & t & n & t \\ \hline n & n & n & n \\ \hline f & t & n & f \end{array}\]

The intermediate value, \(n\) (for ‘nonsense’), is to be read as, not a truth-value, but rather as a kind of meaninglessness. These matrices respect two basic conditions laid down in (Goddard and Routley 1973, 260), that

  • in the case of classical truth values \(t\) and \(f\), the tables just are those of classical logic, so that this is a generalization of the classical case
  • any sentence with a non-significant component itself becomes non-significant

An argument is valid on this logic iff there is no evaluation that interprets all the premises as true (value \(t\)) but the conclusion untrue (values \(f\) and \(n\)). This logic was further investigated by Brady (1980) and Bunder (1979, 1980a, 1980b). For criticism, see Lambert (1968) and Haack (1971, 1975).

This early work is transitional. Paradoxical sentences at this stage of Sylvan’s thinking may have a value, but certainly not that of ‘true’ (or ‘false’). This relatively conservative attitude would begin to fall away as his thinking developed.

2.2 Relevant and Paraconsistent Logic

This section describes Sylvan’s work as part of the Canberra Logic Group’s pioneering research on relevant and paraconsistent logics, and applications to naïve set theory. In the mid-1970s, Routley/Sylvan produced a closely interconnected body of work (1975; Routley and Meyer 1976, 1977, 1979; Routley et al. 1982), much of it in collaboration with Val Plumwood (then Routley), Meyer, Brady, and Priest (e.g., Priest and Routley 1983), circling around a few key ideas, the germs of which we have already met: universality; implication and entailment; and inconsistency. We now visit these in turn.

2.2.1 Universality

In 1975 Sylvan took up the idea of a universal semantics directly (although the title of his paper “Universal Semantics?” is in the uncertain form of a question). Inspired by recent advances in Montague grammar and categorial languages, he became speculatively interested in whether there is some common form beneath all natural languages, that could be adequately represented though logical symbolism. Specifically, he was interested in some “leading assumptions” of the time, namely (1975, 327):

  1. that the surface structure of a grammar can be transformed, or translated, or reduced, into a “deep structure”; and
  2. that the semantics of the deep structure is (some complication of) a two-valued possible worlds semantics.

Here we can see two recurring concerns in Sylvan’s logical work: a sceptical interest in the idea of a model-theoretic reduction (to be lambasted most vociferously with Meyer in their paper “Extensional Reduction” of 1977), and the uses of worlds semantics to do it.

As an initial gloss, a universal semantics, whatever else it may be, is intended to be a framework able to express everything that can be expressed. As in Section 2.1, there should not be any artificial constraints placed on what we might be able to reason well about (or, by extension, think about or imagine), nonsense or not. And a universal logic should not have, as theorems, anything that is patently incorrect. Putting these two ideas together, Sylvan was already convinced that “classical logic” is too strong to serve as the basis for any universal semantics, because it cannot express everything that is expressible, such as many intensional notions; and it does deliver apparently nonsensical theses such as the paradoxes of material implication (see Section 2.2.2 below). (These two aspects of a logic—the extent of the class of models it can describe, and the set of validities it yields—are inversely proportional; cf. Priest 2008, 36–7.)

On these grounds, Sylvan looked increasingly at non-classical logics as a better framework or foundation for any universal semantics. His 1977 manifesto “Ultralogic as universal?” introduces the titular subject (note again the question mark) as follows:

A universal logic, in the intended sense, is one which is applicable in every situation whether realised or not, possible or not. Thus a universal logic is like a universal key, which opens, if rightly operated, all locks. It provides a canon for reasoning in every situation, including illogical, inconsistent and paradoxical ones. Few prevailing logics stand up to such a test. … [A] universal logic should be adequate for mathematical and philosophical purposes—and also for logical functions in other areas such as biology, economics, astrology, theology, and so on (893).

Approaching any universal logic, according to Sylvan, would require extending the expressive power of classical logic, and concomitantly restricting its proving power.

Two possible misinterpretations of this “universalist” project should be flagged. First, Sylvan did not argue that some specific alternative logic is the absolutely correct one, or even that there should be one and only one correct alternative (see Section 3.3). Second, although he can sound rhetorically partisan and ideological, Sylvan’s approach was ultimately rather pragmatic: he couched theory choice in practical cost/benefit analyses familiar from conventional philosophy of science (Routley 1980a). On the meaning of ‘universality’ in this context see Mares (2019) and Nolan (2018). Brady’s 2006 book takes its title in part from Sylvan’s announced project, with a focus on logics for “meaning containment”.

2.2.2 Implication

Faced with the limitations of classical logic, Sylvan joined in the project of refining C.I. Lewis’s strict implication to overcome various paradoxes of the conditional. (See the encyclopedia entry on indicative conditionals.) For, according to the classical account of material implication \(\supset\), for any three random declarative sentences \(p\), \(q\), \(r\) you find on the Internet, \( (p \supset q) \lor (q \supset r) \) is valid (to take just one example; see Routley et al. 1982, 6–7). One diagnosis of the problem here is that all these conditionals, of the form ‘if \(p\) then \(q\)’, display irrelevance: the antecedent \(p\) need not have anything “to do with” the consequent \(q\), whereas correct natural language conditionals (so the argument goes) always respect some kind of relevant connection. The problem may be resolved by turning to an appropriate relevant logic.

Sylvan is explicit, though, that his “main concern is not really relevance at all—the appropriate sort of relevance is a by-product of any good implication relation, which comes out in the wash” (Routley et al. 1982, x) after a deeper diagnosis of the paradoxes. He emphasizes that what is really at issue for a successful account of a conditional is absolute sufficiency—that when \(p\) really does imply \(q\), this means that \(p\) is all that is needed for \(q\).

The central deducibility relation of ultramodal logics, entailment, is intended to capture the notion of sufficiency … of the antecedent of an entailment on its own, without any additional imported truth, especially imported logical truths. … Sufficiency is a go-anywhere notion, which is not limited by the fact that the situation in which it operates is somehow classically incoherent, e.g., inconsistent or paradoxical. If \(A\) is sufficient for \(B\) then it does not matter what else goes on; logical laws may go haywire but nothing subtracts from \(A\)’s sufficiency (1977, 896).

So while Sylvan’s contribution to relevant logic was seminal, his concerns diverged from some other “relevantists”. In some otherwise highly critical remarks, Burgess (1983, 45) writes that “Routleyanism and Andersonianobelnapianism are so dissimilar that it is misleading to apply a single label ‘relevantism’ to both. (And indeed, [Sylvan] sometimes adopts a different label.)”

The diagnosis of the paradoxes of implication as failures of respect for sufficiency leads naturally to an alternative path to their resolution, of a piece with Sylvan’s concerns about universality. On this view, the paradoxes of implication are symptoms of taking too few possibilities into account. One may think of classical material implication as taking only one situation into account, giving rise to theorems like ‘if \(p\) then \(q\), or if \(q\) then \(p\)’, since either \(p\) is true (in which case, \(p\) or \(\twiddle q\) is true, and so q materially implies \(p\)) or else \(p\) is false (in which case, \(\twiddle p\) or \(q\) is true, and so \(p\) materially implies \(q\)). This is immediately resolved upon consideration of two possibilities, \(w_0\) and \(w_1\),

\[\begin{array}{c} w_0 \\ p, \twiddle q \\ \end{array}\]
\[\begin{array}{c} w_1 \\ \twiddle p, q \end{array}\]

and thinking of ‘if \(p\) then \(q\)’ as meaning that in every world in which \(p\), also \(q\), i.e.,

\[ p \rightarrow q := \mathit{necessarily}, p \supset q \]

Then ‘\(p \rightarrow q, \mathrm{or}\, q \rightarrow p\)’ has a counterexample, points at which p holds without q and vice versa, showing a failure of sufficiency exactly because more worlds are considered.

The key to solving the paradoxes and approaching universality, on this approach, is to broaden the collection of worlds, in order to sieve out what sufficiency relations persist. Sylvan extends this strategy to deal with other paradoxes of implication, such as the irrelevant \( q \rightarrow (p \rightarrow p) \).

Since \(p\) does imply \(p\), \(p \rightarrow p\), i.e., at every world in which \(p\), also \(p\), then to show that arbitrary \(q\) is not sufficient for this self-implication, there needs to be a counterexample: one where \(q\) holds without \(p \rightarrow p\). Generally, to preserve sufficiency, the same strategy goes for any logical truth, \(B\): if we are to avoid \(A \rightarrow B\) when \(B\) is logically necessary but irrelevant to \(A\), there must be points at which even logical truths fail. For example, there would be a world at which the law of non-contradiction \(\twiddle (A \amp \twiddle A)\) fails. These points are known as non-normal or impossible worlds, about which there is a growing literature (e.g., Nolan 2013; Berto and Jago 2019).

The logics being proposed here, then, are naturally paraconsistent: they do not validate the “spread” law: (\(p \amp \twiddle p) \rightarrow q\), and so can putatively handle inconsistency without collapse into triviality. (In Sociative Logics, Sylvan refers to these as pararelevant logics.) Indeed, with counterexamples to the law of non-contradiction, there would be worlds where some sentences are both true and false.

The first relevant logics were presented proof theoretically, in terms of axioms and closure under rules. The need for a model theoretic interpretation (given in a classical metatheory) resulted in Sylvan’s co-development with Plumwood of ternary relation semantics for first degree entailment relevant logics (Routley and Routley 1972) and the ensuing Routley-Meyer partnership that proved and extended a range of results for relevant logics (cf. Routley, Meyer, et al. 1982; and Brady 2003). (Cf. Fine 1974; Urquhart 1972.) A Routley-Meyer frame \(\langle W, N, 0, R, {}^* \rangle\) consists of:

  • a set of worlds \(W\),
  • among which are the normal worlds \(N\), the others being non-normal;
  • a distinguished world \(0\), thought of as our actual world;
  • a three-place relation between worlds \(R\);
  • and a function \(^*\) from worlds to worlds called the Routley Star.

An evaluation then assigns formulas a truth-value at each world; so some \(p\) may be true at one world but false at another. With the Routley star, these may even be the same world. The conditions on implication and negation are as follows:

  • \(A \rightarrow B\) is true at world \(x\) iff for all \(y, z\) such that \(R(xyz)\): if \(A\) is true at \(y\), then \(B\) is true at \(z\)
  • \(\twiddle A\) is true at world \(x\) iff \(A\) is false at world \(x^{*}\).

Nothing prevents both \(A\) and \(\twiddle A\) being true at some worlds; indeed, respecting relevance demands it. These conditions can be seen as generalizations of more standard ones: in the case of implication, if \(y = z\) then this is just a modalized material conditional in a Kripke frame; in the case of negation, if \(x = x^*\) then this is just the clause for negation in classical logic. For further details, see the entry on relevance logic, Mares (2004), and Priest (2008, ch. 10). On the Routley star see Restall (1999).

Routley/Myer semantics has generated an enormous secondary literature (cf. the secondary literature section of the bibliography), for example Copeland 1979, 1983, Thomas 2015. Debates have surrounded: the interpretation of the semantics (e.g., the ternary relation, the Routley-star operator, non-normal worlds); alternative semantics for relevant logics; the adequacy of non-classical responses to semantic and set-theoretic paradoxes; dialetheism; and naïve set theory. For recent work about the ternary relation see Beall et al 2012; for a recent exchange about the Routley star and negation, see Berto 2015, De and Omori 2018, and Berto and Restall 2019.

2.2.3 Inconsistency

Sylvan’s instrumental need for inconsistent worlds in order to account for implication led to tentative endorsement of the possibility of true contradictions (dialetheism). Most relevant logicians thought of these “worlds” merely as artefacts of the semantics, not as legitimate possibilities (indeed—they’re impossible!); but there the idea was, of “dialectical” or contradictory worlds. By (1976), he and Meyer consider a rather literal interpretation of Hegelian dialectic, and openly question the “Consistency Hypothesis” that the world is consistent. They urge instead a “dialectical” possibility. They present the (relevant) logic DL (for dialectical logic), and give it an axiomatization that explicitly includes an outright contradiction \(p \amp \twiddle p\) as an axiom. (Smiley calls this “Routley and Meyer’s war work” (Smiley and Priest 1993, 17). See also van Benthem 1979, Havas 1981.)

When Graham Priest arrived in Australia and presented his ‘Logic of Paradox’ to the 1976 meeting of the Australasian Association of Logic, another intensely productive partnership was struck. With true contradictions—later to be named dialetheia by Sylvan and Priest—in view, the potential of surpassing classical logic opened up:

The liberating effect of giving up the classical faith … is immense: … one is free to return to something like the grand simplicity of naive set theory, to semantically closed natural languages (having abandoned the towering but ill-constructed and mostly unfinished hierarchies of formal languages), and to intuitive accounts of truth, of proof, and of many other intensional notions (1979b, 302).

Dialetheism, especially due to Priest, has prompted a long and growing discussion (see Priest 1987 [2006] and Beall 2009 for defences and e.g., Field 2008 for some useful criticism; see the bibliography in the entry on dialetheism for more).

Sylvan’s thinking about contradictions evolved, depending on his co-author, even over the course of a book. In Relevant Logics and their Rivals (1982), early chapters float dialetheism as a hypothesis, in an “agnostic” spirit (61), or that of taking precautions; whereas later in the book, it states bluntly that “mathematics is inconsistent” (255). (The shift is criticized by Urquhart in a 1988 review (Brady 2003, 2).)

As mentioned in the quote above, Sylvan saw that something like the “dialectical logic” DL could be used to underwrite inconsistent but non-trivial mathematical and scientific theories, which had been of interest to him since the start. Of particular note is naïve set theory, used by Cantor, Dedekind, and Frege in the foundations of mathematics (see the entry on the early development of set theory), but dealt an apparently fatal blow by Russell’s paradox circa 1900. Building from work by Brady (1971), naïve set theory as formulated with the implication connective ‘\(\rightarrow\)’ of DL (or the slightly weaker DK) takes as axioms that there is a set for every property \(A\), i.e.,

\[ \mathrm{P}y \mathrm{U}x (x \in y \leftrightarrow A(x)) \]

where ‘\(\in\)’ is read ‘is a member of’ and with Sylvan’s preferred particular and universal quantifiers (see Section 2.1); and that sets are determined by their members, i.e.,

\[ \mathrm{U} z (z \in x \leftrightarrow z \in y) \rightarrow x = y. \]

On the basis of these axioms, comprehension and extensionality, in Routley (1977) he begins to sketch out what he hopes will be the “rehabilitation” of naïve set theory and more using ultralogic.

A basic derivation in this set theory is that the Russell set exists, and is both a member of itself and not a member of itself. The paradoxes, in other words, are proofs, and the resulting contradictions are theorems (1979b, 302). Sylvan sketches the further work needed to show that elementary principles such as the Zermelo-Fraenkel axioms and their immediate consequences can be derived. And he speculates, much more ambitiously, that the Axiom of Choice and the Continuum Hypothesis could be decided as well; see Weber (2012). Priest 2006, chapter 18 is a discussion of paraconsistent set theory in this tradition.

The project was given an essential boost when Brady confirmed the non-triviality of the theory in the late 70s, i.e., that there are (absurd) sentences that cannot be proved in this theory, results which appeared as Brady (1989); see (Brady 2006). Further work in relevant arithmetic, by Routley, Meyer, Mortensen, Dunn, Priest, Restall, and others, followed. This led to the area now known as inconsistent mathematics, carried forward especially by Mortensen (1995, 2010), where e.g., the Routley star is used as a functor to great effect; see the entry on inconsistent mathematics for further references.

2.3 Applications

This section mentions briefly some other applications of Sylvan’s preferred logics to a wide range of philosophical problems. Sylvan saw applications as a test for the choice of such theories over rival logics. Sections 3 and 4 are in a way extended discussions of such applications. Sylvan argued that relevant and, more broadly, what he termed “sociative logics” had applications in areas as diverse as causation, an analysis of knowledge, vagueness (including the idea that there are vague objects; see Sylvan and Hyde 1993), and value theory. Here we sketch two such applications, in confirmation, and computation.

2.3.1 Confirmation

Following Goddard (1977), Sylvan (along with Nola, in 1991) applies relevant logic to solve the paradoxes of confirmation made famous by Hempel. These are problems in philosophy of science about formulating inductive generalizations such as

  1. All ravens are black,

which is confirmed by instances of things which are both black and ravens; but the universal generalization is logically equivalent to its contrapositive form

  1. All non-black things are non-ravens,

which would similarly be confirmed by any non-black non-raven; but since e.g., a red pencil is obviously not confirmation that all ravens are black, something has gone wrong. For Sylvan, the problem—as is often his diagnosis—lies in the formalization of the natural language claims—“It is well-known in relevance circles that the most outrageous of these paradoxes are automatically removed by replacement of the material conditional …” (2000a, 227). “A relevance shift,” he argues with typical restraint, “is a sure-fire way of knocking out all the paradoxes of confirmation” (2000a, 232.). For discussion, see Fitelson (2006).

2.3.2 Computation

Along other lines, Sylvan made tentative steps in the foundations of recursion theory, towards a non-classical theory of computation (cf. Copeland and Sylvan 1999; Sylvan 2000a). According to work by Turing, Church, and Gödel in the 1930s, computers face logical limits on what they can compute (see the entry on the Church-Turing thesis and the entry on computability and complexity). Uncomputability proofs, though, bear a very strong resemblance to the derivations of Russell’s paradox and other diagonal paradoxes. If “dialectical” logic can be used to solve those paradoxes, though—essentially, by accepting that they have truly contradictory conclusions (see Section 2.2 above)—then could the same be done in the case of computers? Then the conclusion would be, not that there are uncomputable algorithms, but rather “there are more algorithmic functions than all algorithmic functions” (2000a, 195). Sylvan envisions “dialeth[e]ic machines”; cf. Weber (2016).

2.4 Summary

Sylvan’s approach to logic is of a piece with his work in metaphysics and ethics: a polemical rebuke of the perceived powers of the day—in the case of logic, the hegemony of classical logic—and a highly imaginative and open-minded attitude towards what sorts of entities—possible and impossible alike—our best theories should condone. We turn now to these other aspects of his work.

3. Ontology and Metaphysics

In this section, we present Sylvan’s work in ontology and metaphysics. As discussed below, Sylvan was deeply inspired by Alexius Meinong but, as a matter of terminology, their understanding of ‘ontology’ and ‘metaphysics’ differ: while Meinong would situate metaphysics and ontology as small corners within a more general object theory, Sylvan situated them the other way around. (See, for instance, Meinong 1904, §2 and §11; Sylvan 1995a, 47). In what follows, we follow Sylvan and employ what we take to be contemporary standard usage of ‘ontology’ (roughly understood as the study of what exists and what does not) and ‘metaphysics’ (roughly understood as the study of the structure of reality), while acknowledging that Meinong-scholars might dispute this use of terms. In Section 3.1, we sketch some of the essential features of noneism, that is, Sylvan’s theory about non-existent objects. In Section 3.2, we discuss Sylvan’s attempt at expanding the horizons of traditional ontology by developing a new theory called sistology. Finally, in Section 3.3, we summarize Sylvan’s heterodox account of pluralism, labelled plurallism.

3.1 Noneism

From 1965 on, Sylvan argued that, through the influence of Quine, contemporary philosophy is committed to a fundamental mistake. Such a mistake, labelled the “Ontological Assumption” (cf. 1980), is represented by the view that one cannot make true statements about what does not exist. In opposition to this idea, Sylvan develops a theory about (non-existent) objects or, in Sylvan’s jargon, items—noneism.

[Noneism is] a very general theory of all items whatsoever, of those that are intensional and those that are not, of those that exist and those that do not (…); it is a theory of the logic and properties and kinds of properties of all items (1980, 5–6)

Sylvan’s intuition is that, in order to be able to say something true about non-existent items, we need to allow for the possibility that non-existent items have properties. For instance, in order to be able to say that ‘Sherlock Holmes is a detective’ is true, Sherlock Holmes needs to have the property of being a detective. Now, according to Sylvan, a suitable philosophical background for supporting this intuition is Meinong’s Theory of Objects. For this reason, in Exploring Meinong’s Jungle and Beyond (Routley 1980), Sylvan tries to deliver a modern logical presentation of Meinong’s philosophy. He writes:

Meinong’s theory provides a coherent scheme for talking and reasoning about all items, not just those which exist, without the necessity for distorting or unworkable reductions; and in doing so it attributes … features [properties] to nonentities [non-existent objects] (1980, iv–v).

At nearly 1000 pages, Routley (1980) develops noneism in great detail. We summarize it in five main theses, which represent the core assumptions of what Sylvan calls minimal noneism (from now on MN). First of all, following Meinong’s account of intentionality, Sylvan believes that:

  • (MN1) “everything whatever (…) is an object [an item]”

(1980, 1–2; 352). In other words, every time we refer to something, we refer to an item. If I tell a story about Sherlock Holmes, I tell a story about an item, namely that item that is the subject matter of my story.

The second thesis is that:

  • (MN2) “very many objects [items] do not exist”

(1980, 2–3). Sylvan follows Meinong in claiming that some items exist (e.g., the Eiffel Tower) and some others do not (e.g., Sherlock Holmes). Like Meinong, Sylvan treats existence as a property: some items have the property of being red and some other items do not; some items have the property of being existent (e.g., the Eiffel Tower) and some items do not (e.g., Sherlock Holmes). When items do not have the property of being existent, they are non-existent items. In Sylvan’s jargon, they are “nonentities”.

Furthermore, according to the third and fourth theses:

  • (MN3) “non-existent objects [items] are constituted in one way or another”

(1980, 2–3), and

  • (MN4) “every object [item] has the ‘characteristics’ it has irrespective of whether it exists”

(1980, 2–3). Thesis (MN3) corresponds to Meinong’s indifference principle: the properties an item has are indifferent to the ontological status of the item itself. Thesis (MN4) corresponds to Meinong’s independence principle: an item’s having properties is independent of whether the item in question exists or not.

As many have pointed out (cf. Russell 1905 and 1907; see also Berto 2013 and Priest 2005), the original theory defended by Meinong faces problems. In particular, Meinong’s theory is threatened by triviality (Berto 2013, 106–107); that is, the situation in which everything exists—including items that clearly do not. E.g., if I refer to not just to Sherlock Holmes but to “the existing Sherlock Holmes”, then it seems by (MN4) that Sherlock Holmes exists.

In order to resolve this issue, Sylvan makes two moves. First of all, he introduces the distinction between characterizing and non-characterizing properties. The former are necessary in order to define the essence of an object. A characterizing property is a property (e.g., being a detective or being smart) that is necessary in order to make a specific item (e.g., Sherlock Holmes) the item that it is. Using Sylvan’s words:

Characterizing predicates [or properties] are those which specify what an item is like, in itself. They tell how an item is in fact. They give its description. A good dossier of an item would perhaps give its characterization first, by way of its characterization features [or properties] (Sylvan 1995b).

On the other hand, the non-characterizing properties are all those properties that are not characterizing. According to Sylvan, the property of being existent is a non-characterizing property.

As it has been extensively argued in the secondary literature (see, for instance, Priest 2005), the difference between these two kinds of properties is unclear. It is also fair to say that, even though some (neo-)Meinongians have tried to cash out such a distinction in more precise terms (see, for instance, Jacquette 2015 and 2017; Parsons 1978 and 1980), there is little consensus that any progress has been made. That being said, even though it is certainly difficult to have strict criteria to separate the characterizing properties from the non-characterizing ones, it is absolutely clear that:

  • (MN5) “neither existence nor non-existence is a characterizing property”

(1980, 2). This is the fifth and last thesis.

The second move Sylvan makes in response to the triviality problem is represented by the idea that, even though it is the case that every time we refer to something we refer to an item, the item in question has characterizing properties. Following Berto (2013), we can also say that, consistent with some other neo-Meinongians (i.e., Jacquette 2015; Parsons 1980), Sylvan argues in favour of the following characterization principle:

for any set of characterizing properties, some item satisfies it.

Consider, for example, Sherlock Holmes. When we refer to Sherlock Holmes, we refer to an item (because of (MN1)). Moreover, even though Sherlock Holmes does not exist (because of (MN2)), he has some characterizing properties (because of (MN3) and (MN4)). For instance, according to Doyle’s novels, Sherlock Holmes is a smart detective. If so, in Sherlock Holmes’s set of characterizing properties, there are, at least, two properties: being a detective and being smart. However, the property being non-existent is not in this set because it is a non-characterizing property. And this is guaranteed by (MN5).

As we have already specified above, minimal noneism is merely the core of Sylvan’s noneism which is more elaborate and sophisticated than sketched here. Exactly because of its complexity, noneism forces us to rethink some of our traditional approaches to important philosophical topics. Examples are intensionality, nonexistence, impossibilia, and paradoxicality. Moreover, in the light of these conceptual innovations, Sylvan also discusses some of the relevant applications of noneism in philosophy of mathematics (cf. 1980, 769–781 and 791–833), philosophy of perception (cf. 1980, 649–678), philosophy of time (cf. 1980, 361–410); philosophy of science (cf. 1980, 781–791) and philosophy of fiction (cf. 1980, 537–595).

Sylvan spent many years developing and defending noneism, but he was not entirely satisfied with it. He had two major complaints. On the one hand, he thought that his way of presenting noneism was rhetorically problematic: EMJB was too long, rambling, and not incisive enough. As such, EMJB needed to be rewritten (see Sylvan 1995b). On the other hand, he aimed at “liberalizing noneism” by allowing all items to have both characterizing and non-characterizing properties (Sylvan 1995b). Archival documents show that, to this end, Sylvan tried to develop a new theory that has many features in common with so-called “modal Meinongianism”, recently defended by Priest. On these issues, see Casati (2018), Griffin (2018), Kroon (2019), Priest (2005).

3.2 Sistology

In late life, Sylvan aimed at enriching the ideas defended in Routley (1980) by developing what he calls “sistology”. On the one hand, sistology adopts all the fundamental ideas of noneism. Like noneism, sistology includes items that do not exist (cf. Sylvan 1991, 837; 1997, 11–12) and it accepts that those items have properties (cf. 1991, 838–39). On the other hand, sistology develops and enriches noneism in the following ways.

To begin with, Sylvan tried to move the focus of his attention from the existence (or non-existence) of items to their being items. Using Sylvan’s words, sistology is concerned with “all items as having standing” (1991, 838). Thus, sistology aims at casting a new light on what it means to be an item instead of showing that it is possible to have non-existent items. The latter project was the unique task of noneism.

Secondly, Sylvan tried to extend and deepen the catalogue of items he dealt with in Routley (1980). In an unpublished manuscript, Sylvan described an imaginary museum in which all sorts of items are accepted. Among those items that have not been (comprehensively) discussed in his (1980), Sylvan listed:

  1. vacancies, vacuums (such as holes, empty bowls, valleys, and absences);
  2. wholes, aggregations (such as the totality, everything, the universal set, and the Cosmos);
  3. significant ideological objects (such as the Tao, Buddhist ultimate reality, Nirvana, Jehovah); and
  4. inconsistent objects (such as the square circle).

In particular, Sylvan devoted significant effort to this last cluster of items, underscoring the idea they require the employment of a paraconsistent logic. Given that inconsistent items have inconsistent properties, if classical logic is employed then triviality immediately follows. In order to avoid trivialism, the adoption of a paraconsistent logic is required.

Consider, for instance, inconsistent objects. (…) By virtue of what they are, they have contradictory properties, thereby trivializing any theory built upon mainstream logic. An authentic sistology requires logical reformulation of a more demanding paraconsistent type (Sylvan 1991, 839).

The third and last attempt to develop noneism is represented by a serious engagement with the notion of a “source”. As he had already discussed, a “source” is what allows us to understand the charactering properties that an item (cf. 1980, 463; 1995a). The source of Anna Karenina’s characterizing properties is Tolstoy’s Anna Karenina. In sistology, Sylvan aims at deepening our understanding of sources by admitting that not all of them are equally reliable. For instance, optical illusions teach us that visual perceptions are not always a trustworthy source for characterizing the items we see. For this reason, Sylvan suggests introducing two kinds of predicates. The first kind (call them “ordinary predicates”) tell us how items look; the second kind (call them “non-ordinary predicates”) tell us how items really are.

Not all sources are always reliable or otherwise satisfactory; for example, perceptual sources are notoriously unreliable as to how things really are. (…) Thus, [the] division of [ordinary and non-ordinary] properties is presumed (1991, 839; italics ours).

Sistology, which is only sketched by Sylvan, nevertheless anticipates some of the ideas currently debated among neo-Meinongians, for example, as discussed above, with “items in general”. Regardless of the existence or non-existence of these items, sistology concerns their “having standing” (1991, 839). In so doing, Sylvan focuses his attention on one of the most under-researched notions of Meinong’s theory of objects, that is, the so-called doctrine of Outsidebeing [Aussersein]. Only recently have neo-Meinongian started to turn their attention to this topic (Casati and Priest 2017; Grossman 1974; Jacquette 2015). So too with the very particular kind of object that is “nothingness” (cf. Sylvan 1995a). After a long-standing lack of interest in these topics, neo-Meinongians have begun to take them into serious consideration as well (Casati and Fujikawa 2019; Priest 2014a and 2014b; Jacquette 2013).

3.3 Plural(l)ism

In the current philosophical landscape, there are many different forms of pluralism on offer. For instance, there is an ontological form of pluralism (there are different ways of being), truth pluralism (there are different ways of being true), and there is a logical form of pluralism (there is more than one correct logic; see the entry on logical pluralism). However, it is almost universally assumed, if mostly unstated, that there can be no pluralism about the actual world—this one is the only actual one. As should appear clear from this entry, though, Sylvan was accustomed to challenging the philosophical consensus. He began by attacking classical logic, he continued by questioning the so-called Ontological Assumption and, late in his career, he decided to challenge what he calls one-world-ism, that is, the idea that there is only one actual world.

Sylvan argues that there is a plurality of actual worlds we all live in. In his Transcendental Metaphysics (1997) he claims:

A theme, to be defended at length, is that while there is an actual world, which is suitably external, mind-independent, perceiver-independent, and the like, it is not unique. There are many actual worlds. That theme is bound to strike others, as it still occasionally strikes me momentarily, as utterly outrageous. [My] work and arguments are designed to remove this misconception (1997, 4).

In order to draw a clear distinction between his pluralism and the others, he refers to his own theory with a neologism: plurallism. The aims of such a theory are summarized as follows:

The overarching themes of plurallism are (…): (1) There is no unique world. There is no unique actual universe; (2) There is no one unalterable truth; no single Way of Truth; (3) There is no single correct Scientific Theory (1997, 4).

In order to support these ideas, Sylvan presents two sets of arguments.

Sylvan argues indirectly there is a lack of (good) arguments in favour of the uniqueness of the actual world. From the fact that there is such a thing as an actual world it does not necessarily follow that such a world is unique, nor is its uniqueness observable (cf. 1997, 54–60).

On the other hand, he directly supports plurallism by arguing that for each area of research, there is (or there could be) a plurality of correct theories. His reasoning goes as follows. All theories are grounded on logic because logic is necessary for reasoning about both the data used by those theories and the theories themselves. And, if there is, not just one, but a plurality of correct logics, there is (or there could be) a plurality of correct theories which spring from all those different, but all equally acceptable, ways of reasoning as well (cf. 1997, 61–74). From this, a plurality of actual worlds follows if we accept two enthymematic assumptions. The first one is that any correct logic, in virtue of its being correct, properly describes an actual world. If so, if there is more than one correct logic, there is more than one actual world too. The second assumption, then, is that there are many correct logics. This idea was not shared by Sylvan’s contemporaries but one that he came to defend late in his career, claiming (1997, xix) “that not merely is there a plurality of logics, but there is also [a plurality] of correct logics”. The idea is elaborated on in Sylvan (1997, ch. 4) and is now widely discussed in the literature (see, for instance, Beall and Restall 2000; Russell 2008; Weber 2017b). Sylvan claims that phenomenological data seems to support plurallism as well (cf. 1997, 118–133).

Sylvan’s motivations for developing plurallism are not uniquely philosophical. On the contrary, he believes that the existence of the plurality of actual worlds can have important political consequences too. One of those consequences is the extension and strengthening of our idea of tolerance. According to Sylvan, intolerant behaviours are often, if not always, grounded on ideologies driven by what he calls the “one-true-way” (1997, 462) or the “one-admissible-way” (1997, 462). Governments, religious groups, and even scientists believe that “truth should be imposed” (1997, 462) where truth is what is uniquely determined by them. Plurallism invites us to entertain the idea that, as there is no such thing as a unique actual world, there is no such thing as a unique truth. And this should undermine the ideological roots of intolerant behaviours.

3.4 Summary

In many ways, Sylvan’s philosophical and logical research is devoted to the attempt to be inclusive, open-minded, and, therefore, tolerant. Contra the Quinean admiration for desert landscape, Sylvan admired an over-crowded jungle of ideas in which different logics, all sorts of items, and a plurality of actual worlds could peacefully coincide.

4. Moral Philosophy

In this section we describe Sylvan’s work in moral philosophy. His seminal and frequently reprinted (1973; see also SEP entry “Environmental Ethics” Section 2) was, alongside Naess (1973), the first published work in environmental ethics and began a central debate in the area, one concerned with intrinsic value in nature. Elaborated on in Routley and Routley (1979b) and (1980a), this work developed arguments against what he termed “human chauvinism”—the view that humans are exceptional in being the sole locus of intrinsic value, all else having merely instrumental value. Alongside this work in environmental ethics more broadly, which was to continue until his death, he also published in defence of pacifism, against nuclear war, and was one of the first philosophers to point to the emerging moral issues associated with anthropogenic global warming.

4.1 The Last Man Example

Developing out of influential work condemning Australian forestry practices in the early 1970s, (cf. Routley and Routley 1973a, Byron 1999), Routley (1973)—“Is There a Need for a New, an Environmental, Ethic?”—presents a thought experiment designed to test what Sylvan took to be a core principle of Western ethical systems, the Freedom Principle:

One should be able to do what he wishes, providing (1) that he does not harm others and (2) that he is not likely to harm himself irreparably (1973, 15)

He calls this principle basic human chauvinism “because under it humans, or people [whether present or future], come first and everything else a bad last”—a view later characterized as “anthropocentric” in the much expanded discussion of The Last Man Example in Routley and Routley (1980a, cf. 96).

We are invited to consider a world in collapse where humanity is reduced to a single person who then proceeds to eliminate, to the best of their abilities, “every living thing, animal or plant (but painlessly if you like, as at the best abattoirs).” (1973, 16) With the demise of the last man (which we may suppose occurs immediately prior to the wholesale destruction unleashed), there are no humans—either others or the last man himself—who could be harmed by such an act and so, with clauses (1) and (2) satisfied, the act is permissible according to the “human chauvinist” Western ethical systems. (And even if “others” were extended to include non-human sentient creatures, still no harm, understood as suffering, would accrue given the act is done “painlessly”.) Yet, “what he does is wrong” and therewith we have a counterexample to such chauvinism and associated Western ethical systems, and a claimed need for a new ethic, “an environmental ethic”, capable of accounting for the wrongness of the last man’s act. (As in his logical work, Sylvan’s strategy is to try to isolate what is sufficient (in this case, for wrongness) by considering “distant” possible worlds.)

Granting the wrongness of the last man’s act, is a “new ethic” really required? Preference utilitarianism has been considered as a “traditional” ethic capable of condemning the last man. (Cf. Elliot 1980, 20 and 23; and Carter 2004, 51–52 for a more limited condemnation along preference utilitarian grounds.) Where there is an overwhelming preference for preservation of the world beyond the death of the last man, and its destruction would thus harm those having such a preference, the Freedom Principle would already appear to prohibit such an act (assuming the aggregated harm outweighs any benefit in the satisfaction of contrary preferences). But notice that condemnation, on this view, is highly contingent, depending on people’s preferences (condemnation is justified only if preferences conflict with destruction). Since the condemnation is thought to be warranted with “no ifs and buts”, yet this “traditional” response offers the correct judgement only in special circumstances, for Sylvan, it counts as “too parochial” (Routley 1973, 20). (Cf. Lamb 2018, 532–3 for a similar point.)

Reacting, in part, to Leopold’s call for a “land ethic”, Sylvan’s subsequent work in the area (much of the early work with Val Routley, later Val Plumwood) proceeds to describe and argue for just such a non-anthropocentric, environmental ethic. A dominant aspect of this “new” ethic (indeed, a characterising feature in Elliot 1980) that was fixed on by subsequent authors was the extension of non-instrumental, “intrinsic” or “final” values to the non-human world. First mentioned in 1974 in early drafts of Routley and Routley (1980a) and subsequently Val Routley (1975), Rolston (1975), and Callicott (1979)—who all employ versions of the Last Man Example—the extension is described and defended at length in Routley and Routley (1980a). (Sylvan assumes intrinsic value is, in general, already assured on the familiar Aristotelian ground that instrumental value requires intrinsic value, lest vicious regress ensue—cf. Aristotle Metaphysics, 994b9–15.)

Sylvan and Plumwood hypothesise that what underpins the deontic prohibition of the last man’s act is the truth of the axiological claim that entities in non-human nature can possess more than mere instrumental value—non-human nature “can have value and create obligations not reducible (in any way) to human interests” (1980a, 129). While such items may have instrumental value, value as a means to human ends, advantaging us in various ways—e.g., the value of forests in supplying water for human consumption—they might also have “non-instrumental”, or what the Routleys called “intrinsic” value (1980a, 126 and 129). Thus, the rejection of human chauvinism in its deontological form (the assertion of and the argument to the falsity of the Freedom Principle) was accompanied by its rejection in axiological form: not only humans have intrinsic value; non-human nature may also be the locus of intrinsic (non-instrumental) value.

While accepting that we may have moral obligations with respect to or regarding entities in the non-human world, Routley (1973, 19) and Routley and Routley (1980a, 174ff) deny that this entails our having obligations to them and deny, too, their having correlative rights. Sylvan rejects such an extension of rights to non-human entities. For this reason, he takes the “new environmental ethic” to “differ markedly” from alternatives like Leopold’s land ethic. As it developed, it also differed markedly from most forms of utilitarianism for a broad range of reasons, arguing instead for a deontologically constrained “optimisation approach to value theory”. (See Routley and Routley 1985; Sylvan 1992.) Variants of Last Man counterexamples to traditional Western ethics are also taken to show that the distribution of intrinsic value extends beyond sentient individuals—contra “animal liberationists” (1980a, 125) like Singer—so that “candidates for value … include all objects” (1980a, 140).

Resisting Sylvan’s broad push for a non-anthropocentric, environmental ethic are several arguments suggesting the inevitability of human chauvinism. Foremost among them are arguments that, he claims, “parallel” arguments for egoism. Their rejection follows similar grounds for rejection of egoism—cf. Routley and Routley (1979b, esp. 47). This paper also distinguishes strong forms of human chauvinism (endorsing what Sylvan later termed the sole value assumption: that only members of the human class and some of their possible states have intrinsic value) from weaker forms that merely endorse, for example, “the Greater Value Thesis: the invariable allocation of greater value or preference … to humans, while not however entirely excluding non-humans from moral consideration” (ibid., 36)—a thesis also rejected by Sylvan. Paske (1991) defends a qualified version of the thesis; the moral differentiation in favour of most humans can be justified (by appeal to deontologically-constrained hedonic consequentialism). Attfield (1981), considering versions of the Last Man Example, also rejects strong human chauvinism while defending the greater value thesis, thus defending a weak chauvinism in Sylvan’s sense. “The good of trees might outweigh some of our whims: but it does not outweigh our interests except where our interests depend on it” (1981, 51).

Petersen and Sandin, on the other hand, defend a strong form of human chauvinism, arguing that the Last Man Example is subject to varying responses depending on the motives attending the act of elimination. They thus reject the hypothesis of intrinsic values in nature, arguing instead that any supposed wrongness “can be better explained by precepts about last man’s character traits and motives” (2013, 133). It remains open whether such a response is adequate for the Last People Example (described by Sylvan immediately following the Last Man Example) who may be said to act “for the best of reasons” though they have acted “badly” (Routley 1973, 16–17).

A number of arguments against Sylvan’s hypothesised intrinsic value of natural items focus on supposed problems that attend the apparently “cosmic” account of value that items are said to have in the absence of valuers (e.g., after the demise of the last man). Some focus on problems traditionally associated with moral objectivism. If value is conceptually independent of valuers then: moral intuitionism is an unacceptable consequence (cf. Mannison 1980, 57, the charge of “realism”); moral theory is inconsistent with (the preferred theory) moral projectivism (Carter 2004, who claims a projectivist theory can explain our intuitions concerning the last man); or such value is simply beyond epistemic access and irrelevant for decision-making (Justus et al. 2009, 187–8). The latter point echoes earlier claims in Thompson (1990), Grey (1993), and Fox (1995) that the hypothesis of intrinsic value in nature results in values that, being too far removed from human concerns, are irrelevant as an ethical guide to human action (Thompson 1990, 159–60; Grey 1993, 464) and, in any event, are unnecessary—an enlightened anthropocentrism is sufficient.

Sylvan’s position on the ontology of values (discussed at length in 1980a, esp. 152ff) draws on the Last Man Example to claim that things can, indeed, be valuable at a time when no valuers exist and extended thought experiments of a similar kind he takes to further establish that things can be valuable in a world wherein no valuer exists at all, though a valuer must exist in some world (1980a, 156, fn 67; cf. also Sylvan and Bennett 1994, 143). Values are, he claims, conceptually dependent on valuers—thus the slogan “no value without valuers” remains true, he contends—and therewith the rock of objectivism is said to be avoided (1980a, 154). Elliot (1980) also contends that a non-objectivist account is sufficient for this kind of value engendered by the last man example, though it is one requiring actual evaluators (“no values without actual valuers”). He goes on to describe a subjectivist account that further links values to valuers in a manner that “makes the valuer the sole determinant of a thing’s value” (1980, 19) with value reduced to valuer evaluations.

Taking himself to have avoided objectivism, Sylvan nonetheless argues against subjectivist accounts—intrinsic values are not subjective either (1980a, 154). Intrinsic value in a world, while depending conceptually on valuers, nonetheless does not reduce to valuers in that world in any way. Some have remarked on the apparent similarities between Sylvan’s account of intrinsic value and secondary qualities, suggesting his account amounted to a response-dependent account of intrinsic value (cf. Grey 2000). See Lamb (2018, §IX) for argument to the contrary.

In the further elaboration of the “new ethic”, Routley and Routley (1980a) develops a multiple factor model combining traditional values, such as the virtues and creature enjoyment, with environmental value-making factors, for example: diversity of systems and creatures, naturalness, integrity of systems, stability of systems, and harmony of systems (170–171). So the shift to an environmental ethic does not reject ordinarily acknowledged welfare values for persons or humans, but simply recognises a further set of factors contributing to intrinsic value in nature (171). Such value-making factors enter into a mutually constrained optimisation so that the increase of one need not increase the overall intrinsic value of the entity exemplifying it; thus, an increase in diversity in a forest may decrease value insofar as it may come at the cost of naturalness (e.g., if the added diversity comes from the anthropogenic addition of feral species not naturally occurring in that forest).

The account of value is non-naturalistic in the sense that value is argued to be irreducible to natural features, even though “grounded” in them. (1980a, §5; Sylvan later committed to the supervenience of intrinsic value on naturalistic features, Sylvan and Bennett 1994, 143). It is Meinongian in a number of respects—most obviously, drawing freely on Routley (1980), cf. esp. §8.11, values are features had by items but, like properties, they do not exist (1980a, 153ff). Sylvan’s moral epistemology also draws heavily on Meinong’s account of “emotional presentation” (see Lamb 2018, §VIII): “the valued object may be emotionally presented and its value thus recognised, without its value simply amounting to its emotional presentation” (Routley and Routley 1983, 453). The account is articulated at length in Sylvan (1986). Perhaps unsurprisingly, Sylvan’s semantic analysis of value (cf. Routley and Routley 1983) makes use of non-classical, relevant logic in its formal analysis. (Weber 2017a also draws on Sylvan’s work in non-classical logic to develop a “new version” of the Last Man Example—the “Ultramodal Last Man”—with a view to avoiding an alleged dilemma besetting the original Last Man Example, “renewing a role for non-standard logics in value theory”.)

4.2 Deep Green Ethics

While Sylvan views the development of deep ecology sympathetically, he distances himself from the positions being argued for under that banner. His own “deep green ethics” is described most clearly in Sylvan and Bennett (1994, ch. 5). Like deep ecology, the position is, using the term originally coined in Naess (1973), “deep” since it rejects the sole value assumption and greater value thesis. But unlike deep ecology Sylvan rejects, in particular:

  1. biocentrism—“all and only life is valuable”

arguing instead that some non-living things have intrinsic value and that not all life is intrinsically valuable; and

  1. biospherical egalitarianism—“the equal value of all life”

arguing instead for eco-impartiality, thus not valuing members of one species over those of another simply on the basis of species membership, and noting that evaluative impartiality with respect to species does not entail their equal value. More generally, Sylvan (1985) argues that under the strong West Coast US influence deep ecology commits to an assortment of dubious metaphysical and psychological themes—often leading to an anthropocentric “person- and consciousness-oriented soufflé”. And links to religion, in particular pantheism and nature mysticism, threaten to “convert deep ecology into a new religion”. What results is a “deep ecology” that is “conceptually murky” and subject to “degeneration”. As noted in Section 1, laying out these points of difference with deep ecologists in uncompromising style earned him the title ‘the bad boy of deep ecology’ (Orton 2005, Other Internet Resources). For responses, see Fox (1986) and Attfield (1993).

His deep green theory is, following his metaphysical and logical pluralism (cf. Sylvan 2000b), also pluralistic “allow[ing] for the requisite theory dependence and cultural relativity of values” (1980a, 156), “there is no uniquely determined correct value system … there are various overlapping systems” though he denies that ethical relativism follows from this (Sylvan 1986, 13). He sees the ongoing cultural project of developing an adequate environmental ethic as being in its early stages.

Grey (2000) contends that the (proto)theory faces numerous problems; for further analysis as to whether Sylvan’s position has been properly targeted see Lamb (2018, 565–80 passim).

Not content with mere theory, as noted in section 1, Sylvan also engaged in ambitious practical conservation work, acquiring high-value conservation properties for rehabilitation and protection. But the value of such rehabilitated landscapes is contested in Elliot (1982) and Katz (1992). Defending the idea that naturalness of origin is a valuable aspect of wild nature, they argue that not only is restored nature of lesser value than any wilderness that it replaces, but the restored copy could be described as “a fake or a forgery” (Elliot 1982, 84); restoration involves a “big lie” as Katz puts it. Sylvan thinks they have grossly overstated their case and responds in Sylvan (1994)—restored landscapes are not mere artifact or fakery. They are not contrived gardens devoid of natural values, artificial nature falsely presented as the real thing.

Consider an area of restored bushland … The restoration results primarily by nature doing its own thing; it is nothing like furniture or pottery making. An ecological restorer, unlike an artisan, does not produce the item, there is no making … Rather there is adjustment at margins … and there is helping in healing (Sylvan 1994, 68).

Sylvan argues that Elliot and Katz have illicitly extended the notion of an artifact, which is widely and wrongfully deployed in such descriptions of restored natural areas and what they (especially Katz) have failed to grasp is the value-enhancing role that restoration plays in the many situations where the damage has already been done. Such restoration “is an addition, an attempt … to claim back much more of what has [already] been grabbed and degraded or ruined” (Ibid., 75). In many cases restoration assists nature in reasserting itself and taking control once more. What results lacks certain properties of the original, to be sure, especially natural continuity, but contributing to the restoration of something to close-to-original value (as opposed to some low-value fake) is, Sylvan argues, worthwhile and can result in near-natural areas of enormous value. That is value enough.

Though Sylvan is uneasy using the term ‘wilderness’ “due to its long history of unfavourable associations and connotation”, he agrees with the broader point being made by Elliot and Katz—“ecological restoration is not an alternative to retaining wilderness, to remnant wildernesses” (Sylvan 1994, 75). However, they have overstated their case concerning the value of restored landscapes. Elliot was persuaded, admitting that he paid too little attention to the types of restoration that can be achieved and underestimated the value and degree of naturalness that can result. In a book-length response to Sylvan and other critics and fellow travellers, Elliot (1997) clarifies his argument. Its Preface acknowledged the enormous debt to Sylvan. He is, Elliot came to think, quite right. “Mucking with nature” can result in something of significant value and it is, Elliot argued, in many cases obligatory to try to undo the damage we have done.

A further practical issue which Sylvan sees as requiring theoretical justification is predation: the killing of animals for food. “The vegetarian options face, it certainly seems, insuperable difficulties, especially concerning such issues as animal predation (which is an important, immensely frequent, and often desirable, ecological fact), and concerning the reduction in numbers of animals, especially introduced animals, which build up to ‘pest proportions’ (some reduction is often required for vegetable growing to operate successfully)” (Routley 1982, 5). Sylvan himself, for example, culled feral rabbits (a damaging, introduced species in Australia) and he consumed the animals killed. While his environmental ethic demands respect for intrinsically valuable non-humans, he argues that the

respect position is not a reverence position … interference is acceptable [in certain cases] … The lives, preferences, choices, and considerations of other species or objects of moral concern are not to be taken as sacred or inviolable [though we] require that good reasons be given for interfering with the environment (Sylvan and Bennett 1994, 149).

See Routley (1982, §4) for a defence (a paper which also presents a moral defence of limited cannibalism). For a similar view see Callicott (1980) and for defence of the contrary claim that we ought, where possible, act to eliminate predation, even cases of wild animals taking prey for food, see Nussbaum (2007, ch. 6).

4.3 Further Moral Theory

In addition to work in environmental ethics, Sylvan wrote on other ethical issues including arguments for moral obligations to future generations (cf. Routley and Routley 1978, Sylvan and Plumwood 1991), and the ethics of energy choice (Routley and Routley 1979c). The argument offered in the latter paper against nuclear power centres on the (anthropocentric but nonetheless, in Sylvan’s view, salient) claim that bequeathing toxic nuclear waste to future generations constitutes an ethically unacceptable shift of costs onto others. And a similar argument was mounted against conspicuous consumption of fossil fuels from what Sylvan and Plumwood then referred to as “atmosphere heating” (Routley and Routley 1979c, §3). Theirs appear to be amongst the earliest philosophical discussions focussing on the ethics of climate change. And it is not just the claimed immorality following from the consequences of climate change to future humans, though that is given weight; from a deep green perspective, the claimed erosion of value outstrips mere anthropocentric concerns and needs to take into account non-human nature, where the resultant erosion of intrinsic value is taken to loom large.

Considering destructive practices more generally, beyond those destructive of the environment, Sylvan considered violence against persons, arguing that not only was nuclear war immoral, but that which conditionally promised it, nuclear deterrence, was also immoral (cf. Routley 1984a). In fact, violence in general was, he argued, immoral, defending pacifism and responding to the standard objections to it in Routley (1984b).

In formal ethics, Sylvan defended a non-classical deontic logic. Routley and Plumwood (1989) argued that the existence of moral dilemmas establishes the need both for: (i) a non-classical propositional logic underpinning deontic logic; and (ii) the rejection of some other central principles of orthodox deontic logic, especially the principle of deontic consistency

  • (PC) \(\mathrm{O}A \rightarrow \twiddle\mathrm{O}\twiddle A\)

and the Kantian principle ought-implies-can (since dilemmas create impossible obligations). He argues that the sentential fragment of deontic logic must be paraconsistent and a relevant logic is recommended (see Section 2).

Sylvan saw his ethics as systematically connected with issues in social and political philosophy, extending out from “deep green ethics” to a broader “deep green theory” that “includes a radical social and political theory, centred upon social anarchistic forms of organization … and elements of radical economic theory … There have to be changes in social and political arrangements … towards less consumptive, populous and wasteful societies, and so on” (Sylvan and Bennett 1994, 151).

Some of these ideas are discussed at length in Routley and Routley (1980b) where alternative forms of economic and political organisation are first considered from an environmental perspective. Sylvan focuses his attention on what he takes to be an evident failure of the political arrangements proposed in the West. According to him, the great limitations to the freedom of human beings, the uneven distribution of wealth and, above all, the constant damages caused to the environment are all symptoms of a disease that must be treated. Sylvan argues for what he calls pluralist anarchism, (a form of socialist anarchism) abandoning any form of government, including the minimal one defended by Robert Nozick (2013).

4.4 Summary

Sylvan’s work in moral theory helped pioneer the rise of environmental philosophy as a new sub-discipline and connected environmental issues with broader moral issues as well as issues in political and social philosophy. Drawing on other work in metaphysics and logic, he sought new non-anthropocentric moral foundations, heavily critical of both traditional ethics and emerging alternatives that lacked clarity and rigour.

5. Conclusion

The overall picture that emerges from Sylvan’s work is of a broad philosophy that draws on non-classical (relevant) logic, a neo-Meinongian metaphysics and a neo-Meinongian value theory as a means of accounting for “common-sense” ways of talking (e.g., about things that do not exist), ways of valuing (e.g., the seeming intrinsic value of things in the natural world) and socio-political arrangements (e.g., a pluralist anarchism). Sylvan’s work was radical, but rigorous; a rich many-worlds semantics underpins formal analyses. His work was contentious; many traditional philosophical “problems” are claimed to be artefacts of faulty orthodox theories. And his work was expansive; philosophy’s traditional role with the question “How are we to live?” is taken seriously. Above all, Sylvan’s thought was unified and systematic: “What is sought is a theory of values which blends both with object-theory and with deeper environmental theory…” (1986, 1).

Sylvan’s program was left unfinished when he died. Whatever one thinks of his bold statements (“a wild mixture of wonderfully incisive ideas and absolutely false claims,” as Meyer put it in 1996), Sylvan pushes philosophers to recognize that many propositions taken as facts are not unrestrictedly true, but rather are relative to what assumptions one is making about logic, ontology, and value. Changing those assumptions changes the possibilities. And Sylvan’s work urges us to be ready for more possibilities—even what is, as he put it, “beyond the possible” (this is the title of an unpublished manuscript cited in Routley 1980).


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Thanks to Ross Brady, Naoya Fujikawa, Roger Lamb, Graham Priest, and the referees for comments.

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