Nicolaus Taurellus (b. 1547 Montbéliard, d. 1606 Altdorf) is one of the early modern German philosophers who re-established metaphysics as a topic of serious academic inquiry in the Lutheran tradition. He adhered to the pious goal of providing a unified account of philosophical and theological truth, but in doing so he developed a series of controversial claims, such as the view that the basic constituents of reality are immaterial, form-like entities. In contrast to traditional form-matter composites, he maintained that such form-like entities fulfill the criterion of substantiality—the capacity of subsisting independently of other entities. At the same time, he held that the composition of immaterial entities can form only accidental, non-substantial unities. His conclusion that human beings are only accidental, non-substantial unities was perceived as a challenge to traditional views of personhood. During his lifetime, Taurellus’s philosophy met fierce opposition from orthodox Lutheran theologians. Still, his metaphysics prefigures some basic ideas of the metaphysics of Leibniz, who knew Taurellus‘s philosophy and thought highly of it.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Immaterialism and the Compositional Structure of the World
- 3. Substantiality and Ontological Dependence
- 4. Living Beings and the Origin of Souls
- 5. The Problem of Substance Monism Revisited
- 6. Emanative Causation and the Problem of the Eternity of the World
- 7. Aftermath
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1. Life and Works
Nicolaus Taurellus (Oechslein) was born on November 26, 1547 in Montbéliard/Mömpelgard into the family of a poor city clerk (for biographic information, see Baier 1728: 1–14; Bayle 1730: vol. 4, p. 327; Schmid 1860: 1–22). At the time, the city was politically affiliated with the duchy of Württemberg, and patronage by the Duke of Württemberg allowed Taurellus to study philosophy at the University of Tübingen with the eminent Aristotelian logician and natural philosopher Jacob Schegk (on the intellectual scene in sixteenth-century Tübingen, see Methuen 1998; on Schegk, see Kusukawa 1999). After completing his master of arts in philosophy (1565), he began to study theology but soon moved on to medicine and completed his medical doctorate at the University of Basel (1570). In 1573, he published his first and most comprehensive work in metaphysics, The Triumph of Philosophy (PT), which pursued the plan to provide a unified account of philosophical and theological truth and thereby to offer a philosophical defense of the doctrine of creation (PT: 220–222, 250–252; for overviews of Taurellus’s metaphysics, see Petersen 1921: 219–258; Mayer 1959; Leinsle 1985: 147–165; Wollgast 1988: 148–153). In spite of its pious intention, and although it appeared with one of Europe’s leading academic publishers of the time, the Henricpetri press, the work was perceived as a provocation and, career-wise, initially turned out to be a failure.
After several difficult years, Taurellus took up a professorship in ethics at the University of Basel in 1579, and in 1580 he accepted a professorship in natural philosophy and medicine at the University of Altdorf, the university of the city of Nuremberg (on his activity at Altdorf, see Mayer 1960). In accordance with his teaching duties, he published a massive volume on medical prognostics (Taurellus 1581) and an annotated edition of the works of the thirteenth-century physician Arnaldus of Villanova (Arnaldus of Villanova 1585). He returned to philosophy in 1586 with a critical commentary (VML) on Aristotle’s On Life and Death. In 1596 he published a short overview and evaluation of Aristotelian metaphysics, followed in the next year by a 1000-page response to the Averroistic philosophy of Andrea Cesalpino (1524/25–1603), whose work became influential at the University of Altdorf (see Mulsow 2004: 7–9). In a group of three last monographic works, Cosmology (1603 [KOS]), Uranology (1603) and On the Eternity of Things (1604 [DRA]), Taurellus gives detailed responses to central themes of late scholastic cosmology, especially as developed by the Paduan philosopher Francesco Piccolomini (1520–1604). Also a 1604 dissertation, On the Origin of Rational Souls (TRA), is marked by its preface and references to earlier metaphysical works as a text authored by Taurellus (which corresponds to academic practice in early modern Germany). Apart from his scholarly publications, he produced two volumes of poetry (Taurellus 1592, 1595), one of which is regarded as a significant contribution to early modern emblematics (see Homann 1971: 105–122). On September 28, 1606 Taurellus succumbed to the plague at the age of 58.
2. Immaterialism and the Compositional Structure of the World
In his Triumph of Philosophy, Taurellus accepts the traditional claim that the elements (earth, water, air, fire) are the basic constituents of the natural world. However, he develops an intricate argument for denying the received view that prime matter enters into the constitution of elements (see Blank 2014). Thereby, he offers a reinterpretation of the nature of the elements. The argument starts with a consideration of the motivation for introducing the notions of form and prime matter. As he describes it, the motivation arises out of the view that in natural things there are contrary properties: active properties such as the capacity of bringing forth changes in other things, and passive properties such as the capacity of undergoing change through the agency of other things. If these properties are understood as contrary, then they seem to require two different origins. For this reason, the active properties of natural things were seen as requiring the existence of forms, while the passive properties of natural things were seen as requiring the existence of primary matter (PT: 202).
However, Taurellus challenges the assumption that active and passive properties of natural things should be regarded as contraries. This is why: “Nothing takes on its contrary but rather cedes when the contrary comes; but passivity increases with the increase of activity” (PT: 284). Hence, his argument against the contrary nature of active and passive properties is that an increase of passive power is compatible with an increase of active power. But if activity and passivity are not contraries, “they are present in the same subject and proceed from the same cause” (PT: 292). At the same time, Taurellus holds on to the assumption that the active properties of things have to be explained by the existence of an active principle. This is why he does not eliminate the notion of form from his ontology. On the contrary, because active and passive properties are not contraries, he believes that they proceed from forms alone:
We say that a thing is active and passive with respect to the same form; but in such a way that action is its proper effect, while the other does not arise from matter conjoined with it but from an externally existing contrary principle. (PT: 294)
Regarding forms as the unique kind of origin of the active and passive properties of natural things also leads to a reinterpretation of the compositional structure of the world. In Taurellus’s view, forms are the only beings underlying the compositional structure of the world: “Matter plainly does not exist, and nothing but forms can be and can enter composition” (PT, 280). Accordingly, “mixture or composition is … a mere conjunction of forms that in no way changes them” (PT: 276). At the same time, understanding composition in this way implies that no substantial form can be understood as a composition of other forms (PT: 274). Rather, every composition is accidental (PT). This is why Taurellus formulates the provocative claim that a human being does not possess substantial unity but rather is an aggregate of a plurality of forms (PT: 110).
Taurellus continues to use the term “matter”. Obviously, however, his immaterialism about the basic constituents of the natural world leads to a reinterpretation of the meaning of the term. One of the reinterpretations that he offers derives from his view that complex natural beings contain a plurality of hierarchically ordered substantial forms. His reinterpretation of matter in terms of subordinate forms allows Taurellus to continue to talk about bodies (corpora) and corporeal beings (entia corporalia) (PT: 160–162; 182; 352–354; 552–554). As he puts it, “if it is not understood as a less noble form, … matter does absolutely not compose anything” (PT: 278). Thus, there is a sense in which one can talk about matter in which one uses a traditional connotation of the notion of matter, namely, that it is something less noble that underlies something nobler (PT: 296). Thus, even if the idea that prime matter underlies form is given up, the structure of something less noble underlying something nobler can be upheld. More specifically, less noble forms can be understood as the subjects of nobler forms. In Taurellus’s view, things receive the character of subjects
for the same reason that makes that they are less noble, such that forms that are within nothing else but serve as subjects for something else are the most ignoble, but those that do not serve as subjects for anything else but are within something else are nobler. (PT: 330)
As Taurellus explains, a form is nobler than other forms if it is more prone to cause changes in other forms, and form is less noble than other forms if it is more prone to receive the effect of the activities of other forms. Passive changes of forms thus are seen as a result of the contingent activity of other forms together with the internal constitution of the forms that have undergone change (PT: 298). In this sense, in Taurellus’s view the subordination relation between substantial forms reduces to relations of efficient causation between substantial forms. Consequently, Taurellus regards the activities of substantial forms as the origin of all of the forces found in the natural world:
Nature is the unique principle of corporeal things and consists in a single substance, not in two or three substances. This substance seems to be manifold because it expresses itself in various forces. (PT: 376)
There is still another sense in which the notion of matter retains a function in Taurellus’s metaphysics. This becomes clear when Taurellus suggests a metaphorical usage of the notion of prime matter. As he puts it, with respect to God prime matter is “the NOTHING” (in capital letters) out of which God creates the world (PT). The connection that Taurellus establishes between the notion of prime matter and the notion of nothing strongly differs from the use of the term “nothing” that often designates matter in the Neoplatonic tradition (see Bovillus 1510: fol. 63v–64r). Taurellus denies that prime matter is a constituent of created beings and holds that immaterial forms have active and passive characteristics of their own. His point is not that matter, due to its lack of determination, is “close to” nothing, nor that matter is undetermined except for its three-dimensional characteristics. Rather, when he calls prime matter “nothing” he has in mind a strict identity statement. This is why it is a suitable metaphor for what is there before the divine act of creation, namely, no created being. Prime matter in this metaphorical sense is absolute non-being.
3. Substantiality and Ontological Dependence
Taurellus’s immaterialism about the basic constituents of the natural world derives from considerations concerning the substantiality of created beings. Taurellus maintains that creatures, in one sense, are not separated from God and that, in another sense, they are separated from God. As to the first sense, he argues that “since an infinite substance fills out everything, nothing can be separated from it”. As to the second sense, we differ numerically from God “not with a view to God’s being in us and our being in him but in the respect that we differ due to our substance” (PT: 412). Hence, God is characterized as a being that extends throughout the whole of space. And this means that no creature can be spatially separated from God. The only sense in which creatures can be understood to be separated from God thus must have to do with the nature of their substance. And to differ from God with respect to substance presupposes that creatures are substances. This is why establishing the sense in which creatures can be understood to be substances is central for Taurellus’s project.
Taurellus considers the alternative hypothesis that natural beings are conjoined with their cause in such a way that if their essences would not be sustained by their cause they could not persist. However, he objects that this hypothesis would lead to a kind of substance monism according to which the world would be an accident of the divine substance:
If the world is not separated by its substance from God but always exists conjoined with him and in the same way will persist to eternity, it does not subsist in itself … But it will be an accident of God that can neither be separated from him nor persist separately. (PT: 428)
In Taurellus’s view, the world cannot be an accident of the divine substance both due to the nature of God and due to the nature of natural things. As to the nature of God, Taurellus argues that regarding the world as a divine accident has the absurd consequence that one would have to ascribe to God finite accidents:
The absurdity cannot be avoided that an infinite substance will be defined by finite accidents, for the nature of accidents consists in limiting substances or to define them is some other way. (PT: 430)
it would follow … that we are the perfection of the substance of God because actions perfect the substance from which they proceed (PT: 492)
Taurellus argues that this cannot be right because, due to his infinity, God cannot be said to have accidents at all:
Because God exists infinitely with respect to substance, he does not receive anything through which he could be defined, which is the reason why accidents are as foreign to him as possible since they limit or define substances. (PT: 454)
Taurellus’s view that forms are the only beings that underlie the compositional structure of the world contributes to explicating a sense in which the world differs by its substance from God. Taurellus points out that there is a close connection between his criticism of the theory of prime matter and his theological aim of defending the doctrine of creation. This connection has to do with a consequence that, in his view, follows from the theory of prime matter, namely, that prime matter is an accidental being. As he remarks, the Aristotelian principles “want matter which is nothing by itself to be something accidentally. For if this is true, it will be an accident, not a substance” (PT: 240). As Taurellus argues, something analogous holds for the conception of form in the hylomorphic tradition:
The natural philosophers have stated that natural forms cannot subsist without a subject; if this were admitted, they would not be substances but accidents, because substances are not in something or from something but subsist through their own force, while one says of accidents that they do not subsist but rather are in something. (PT: 318)
What is more, Taurellus does not think that a conception of matter and form as accidental beings could be given a consistent formulation. As he argues, a theory of mutual existential dependence between primary matter and form leads to the absurd consequence
that the effect is in this case its own cause. For what gives essence to something else is a cause, a form that cannot subsist without matter is its effect; and conversely because matter is absolutely nothing without form, its subsistence depends on its own effect. (PT: 320)
A theory of immaterial forms is exactly what yields an analysis of the substantiality of elements. This is so because, once the assumption that form depends existentially on prime matter is given up, there is no need to regard form as an accidental being:
Tell me, does nature subsist by itself or does it subsist in something other? If you say that nothing underlies it, why shouldn’t one be allowed to ascribe the same to form, such that it is nature and subsists without matter? (PT: 376)
Taurellus’s immaterialism about the basic constituents of the compositional structure of reality thus explicates a sense in which these basic constituents are substances.
The ensuing view of the relation between God and creatures accepts creation dependence of creatures on God but denies the dependence of creatures’ continued subsistence on God. Taurellus gives the following characterization of physical change:
Nothing happens accidentally if not something that is in itself is presupposed. The natural philosophers propose this as an axiom, that something active does not have any effect unless the subject on which this action is directed possesses the disposition to receive this activity. (PT: 266–268)
Thus, in Taurellus’s view natural things possess are active potencies that bring forth changes in other natural things and passive potencies that make them capable of undergoing changes through the agency of other natural things. These natural changes are determined by natural active and passive potencies of immaterial forms, but these natural potencies cannot bring about any kind of change for which immaterial forms do not have a disposition.
This is why these changes do not carry with them any threat to the subsistence of the world:
Because the world is substance and because one says that something is changed naturally when it is changed in a direction for which it has some disposition in it, it follows that if the world does not decay in this way, it does not carry any potency [for decay] in itself. (PT: 498)
In this sense, the existence of natural things is due to a divine act of creation but the subsistence of these natural things does not require any continuous divine concurrence: “Things … have received substance from him, but they do not continue to receive it” (PT: 492). This is the crucial point that Taurellus’s rejection of prime matter is meant to make. Only if the subsistence of the forms that underlie the compositional structure of the world as well as their active and passive potencies does not depend on continued divine agency can the hypothesis that the world is an eternal accident of the divine substance be refuted.
4. Living Beings and the Origin of Souls
Still, using the notion of form in this way to characterize the substantiality of the ultimate constituents of reality still leaves much to be explicated with respect to the origin of living beings. Taurellus considers a creation theory of the origin of human souls (PT: 144), but he also voices doubt concerning such a theory. In particular, he cautions that an act of divine creation would render the imperfection of human souls inexplicable (PT: 166). Therefore, he offers an integrated naturalistic account of the origin of the souls of non-human animals and humans.
Here, the connection between Taurellus and his teacher Jacob Schegk becomes relevant. Schegk maintains that both inanimate forms and animate forms depend on the mixture of elements. As he points out, such a conception of the origin of animate forms has the consequence that “an animate form also is a physical form …” (PT). In fact, such a view of the origin of souls is found in Alexander of Aphrodisias (fl. ca. 200 CE), upon whose work Schegk has commented extensively. According to Alexander, the soul
is a power and form, which supervenes through such a mixture upon the temperament of bodies; and it is not a proportion or a composition of the temperament. (Alexander of Aphrodisias 1568: 78, 2008: 104)
As Victor Caston has argued, talk about supervenience should here be taken in the technical sense of a co-variation of mental states with bodily states (Caston 1997: 348–349). Moreover, Caston emphasizes that, for Alexander, the soul possesses causal powers that are more than the aggregates of the causal powers of the elements (1997: 349–350). In the sense that Alexander ascribes distinct new powers to souls as well as to the forms of non-animate composites such as chemical blends, Caston characterizes Alexander as one of the ancient thinkers who were committed to emergentism (1997).
Taurellus adopts a similar line of argument. He holds that
when by mutual action and passion mixed things are changed in such a way that none of them remains entirely the same, but some new form arises out of it that related to the forces of all of them, without doubt there exist mixed forms that have the forces of many, bring about different effects, which is most evident in the changes of things and especially in the use of medicaments. (PT: 272)
Also, he is clear that what arises in genuine mixture is not only a composition of simple compounds but also a simple form. In his view, this form is simple “because it is not composed but rather generated” (PT: 42). Consequently, it cannot undergo a process of being split up, although it can perish when the basis from which it emerges is changed (PT). This is why the simplicity and immateriality of emergent forms is compatible with their capability of being destroyed (PT: 44; 276).
This conception of the emergence of new forms is what underlies Taurellus’s analysis of the structure of plants and animals. He ascribes soul and life only to the latter since only they possess sense and self-motion (PT: 350), but this should not obscure the fundamental analogy between the emergence of forms in plant and the emergence of forms in animals. In his view, what possesses life in the proper sense are higher kinds of forms—the souls of animals (PT). The organic body of an animal, constituted by a plurality of less noble substantial forms, possesses life only in a derivative sense, since it possesses active and passive properties that derive from the active and passive properties of the animal soul (PT: 352). But even if he follows the Galenic tradition in denying life to plants (VML: sig. B3r), he ascribes to each plant a substantial form that accounts for some of the activities of the organic plant body—activity that cannot be explained by the temperament of elementary qualities (VML: sig. G3r). Something analogous holds for plant seeds and animal seeds: They do not possess a soul but a natural form that is capable of generating plants and animals (VML: sig. B5r; TRA: 11). As Taurellus argues, it is necessary to postulate the existence of such natural forms because not all kinds of attraction relevant for operation of plants and seeds can be explained by the agency of elementary heat (VML: sig. B5v). Thus, even plant forms and seed forms possess new causal potencies that go beyond the causal potencies of the elements that function as the matter of the emerging form.
As Taurellus characterizes it, there is a circle of causation between the emergent form and the elements from which it emerges: The life of the soul is communicated to the body (VML: sig. Gr), but the life of the souls is also perfected by actions that it can only carry out by means of the body (VML: sig. Gv). Consequently, the soul perfects the body and the body perfects the soul (VML: sig. G2r). Astonishingly, Taurellus applies such a conception of the mutual dependence between forms and organic bodies even to the case of humans. As he claims, “the human soul by itself is capable of ceasing to be” (VML: sig. F4v). Thus, they have in common with the soul of brutes that “they necessarily have their essence and life in a body” (VML: sig. G4r; see TRA: 11). Taurellus does not challenge the theological idea of immortality but concludes that if human beings are immortal, the relevant supernatural divine agency responsible for resurrection must relate to soul and body alike (TRA: 26).
5. The Problem of Substance Monism Revisited
Taurellus returns to the problem of substance monism in his extended critical response to Cesalpino (see Muratori 2014; Blank 2015: 194–199). Taurellus makes clear that one of his main targets of criticism is Cesalpino’s conception of God. As Taurellus points out, in a crucial respect Cesalpino goes beyond Averroes:
What [Averroes] said about the assisting intellect, Cesalpino extends to the souls of humans and of the other animals, and of the entire world, for he asserts a single soul that exists by itself and is multiplied according to the bodies of living beings. And through participating in it, the bodies are animated and substances. (AC: 25)
Taurellus is clear that such a conception implies that God is not separated from matter and also not an efficient cause of things; rather, God is understood as a constituent cause (AC: 25–26). What is more, Cesalpino’s conception of God seems to imply substance monism not only with respect to all animate beings but also with respect to the world as a whole.
Substance monism seems to be an implication of a combination of views held by Cesalpino: (1) the view that the active intellect is a substance that is capable of self-reflection; (2) the view that the active intellect “perfects everything”; and (3) the view that the active intellect “implants into things a striving for perfection insofar as it is intellection” (Cesalpino 1593: fol. 35v). Thus, the substantiality of the active intellect is characterized as being due to its capability of self-reflection, and it is this specific activity that is understood as the origin of the activity of natural things, not only of minds. Consequently, Cesalpino maintains that the plurality of substances cannot be based on considerations concerning human self-reflection. His argument invokes the possibility of a temporary split in the self-consciousness of the active intellect—the possibility that during the life-time of a living being the part of the active intellect that animates this living being undergoes a stream of acts of self-reflection that are isolated from the stream of acts of self-reflection that other parts of the active intellect undergo at the same time. If so, individual minds would be “included in a unique intelligence as parts are contained in a whole or as a smaller number is contained in a larger number” (Cesalpino 1593: fol. 36r).
One of the most interesting criticisms that Taurellus levels against Cesalpino concerns exactly this issue. As Taurellus argues, the claim that reflexive acts are due to parts of the active intellect could be construed in two ways. The first way would be to understand the relation between the activities of the parts of the active intellect and the activities of the active intellect as a whole as analogous to the relation between the activities of the parts of a stone in motion and the activity of the whole stone in motion. Here, the activities of the parts of the moving stone are of the same kind as the activities of the moving stone as a whole: self-motion with the same direction and speed. If this were the relevant analogy, Taurellus argues, the activities of the parts of the active intellect would be of the same nature as the activities of the active intellect as a whole (AC: 270–271). Evidently, this is contrary to the assumption that Cesalpino makes, namely, that one part of the active intellect does not have reflexive access to the activities of any other part of the active intellect.
By contrast, the second way of understanding the relation between the parts of the active intellect and the active intellect as a whole would be to use the analogy of the relation between the parts of a clock and the clock as a whole. Here, we have in fact different kinds of activities. But, as Taurellus argues, the difference between the activities of the parts of a clock is exactly what justifies regarding these parts as separate entities of a different kind. Analogously, what speaks in favor of regarding human minds as separate substances is not just the fact that reflexive acts occur but also that the content of one series of reflexive acts is not accessible from the perspective of another series of reflexive acts (AC: 271). The cognitive inaccessibility of one series of reflexive acts from the perspective of another series of reflexive acts would thus be inexplicable when one assumes, as Cesalpino does, that these acts derive from a unique intelligence. This is why Taurellus believes that the structure of reflexive acts speaks in favor of the existence of a plurality of active substances.
6. Emanative Causation and the Problem of the Eternity of the World
Taurellus’s conception of a separation between God and creatures with respect to substance is challenged not only by Cesalpino’s version of a theory of a unique intellect but also by theories of emanation prominent in early modern Platonism. This is why in Cosmology (1603 [KOS]) and On the Eternity of Things (1604 [DRA]) Taurellus discusses Piccolomini’s views on emanative causation (see Blank 2009). Like Taurellus, Piccolomini raises numerous objections against thinking about the relation between God and the world in terms of emanative causation. However, Taurellus criticizes Piccolomini on two levels: he thinks that many of Piccolomini’s arguments are flawed in matters of detail and, hence, do not lend support to the desired conclusion; and he reproaches Piccolomini for conceding too much to the Platonists—such as the view that elementary forces derive from the agency of a Platonic world soul. No doubt, Taurellus’s books were highly informative for his contemporaries in that they show how a theory of emanative causation might work. However, understanding the relation between God and the world as an emanation relation turns out to be incompatible with his own view of the subsistence independence of elements.
In Taurellus’s view, several arguments provide reasons against understanding subsistence dependence of created beings in terms of formal emanation. Taurellus holds that elements possess forms and forces that are independent of any continued divine agency. That he ascribes formal properties to elements that are independent of a continuous conserving activity of God becomes clear, where he discusses Piccolomini’s claim that every part of the world depends on God (Piccolomini 1596b: bk. II, ch. 2). Taurellus points out that Piccolomini derives this claim from Marsilio Ficino, who held that corporeal mass cannot exist on its own since otherwise it would form itself (see Ficino 2001–2006: vol. 1, 18–27). As Ficino and Piccolomini argue, conveying form onto a corporeal substance is not a property of body since all active beings act by means of some incorporeal faculty.
Ficino and Piccolomini conclude that the world depends in all its parts on an incorporeal principle of agency in such a way that, since it depends always on this principle, it can be said to be created continually (DRA: 448–449). Taurellus agrees that bodily mass cannot convey form onto itself. However, he does not believe that bodily mass, once it is formed, requires any external active principle to preserve its form (DRA: 449). Likewise, he holds that elements have their own forces—forces that are derived from the elements, not from any being external to them. In his view, the heavens not only do not have the force to convey form to elements, they are also unnecessary to explain the forces that elements possess. Taurellus takes issue with Piccolomini’s claim that God imparts forces on things in the world by means of a Platonic world soul (see Piccolomini 1596a: ch. 30). Contrary to Piccolomini, Taurellus holds that in addition to general forces that influence all bodies on earth in a uniform way, there are specific forces that belong to the elements (DRA: 275).
Taurellus develops some further considerations against understanding subsistence dependence in terms of the emanation of the essences of natural beings from the essence of God. Suppose that the heavens are preserved by means of continuous creation or by means of a perpetual efflux of divine essence. In this case, Taurellus argues, Heraclitus’ view of the perpetual flux of all things would be confirmed since nothing would remain intact beyond the duration of a moment. If emanation is thought of as a “flow” of essence, as much essence as is conveyed to a particular object at a given moment has to be previously withdrawn from its source (KOS: 235–236). In this way, emanation of essence implies the constant change both of created things and their source. Taurellus argues that such a conception of the mutability of all created things is contrary to the Aristotelian conception of the regular and stable motions of the stars—motions which become inexplicable once one assumes that stars are unstable and momentary objects. The same holds, according to him, for the fixed and stable figure of stars (KOS: 236).
Taurellus discusses two ways in which something “flows” from one being to another: the “flowing” of substance, and the “flowing” of accidents (KOS: 238). According to the late scholastic concepts of accident and substance shared by Taurellus (see, e.g., AC: 48–49), accidents are entities that inhere in another being, while substances are entities that do not inhere in another being. If a new accident of a substance is produced by this substance, we have an instance of immanent causation: a causal relation within one and the same being. If a substance produces a new accident, one could plausibly assume that such a causal relation does not diminish the substance from which the new accident arises, because it is an effect that inheres in it. Taurellus holds that this is the only conceivable conception of how something can to be said “in” God: divine attributes “complete” the divine essence (DRA: 458). But he maintains that such a conception of the “flowing” of accidents is of no help when it comes to analyze the relation between God and natural beings. As he argues, due to the self-sufficiency of elements, elements are the true subjects of inherence of their accidents. Hence, they belong to the category of substance, not to the category of accidents. Therefore, also a world composed of elements does not belong to the category of accidents (KOS: 62–63). Consequently, a world composed of elements cannot inhere in the divine substance (KOS: 238; DRA: 459).
Although Taurellus’s publications in metaphysics can be read as a sustained philosophical defense of the Christian doctrine of creation, his work triggered polemical opposition from orthodox Lutheran theologians (see Feuerlein 1734). Apart from blatantly misguided but highly derogatory allegations of atheism, some of his contemporaries saw a connection between Taurellus’s views and the views of two other controversial thinkers. One of them is the atomistic natural philosopher David Gorlaeus (1591–1612), the other is the Arminian theologian Conrad Vorstius (1569–1622) (Lüthy 2001: 278–286, Lüthy 2012: 122–129, and Lüthy 2018).
The connection between Taurellus and Gorlaeus seems to be particularly direct because Gorlaeus develops a long series of arguments in support of the claim that a human being is “one being by aggregation, not by essence” (Gorlaeus 1620: 222–234; on Gorlaeaus, see Lasswitz 1890: vol. 1, pp. 455–463; Gregory 1966: 46–51; Lüthy 2012). Moreover, to spell out the implications of such a view of composites Gorlaeus presents a fully developed theory of material atoms, according to which nature is constituted by minimal, quantitative, indivisible, and corporeal particles interspersed with small regions of vacuum (Gorlaeus 1620: 239–243). The close connection between the endorsement of the existence of material atoms and the denial of the existence of composite unities in Gorlaeus made it tempting for Taurellus’s contemporaries to conjecture that such a close connection could be found also in Taurellus (see Voetius 1643: 28). However, a close look into Taurellus’s account of elements (see above section 2) shows that the unities that produce beings “by aggregation” are not to be understood in analogy to material atoms. The supposed closeness between the views of Taurellus and Gorlaeus thus rests on a misinterpretation of the ontology of the Triumph of Philosophy.
In critical responses to Vorstius, Taurellus has also been charged with having been the author of the view that God is a limited quantitative being—a view that his critics also ascribed to Vorstius ([Anonymous] 1611: 8–9; Vorstius 1611: 22–23; see Shriver 1970). As to the view that Vorstius’s critics ascribed both to Vorstius and to Taurellus (the view that God is a quantum that is limited and possesses accidents), it turns out, that such a reading does not adequately represent either Vorstius’s or Taurellus’s views concerning divine extension. Vorstius holds that God is infinite not only with respect to duration and potency but also with respect to omnipresence (Vorstius 1610: 221). Because God is omnipresent, there is a quantitative aspect to his nature; however, Vorstius is clear that
this does not relate to physical or corporeal and sensible quantity but has to be understood with respect to the true and by no means fictional but evidently for us imperceptible and spiritual magnitude of God. (Vorstius 1611: 2)
Also, Vorstius emphasizes that he
never claimed that God is finite unless perhaps in the sense that God is a definite being, that is, a determinate being on its own that is distinct from other beings. (1611: 2–3)
Accordingly, when Vorstius talks of the “place” of God, he does not mean any physical place in the Aristotelian sense—a place defined by the boundaries of other bodies—but rather wishes to express the view that God extends throughout the whole of space (1611: 3).
On first sight, the views of Vorstius may seem to differ from Taurellus’s conception of divine infinity, because Taurellus’s conception seems to involve a sense in which God is a material being. Consider the following passage:
We say that God is almighty both in the sense that he has an infinite potency due to his substance, and in the sense that he also has infinite matter due to his essential characteristics, that is, one that in no way hinders the agent through any potency of acting. (PT: 484)
However, although infinite matter, in a certain sense, seems to be included among the essential characteristics of God, Taurellus here gives an explication that clearly marks talk of “infinite matter” as metaphorical. “Infinite matter” as a metaphor for the infinite divine potencies indicates that there are no further potencies that could function as an external impediment to divine agency. Such a metaphorical usage of the notion of infinite matter evidently does not imply that God has material (and, hence, limited) properties.
Taurellus thus cannot be understood as an atheist, an atomist, or a proponent of a theory of a material God. Nevertheless, the opposition that Taurellus met during his lifetime was highly successful in raising suspicions in the minds of his contemporaries, and there are virtually no references to his thought in subsequent publications by Protestant metaphysicians (on Taurellus’s immediate successors, see Sparn 1976). However, his work was by no means forgotten. It is documented that Jacob Thomasius (1622–1684), one of Leibniz’s academic teachers, owned most of Taurellus’s books (Schmid 1860: 19). Leibniz himself gave to Taurellus the epithet of “the Scaliger of the Germans” (Feller 1718: 142)—no small compliment given the fact that the young Leibniz regarded Julius Caesar Scaliger as one of his models for an eclectic, conciliatory approach to philosophy (Leibniz 1923–: II, 1, p. 90).
Although there are only some very few explicit references to Taurellus in Leibniz’s writings, the nineteenth-century German philosopher Ludwig Feuerbach (1804–1872) has suggested that the similarities between Taurellus and Leibniz may run much deeper than one would expect. Feuerbach’s suggestion is based on two considerations: (1) Taurellus’s view of the active powers of the human mind bears similarities to Leibniz’s conception of the inherently active nature of human cognition; and (2) Taurellus’s defense of substance pluralism and creation theory against Cesalpino bears similarities to Leibniz’s defense of substance pluralism and creation theory against Spinoza (Feuerbach 1981: 192–193). If one adds to Feuerbach’s observations the similarities between Taurellus’s conception of immaterial form-like unities as the ultimate constituents of reality and Leibniz’s conception of immaterial, simple substances as grounding the physical world, then Taurellus may emerge as the thinker who, within the context of Protestant metaphysics, came closest to anticipating central elements of Leibniz’s metaphysics.
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- Groos, Karl, “Taurellus, Nicolaus” in: Allgemeine Deutsche Biographie 37 (1894), S. 467-471. [German]