Territorial Rights and Territorial Justice

First published Tue Mar 24, 2020

Political philosophy has witnessed a recent surge of interest in territorial rights—what they are, who holds them, what justifies them—as well as in a broader theory of territorial justice, which situates said rights in an account of distributive justice, thereby addressing the scope of the rights. This interest is hardly surprising. The state is not simply a membership organization: it exercises authority over a geographical domain and this naturally gives rise to questions about how state authority over place can be justified, and how different claims to this authority can be assessed fairly. Moreover, many of the most pressing questions facing the contemporary interstate order are connected to territory—questions such as how to resolve disputes where more than one state makes claims to the same territory, how to draw boundaries in the case of secession or when borders are contested. Indeed, many of the major issues of the day—such as migration, resources and self-defense—have important territorial dimensions, so that a complete normative understanding of these issues requires a normative theory of territory.

What is perhaps more surprising is that territory has been relatively neglected. Until recently, most debates in political philosophy have focused on the rights and duties of citizens toward the state, and vice versa, but relatively little was written about how to justify, or conceptualize, the territory of the state. This neglect was not confined to political philosophy: it was a feature of all three traditions that were influential in thinking about the state. In international law, the territorial dimension of the state was taken for granted. The 1933 Montevideo Convention on the Rights and Duties of States defines states as territorial entities, which suggests that the first order of business is to explain, theorize and justify states and that the territory of the state can be simply assumed. This assumption was also made by political scientists, writing in both the comparative politics and international relations traditions. They offered explanatory and descriptive theories of the state but paid scant attention to the spatial element, largely assuming that the territory of the state is the product of history and past coercion which can be taken for granted as a basic feature of the state. One might have thought that normative political philosophers would be more interested in the question of how political authority can be wielded over territories and not just not over persons. However, political philosophers were also guilty of this blind spot, in part perhaps because of the extraordinary influence of Rawls in contemporary political philosophy. Rawls’s task in A Theory of Justice was to theorize the domestic justice of the basic structure of the state, and he therefore assumed, arguendo, that “political society is closed” (Rawls 1971: 4), by which he meant that we should conceive of it in the first instance as a self-sufficient entity that we happen to be in and cannot leave. He then tackled the question of the legitimacy of the state vis-à-vis the international order at a later stage of the analysis (Rawls 1999). The closed society assumption obscured many important issues from view, and has meant that political philosophers who adopt this methodological strategy have nothing to say in a range of cases that are very important for resolving questions of importance to inter-state peace and stability, as discussed above.

1. Conceptual Issues

1.1 What is territory?

One common preliminary distinction is between territory and land. Land is that part of the earth’s surface that is not covered by water. Territory is a political and geographic concept. It refers to the spatial area of jurisdictional authority. States have territory: it is the geographical extent of their jurisdictional authority. This usually covers the land within the borders of the state, but it can and does in the modern world extend off shore into the sea, below the earth’s surface (to control resources) and above the earth’s surface, as most states also claim jurisdiction over their air space. Territory, then, is not co-extensive with land, although all (or almost all) land on this planet is divided up into different jurisdictional units, or territories. The critical geography literature on ‘territory’ tends to primarily conceive of ‘territory’ as a geographical area that is controlled, or over which power is exercised (Elden 2013); whereas the political philosophy literature tends to be more interested in territory as the domain of legitimate jurisdictional control and associated rights (Miller 2012; Nine 2012; Banai 2014; Moore 2015; Angeli 2015; Stilz 2019). Territory is also distinct from property as will be explained below.

1.2 Territorial rights

The political philosophy literature on territory makes use of the idea of territorial rights. This is often done in a way that is analogous to how we think about property rights—viz., as a bundle of different liberties, powers, immunities, and claims, which, when held together with respect to a material thing, constitutes what we mean by property rights. In the case of property, the fullest form of normative control over that thing was what Honoré (1961) called ‘full liberal ownership’, but he also recognized that property rights can be parcelled out and held by different agents and that each right within the bundle may have its own, separate justification.

In the case of territorial rights, the central and fundamental right is the right of jurisdiction, which is the right to create and enforce laws within the domain in question. However, there are other related rights (powers, immunities) related to jurisdiction, which we also lump together as part of ‘territorial right’. It includes the power to make changes to the territory’s status, for example by incorporating it into some larger entity such as the EU, and the power to create sub-jurisdictional units of a federal system. It includes the right to do business in the world as a legal entity—to make war and peace, to conclude treaties, and enter into alliances. And it includes rights against other similar entities not to be interfered with in the exercise of this power.

Territorial rights are also normally understood to include other rights beyond jurisdiction and the associated claims, powers and immunities: rights to control resources within the geographical area, rights to control borders and regulate the flow of people and goods across them and rights to defend the territory against outside aggression (Simmons 2001; Miller 2012). Although these are often assumed to be inherent in the very idea of a sovereign state, we can envisage entities that have some rights of jurisdiction but lack other elements in the territorial bundle. Consider the members of the European Union which have significant jurisdictional powers at the member state level, but no border checks between member states in the Schengen area. Most federations are structured in this way. In Canada, provinces exercise wide powers of jurisdiction (over education, health, roads, natural resources) but there are no border controls between provinces. Thus, each element in the bundle that make up what we might loosely call ‘territorial rights’ needs to be examined, related to other elements, and justified, if we are to have a full normative theory of territorial rights or territorial justice.

The structural similarities between property rights and territorial rights should not blind us to their differences. Territory is not the same as property, because it has, as its primary element, a right of jurisdiction. Some of the rights that are included in rights over territory look as though they’re concerned with the claims to regulate and control a particular territory, which we think of as primarily rights of jurisdiction; and other rights are much more property-like, because they involve exclusionary claims over a region, and claims about how to use resources and land located within the boundaries of the state. However, these rights are mainly conceived of as secondary to that of jurisdiction, and of meta-jurisdictional powers such as the power to secede from a state or merge with another one.

One of the fundamental divisions in theories of territorial justice concerns the question of the relationship between territory and property, with theorists of a more Lockean or libertarian bent arguing that there are natural rights to property, which can give rise to rights over territory. On this story, property-holders consent to create a state and bring their property with them. Other theorists, including justice theorists, self-determination theorists and liberal nationalists, view rights of jurisdiction as both prior and fundamental, since it is through the exercise of jurisdiction that the rules according to which people can acquire and transfer property are determined.

1.3 What is a theory of territorial justice?

A theory of territorial justice has to explain and justify rights over territory. It has to explain what rights there are, the limits of these rights, and who holds these rights. In doing so, it has to examine and justify the relationship between three different elements: the people (or individual persons); land; and the regime, government or state. There are different ways in which these elements are related and different justificatory values may undergird these different configurations, but all extant theories offer an argument that relates these different elements and justifies their particular configurations.

The main differences among these theories tend to track the following dimensions: (1) the putative territorial right-holder; (2) the value that explains and justifies rights over territory and which limits the scope of each of these rights; and (3) the argument for connecting both the justifying value and the rights to the particular geographical area. Let’s take these different dimensions in order. The first key difference among rival theories concerns their conception of the appropriate (or justified) territorial right-holder: is it the nation? the people? or the state? They also offer different accounts of the underlying value that justifies these rights: the main contenders are peace and stability; justice; and self-determination. The underlying value also affects the scope of the rights being claimed, and indeed which set of rights in the bundle of rights can be so justified. A theory of territory has to explain how we can demarcate the geographical domain that the rights range over. It is not sufficient to explain in general that states need to be territorial in order to realize whatever value is supposed to justify them. The theory should explain which particular bits of territory are connected to which states. This is called in the literature ‘the particularity question’. To address this question, the theory needs an argument that relates people and land to the state in ways that justify rights over particular bits of territory, and this is a difficult problem for one of the most prominent theories of territory—justice theories.

2. Theories of Territory in Historical Perspective

There are a number of historical theories which have presented arguments about territory that have been relatively neglected in the scholarship on these theories, which has tended to focus on other aspects of their argument. Three key traditions are the natural law tradition, in particular Grotius and Pufendorf; the social contract tradition, and particularly Locke, who offered a theory of political obligation and a justification for limited constitutional government; and the justice tradition, associated with Kant, which identifies the state with the achievement of justice. None of these offered a complete theory of territory, but they did, in the course of theorizing the state and the international order, connect territory in crucial ways to their overall argument, such that it is extremely useful to focus on how they conceptualized territory, how they argued for it, and how it was related to other key elements in their political theory. Contemporary theories, which will be discussed in sect. 3, mainly build on these earlier theories.

2.1 Natural law theories: Hugo Grotius (1583–1645) and Samuel Pufendorf (1632–1694)

Both Grotius and Pufendorf operated in a natural law tradition. They both assumed that natural laws, which can be rationally apprehended, apply to all human beings, are invariable across time and space, and constitute the fundamental bonds of human society. Both theorists made room for conventional law but argued that these were constrained by the precepts of what both referred to as ‘right reason’.

Writing in a period of initial imperial expansion and discovery, Grotius in Mare Liberum (1609) defended the idea of common ownership of resources. By the term ‘common ownership’, Grotius meant that God granted all humans a right (a liberty right) to use objects or resources in the world to satisfy basic needs. In relation to the ocean, Grotius argued that no state or common power could claim exclusive dominion over it because the sea is not confinable within fixed boundaries and also is not amenable to transformation through human labor and so not an appropriate object of property rights. For these reasons, it should remain a relatively undisturbed commons; human beings would be free to travel on it and engage in mutual exchange, and to fish (the resources of the sea being, in his view, almost limitless). Although this view was challenged in his own day by John Selden in Mare Clausum (1635), who pointed out that geographical coordinates could enclose the sea, and in our own day by the recognition that the resources of the ocean and the seabed are not limitless, the idea of international rights over a global commons was very influential in the creation of modern international law, and was also important to the development of sea empires shortly thereafter (see Armitage 2012: 54–56). This idea is applied to many areas today as part of the idea of ‘common heritage of mankind’.

In relation to land Grotius argued that all individuals have a natural right to use objects that are held in common, but this right lacks some of the incidents that we associate with ownership proper. There is no right to exclude or to have a thing when it was no longer in one’s possession. He then elaborates a genealogical argument, according to which, in the early period of human existence, we lived in a simpler state where “the great extent of land was sufficient for the use of all occupants, as yet but few in number, without their incommoding each other” (Grotius RWP: II, 2, ii). However, as people became more ambitious and more acquisitive in meeting their needs, they began to interact more extensively with resources, and so came to possess moveable things and to cultivate and occupy immoveable resources, like land. As population increased in number and spread throughout the world, it didn’t make sense to have a common right in objects many miles distant from where people live (Grotius RWP: II, 2, ii). Grotius appealed to the idea of consent, capaciously understood to include the gradual establishment of rules of acquisition, use and transfer. He also argued that possession would be converted to jurisdiction through a public act which allows all to recognize who possesses what, which is important to ensure peaceful possession and reconcile the division of the world with human sociability.

Because Grotius conceives of natural rights (including our rights as common owners in things) as potentially transferable, he is able to explain and defend different kinds of government systems—democracies, oligarchies, even absolute monarchies. Since, for Grotius, the natural rights that a person has over his or her own person are alienable, he is able to argue that the source of the state’s authority stems from the transferability of this right to a sovereign authority through consent, including conventions developed over a long period of time, which represents an implicit exchange for a peaceful and stable society. He also argues that civil authority can also be acquired through conquest (Grotius RWP: II.3.viii), although this aspect of his theory is not emphasized by contemporary scholars.

Most criticisms of Grotius’ theory focus on his defense of absolute sovereignty, but the focus here is on his account of group-based possession implicit in his justification for territory. The central difficulty is that Grotius’s account of possession does not have a scope limitation. It’s not clear that he has the conceptual resources to establish limits to the area that a group can claim (or possess). He did, however, recognize a right of necessity and other moral rights (to passage, settlement, commerce, use of water, rights of refuge), which means that some sharing would be required by an appropriator. For their part, incomers would be required to submit to the sovereign (Grotius DJB II,2, xvii). This suggests that he envisions state jurisdiction as encompassing large areas that are not possessed or occupied in the normal sense, and some might argue that it is counter-intuitive that a single group should be able to claim sovereignty over vast tracts of land, as the European empires did in the ‘Age of Discovery’, and require that all peoples and migrants simply submit to their rules.

The scope limitation for sovereignty authority is described more clearly in Pufendorf’s natural law theory. Like Grotius, whose political philosophy he was attempting to defend, Pufendorf (DMC) believed in natural law and also laws derived in more conventional ways—such as civil laws, or laws between nations. He builds on Grotius’ account in two ways. First, Pufendorf rightly pointed out that the ocean could be subject to the exercise of jurisdiction. Second, and more significantly, his account provides the conceptual resources to recognize not only collective title, but it incorporates the idea of fair rules and fair terms in his account of the establishment of property regimes. For Pufendorf, the state of nature was a state of social living, and our claims to resources of the commons were rights held in a negative community in the sense that the natural world was equally open to everyone, but that, in order to appropriate land or property, one needed the consent of other co-owners. Pufendorf did not specify what kind of consent ought to count. However, he suggests that it would take the form of collective property or property held by communities, and that, from this, individual claims could be derived. Cara Nine (2019) has argued that his account has the conceptual resources to explain the limits of the state’s territorial domain in a non-arbitrary way, because he limits both individual and collective title by invoking moral principles such as non-domination and need.

2.2 Consent and property theories: John Locke (1632–1704).

John Locke’s central concern was to justify a limited (rights-respecting) constitutional government, and, like Grotius and Pufendorf, he appeals to consent. Locke’s argument proceeds by first defending the idea of natural rights to property, which he grounded in the fundamental importance of private holdings to the exercise of liberty, i.e., to the ability of persons to engage in individual or collective projects. He argued that individuals can acquire property in land and other external material objects by ‘mixing their labor’ with it and thereby improving it (Locke ST: V,27). He then argues that the difficulties that would be attendant on such an arrangement could only be solved by creating a jurisdictional authority to govern such people and protect their rights. Individuals in the state of nature, or loosely associated persons (e.g., families), many of whom have property in land, would, Locke argued, combine together to form a state to protect their rights. They would consent to majority rule, to obedience to and support for law (within the limits of natural law) and, importantly, consent to incorporate one’s rightful landholdings into the territory over which the government has jurisdiction. Locke connects the creation of authority over persons and authority over territory in this way:

By the same Act therefore, whereby any one unite his Person, which was before free, to any Commonwealth; by the same he unites his Possessions, which were before free, to it also; and they become, both of them, Person and Possession, subject to the Government and Dominion of the Commonwealth, as long as it hath a being. (Locke ST: VIII, 120)

There are two justifications for the state: one is functional, since the creation of political authority is necessary to solve the deficiencies of the state of nature at least as regards the protection of people’s natural rights; and the other is consent, as people in the state of nature are imagined to agree to a political order, an act which reconciles man’s natural liberty with subjection to common authority. The natural right to property, on this argument, is conceived of as prior to the state, and an essential building block for justifying the domain of state jurisdiction. By linking people and land together prior to the creation of political authority, Locke’s theory can explain the domain of jurisdictional authority. The boundaries of the state are coextensive with the boundaries of property that individual property holders incorporated when political society was created.

Although this theory is able to explain how there might be legitimate jurisdictional authority over various chunks of land, it also seems likely that these would be perforated by land held by dissenters, or at the least non-continuous boundaries. This means that the theory is of limited usefulness in justifying the contiguous jurisdictional authority of territorial states, where the writ of the law applies to all those contained within the external boundaries but there is no un-owned or un-consented interior land. In other words, this argument does not justify territorial right as we know it, where territorial rights and especially jurisdictional authority are consistently or evenly applied across the territory. This is not a flaw in itself. We shouldn’t think of normative theory as intent on justifying contemporary practices. However, it is a problem in so far as that does not seem compatible with the performance of functions relating to the exercise of jurisdictional authority, and functionality was also an important element in Locke’s argument for why individuals would seek to create a political order that has authority over them in the first place and can adequately protect their natural rights.

2.3 Justice theories: Immanuel Kant (1724–1804)

In some respects, Kantian arguments for territorial rights are the exact reverse of Locke’s. Kant offers a general justification of the state as necessary to the pursuit of justice, but then, having shown that the state is necessary to justice, this argument has difficulty in explaining which bits of territory each state ought to have.

Kant first defends the right to occupy and appropriate objects as implicit in, and justified by, the exercise of individual freedom. He then points out that removing things from common use prevents other people from enjoying the object in question, and this unilateral exercise of one’s freedom is therefore incompatible with the exercise of other people’s freedom. The only way out of this dilemma is through the multilateral recognition of ‘rights of property’ (by which he means agreement on the obligation to respect the acquisition, transfer and use of objects in the external world) and institutions of justice to set and enforce these multilateral rights. This provides an argument for why people who live in close proximity to one another, and therefore cannot avoid interacting, are morally obliged to enter the civil condition and acknowledge a political authority whose coercive law can guarantee their property rights. On Kant’s account, everyone in the state of nature has an obligation to leave a ‘a state devoid of justice’ and replace it with ‘a rightful condition’.

This theory successfully justifies the exercise of jurisdictional authority—indeed, the argument that we are subject to authority because it is required by justice is probably the most compelling justification of state power on offer. However, there are difficulties for this theory in explaining and justifying why that authority is held over particular areas of the earth. It is a short step from this type of argument to appeal to a principle of proximity to mark out a domain in which people are unavoidably interacting with one another, and then explain why people who are proximate must be under the same authority, because likely to fall into disputes (Waldron 2009). However, since there are many possible domains of possible interaction, the argument does not tell us which territorial unit we should join in cases where we stand midway between one group of proximate people who are in the process of creating state A, and a second group who are creating state B; and some members of our group seek to create state C (Miller 2011). It’s clear that we should join a political community, so that we are not in a lawless condition, and indeed it appears that all the contenders might be justified in compelling us to join their political community, but it is indeterminate about which political community ought to exercise rightful authority over us. Kant’s argument avoids discussing this dilemma only by appealing to considerations which fall outside of the Kantian theory itself: he points out that people tend, as an empirical fact, to be naturally grouped along linguistic or religious lines, and that membership in these cultural groups helps to define particular jurisdictional domains (Kant PP: I, first supp., para. 2). This empirical assumption helps Kant to escape what might appear to be the cosmopolitan logic of his account: without appeal to that purely contingent fact of people’s preference to associate politically with others who are religiously or culturally similar, it seems that the logic of his account is universal. Although Kant himself offered various reasons for opposing a world state (Kant MM: II; 53–61) it is not clear that these reasons are consistent with the logic of his theory.

One could, of course, accept a universalist, Kantian account of state authority, but supplement that account with subsidiary principles, which help to define the boundaries of particular authorities. But if those subsidiary principles are more than principles of convenience or affirmations of the status quo, both of which are problematic, then it means that Kant’s theory can’t be a stand-alone successful account, but has to be hybridized with another account. This is because Kant’s theory provides a successful justification for state authority but needs another account to justify each state’s particular territory.

3. Contemporary Theories of Territory

Most contemporary theorists of territory build on the historical arguments of Grotius and Pufendorf, Locke and Kant, or are a hybrid of these historical accounts. Some—like Risse in relation to Grotius, Stilz in relation to Grotius and Kant, Nine in relation to Pufendorf and Locke, Simmons in relation to Locke, and Waldron and Ypi in relation to Kant—are explicitly based on earlier theorists, and offer ways to improve some of the difficulties that beset the original account. Others—like Miller in relation to nationalist theory—offer a philosophical version of a popular nationalist belief in relation to homelands, which has historical roots in the nineteenth century, but lacked a clear philosophical defense. Contemporary accounts that ground territorial rights on self-determination and peoplehood are not based on a single identifiable theorist, though this version attempts to define territorial right—holder and the justificatory value in a way that avoids some of the problems of earlier theorists.

3.1 Natural law theories updated

As noted above, one of the key problems with Grotius’s account of territory is that it failed to explain the scope of the state. Jurisdiction was based on possession but possession was defined descriptively: a group could come to possess land through force or through public claims, but it was not clear how the scope or extent of the possession was defined normatively or how it could be limited. One of the key contemporary defenders of Grotius—Mathias Risse—attempts to update Grotius’s account by developing a principle or set of principles designed to address this problem.

In a series of articles with Michael Blake and a book Global Justice and Common Ownership of the Earth, Risse argues that the key Grotian insight is that our institutional practices should reflect the “core idea” of common ownership, which

is that all co-owners ought to have an equal opportunity to satisfy basic needs to the extent that this turns on collectively owned resources. (Risse 2012; 2014: 112)

He then addresses the key deficiency in Grotius’ theory of territory: he proposes a scope limitation on possession, which limits the amount possessed by requiring that it be justified from a global perspective. Risse’s distinctive proposal is a proportionality principle to explain how much each group is entitled to. Grotius himself did not endorse proportionality, but he did believe in common ownership, combined with a right of necessity, which Risse says implies the following disjunctive right: each individual has the right

either to use (in the narrow sense) resources and spaces to satisfy one’s basic needs or else to live in a society that does not deny one the opportunity to satisfy one’s basic needs in ways in which it otherwise could have been done through original resources and spaces. (Risse 2014: 112)

How does the proportionality principle work? The idea is that potential migrants can be excluded from states or areas of the world where people are over-using (or using at the average level) the resources, but they cannot be excluded from the areas where the resources are ‘under-used’. This brings in a rather technical discussion of what constitutes ‘over-use’ and ‘under-use’, but the most consistent formulation is that one is ‘underusing’ a territory when the ratio of a state’s population to the value of its natural resources is low compared to the other states, and ‘over-using’ it when the ration is high (see Blake & Risse 2008; Risse 2012: 158–166).

Critics of this view allege that there is a very basic difficulty with the proportionality principle, which is that it is insensitive to the myriad ways in which people interact with place, which ought to be relevant to a theory of territorial justice. It relies on a homogeneous and undifferentiated view of resources as existing in the world, and thereby raising property and distributive justice questions. This treats ‘resources’ as equivalent to natural things which can be brought under an ownership relation. Both Kolers (2009) and Moore (2012, 2015) have argued that the concept of ‘resource’ does not refer to a natural kind, but contains an important relational element, such that something gets transformed from being part of the natural world to a resource by being viewed instrumentally and that this relational character is part of how we individuate resources and distinguish resources from things in the physical world that are not resources. This means that what counts as a resource is historically, culturally and individually variable. Something can be a resource for one person or one group, because instrumental to the satisfaction of his or her purposes or needs, but not a resource for someone else, because that person does not view the object instrumentally. For example, the Lakota Sioux believe that the Black Hills are sacred, which means that they don’t view them instrumentally. When in 1980, they won a U.S. Supreme Court award, compensating them for the unlawful taking of Sioux lands, they rejected the award: they didn’t want compensation; they wanted the mining stopped. This highlights the problem with the proportionality principle and common ownership: it is biased towards intensive uses relative to population. It wrongly assumes that we view all things in the natural world from the same instrumental perspective, such that the ideas of trade-offs, compensation and use-value are obviously applicable and neutral terms to use. What is needed, critics allege, is a set of principles to adjudicate territorial claims that better respect cultural variability with respect to land.

Cara Nine has also updated the natural law tradition, focusing on Samuel Pufendorf’s theory. In a series of well-known articles and her 2012 book, she relied on a particular interpretation of Lockean arguments, but more recently she has argued that Pufendorf’s natural law/ common ownership argument is instructive for our thinking about what we now think of as the global commons. She examines the ocean as a common pool resource and the test case of rival claims in Arctic waters (Nine 2019). She argues that Pufendorf’s appeal to conventional agreements and a system of collective dominium may be the best way for assessing whether there is real benefit from exclusive use of an object (thereby potentially giving rise to property claims) and the role of necessity in adjudicating between rival claims. Nine argues that Pufendorf’s more social, conventional and collective account of our relations to the world contains a discussion of inherent limits of jurisdictional control. The claims to common pool resources, are, she argues, limited in three ways: the need to avoid domination among claimants, thus setting the stage for a deliberation amongst claimants from a position of equal status; avoiding greed,; and avoiding taking what is already used by others, which implies a recognition of the needs, commitments and expectations of others (see also Mancilla 2012). Although this is not presented as a full territorial theory, it does indicate the rich nuances of some exponents of that tradition and the way that the concepts they deployed can be serviceable to contemporary problems. It also points to a conventional account of the limits of such rights, where the conventions have to be sensitive to the equal standing of parties, and their needs and commitments. Nine then usefully discusses how this could be applied to places that we think of as part of the global commons as well as its implications for a hybrid (conventional combined with moral principles) theory of boundaries.

3.2 Consent and Natural Property Theories

There are many internal disputes amongst contemporary Lockean-inspired theorists concerning the appropriate understanding of Locke’s argument and the extent to which Locke is vulnerable to some of the standard objections. An objection was raised earlier that might be called the Swiss cheese objection: it seems unlikely that a consent argument can justify the contiguous territorial control that we might expect of a state. Some Lockean theorists, such as Hillel Steiner (1996: 144), are happy enough to accept this as an implication of a Lockean theory, but deny that it is a problem, or anyway not a fatal problem. A. John Simmons, however, has argued that the functional strand in Locke’s theory does important work, so that,

when people consent to make or join a political society, their consent should normally be understood as consent to whatever arrangements are necessary for a peaceful, stable society. (Simmons 2001: 313)

On his view, Locke’s argument has the conceptual resources to limit the ability of property-owners to exit or sell their land to people who do not accept the sovereign’s jurisdictional authority, and to ensure that all subsequent holders of the land will be bound by the obligations of state membership. In this way, Simmons contends, the Lockean argument can address two of the most important sources of non-contiguity.

There is however a rival interpretation of Locke’s theory, advanced by Bas van der Vosssen (2015), according to which states’ external boundaries are conceived of as the product of consent amongst sovereign authorities themselves, thus developing a two-stage argument for territorial rights. It is, however, not clear whether this interpretation can be easily reconciled with the distinctive feature of Locke’s account, which is the idea of property-holders consenting to create territory.

Cara Nine’s early articles and her 2012 book Global Justice and Territory also make use of Locke’s theory to explain how a state can gain entitlement to a territory. She argues that a state improves its territory, adding value to the area via the enforcement of jurisdictional rules about property, contract, and so on. This use of Locke to justify territory by a corporate agent is coherent but it is purely retrospective: it tells us that a state can be entitled to an area on the basis of what it has done, but since the state excludes other potential claimants it cannot really show that it has done more than other contending territorial agents would have done, nor does it offer the resources to decide between two contending groups, each aspiring to create a state in the region (and thereby engage in the value-enhancing jurisdictional activity). Nine’s recent work on Pufendorf and her emphasis on conventional agreements under certain conditions is focused on addressing that problem.

A. John Simmons, in his book Boundaries of Authority (2016), offers a more self-consciously Lockean theory of territory. Simmons complains that all existing territorial theories—nationalist, self-determination theories, justice theories—tend to accept a version of Waldron’s (1992) supersession thesis, which is the view that historic rights (to land) weaken over time. Simmons rejects this view, arguing, like Locke, that all political authority, to be rightful, has to be grounded in consent. He holds that indigenous people were doubly wronged, because not only did they not consent to the state, but their collectively owned property was also wrongfully annexed. This line of argument reveals a significant difference between Lockeans (who have an historical argument about justice) and other theorists. Lockeans tend to think that rights in things—including rights in land—are heritable and do not disappear as the specific right-holders and wrongdoers die off, or when the property that they had is wrongfully taken from them.

However, it could be argued that Simmons’ position is counter-intuitive, because we often do feel that the passage of time matters to the existence of rights. After all, if the interests that grounded the right no longer apply (due to changes wrought by the passage of time), then it seems that this will affect the right (which was designed to protect said interest). It’s hard to avoid this conclusion if we think of rights as protecting human interests, some of which may be relational or contingent. A deeper problem, to which this point gives rise, is that Simmons presents his Lockeanism as “an ideal theory”. However, almost everything that we are interested in—wrongful political incorporation, theft of land and then subsequent transfer—are instances of non-ideal theory, and it is not fully clear how Simmons’ Lockean insights are meant to apply in the real world. It does suggest that we need a process of apology or rectification, but Simmons does not elaborate on the form that rectification in the present should take, and how it might be reconciled with the claims, if any, of descendants of wrongful settlers, or of settler states.

3.3 Justice accounts

There are many theorists of justice and political obligation who adopt a Kantian view of the justification of the state, but fewer who try to apply this theory to justify territory. A fairly typical view is expressed by Allen Buchanan who argues that “the chief moral purpose of endowing an entity with political power is to achieve justice…” (Buchanan 2003a: 247; Waldron 2009). He then clarifies that justice involves acceptance of human rights, due process and the rule of law. This basically Kantian view is very helpful for explaining why we need states, but, like Kant’s own account, has difficulty explaining where the state ought to wield that power (the particularity problem). This in turn gives rise to three distinct, but inter-related, problems, and manoeuvres to deal with that problem.

Because Kantian theory has no internal mechanism to address the particularity problem, it accords rights over territory retrospectively, after some group or agent has succeeded in gaining political power. This seems unacceptable for a theory that, in other ways, is guided by the importance of justice and the rule of law, and deeply sub-optimal for a theory of territory, which ought to be able to adduce normative principles to adjudicate cases where more than one political community has claims to the same territory.

Another problem is that, as a theory of territory, it seems very demanding. If states do not have rights over territory unless they are just states, then, one implication of the argument is that even on a relatively minimalist view of justice (involving guarantees of human rights and due process), no state legitimately exercised territorial rights over its political community at any time prior to the twentieth century, and most states, even now, do not have legitimate territorial rights over their area (Banai 2014). But this seems counter-intuitive. One of the reasons why imperialism was thought to be wrong is that it represents a violation of the colonized state’s territorial rights. But if, say, Morocco had no territorial rights over its territory in the nineteenth Century, when it was colonized by France (on the reasonable assumption that Morocco was not, at the time, human rights-respecting), then there was no specific wrong about imperialism, or indeed any specific violation in French governance over that territory. Of course, we could just say that French rule turned out to be wrongful because it turned out to be unjust, but that argument would also apply to the rule that preceded imperialism and the rule after decolonization, which some have argued is counter-intuitive (Moore 2014, 2015, 2019a).

A third problem, which is closely related to the two difficulties above, is that most theorists who adopt this line of argument tend to distinguish full justice from legitimacy, and so confer territorial rights on less-than-ideally just states. This means that while the theory seems to set the bar quite high in terms of the justification of the state, it is low when it is applied to actual states, especially when we examine the historical trajectory that enabled the state to gain rights over that geographical space. Many states have originated in deeply unjust practices: they gained territory through conquest, trickery and other forms of brutality. This sits uneasily with the overall emphasis on justice in the theory. It also introduces a problematic, because very status quo-oriented realpolitik element into the theory, and so tends to justify existing territorial orders, including ones that gained their territory through conquest and deceit. This may be a problem in Lea Ypi’s justice based account (Ypi 2014), which contends that states are only “provisionally” as opposed to “conclusively” justified until we have an international agreement on existing territory. But since having a universal agreement on territory is very unlikely in the medium to long-term future, this amounts to accepting (albeit with the adjective ‘provisionally’) whatever territorial entities there currently are, and treating these as ‘provisionally’ rightful.

3.4 Nationalist theories

Nationalism has been identified as a relatively modern phenomenon—with some theorists pinpointing its rise with the French Revolution, and the associated principle of self-determination; and others with the rise of print media, which created a community of people who shared similar political values and aspirations and identities, but were not related in a face-to-face way (Anderson 1983). Nationalism, even in its earliest versions, appealed to the idea of a ‘national homeland’, but this was not defended philosophically, nor grounded in terms of any particular values. More recently, several theorists (Miller 2007; Meisels 2009; Gans 2003) have sought to defend liberal nationalism, which involves articulating an account of how a nation can come to have a particular territory. The structure of this argument—identifying a link between the right-holding group (the nation) and the land—has a Lockean structure, but the right-holder is not the individual person, but instead a collective—the nation.

What is a nation? David Miller defines a nation as

a community (1) constituted by shared beliefs and mutual commitments, (2) extended in history, (3) active in character, (4) connected to a particular territory, and (5) marked off from other communities by its distinct public culture. (Miller 1995: 27)

The connection to land is definitional of a nation. The relationship between people and land is not simply assumed: rather, an account is given of the inter-relationship between group culture and land. People who inhabit a certain territory shape the land that they occupy; their culture is mixed with the physical characteristics of the land, and the physical characteristics shape the culture that they develop. Land has value for the people, both objective value, because they improve it in various ways, building places of religious worship and developing cities and irrigating farmland; and subjective value, because the land comes to have symbolic significance for them, as they bury their dead in certain places, build monuments to significant historic achievements or losses, and so on. (Miller 2007: 217–218). In this way, a group comes to have a special relationship to land that they occupy, and can make a better claim to that land than any other group. This argument does not yet justify territorial rights, however. This is established via a further argument that in order to maintain value (subjective and objective) in land, the people need to have jurisdictional authority over it (Miller 2012: 263).

This argument has no difficulty explaining the wrong of conquest (even if the conquering state is more effective or objectively just than the political order that it replaces), since the link between the group and the land is established prior to the political order. Therefore any conquest of the land represents a violation of the interests, subjective and objective, of group members. Although the contours or precise boundaries of the nation are somewhat permeable, this type of argument is able to identify a group and then define the land to which the group is entitled. It is not clear how exactly we are to adjudicate cases where two groups are subjectively and objectively attached to the same territory—as with Jerusalem—although Miller seems to think that a comparative assessment of the claims will be able to yield conclusions in most cases, and in some cases will endorse a shared sovereignty arrangement (Miller 2014).

One key problem with this theory is that the territorial right-holder is conceived of as a ‘nation’, and some have argued that this is problematic because potentially exclusionary. Proponents of this argument endorse a liberal form of nationalism, so conceive of the culture as a thin, public culture potentially inclusive of many different groups in society. Nevertheless, one might think that any reference to a cultural nation suffers from both over-inclusion and under-inclusion. The over-inclusion problem is that the actual ‘cultural mixing’ which is supposed to explain rights to land could also apply to cultural groups that are not nations, such as neighborhood cultures or sub-cultures in society. Do they not also mix their culture with the geographical area and so have right to protect the value so created? Another sort of problem is that any reference to ‘cultural nation’ might seem to raise the problem of essentialism, which is that it rests on particular (essential) features as necessary or important to the culture or nation, which then has the effect of marginalizing people who do not share in that feature (Moore 2019b). Miller is careful to offer a Wittgensteinian family resemblance conception of nations, which is designed to address the problem of essentialism by not specifying that any particular feature or value is necessary, but one may wonder whether this conceptual move is consistent with the account of ‘value’ in the land, which may reify certain properties.

3.5 Ethnogeographic Group Theory of territory

Avery Kolers, in his book Land, Conflict and Justice, puts forward a theory of territory that has the same structure as nationalist theories, in linking (unstructured) groups with land first and then describing the state later, but he identifies the territorial right-holding group as an ‘ethnogeographic community’ rather than a nation. By this term, Kolers means a group of people that (i) share a specific social ontology of land, and he clarifies that this means “a culturally specific conception of land, what land is, what about it is valuable” (Kolers 2009: 3–4) and (ii) a specific material relationship with land, so that the community in question is characterized by pervasive material interaction between the land and the community. The two criteria—one subjective, the other objective—are somewhat different, since the former seems to include cultural significance and meanings, whereas the latter tracks economic and functional considerations. However, as Kolers notes, there are reasons to believe that our ideas about land often reflect our material interests and material relationship with it. In his examples, most cases exemplify both conditions. As these can come apart, we could suppose that they are jointly necessary and sufficient conditions.

Kolers’ theory appeals to the notion of ‘plenitude’ to explain how a group can be attached to an area, and this seems like it ought to be able to adjudicate rival claims, and potentially limit the scope of territorial rights. Plenitude, for Kolers, involves (1) internal diversity, (2) external distinctness, each from the perspective of the claimants, and (3) feasible plans for maintaining these in perpetuity (Kolers 2009: 115). Plenitude is claimed to be value-neutral in the sense that it does not rest on a normatively contested theory of appropriate use, and is compatible with an ecologically sensitive commitment to keeping some areas in their natural state without reverting to common ownership in the sense of a libertarian free-for-all.

However, since ‘plenitude’ has a number of different dimensions, it’s not clear that it represents an authoritative mechanism to decide between rival claims. More than one group can make claims on those bases to the same piece of land. What if one group recognizes its internal diversity and a different group its external differentiation? What if neither has feasible plans for maintaining them in perpetuity? Since this is not a single criterion at all, but embodies at least three different requirements, it’s possible that all could be met by more than one group, or that some elements could be met different groups. Unfortunately, Kolers does not indicate what to do in this situation, which means that Kolers’ theory is less precise in addressing rival claims and conflict than it initially seems to be.

3.6 Self-determination theories

Self-determination theories of territory have the same overall shape as nationalist theories, but they seek to avoid the difficulties of assuming culturally homogeneous nations by ascribing territorial rights to a ‘people’ understood as a politically-organized rather than cultural group. Anna Stilz (2019: 10) argues that her account is built on three pillars: a property-like right of occupancy; the value of ‘basic justice’, conceptualized in Kantian terms of the requirements of an ‘omnilateral will’; and the value of collective self-determination. Margaret Moore (2015: 66) appeals to the first and third: that a state holds territorial rights (by acting as a vehicle of self-determination” for a group; and that the group must “legitimately occupy” the territory. Although Moore does not emphasize basic justice as a requirement for holding territorial rights (though she claims it is necessary for legitimate governance), she argues that there are functional and justice reasons why the state should be organized territorially—to secure equal treatment for all citizens of the state, justice, and the rule of law. Stilz deploys more Kantian language, to describe her commitment to justice, but this isn’t central to her theory of territory, in the sense that it does not help to define the boundaries of particular territories, nor does this argument contribute to the justification for particular territories.

Both Moore and Stilz explore the moral relationship between people and place through invoking the idea of what it means for a people to occupy a place. The central difference between Moore’s and Stilz’s accounts are the different accounts of the holders of occupancy rights. Both agree that the occupancy right-holder must occupy the land legitimately (meaning that it has not displaced someone else) and it must be rooted in that geographical space by the life-plans and projects of the group’s members. However, Stilz’s theory describes the holder of occupancy rights as the individual; and Moore disaggregates different ‘incidents’ of occupancy rights, so that some are held by individuals (which she calls individual residency rights) and some are held by groups (which she calls a group-based occupancy right). The key element, for Moore, in the transition to territorial rights is the group-based occupancy right. Both argue that occupancy requires more than physical presence: the individual and/or group must be rooted in that geographical space by the individual life-plans, and, for Moore, the collective projects of the group’s members.

There are three important challenges to self-determination theories. Both Stilz and Moore can explain why people should not be expelled or relocated—because it will disrupt their located life plans—but neither can offer precise guidelines for boundary–drawing. This is because Moore’s group occupancy principle can only identify heartlands of groups, but as she concedes, in many cases, this does not draw precise boundaries because often groups overlap on the same land. It does not therefore provide an easy solution to border disputes. In many cases, territories cannot be parcelled into discrete units and power-sharing forms of self-determination between groups are necessary in particular areas. Stilz’s theory seems to be even less determinate with respect to identifying the location and scope of territorial rights because it’s not clear that individual located life plans would converge on the same place at all. Although Stilz uses the case of Navajos as a case of a group that was wrongly expelled, it’s not clear where the individual Navajos are entitled to return to, and why their claims are any different from any other person, who has plans with respect to a place, and in which, individual variation being as it is, there may or may not be overlap among different individual Navajos.

Second, the emphasis on collective self-determination as the value that territorial rights realize seems to apply most straightforwardly to groups that engage in democratic self-determination, because then we can then be confident that the state is the vehicle of the group self-determination. If this is so, then, both Moore and Stilz are vulnerable to the criticism that is parallel to one that is levelled against justice theorists, viz., that either the bar to being a territorial right-holder is so high that many states would not meet it (which seems somewhat counter-intuitive); or the bar is so low that it raises questions whether such an entity could be justified on a self-determination argument. Both Moore and Stilz partially avoid the most troubling implication of this as they argue that the appeal to self-determination distinguishes between internal and external threats to state territorial integrity and that they can thereby explain the value that is lost by external intervention.

Third, whether self-determination could be realized or not depends on whether the occupancy group (in Moore’s theory) or the aggregate individuals who have occupancy rights (in Stilz’s theory) have the capacity to be the right kind of agent to exercise jurisdiction. However, the capacity condition is normatively problematic. If we define capacity broadly, it suggests that any state that is conquered or failed lacks capacity and is therefore not an appropriate agent for territorial rights. This is counter-intuitive, because many groups lack capacity because they have been denied it through previous injustice. Thus it seems that this condition is too sensitive to power configurations for a normative theory of territorial rights. Moore attempts to avoid this problem by emphasizing that there are third-party duties to refrain from interference and to assist groups that suffer from burdened conditions. However, this strategy could be criticized as being ad hoc, in the sense that it is not based on a principled definition of what counts as ‘capacity’.

4. Future Directions

The recent surge of interest in territorial justice and territorial rights may be attributed to the fact that it has become clear that the different elements of the bundle of territorial rights are connected to a wide range of increasingly important and pressing debates, such as resource justice, migration and secession. Some of the most interesting work on migration justice takes into account the issue of rights over territory (Ochoa Espejo 2016; Song 2018). The interest in resource justice may be connected to the obvious fact that there are many different claims for common pool resources and some of these are being increasingly degraded. This makes more pressing the question of who has entitlement to control resources and what are the terms under which individuals or groups should interact with such places (Armstrong 2017; Nine 2014, 2019; Banai 2016). Armstrong (2017, 2018), has focused on resource justice and on the special case of the oceans which is a particularly significant common pool resource. Some of this interest is connected to technological innovations which make possible harvesting resources in the seabed, or potentially in space.

Another area of recent interest has been the implications of occupancy rights, which are discussed in self-determination theories, and has recently been deployed in relation to indigenous land rights (Colburn 2019), gentrification (Huber & Wolkenstein 2018), wrongful expulsion from land (Moore 2013), and people who inhabit islands which are doomed to sink with the effect of climate change (Blomfield 2019; Kolers 2012a; Nine 2019). If these theorists are correct to theorize a moral relationship between people and place, then, the loss suffered by people who are displaced by climate change cannot be redressed fully simply by allowing them to migrate to another place: they have lost their home and community, and the place that they are attached to.

There is also a burgeoning literature on territorial rights that question the fixity of current theories, and give greater attention to the overlapping and fluid nature of human’s relations to the natural world and its implications for governance, resources, and diverse claims (see Mancilla forthcoming; Nine forthcoming). This is another instance of the way in which focus on territory and territorial justice has implications for a wide set of literatures in quite different areas, and potentially gives rise to a host of related arguments on diverse topics.


Historical political theorists are cited in a way that is accessible regardless of which edition one uses. The acronyms refer to the essay cited:

  • Grotius, [ML], Mare Liberum, 1609.
  • –––, [DJB], De jure belli ac pacis, 1625
  • –––, [RWP], Rights of War and Peace (1625)
  • Kant, [MM], Metaphysics of Morals (1785)
  • –––, [PP], Perpetual Peace (1795)
  • Locke, [ST], Second Treatise of Government (1689)
  • Pufendorf, [DMC], On the Duty of Man and Citizen according to Natural Law (1673)
  • Selden, [MC], Mare Clauseum (1635)

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Other Internet Resources

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