Global Justice

First published Fri Mar 6, 2015; substantive revision Fri Jun 9, 2023

On common accounts, we have a state of justice when everyone has their due. The study of justice has been concerned with what we owe one another, what obligations we might have to treat each other fairly in a range of domains, including over distributive and recognitional matters. Contemporary political philosophers had focused their theorizing about justice almost exclusively within the state, but the last twenty-five years or so has seen a marked extension to the global sphere, with a huge expansion in the array of topics covered. While some, such as matters of just conduct in war, have long been of concern, others are more recent and arise especially in the context of contemporary phenomena like intensified globalization, economic integration, and potentially catastrophic pandemics and anthropogenic climate change.

John Rawls’s seminal book The Law of Peoples initiated many debates about global justice (Rawls 1999). Several questions soon became prominent in discussions including: What principles should guide international action? What responsibilities do we have to the global poor? Should global inequality be morally troubling? Are there types of non-liberal people who should be tolerated? What kind of foreign policy is consistent with liberal values? Is a “realistic utopia” possible in the global domain? How might we transition effectively towards a less unjust world?

Contemporary events also played an enormous role in prompting philosophical inquiries. Prominent cases of genocide, ethnic cleansing, forms of terrorism uncommon prior to 2001, intensified interest in immigration to affluent countries, increased dependence on the labor of those from low-income countries, and enormous threats to well-being, security and the environment became common catalysts for further work. Philosophers began to reflect on questions such as: Is it ever permissible to engage in coercive military action for humanitarian purposes, such as to halt genocide or prevent large-scale violations of human rights? Can terrorism ever be justified? Should affluent countries open their borders more generously than they currently do to those from low-income countries who would like to immigrate to them? Are our current global economic arrangements fair ones and if not, how should they be transformed? What responsibilities do we have to one another in a globalized, post-Westphalian world order? How should we allocate responsibilities for reducing global injustice in our world, such as in the case of distributing costs associated with addressing climate change?

Increased interest concerning issues of global justice also coincided with enhanced interest in the place and value of nationalism. These explorations tracked events such as nationalist clashes which spilled over into widespread suffering (notably in the former Yugoslavia and Rwanda), increased calls for national self-determination to carry considerable weight, such as in state recognition for Palestinians or Tibetans, and also in the case of secession (prominently, Quebec). In this area global justice theorists have been concerned with a range of important questions such as: Under what conditions should claims to national self-determination be granted substantial weight? When should self-determination yield to concern for protecting human rights? Are commitments to nationalism and global justice compatible? Is genuine democracy only possible at the state level or are there robust forms of democracy that are possible in more international fora? How are ideals of democracy best incorporated into defensible global institutional arrangements? Is world justice possible without a world state? In recent years reflection on existential threats like climate change, war, and pandemics and how perspectives of the oppressed might inform the future of the sub-discipline, have contributed new dimensions to answering core questions along with adding central questions within the field.

The primary purpose of this article is to give an orientation to the enormous and rapidly expanding field of global justice. There are several entries in this encyclopedia that already cover some of the core topics well and these will be cross-referenced. But there are still many important gaps, along with some missing context as to how some topics fit together. This entry aims primarily to address these needs.

1. Some Definitional Issues

1.1 Global and International Justice

A distinction is often drawn between global and international justice. The key point of difference between these two notions involves clarifying the entities among which justice is sought. In international justice the nation or state is taken as the central entity of concern and justice among nations or states is the focus. In the domain of global justice, by contrast, theorists do not seek primarily to define justice between states or nations. Rather they drill down through the state shell and inquire about what justice requires among human beings. Global justice inquiries take individual human beings as of primary concern and seek to give an account of what fairness among such agents involves. There are several types of actions that cut across states or involve different agents, relationships, and structures that might be invisible in an inquiry seeking justice among states exclusively. Many different kinds of interactions are not circumscribed by state membership and yet can importantly affect human beings’ most fundamental interests, so asking the question about what individual human beings owe one another often uncovers significant neglected features of relationships and structures that are of normative concern. Global justice analyses are not precluded from yielding state-level obligations; indeed, they typically do. However, they consider a wider array of possible agents and organizations that might have duties as well.

There are advantages associated with both types of inquiries. An important advantage of asking what states owe one another is that much international law presupposes the states system and requires states to perform various actions to promote justice. In this way, responsibilities often appear to be clearly allocated to particular parties thus making it quite precise who ought to do what in our actual world. One advantage of global justice inquiries is that we are not forced to take states as a fixed constraint and we can therefore consider a range of relevant relationships, capacities and roles that also structure our interactions and might be relevant to how we ought to conceptualize global responsibilities. While asking about what individuals owe each other may well have implications for states and their obligations, a range of other agents and institutions may also have relevant justice obligations. These responsibilities can become more visible when we explore what individuals owe each other. The two approaches have different strengths and can complement each other, but in contemporary debate they are often taken as rivals competing to provide the most plausible framework.

For further discussion of international justice, see the entry on international distributive justice.

1.2 What is a Theory of Global Justice?

In general, a theory of global justice aims to give us an account of what justice on a global scale consists in and this often includes discussion of the following components:

  1. identifying what should count as important problems of global justice
  2. positing solutions to each identified problem
  3. identifying who might have responsibilities in addressing the target problem
  4. arguing for positions about what particular agents (or collections of agents) ought to do in connection with solving each problem and
  5. providing a normative view which grounds (1)–(4).

Theories of global justice aim to help us understand our world better and what our responsibilities are in it. While some theorists aim purely at theoretical understanding, others hope also to provide an analysis that can be useful in practical policy making concerning global justice matters.

1.3 When is a Problem a Global Justice Problem?

Problems of global justice arise when one (or more) of the following conditions obtain:

  1. Actions stemming from an agent, institution, practice, activity (and so on) that can be traced to one (or more) states negatively affect residents in another state.
  2. Institutions, practices, policies, activities (and so on) in one (or more) states could bring about a benefit or reduce harm to those resident in another state.
  3. There are normative considerations that require agents in one state to take certain actions with respect to agents or entities in another. Such actions might be mediated through institutions, policies, or norms.
  4. We cannot solve a problem that affects residents of one or more states without co-operation from other states.

So, in general, a problem is one of global justice when the problem either affects agents resident in more than one state or the problem is unresolvable without their co-operation. For the problem to be considered genuinely global rather than regional it should affect more than one regional area.

2. Principles to Guide Behavior in International and Global Matters

What sorts of duties of justice, if any, exist among human beings who do not reside in the same country? If there are such duties, what grounds them? Some argue that John Rawls’s principles developed for the case of domestic justice, notably, the Fair Equality of Opportunity Principle or the Difference Principle, should apply globally (Beitz 1999; Caney 2005a; Moellendorf 2002). Others maintain that the content of our duties to one another is best explored by examining alternative concepts not featured in the Rawlsian corpus, such as capabilities or human rights (Nussbaum 2006; Pogge 2008; Nussbaum 2015).

Much discussion about what we owe one another in the global context is influenced by the work of John Rawls, so a short synopsis is needed to situate debates. Since discussion of these issues is amply covered in the entries on international distributive justice and John Rawls, this will be a compressed summary focusing only on the most central aspects of the debate that have a bearing on core topics of global justice.

2.1 The Influence of Rawls’s Law of Peoples

In The Law of Peoples, John Rawls argues for eight principles that he believes should regulate international interactions of peoples. For Rawls, a “people” is constituted by a group of persons who have in common sufficient characteristics such as culture, history, tradition, or sentiment. Rawls uses the term “people” in ways that relevantly correspond with how many use the term “nation”. In addition, Rawls often assumes that, for the most part, each people has a state.

The eight principles Rawls endorses acknowledge peoples’ independence and equality, that peoples have the right to self-determination along with having duties of non-intervention, that they ought to observe treaties, honor a particular list of human rights, should conduct themselves in certain appropriate ways if they engage in warfare, and that they have duties to assist other peoples in establishing institutions to enable people’s self-determination. He also advocates for international institutions governing trade, borrowing, and other international matters that are characteristically dealt with by the United Nations.

Several claims have been the subject of much debate between critics and defenders of Rawls’s position. In particular, Rawls believes that so long as all peoples have a set of institutions that enable citizens to lead decent lives, any global inequality that might remain is not morally troubling. Critics draw attention to the ways in which global inequality – perhaps in levels of power or affluence – can convert into opportunities for deprivation and disadvantage. For instance, the global advantaged can use their superior position to influence the rules that govern international institutions – such as trade practices – which can facilitate further opportunities for increased advantage and so they can indeed threaten the abilities of others in distant lands to lead decent lives (Pogge 2008).[1]

Another important issue that underlies debate between Rawls and his critics concerns different views about the nature and origins of prosperity. Rawls gives a particularly strong statement of what he takes the causes of prosperity to be. He claims that the causes of the wealth of a people can be traced to the domestic political culture, the virtues and vices of leaders, and the quality of domestic institutions. He says:

I believe that the causes of the wealth of a people and the forms it takes lie in their political culture and in the religious, philosophical, and moral traditions that support the basic structure of their political and social institutions, as well as in the industriousness and cooperative talents of its members … The crucial elements that make the difference are the political culture, the political virtues and civic society of the country (Rawls 1999, 108).

Critics observe that in addition to local factors, there are also international ones which play an important role in prospects for well-being. Thomas Pogge prominently helps bring some of these into view. The international borrowing and resource privileges, are good examples of the ways in which international practices can have profound effects on domestic factors which undeniably also play a role in promoting prosperity. According to the international borrowing privilege, governments may borrow amounts of money on behalf of the country and the country thereby incurs an obligation to repay the debt. The international resource privilege refers to a government’s ability to do what it likes with resources, including selling them to whomever it chooses to and at what price. Any group that exercises effective power in a state is internationally recognized as the legitimate government of that territory and enjoys the two privileges. But, Pogge argues, this sets up undesirable incentives that hamper developing countries’ abilities to flourish (Pogge 2008). These include incentivizing those strongly motivated to hold office for material gain to take power by force or exercise it in ways that help reinforce oppressive governments’ abilities to retain control. The global advantaged benefit greatly from these privileges and so have little incentive to reform them. But, according to Pogge, reforms are sorely needed. If only sufficiently legitimate governments are able to enjoy these privileges, the international community would remove one important obstacle developing countries currently face.

Defenders of Rawls’s views argue that his position is more complex than is commonly acknowledged and allows for both a principled stance on some fundamental values along with appropriate openness to alternative ways in which legitimate and decent peoples might organize their collective lives (Reidy 2004; Freeman 2006). They argue that Rawls’s position shows great sensitivity to a number of factors that must be weighed in considering right conduct in international affairs. For instance, when Rawls makes his bold claims about the causes of wealth it is useful to bear in mind the context in which he is arguing. Against an assumption that resources are enormously important for a society’s ability to flourish, Rawls emphasizes the importance of strong institutions, political culture and other local factors, in sustaining decent lives for citizens. Rawls also reflects on the difficulty of changing political culture, noting that simply transferring resources will not help. Interestingly, in a little discussed passage, Rawls ventures that an “emphasis on human rights may work to change ineffective regimes and the conduct of rulers who have been callous about the well-being of their own people” (Rawls 1999, 109). For more on whether Rawls provides us with a cogent model that can provide sage guidance in international matters see the entries on on international distributive justice and John Rawls. See also Martin and Reidy (2006). For the purposes of this entry we need only summarize some key questions that were influential in setting the terms of discussion about global justice for some time.

Some key questions are:

  1. What principles should govern interactions among peoples at the global level?
  2. What are the causes of prosperity and are they traceable entirely to domestic factors or are international considerations relevant?
  3. What should count as the kind of prosperity or well-being that we are aiming to promote?
  4. Do we have an obligation to ensure people have their basic needs met and can otherwise lead “decent” lives, or should we be more concerned with global socio-economic equality?
  5. What duties do we have to those peoples who do not yet have what they need for self-determination or prosperity?
  6. If human rights serve an important role in world affairs, which rights should be on our list of those to endorse? What duties arise from such commitment?
  7. Can we properly hold nations to be entirely responsible for the well-being of their people and if so, in what kinds of conditions might this make sense? How do we encourage nations to take responsibility for their people’s well-being?
  8. When we consider what we owe one another, do compatriots deserve special consideration?

We trace some of the influential positions that have shaped answers to these questions next.

2.2 What Global Duties Do We Have?

One of the most visible and large-scale contemporary global justice problems we face is that of global poverty. What ought we to do for the 1 billion or so people who currently live in poverty? This is a huge area nicely canvassed in the entry on international distributive justice. A few seminal arguments deserve mention here as well, however. In a classic argument Peter Singer describes a so-called easy rescue case in which an infant is drowning in a shallow pond. You happen by and can save the child with minimal effort and inconvenience on your part. Singer argues that you would be obligated to assist using the principle that when it is in our power to prevent something bad from happening without sacrificing anything significant or comparable, it is wrong not to prevent the bad from occurring. So, Singer argues that we have extensive duties to assist needy others, whether they be geographically proximate or not. We have extensive duties to assist the global poor who, with equally minimal effort on our part, can be saved from dire circumstances, since the same principle applies in both cases (Singer 1972). (For more treatment see Unger 1996 and for criticism see Lichtenberg 2013).

Thomas Pogge offers another influential contribution in World Poverty and Human Rights. He argues that since developed countries impose a coercive global order on the poor that foreseeably and avoidably causes great harm, they have important responsibilities to reform the global order such that it ceases to do so and instead better secures human rights (Pogge 2002, 2008, 2010). We harm the global poor when we collaborate in imposing an unjust global institutional order on them and, moreover, that order is unjust when it foreseeably perpetuates large-scale human rights deficits that can reasonably be avoided were we to make quite feasible institutional modifications (Pogge 2002, 2008, 2010). We also harm the poor when we deprive them of their resources and through a shared and violent history (Pogge 2008). While Singer emphasizes our capacity to assist with need satisfaction, Pogge emphasizes instead our contributions to the problem as grounding our duties.

When discussing our duties to one another there is also vigorous debate about what the content and target of our duties should be, along with discussion about what are the best ways to discharge these. Traditional dominant economic approaches to promoting prosperity have focused on raising income levels or increasing Gross Domestic Product (GDP). Railing against such approaches, Amartya Sen suggested that the capabilities approach provides an improved measure of well-being and constitutes a better way to capture changes in people’s condition over time (Sen 1980). Exploring what people are able to do and be provides a more appropriate standard by which to evaluate whether their condition has improved rather than focusing exclusively on their incomes or per capita GDP. Martha Nussbaum develops this approach and argues for a list of ten capabilities that should be secured for all people in all places. This universal list can provide an important tool in persuading governments to make reforms conducive to their citizens’ flourishing. (See the entry on the capability approach for more.) Another important discourse for discussing duties is that of human rights which is discussed in Section 2.4 below. Before we continue it is important to mention that there are many possible ways to understand the content of our duties to one another. (For more see entries on egalitarianism, equality, sufficiency, capability theory, well-being, and needs in moral and political philosophy). The issue of our duties to one another is a vast topic and we continue to discuss it throughout this entry. This section serves only as an introduction.

2.3 Cosmopolitanism, Duties to Non-Compatriots, and Compatriots

When considering what we owe one another, are compatriots special? Do we have the same duties to non-compatriots as we have to compatriots or is there some principled way in which these two sets of duties ought to differ?

Nationalists argue that we belong to national communities and any account of our global responsibilities that ignores this omits an important aspect of how we relate – and ought to relate – to one another. They argue that nations can provide a valuable grounding for social attachment, identity and meaning in life, and can ground special obligations to strengthen national life and assist co-nationals (Miller 1995; Tamir 1993; Lenard 2012). Others defend the value of nationalism on instrumental grounds; there is nothing inherently special about our co-national relationships but state boundaries are useful in assigning important duties to particular agents (Goodin 1998). In a world of great unmet need, paying special attention to one’s co-nationals can be justified (Goodin 1998; Lenard 2012).[2]

In the words of Diogenes, widely credited as the first person to propound cosmopolitan views, cosmopolitans see themselves as “citizens of the world”. Contemporary cosmopolitans typically hold that every human being has standing as an ultimate unit of moral concern and is entitled to equal consideration of her interests no matter what other affiliations, especially national affiliations, she might have. Drawing on the idea that we all have equal moral worth, cosmopolitans seek to broaden our moral horizons so that we do not forget about the responsibilities we have to others beyond state borders, even when we have local responsibilities as well.

Prominent cosmopolitans frequently offer accounts that feature different elements. Martha Nussbaum emphasizes that, as human beings, we belong to a global community of human persons (Nussbaum 1996). Nussbaum argues that while love for one’s country might have a legitimate place in people’s conceptions of a good life, we should not overlook the many other relationships we are in which connect us to others in the world. We need to draw the global community in closer to the local one, and, more generally, aim to see ourselves as members of overlapping communities which also have important claims on us.

By contrast, Thomas Pogge focuses on the implications of cosmopolitanism for the global institutional order. We need to ensure that global institutional structures give equal consideration to everyone’s interests. He says, “Insofar as human agents are involved in the design or administration of global rules, practices, or organizations, they ought to disregard their private and local, including national, commitments and loyalties to give equal consideration to the needs and interests of every human being on this planet” (Pogge 2013, 298). This equal-consideration-of-interests requirement only applies to such contexts. While such impartiality norms are perfectly familiar within the state, for instance, when judges operate in law courts, we have yet to realize the requirement at the global level.

It is often assumed that cosmopolitanism must necessarily be in tension with more local attachments to friends, family or compatriots. Some cosmopolitans believe such conflict is inevitable, unproblematic and a necessary part of understanding what cosmopolitanism entails (Ypi 2013a). Others argue for different ways in which the apparent tensions could be resolved (Pogge 2013; Tan 2004; Appiah 2007; Cabrera 2020). As we see above, Pogge emphasizes the clear separation of spheres in which equal consideration of people’s interests applies. Kok-Chor Tan offers a similar argument. His strategy is to show that cosmopolitan principles should govern global institutional structures that ensure people are treated as equals in their entitlements (Tan 2004). When this is the case there can be a legitimate role for patriotism that operates within such constraints. Partiality to co-nationals need not conflict with cosmopolitan obligations. Another notable strategy is to argue that we cannot achieve justice at a national level unless we attend to justice at a global level. On this view, we have at least instrumental reasons to care about global justice, even if we care deeply about social justice in our nation (Banai; Ronzoni and Schemmel 2011; Ronzoni 2013).

There is an important debate among egalitarian theorists about whether our concern with equality should be confined to members of the same state or whether it should extend to all globally. Some theorists argue that careful consideration of notions such as reciprocity, coercion, or fair terms of co-operation mandate that we give special weighting to the interests of compatriots (Blake 2013). Others, by contrast, argue that these concerns, when properly understood, point in the direction of equally strong duties to non-compatriots. One form of the argument that we have special duties to compatriots that are not shared with non-compatriots, draws on the coercive legal structure that applies within states and claims that such coercive structures do not apply outside of them (R. Miller 1998; Blake 2001). Another highly influential version claims that there is a difference in the authority to enforce justice within and outside the state (Nagel 2005). There are many important challenges to such positions. One important line of argument maintains that coercion is indeed relevant in triggering duties of egalitarian justice, but since this is rampant at the global level it activates global not just national egalitarian duties (Cohen and Sabel 2006; Abizadeh 2007; Valentini 2012). So, the same ingredients Nagel identifies as crucial in generating state authority exist at the global level as well (Cohen and Sabel 2006). Nicole Hassoun argues that there are many coercive international institutions and that, to be legitimate, these institutions must ensure that everyone they subject to coercive rules can secure what they need to consent or object to these rules. This requires adequate food, water, shelter, education, healthcare and the social and emotional support they require for sufficient autonomy (Hassoun 2012). Laura Valentini suggests coercion requires freedom as independence (non-domination) but this does not require egalitarianism in the global sphere. Rather, a just global order would be inclusive, not oppressive (Tan 2013, 25). Others provide novel ways of defending cosmopolitan egalitarian theories or combining them with statist commitments. Pablo Gilabert articulates a contractualist theory of egalitarian justice that generates positive obligations to eradicate severe poverty globally even without robust international institutions or cosmopolitan solidarity (2012). Similarly, Lea Ypi defends a statist cosmopolitanism that stresses the importance of political obligations to support cosmopolitan ends. She suggests a significant degree of equality is important for helping everyone secure a basic minimum and cultural resources, a sense of justice, and education can help promote this equality (Ypi 2012; on education and global justice, in particular, see Culp 2020a). Ypi sees fostering the commitment to cosmopolitan ideals as a political, as well as moral, task (Ypi 2013a).

Once again, these are vast topics and more treatment can be found elsewhere in this encyclopedia, such as the entry on international distributive justice. For comprehensive treatment of nationalism and cosmopolitanism see the entries on nationalism and cosmopolitanism, respectively.

2.4 Human Rights Fulfillment

Discussion of global justice matters often invokes concern for human rights. In fact, for all their differences, both nationalists and cosmopolitans frequently agree that a good way to think about some of our duties to one another is via human rights. Human rights can and do therefore serve as an important discourse for furthering discussion about our global responsibilities.

Respecting human rights is an important requirement in much international law and can be a key criterion in evaluating whether governments are considered legitimate by the international community. The United Nations Universal Declaration of Human Rights is a highly influential account of all human beings’ basic entitlements and this document often plays an important role in real world debates about justice matters. See the comprehensive entry on human rights for more detail. Here we have space to discuss only two issues that have been prominent in debates about global justice.

The first concerns the kinds of duties we have in relation to human rights. Against a conventional view widespread before 1980, Henry Shue argues that if rights to physical security are basic, so are rights to subsistence (Shue 1980). A careful analysis of the duties associated with human rights indicates that the commonly held distinction between positive and negative duties cannot be maintained. All rights have a range of both positive and negative duties associated with them.

The second prominent issue concerns whether our failures in relation to fulfilling human rights amount to rights violations. Thomas Pogge (2008) offers an influential account of duties with respect to human rights. Our current global order perpetuates global poverty on a massive scale, but since feasible reforms to that order could avert this harm, our failure to make reforms not only implicates us in the misery but also in the violation of the rights of the poor.[3] We therefore have extensive obligations to reform our global order so that the rights of the poor can be fulfilled.

Many theorists have done important work on a range of issues concerning human rights and international obligations (Buchanan 2004; Hessler 2005; Nickel 2007; Beitz 2009; Holder and Reidy 2013; Song 2019). Theorists have also focused attention on particular rights, prominently the right to health (Wolff 2013). Some important questions include: What are human rights’ grounds or can they be defined by their functions? Are human rights properly moral or political/legal? Does respect for rights conflict with community obligations or respect for culture? What is the proper role of human rights in morality, law, and policy? How should we best understand the normative implications of our contemporary human rights practice? (Wolff 2013; Cruft, Liao, and Renzo 2015; Gilabert 2019; Etinson 2018; O’Neill 2005; Beitz 2009; Brock 2023).

For more treatment of issues, especially concerning what human rights are, which rights are rightly construed as human rights, and how human rights function in international law, see the entry on human rights.

3. The Proper Use of Force, Military Intervention, and its Aftermath

3.1 War and Just Conduct

Within the field of global justice, issues concerning war have one of the longest histories. The just war framework has been influential in setting the terms of much debate about the proper use of force in international affairs. Aristotle, Cicero, Augustine and Thomas Aquinas offered some of the earliest accounts of the criteria that should be met for war to be justified. Two areas have been especially thoroughly studied: (1) the conditions under which entry into the war is justified (Jus Ad Bellum) and (2) the conditions for fair conduct within the war (Jus In Bello). While having a just cause is standardly held to be a necessary condition for a war to be justified, it is not sufficient. Theorists often disagree about which additional conditions must be satisfied for a war to be characterized as a just war. The most common additional conditions proposed are that the war should be undertaken by a proper authority, with the right intentions, when the war would follow requirements of proportionality (the ends to be secured would warrant going to war), only as a last resort, and when there are reasonable prospects of success. On traditional accounts of just war theory all conditions must be met, while several theorists challenge whether they are all necessary (Mellow 2006; Moellendorf 2002; Walzer 1983).

Once the fighting begins two central principles guide evaluation of whether the war is being conducted fairly: one which respects the distinction between combatants and noncombatants (The Principle of Non-Combatant Immunity) and another that governs what counts as the proportional use of force (Proportionality). On the first, it is not legitimate to use force against civilians and, even though some collateral civilian damage may occur, it is wrong to deliberately target non-combatants. On the second, combatants may only use the force necessary to achieve their ends – the force used must be proportional to the ends that are to be secured in conducting the war. There are further requirements governing fairness, such as requirements to comply with international laws and treat prisoners fairly, but the two featured principles are the most commonly invoked in normative analyses of Jus In Bello.

The third part of just war theory (Jus Post Bellum) concerns how the war concludes and the transition back to a situation of peace (Bass 2004, Rodin 2008). It deals with issues such as compensation, punishment, and reform (Ohlin 2014). A fourth component has been suggested especially in light of engagements in Iraq and Afghanistan in the years 2001–2011, namely, justice in exiting the war (Jus Ex Bello), which concerns when it is appropriate to end a war (Moellendorf 2008; Rodin 2008).

There are many contemporary global justice issues concerning the appropriate use of force (and its aftermath) that currently command attention including: Is drone warfare (or any kind of warfare) permissible? Can terrorism ever be justified? Are “targeted assassinations” (where leaders who are primarily responsible for decisions to go to war are targeted for assassination) justifiable? May we engage in a war in order to prevent an anticipated “worse war”? Is torture to contain major global threats permissible? Is the attempt to contain nuclear weapons development by those who have them already fraught with hypocrisy? How should we deal best with societies in a state of transitional justice? Is there a place for “Truth and Reconciliation Committees” (Walker 2006)? When are political apologies for historic injustice in warfare appropriate? Some suggest that the changing nature of combat has fundamentally altered the ethics of war, for instance emphasizing how individuals can be held morally accountable for their participation and actions contributing to unjust wars (Ryan 1983; McMahan 2009; Pfaffe 2020; Ohlin 2014; Reitan 2018). Scholars also consider different ways to engage in defensible non-militaristic international reform interventions (Rafanelli 2021).

Here we consider very briefly only two further issues that continue to attract widespread current interest in the global justice literature: Humanitarian Intervention and Terrorism. See the entry on terrorism for an extended analysis of such questions. See the entry on war for a comprehensive overview of issues concerning justice in war.

3.2 Humanitarian Intervention

Under what conditions, if any, may we engage in military intervention aimed at stopping genocide? In recent years this issue has become salient as large-scale human rights violations and suffering unfolded in Rwanda, the Sudan, the former Yugoslavia, and Libya. Against the traditional understanding that respecting state sovereignty requires non-interference, successful arguments were marshaled that there are important responsibilities to protect the vulnerable (International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty 2001). Leaning heavily on the conventional conditions contained in the just war framework, the International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty argued that we may engage in war aimed at protecting those who suffer at the hands of governments unwilling or unable to stop large-scale human rights abuses. The commission produced an influential report “The Responsibility to Protect” which was accepted by the United Nations in 2005, and the principles contained in the report have guided decisions about cases, such as Libya in 2011 and Syria in 2012. One frequently voiced concern about humanitarian interventions is whether they are just another form of imperialism. How will interveners be held accountable for their actions? Taking such concerns seriously Allen Buchanan and Robert Keohane advocate for a series of innovative mechanisms of accountability, both before and after the proposed intervention takes place, to allay fears about abuse (Buchanan and Keohane 2004).

3.3 Terrorism

What kinds of violence count as terrorism? Is there a difference between state terrorism and that perpetrated by insurgent organizations? Might terrorism be justified under certain circumstances? Terrorism centrally involves either using or threatening to use violence against people, commonly taken to be innocent, in order to produce results that would not otherwise occur (Coady and O’Keefe 2002; Primoratz 2013). Some challenge that the targets are innocent. As terrorists often point out about citizen complicity in atrocities, citizens pay taxes and vote, and their governments undertake actions that they can be said to sanction and from which they benefit, so it is coherent to hold citizens responsible for their governments’ actions. On this argument, citizens can be legitimate targets of violence. In addition, there is relevant precedent from governments targeting civilians when they perceive the situation to be one of a “supreme emergency”, as happened in the case of Britain targeting German civilians in the Second World War. So when governments judge that some moral disaster is sufficiently likely, it can be repelled using unorthodox and otherwise repugnant means.

4. Global Economic Injustice

Do global economic arrangements – especially economic globalization – give rise to important responsibilities? Globalization is a complex phenomenon, characterized by the faster movement of people, goods, and ideas across borders but with many facets. For our purposes we need to note only some of its characteristic central features. These include (i) an increasingly globally integrated economy, (ii) dominated by transnational corporations engaged in activities (such as production and distribution) that span multiple countries, (iii) increasing regulation of economic matters by supranational institutions (such as the World Trade Organization), (iv) general commitment to removal of barriers to “free trade,” and (v) higher levels of economic interdependence. While there is much debate about the long-term effects of globalization and whether they are on balance good or bad, at this stage, the effects of globalization have been mixed. For some, globalization has brought improvements, while it has worsened the position of others (Singer 2002; Hassoun 2008; Risse 2012a; Risse and Wollner 2019).

Philosophers have been concerned with answers to a range of questions such as: What kinds of economic arrangements are just? Should our international institutions be reformed to better reflect fair terms of co-operation in our globalized world? Can globalization be better managed so that it works to assist the global poor more effectively? Are protectionist policies in trade justified or, rather, is free trade required by considerations of justice? Should poor working conditions in developing countries be a matter of concern for citizens and consumers in affluent, developed countries? If so, how might harmful employment conditions be effectively improved?

While Thomas Pogge argues that globalization has harmed the poor on a massive scale, Mathias Risse argues that this is not at all clear (Pogge 2010; Risse 2005). Risse argues that in many ways the global order must be credited with benefiting the global poor as well. He challenges Pogge’s claim that there are feasible alternatives to our global order that could be easily implemented and would avert the harm to which Pogge draws attention.

The World Trade Organization (WTO) has been an important focal point for discussion about global economic justice. In particular, critics argue that some of its policies, such as those that generally advocate free trade but allow protectionism in affluent developed countries, involve grave hypocrisy and unfairness to some of the world’s most vulnerable people, while others defend some key WTO provisions (Risse and Wollner 2019; Pogge 2001; Moellendorf 2002; Hassoun 2009a, 2011; James 2012). For further reading see: de Bres 2016. There are also large disparities in the resources at the disposal of various parties such that weaker parties often suffer huge disadvantages in being able to negotiate agreements that work well for them. In these sorts of ways agents in developed countries (such as governments, citizens or firms) can take unfair advantage of those in developing countries (R. Miller 2010; Barry and Reddy 2008).

More generally, there are concerns related to the extraordinary power of multinationals and the undue influence they are able to exercise in negotiating deals favorable to them at the expense of the interests of the most vulnerable. So-called sweatshops (in which workers typically labor under harsh and hazardous conditions) are also a frequently raised example of how western consumers are implicated in far away suffering, given the high level of dependence in high-income countries on labor from low-income ones. When we purchase products manufactured in sweatshops are we guilty of contributing to exploitation and if so, what ought we to do to mitigate these unfairnesses? Christian Barry and Sanjay Reddy offer an innovative proposal to incentivize improvements in labor standards and wage levels in poor developing countries (Barry and Reddy 2008). This “Just Linkage” proposal offers some additional desirable opportunities for enhanced international trade to those who meet higher standards.

In this domain, philosophers have also examined a range of other issues including obligations to forgive odious debt and whether micro-finance is to be welcomed as a positive force for the global poor (Barry, Herman and Tomitova 2007; Khader 2014; Sorell and Cabrera 2015; Hassoun 2019).

Several philosophers have considered individuals’ obligations to promote economic justice through ethical consumption. There is an important debate on whether ethical consumption is helpful and required (Risse 2005; Walton 2014). Some argue that ethical consumption is only permissible when appropriately democratic (Hussain 2012; Barry and MacDonald 2018). Others argue that ethical consumption is permissible as long as it promotes positive change (Hassoun 2018; Berkey 2021; Budolfson 2015).

Other more general concerns about exploitation and economic justice can be found at the entries on exploitation and normative economics and economic justice. See also the entry on globalization.

5. Global Gender Justice

The effects of poverty do not fall equally on men and women, nor on boys and girls. In general, poverty makes the lives of women and girls harder than their male counterparts, as cultural expectations often dictate that women and girls do more care and domestic work or go without (or much less) when resources are scarce. This can significantly thwart women and girls’ well-being, as education, health care, and food are routinely withheld in favor of distribution to men and boys.

Cultural perceptions of gender roles can often lead to practices highly damaging to the most fundamental interests of women and girls. These include “honor killings” (where it is believed culturally permissible to kill a girl or woman who is perceived to have brought shame to the family), genital mutilation, infanticide, forced prostitution, arranged marriage, and legal recognition of property and inheritance rights that significantly disadvantage women and girls. Poverty can exacerbate such vulnerabilities so we have further reasons to address it as a matter of urgency (Jaggar 2009, 2013, 2014). Martha Nussbaum has argued for a list of ten capabilities that all human persons, no matter what their gender, ought to be positioned to exercise. She argues that this approach offers a powerful tool for persuasion in cases where girls and women are denied these opportunities by local actors in different cultures.

Alison Jaggar prominently argues that various structures create and recreate transnational gendered vulnerabilities and she illustrates with practices common in domestic work and the sex industry (Jaggar 2009, 2014). Anca Gheaus has argued that patterns of international immigration – where women typically provide an international market for care work – constitute a kind of care drain. This work is not fully voluntary occurring against a background of unjust options, and amounts to a major issue for women and their families as well as countries and global justice more broadly (Gheaus 2013; Eckenwiler 2009). Others focus on how universal values can inform feminist approaches and discuss how concrete issues like globalization affect women (Khader 2014, 2018; Parekh and Wilcox 2018). (For more see also the entry on feminist perspectives on globalization).

Some important policies have influenced international discourse in combating gender injustice. The Millennium Development Goals (MGDs) includes as a third goal the promotion of gender equality and the empowerment of women (for discussion of the MGDs, see: Pogge and Sengupta 2020). The 1995 Beijing Platform for Action set the stage for several International Covenants and before that the United Nations Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women afforded some important protection for women’s human rights. Some theorists are suspicious of human rights language and are inclined to reject what they perceive as a masculine or neocolonial discourse that trumpets individual autonomy in a way that fails to acknowledge, adequately, our fundamental human interdependence and history of oppression (Jaggar 2020). While there certainly is a place for discussion of these important themes, others argue that we should not lose sight of the important victories human rights have also been able to secure, despite still having a long way to go (United Nations n.d.). The rhetoric of human rights has enabled substantial gains for promoting gender equality and protection of women’s fundamental interests, so it has at least strategic value.

For a good survey of recent work on global gender justice, see Jaggar 2020. For more on solutions to often discussed problems, such as adaptive preferences, see Khader 2011, 2018. For more see the entries on feminist perspectives on globalization and feminist perspectives on power.

6. Race and Global Justice

Discussion of how histories of imperialism and racial discrimination have shaped current patterns of global injustice have become more prominent in Anglo-American discussions of global justice. In particular, concerns arise about how colonial histories affect continued oppression and exploitation of racial minority groups on a global scale (Mills 1997; Bell 2019; Boxill 2009; Okeja 2019; Buckinx, Trejo-Mathys, and Waligore 2015a; Lu 2017). Shining a light on how colonialists often embraced beliefs about racial inferiority and superiority, theorists argue that white supremacy has played an important role in structuring ways of thinking about global justice. Key questions that emerge from such analysis include: Have debates about global justice been inclined to ignore imperial histories (especially of racial domination) and if so, how should that be taken into account now? Are egalitarian cosmopolitan accounts effectively trying to promote liberal imperialism or can such discourse effectively combat it? What alternative resources can we find in other traditions of political thought and practice for theorizing global justice in insightful ways? While some argue that liberalism and imperialism are inextricable (Mehta 1999), others are more optimistic about liberalism’s prospects. Yet others believe that sometimes imperial-like solutions are necessary to solve especially challenging problems (Ignatieff 2003). (For a good range of views see Bell 2019).

Reflecting on the philosophical field of global justice, it is notable that until more recently, race is often absent from some of the most prominent discussions of global justice. Charles Mills was an especially important figure in drawing attention to these omissions. In his view, this means that theoretical debates have largely ignored or misunderstood “some of the principal sources and sites of injustice” (2019). These omissions can often be traced to dominant methods in Anglo-American philosophy in which ideal theorizing (in a Rawlsian fashion in particular) brackets out certain issues in a conscious way. But putting to the side issues of (say) racial domination means we will be blind to core histories and practices, such as slavery, imperialism, and racism that structure our contemporary world.

Discussion of race and empire have not been completely ignored by global justice theorists. For instance, there is an important literature on historical injustice and reparations (Butt 2008; Tan 2007; Lu 2016; Barry and Goodin 2009), and another on trying to identify how to describe the wrongs of colonialism (Ypi 2013b; Stilz 2015; Valentini 2015). Margaret Moore draws attention to the ways in which the dispossession of land and racial domination are particularly important features in identifying the wrongs of settler colonialism (2016). And yet, the concerns Mills raises still resonate. What would global justice theorizing look like if it placed histories and contemporary practices of racial domination at its core? How can we better integrate histories of colonialism and racial domination into our thinking about current problems of global justice?

For some, this means we must reject theoretical frameworks and vocabularies currently on offer by most political philosophers; others do not believe wholesale rejection is needed. (For a good review of positions see Bell 2019). Charles Mills exemplifies the first approach. For Mills, global justice theorists have failed to take seriously global white supremacy and its legacy and this is especially noteworthy given its role in understanding current patterns of global inequality, poverty and violence (1997, 2019). We need to consider this history and make race a central site of investigation for global justice theorizing, which requires rejecting Rawlsian-style ideal theorizing. It would also involve giving a more prominent role to issues of corrective justice and seeking compensation for the wide-scale massive injustices perpetrated through structures of global white supremacy. Similar views can be found in the work of Olúfẹ́mi Táíwò who writes: “Injustice and oppression are global in scale… [b]ecause Trans-Atlantic slavery and colonialism built the world we live in, and slavery and colonialism were unjust and oppressive”, reparations require remaking the “world system” (Táíwò 2022, 1). On his account, reparations require, among other things, reconciliation and eliminating institutional racism (Táíwò 2022, 4).

Another very important literature has emerged concerning the many alternative understandings of justice that can be found in places formerly dominated by colonial occupation. Indigenous philosophies have many important insights to offer (Lauer 2017; Metz 2017; Watene 2022). In particular, scholars often consider the prospects for indigenous perspectives to promote global environmental justice (Whyte 2014; Watene 2022). Locally embedded frameworks often support, but also provide new alternatives to, traditional approaches to human needs, rights, international development and justice issues more generally (Lauer 2017; Menkiti 2017; Metz 2017).

Ines Valdez (2019) argues we should substitute discourse centered on obligations and duties with one centered on power, coalition-building and contestation. Kimberley Hutchings (2019) emphasizes that in decolonizing our theorizing about global justice, we have to change the way we see the practice of global justice theorizing. We need to think of the latter less as a way to arrive at answers to global justice questions and more as a way to live with others without subsuming them into a particular world. Rather, opening up the conversation to sharing different perspectives we embark on a collaborative approach to experiments in living and being with others. It is not about finding new answers to what we mean by justice but rather “about finding new ways of relating to ourselves and to each other in our pursuit of whatever we may think of as justice” (2019, 121). Adopting such perspectives may reduce some noted tensions in being part of a world community and others that are smaller, drawn along racial, ethnic or other identity lines (Appiah 2007).

For more on these topics see the entries on colonialism, race, black reparations, reconciliation, transitional justice, and critical philosophy of race.

7. Immigration

There are many issues debated in the global justice literature concerning migration, whether temporary, permanent, legally sanctioned or undocumented. These include: Should states have the right to control their borders? Even if they have such a right, should states be more generous in admitting would-be migrants, especially considering the facts about global disparities in life prospects? When affluent developed states refuse to open their borders to the economically disadvantaged, is this equivalent to members of the aristocracy unjustly protecting their privilege, as was the case in feudal times? What responsibilities are there to refugees? Can undocumented immigration be justified under certain contemporary circumstances? What sorts of criteria may affluent developed countries use when selecting migrants from the pool of applicants for citizenship? May they legitimately consider how prospective migrants would fit in with current citizens, favoring certain religious, linguistic, or ethnic affiliations to manage compatibility? When making migrant selection decisions, should they consider the effects on those who remain in countries of origin and if so, is this fair to the would-be migrants who would be excluded on grounds of alleged negative impacts for home country citizens? If states admit migrant workers, are there moral constraints on how they should be treated? Would admitting temporary workers without simultaneously allowing them a pathway to citizenship be unjust? What responsibilities do we have in relation to human trafficking?

There are several now classic defenses of state’s rights to control borders. David Miller (Miller 2005, 2007), Michael Walzer (Walzer 1981) and Christopher Wellman (Wellman and Cole 2011) have been particularly important. Prominent proponents of the alternative “Open Borders” position include Joseph Carens (Carens 1987, 2013), Philip Cole (Cole 2000; Wellman and Cole 2011), Chandran Kukathas (2021) and Alex Sager (2018). While many theorists discuss the responsibilities to refugees and guest workers, Walzer’s treatment is particularly influential, especially in arguing for his view that guest worker programs are only justified when they offer such “guests” a proper pathway to full and equal citizenship (Walzer 1981). See also: Owen 2020 and Miller 2020. Within the global justice literature, there is considerable discussion of the ethics of recruiting migrants away from poor countries. Whether brain drain issues should be salient for migration decisions has been a focal point for some discussion (Carens 2013; Oberman 2013; Brock and Blake 2015; Bertram 2018). More generally, much recent discussion concerns justice in state admission policies and the kinds of factors that may or should be included in deciding who to admit and exclude (Wellman and Cole 2011; Lister 2010; Oberman, Fine and Ypi 2016; Blake 2019; Sager 2018; Song 2018; Brock 2020; Morgan 2020; Wilcox 2021; Hidalgo 2021; Buckinx 2019; Jaggar 2020; Vasanthakumar 2022). There has been considerable discussion of appropriate treatment for refugees (see especially Serena Parekh 2017, 2020 and Brock 2020). And discussion has also focused on duties for those who leave their countries of origin (Vasanthakumar 2022; Brock and Blake 2015). For more detailed coverage of issues concerning migration matters, see the entry on immigration.

8. Global Environmental Issues

Patterns of human behavior that destroy habitats, accelerate species extinction, exacerbate toxic levels of pollution, degrade the oceans, contribute to ozone layer destruction, or increase population levels are all issues of global environmental concern (Armstrong 2022; Gardiner 2011; Gardiner, Caney, Jamieson, Shue, and Pachauri 2010). However, although there are many global environmental topics that are rightly concerns of global justice, there is one that dominates discussion and that concerns our responsibilities with respect to climate change. Here we focus exclusively on this issue.

Among the scientific community it is no longer controversial that anthropogenic climate change is real and a significant threat to the well-being of both current and future generations. But it is also widely acknowledged that human development is an important way to address high levels of global poverty, that such development is energy intensive, and the cheapest sources of energy available are not likely to be clean energy types. These considerations significantly affect efforts to deal with problems presented by climate change. There is much discussion about the principles that should inform a fair treaty aimed at dealing with addressing climate change that also gives appropriate weight to concerns for human development (Shue 2014; Athanasiou et al. 2022). Some of the main contenders include principles that recognize causal responsibility for high emission levels, principles that are sensitive to ability to pay, and ones according to which those who have benefited from emissions should now be expected to absorb more costs.

We have not all contributed equally to the problems created by emissions; industrialized nations have contributed historically at much higher levels than those that are still developing. And so we should endorse the guidelines that those who have polluted more should pay more to help redress current problems (The Polluter Pays Principle). However critics argue that this principle unfairly holds some responsible when they did not know they were causing harm, since it was not widely known that greenhouse gases could result in climate change prior to 1990. So on this view, responsibility for emissions prior to 1990 should not conform with the Polluter Pays Principle, even if it is used to allocate costs after 1990. Others reply that countries can still be liable for causing harm even if they lack moral responsibility for doing so (Shue 2014). A second principle that is often discussed is The Beneficiary Pays Principle. Those who live in industrialized countries have typically benefited greatly from high levels of emissions so it is not unfair if they are expected to pay a higher proportion of costs. Critics object that a history of benefiting is an insufficiently strong consideration for assigning responsibilities now: in many cases whether or not people benefit is largely outside of their control. According to a third popular principle, The Ability to Pay Principle, the capacity of agents to pay for costs associated with mitigating climate change should be relevant. Again, some object that the ability to pay is a poor principle for assigning responsibility.

More recently, philosophers have evaluated different proposals for not only mitigating and distributing the costs of climate change but also adaptation to its diverse effects (Gosseries 2004; Vanderheiden 2008; Gardiner, Caney, Jamieson, Shue, and Pachauri 2010; Blomfield 2019; Shue 2014, 2021; Brooks 2020). Moreover, they have considered how we can mobilize hope in the face of the seemingly tragic consequences of our failures to both address the challenges of climate change and human development in a timely manner (Moellendorf 2022; Cripps 2022; Malm 2021; Mckinnon 2022). Some of this work connects to important debates about feasibility and institutional mechanisms for addressing climate change fairly (Caney 2020; Gheaus 2013; Gilabert and Lawford-Smith 2012). For more on climate justice see the entries on climate justice and climate science (Parker 2018; Caney 2022). Comprehensive treatment of climate justice requires addressing the issue of responsibilities to future generations (Meyer and Gossieries 2009). For important treatment of our responsibilities to other generations see the entry on intergenerational justice.

9. Global Health Issues

One striking feature of the state of global health is that there are large inequalities in health outcomes and opportunities for health. Consider that life expectancy can vary a great deal. A person born in Sierra Leone can expect to live about 40 years whereas one born in Japan can expect to live for 80 years. Malaria has been almost entirely eradicated in high-income countries, but it still kills about a million people in developing countries per year (United Nations 2009). A woman in Niger has a 1 in 7 chance of dying in childbirth, whereas this is 1 in 11 000 for women in Canada (Benatar and Brock 2011, 2021). The global burden of disease is by no means evenly spread nor does workforce capability correspond with areas of highest need. In fact many of the countries that suffer from the greatest burdens of disease have the fewest skilled healthcare workers. In addition, pharmaceutical companies do not spend their research and development budgets in ways that match where the needs are greatest. Rather, seeking the most profitable ventures, they are much more likely to spend resources developing drugs for lucrative markets where the payoffs are greatest, even when the marginal benefits to consumers are small. One example is the research and development resources pharmaceutical companies frequently spend on developing drugs that are similar to others already available, rather than developing treatments for diseases for which there are no cures. Historically, it is estimated that drug companies spent approximately 90% of their research and development resources in seeking treatment for about 10% of diseases and some argue that justice requires reorienting incentives for new research and development to better align with the global disease burden (Drugs for Neglected Diseases Working Group 2001; Flory and Kitcher 2004).

The poor in developing countries are also often more vulnerable to disease and less able to resist disease because of poor living conditions related to poverty. Lack of clean water, clean energy sources, inadequate nutrition, and other social determinants of health play a key role in explaining this increased vulnerability. Living in overcrowded houses can facilitate the spread of infectious diseases, such as tuberculosis. So, a number of issues that sustain poverty or exacerbate people’s vulnerability to disease as a result of poverty should be of concern (Benatar and Brock 2021). As Norman Daniels argues, health inequalities among different social groups can be considered unjust when they result from unjust distribution in factors that are socially controllable that affect population health (Daniels 2011, 101). On this view many health inequalities that exist are ones that ought to be of concern as they meet this criterion. How should responsibilities for improving this situation be allocated? In many ways, but here we pick out just a few that have received considerable attention in the philosophical literature.

The current system of intellectual property rights is one troubling area. The World Trade Organization grants product patents for a twenty year period which effectively renders many new medicines unaffordable for the vast majority of the world’s population and those in greatest need. There are a number of innovative proposals aimed at addressing these issues. One prominent example is the Health Impact Fund proposal developed by Thomas Pogge, which offers alternative ways to reward pharmaceutical companies, notably by how much impact they have on actually curing diseases (Pogge 2008). The greater their impact, the larger the share of the rewards they would receive from the Health Impact Fund. Nicole Hassoun proposes a “Global Health Impact” certification program for rating pharmaceutical companies’ contributions to the global poor (Hassoun 2020). Companies would compete for the gold star rankings which could significantly affect consumption choices and thereby expected profits. In both cases the aim is to create important incentives for key agents to care about how their products affect the global poor.

There are many other issues that concern philosophers in the domain of global health. There are worrying practices of experimentation on disadvantaged subjects in developing countries (Emanuel et al. 2004). Increasingly, clinical research has been outsourced to poor, developing countries with populations that are often highly vulnerable. We might wonder about whether these populations are being exploited and whether the participants have compromised abilities to consent to drug trials. In many cases the trials bring considerable health benefits that would not come their way were it not in the interests of pharmaceutical companies to do clinical research in those locations. If sufficient benefits accrue for local populations, some argue that these cases need not be of concern, while others disagree (Emanuel et al. 2004; London 2011).

New infectious diseases and the threat of pandemics are creating further questions about our responsibilities. Often the case is made that national interests in public health in developed countries mandate concern for infectious diseases that originate in developing countries. When resources for addressing these threats are limited, some argue it is acceptable for states to prioritize their populations, while others disagree (Hassoun 2021; Ferguson and Caplan 2021; Savulescu 2020). There are also important debates about how to distribute vaccines across borders and about whether other public health policies – e.g. immunity passports – violate individual rights or are justified for protecting public health (Emanuel et al. 2020; Emanuel et al. 2021; Herlitz et al. 2021; Liu, Salwi, and Drolet 2020; Persad and Emanuel 2020; Voigt 2022; Jecker 2022; Bramble 2020; Baylis and Kofler 2020a, 2020b; Jecker, Wightman, and Diekema, forthcoming). Some argue that global justice – solidarity and respect for human rights – demands addressing diseases that are not as transmissible as COVID-19 and may not pose as significant threats to many people in developed countries (Daniels 2007; Atuire and Hassoun 2023; Gould 2018; Lenard and Straehle 2012; Benatar and Brock 2021; Herlitz et al. 2021). There is also significant concern for fair procedures in addressing health crises globally.

For more see also public health ethics, and justice, inequality, and health.

10. Some Issues that Cut Across Several Themes

10.1 Natural Resources and Global Justice

Discussion of natural resources often figures prominently in several topics of global justice. Some relevant questions include: Are national communities entitled to the resources they find on their territories? Should principles of global justice apply to our arrangements for justly distributing natural resources? Charles Beitz was an early proponent of a resource distribution principle, according to which natural resources should be allocated such that each society is able to provide adequately for its population (Beitz 1975). We saw in Section 2 that Rawls believes that resources are not important to prosperity in the ways many imagine. Rather, institutional resilience matters more. By contrast, Thomas Pogge highlights the ways in which international practices concerning the distribution of resources create considerable obstacles for prosperity in developing countries. In short, these practices create incentives for the wrong kinds of people to take power through illegitimate means and to focus on retaining power at the expense of other goals governments should have, such as trying to improve the well-being of their citizens. We need to modify these international practices so they do not create such an unfavorable environment. In addition, Pogge proposes a Global Resources Dividend as one measure by which practices concerning natural resource distribution would work in some small way to the benefit of the global poor. On this Global Resources Dividend proposal there would be a small tax on resource extraction, payable by the consumers of resources, and available for projects that would assist in helping everyone to be able to meet their basic needs with dignity (Pogge 2008).

Leif Wenar is also concerned with prevailing practices governing the sale of natural resources and their products (Wenar 2010, 2016). When consumers in wealthy states buy goods from developing countries, this is often similar to consciously receiving stolen goods. Legitimate resource sales require general agreement from citizens. Evidence of agreement requires that: (i) owners must be informed about sales, (ii) owners must be able to express dissent freely should they have doubts about sales, and (iii) owners should be able to stop resource sales without fearing grave consequences such as violence and intimidation. Wenar aims to outlaw dispossession of citizens’ resources by promoting various practices that would satisfy these conditions and promote clean trade (Wenar 2016).

For various reasons (including strategic ones) Thomas Pogge and Leif Wenar do not directly challenge the right of nations to own resources on their territories. Policy recommendations, are much more likely to be effective if they can fit within the main structures of international conventions. However, other theorists do take up this issue including Hillel Steiner (2005), Tim Hayward (2005) and Mathias Risse (2005, 2012b). Steiner argues that all inhabitants of the world are entitled to an equal share in the value of all land and he advocates for the “Global Fund” which aims to ensure that equal share entitlements can be secured. The Global Fund would constitute a clearing house for payments and disbursements (Steiner 2005).

Appealing to accounts of ownership of resources, some philosophers draw out important implications for diverse global justice debates. Mathias Risse argues that we all, collectively, own the resources of the earth and this has profound implications for a range of global justice issues, including immigration. When people are under-utilizing their “rightful shares” of territory, they cannot complain when co-owners would like to occupy some of it. Some theorists concerned with environmental issues also discuss our rights with respect to natural resources. Some argue that we have equal rights to access the earth’s resources. Tim Hayward, for instance, argues that we have equal rights to ecological space (Hayward 2005). This is often appealed to when there is a perception that we have exceeded our share, such as in levels of carbon emissions and consumption more generally.

Accounts according to which we have equal rights to resources, land, ecological space and so on, are often accused of suffering from an important common problem. It is difficult to defend a clear and compelling account of the value of resources as these can vary considerably in different social, cultural and technological contexts. But we need to be able to quantify resource values to some plausible extent, if we are to determine whether people are enjoying or exceeding their equal shares (Armstrong 2017).

Others defend territorial sovereignty for other reasons. Some, like Cara Nine argue that collectives have a right to territory when they “establish legitimate, minimal conditions for justice within a geographical region” (Nine 2012, 2022). While Anna Stilz argues that states allow people to associate in specific geographical locations and realize economic, social, and cultural values free from interference as long as they respect others’ rights to associate as well (Stilz 2019). She defends collective self-determination that represents subjects’ political will and ensures self-directed agency and non-alienation where this is compatible with global justice. Stilz maintains that actual states only have a legitimate right to territory if they have rightful occupancy, implement a system of basic justice, and represent the shared will of most inhabitants. But, even when they do not, she thinks states can be justified in ruling a territory if they are the only available way of providing decent rule or changing their boundaries will jeopardize urgent interests or come with high costs (Stilz 2019).

Others argue against territorial sovereignty or for reconceiving sovereignty in a way that encourages respect for human rights and can limit our tendency towards war, coercion, inequality and collective action problems (Chatterjee 2011; Held 1995). Some maintain that all who are affected by states’ actions should have a say in their rules while others reject this conclusion. For discussion, see Buchanan and Keohane 2011. For other important work on territory, see the entry on territorial rights and territorial justice.

10.2 Allocating Responsibilities for Global Problems

There are a number of global justice problems that need to be addressed, and this raises the issue of how to allocate responsibilities fairly. Who should do what to reduce global injustices? Several different agents, groups, organizations and institutions could play a role. Which responsibilities should devolve to corporations, governments, consumers, citizens, international organizations or social movements? Some frequently discussed proposals focus on agents’ contributions to a problem, their patterns of benefit from the problem, and their capacity to take constructive action now. Two influential frameworks deserve more extended treatment, notably that of Iris Marion Young concerning a social connection model for allocating responsibilities for structural injustice and that of David Miller concerning remedial responsibility (Young 2011; Miller 2007).

In contrast to the idea of responsibility as involving finding fault and individual liability, Iris Marion Young develops a forward-looking model which she argues is more appropriate. She draws on the idea that participation via institutions sometimes produces injustice, so we have particular responsibilities to address injustice. We share responsibility for addressing injustice but we may have different degrees and kinds of responsibility. She offers different parameters of reasoning that can help individuals and organizations decide what might make the most sense for them to do in efforts to remedy injustice, given that there are so many injustices, whereas time and resources are limited. Using the case study of the global apparel industry she illustrates how the fact that we are positioned differently can entail varying but important responsibilities for all who participate in activities that sustain sweatshops. There are at least four parameters that agents can use in their reasoning:

  1. Power: we have different levels of influence and capacities to change processes. We should focus on those areas where we have greater capacities to change worrisome structural processes. This might mean focusing on a few key players who have both greater capacity to make changes themselves and to influence others.
  2. Privilege: some people have more privilege than others in relation to structures. So middle-class clothing consumers have more discretionary income, choice and ability to absorb costs – they can change their clothing purchasing practices more easily than those who earn minimum wage, have little discretionary income, and little ability to absorb further costs.
  3. Interest: All who have an interest in changing oppressive structures have responsibilities in connection with remedying these. This entails that “victims” too have important responsibilities since they have a great interest in eliminating oppression. In a nuanced analysis she argues that they might have responsibilities in certain contexts, such as to speak out about the harsh conditions in which they work. They must take some responsibility for resisting and challenging the structures. Without their participation the need for reforms may be rationalized away or reforms may not take the required form. These obligations may not always exist, especially when the costs of resistance would require extraordinary sacrifices.
  4. Collective ability: In some cases we already have collective organization capacities and resources that are well established. Sometimes it just makes good practical sense to draw on these. So, for instance, sometimes student associations, faith-based organizations, unions, or stockholder groups already exercise significant power in being able to coordinate like-minded members who are willing to take certain actions. She encourages us to harness organizational resources where doing so would prove effective.

In summary, Young encourages us to think about how we can best take responsibility for reducing structural injustice by reflecting on these four parameters – different positions of power, privilege, interest and collective ability. (For comprehensive review of the merits of Young’s approach see McKeown 2018, 2021.)

David Miller offers a tremendously influential connection theory of responsibility that also discusses our remedial responsibilities. There are six ways in which we can be connected to someone, P, who needs help and so be held remedially responsible for assisting. These connections give rise to six ways in which remedial responsibility can be identified. We might be morally responsible for P’s condition; we might be outcome or causally responsible for P’s condition; we might have had no causal role in their condition but have benefited from it; we might have capacity to assist P; or we might be connected to P through ties of community.[4]

There is a huge literature on taking responsibility for remedying or preventing future global injustice, including discussing the merits of these two dominant approaches. For some other innovative contributions see, for instance, Barry and Overland 2016, Dahan, Lerner and Milman-Sivan 2023, 2016, McKeown 2018, 2021, Brock 2023.

More recently attention has focused on what those on the receiving end of injustice may permissibly do. Alejandra Mancilla (2016) argues that the needy can take what they need and use material resources for self preservation even if that requires taking from others. In doing so she expands on James Sterba’s earlier arguments against libertarians for similar conclusions (Sterba 2008, 1996). Also see (Cabrera 2004). Others like Cecil Fabre, Johan Olsthoorn, and Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen argue that sometimes poor states may wage war on the affluent for subsistence (Lipper-Rasmussen 2013; Fabre 2016; Olsthoorn 2021). [Some, like Peter Unger and Gerhart Øverland argue that it is acceptable to force others to assist in poverty-alleviation under at least some circumstances (Unger 1996; Øverland 2009)].

In the global justice literature, there are also important concerns about the distribution of responsibilities among collective and individual agents. Prominently, can we hold nations responsible for global injustices or remedying such injustices? This raises important questions about collective responsibility that are well treated elsewhere in this encyclopedia (see the entry on collective responsibility).

10.3 Authority in the Global Domain: Do We Need a World State to Secure Global Justice?

Is it possible to have global justice in the absence of a world state? Hobbes argues that this is not possible since there is no global authority that can secure and enforce the requirements of justice. He presents the classic so-called realist case, which is highly influential in international politics, such that there is a state of nature in the international realm. All states compete in pursuing their own advantage and since there is no global authority there can be no justice in international affairs. Also for an overview of some key work on realism in political philosophy, see the entry on political realism in international relations and Rossi and Sleat 2014.

Others are more optimistic. Since we already have a high level of interaction among states, organizations and other agents, this has generated various norms and expectations about appropriate conduct that guides behavior in the international sphere (Beitz 1999). Moreover, we have a strong interest in co-operation when this is necessary to deal practically with a range of problems that have global reach. Global governance is concerned with how we manage interests affecting the residents of more than one state in the absence of a world state. There is already a high level of co-operation among a variety of networks, organizations and other groups of interested parties at the sub-state level, and this is powerfully influencing the redesign of best practice norms in particular domains (Slaughter 2004). Some argue for a global state or democratic system – often with subsidiarity or some kind of poly-centric political order, and others argue for more limited forms of legitimate global governance (Cabrera 2018; Gould 2004, 2014; Held 2004; Kuper 2004; Buchanan and Keohane 2006).

Other change agents that can and have exercised considerable reform pressures include global social movements, such as the anti-sweatshop movement, the fair trade movement, and other ethical consumption movements. Global activism has been an important source of incremental change. These simple examples show that much more is possible in the absence of a world state than realists acknowledge.

For more on issues of world government, see the entry on world government, which provides extended treatment of this issue.

11. The Contribution to Public Policy, Interdisciplinary Engagement, and New Methods

Philosophers are contributing in important ways to discussions of global justice policy issues. As illustrations, in this entry we have canvassed several institutional reform proposals for addressing global injustices which have enjoyed widespread attention, both within the academy and beyond. These include Thomas Pogge’s Health Impact Fund and Nicole Hassoun’s Global Health Impact proposals (Section 9) along with Pogge’s proposal for a Global Resources Dividend (Section 10.1), Christian Barry and Sanjay Reddy’s Just Linkage Proposal to help improve working conditions (Section 4), Allan Buchanan and Robert Keohane’s institutional innovations to secure accountability in the use of military force (Section 3.2), and the innovative work of Leif Wenar concerning proposals for clean trade (Section 10.1).

In addition to those illustrations already highlighted in this article, philosophers are having an impact on policy discussions in a wide range of areas including climate change and contributing ideas to the Human Development Reports (United Nations Development Programme 2020, United Nations Development Programme 2022). They have contributed to influential international multi-disciplinary projects that seek alternative ways to measure quality of health, life or poverty (Nussbaum and Sen 1993, Esposito and Hassoun 2017, Wisor et al. 2014). Philosophers have also discussed rampant abusive tax practices by corporations and wealthy individuals and how this deprives developing countries of much-needed income for human development in developing countries (Brock 2009). There are also important discussions of global income taxes, carbon taxes, financial transaction taxes and Tobin Taxes (Moellendorf 2009; Caney 2005b; Brock 2009). The pervasive problems associated with corruption have been attracting increased attention (Wenar 2016; Brock 2023). So, philosophers continue to make an important contribution to policy debates and this is also likely to be an area in which important future work on global justice will concentrate.

Philosophers are also engaging in more interdisciplinary research and global justice theorists sometimes do experimental or more broadly empirical philosophy (Miller 2001; Appiah 2007; Hassoun 2009b, 2014; Lindauer 2020; Lindauer et al. 2023; Buckland et al. 2022; Pölzler and Hannikainen 2022). Furthermore, there is some sophisticated work in related disciplines and there is significant room for fruitful interdisciplinary future research (Cappelen, Fest, Sørensen and Tungodden 2020).

Philosophers also play central roles in methodological innovation, which can in turn play an important role in informing debates about theory and public policy. As one prominent example of the contributions of new global justice methodologies, it is worth noting the emergence of “Engaged Theorizing” (see website listed under internet resources), especially in the global justice context (Ackerly 2018; Deveaux 2015, 2021; Cabrera 2010; Lu 2017; Rafanelli 2021; Reed-Sandoval 2020). Such approaches take lived experience, social action campaigns, and justice movements as the central important starting point for normative theorizing. Using interpretive, qualitative, and normative analysis, engaged political theorists try to align political philosophy with the questions, goals, and needs of communities seeking social justice. In these ways there have been important new attempts to bring philosophy to bear on our contemporary global realities, with significant progress made in bridging the divisions between theory and practice.


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