Theories of Biological Development

First published Fri Jun 3, 2022

Development is a central biological process, and ideas about its nature have been influential in biological thought. This entry surveys the history of these ideas through the lens of “epigenesis vs. preformation”. Epigenesis is, roughly, the thesis that every developing entity starts from material that is unformed, with form emerging gradually, over time, in the process of development. Preformation, in contrast, is the thesis that development begins with the entity in some way already preformed, or predelineated, or predetermined. The question “epigenesis or preformation?” is in part metaphysical: what is it that exists—form or also the unformed that becomes the formed? And it is partly epistemological: how do we know—through observation or inference? Debate on these entangled questions has persisted since ancient times, and today plays out as genetic determinists appeal to the already “formed” through genetic inheritance, while others insist on the efficacy of environmental plasticity. This entry surveys the main theories of development that engage this debate, from Aristotle on generation, to recent systems-theoretic and stem cell-based views. Of course, “epigenesis vs. preformation” is not the only longstanding theoretical opposition that bears on development. But this framing is an inclusive way to capture patterns of transformation and constancy in debates about biological development. Nature or nurture, epigenesis or preformation, genetic determinism or developmental free will, or is some version of a middle ground possible? The terms of this perennial discussion, and the underlying assumptions, continue to shape debates about when life begins and have profound bioethical and policy implications.

1. A Caveat About Theories

A theory of development should explain the core phenomena of growth, cell differentiation, and morphogenesis, which together transform an egg into a mature organism. However, beyond this rough consensus uncertainty abounds. Exactly what entities undergo development, and what are the process’ temporal, spatial, and functional boundaries? These questions are debated in biology and philosophy (Bonner 1974; Pradeu et al. 2011). Also unsettled are the nature and significance of scientific theories. Whether a general theory of development is possible or desirable hinges in part on how “theory” is defined. Yet there is no philosophical consensus to fall back on. Furthermore, developmental biology is not a traditionally theoretical field (in contrast to, say, evolutionary biology; see the entry on developmental biology). A recent edited collection, Towards a Theory of Development, reveals a variety of viewpoints and frameworks, ranging from skepticism about any such theory, to specific proposals influenced by physics, mathematics, biochemistry, systems biology, and more (Minelli & Pradeu 2014a). Broadly speaking, however,

most developmental biologists have not been strongly interested in constructing an overarching theory of development and… developmental biology has not been a focal topic for philosophers of biology. (Burian 2014: xii)

The subject has received little focused attention in biology or philosophy.

The term “theory”, for the purpose of this entry, refers to broad conceptual frameworks about the nature of the developmental process as a whole. This is more inclusive and less demanding than traditional philosophical notions of theory; “big picture” views offering an overall characterization of and/or basic principles for understanding development. Epigenesis and preformation are alternative theories in this sense: two persistent ways of describing and seeking to explain the development of individual organic form.

2. The Problem

The core question underlying the existence of these two competing philosophical traditions is the extent to which something is formed or organized from “the beginning” or whether organization and form arise only over time. Nineteenth-century uses of the term “evolution” included a sense of unfolding of preexisting form, a sort of preformationism in contrast to the epigenesis of the day. Discussions of “evolution” and “epigenesis” can therefore be misleading in retrospect since the former term has assumed a meaning closer to the older meaning of epigenesis (Bowler 1975). Making things even more complicated, by the late nineteenth century “preformationism” really was more about various versions of predetermination or predelineation than preexistence of form as such. Furthermore some authors saw epigenesis or preformation as entirely internally directed, while others in each case allowed responses to the environment. In the background lie debates about the relative significance of predestination and free will, for persons, for organic beings, or even for the inorganic. In each case, it is important to keep in mind what the particular writer was saying and the arguments presented. Thus, discussions of epigenesis and preformation often bring in other ancillary questions and are difficult to separate from their contexts. This entry is an effort to extract what is centrally at issue and to focus on key contributions to the discussion.

The terms of debate can in principle apply to the inorganic world; e.g., solar systems can “evolve” and could develop epigenetically. Yet they are not thought of as doing so, typically, and so epigenesis and preformation are primarily applied to the organic world. Species can evolve or develop more or less gradually, with more or less form already physically existing or programmed in from the beginning. Yet typically discussions of epigenesis and preformation have focused on individual organisms and their development rather than on species. The emphasis is on different interpretations of the actual developmental process as it plays out in time, in individual organisms. Therefore, this entry focuses on individual organisms and understandings of their development processes. Even more specifically, this means looking at the development of their form and to a lesser extent also function. Epigenesis and preformation offer two competing interpretations of what is involved, with a range of alternatives in between. The two approaches draw on different metaphysical and different epistemological sets of assumptions. We can get at the central issues by looking most closely at a series of focused episodes.

3. Aristotle and Aristotelianism

Aristotle was a keen observer of many things, including embryos. Looking at chicks, for example, and drawing on his interpretations developed earlier for the physical sciences, he saw material, final, formal, and efficient causes at work in the generation of individual organisms. The early egg was not formed; it did not already contain a little chick (or whatever the species). Instead, an individual animal only gradually acquired a heart that began beating; likewise for the other parts that make it a chick. The material may be there from the beginning, but the formal cause only gradually plays out along with the efficient cause of embryonic development.

Thus, Aristotle could fit his observations of embryos into his larger theoretical interpretations of the world. In sexual generation, individual organisms begin when the fluids from the mother and the father come together. This combines the essential causes and initiates the developmental process. The maternal contribution is the material cause, which resides in the menstrual blood. After “the discharge is over and most of it has passed off, then what remains begins to take shape as a fetus” (Aristotle De Generatione Animalium [GA], 1.727b17–18). Yet the menstrual blood, or female semen, is only that out of which it generates and must be acted upon by the male semen which is that which generates. Together, consistent with the essential nature of the species and telos (or final cause) in question, the formal cause and efficient causal process act to bring a formed individual organism from potential into actual being. Gradually, over time, an individual organism’s form begins to emerge from the unformed. The male and female parents serve as the “principles of generation” for each individual organism (in sexually-generating species).

For Aristotle, an individual life begins when the male and female semen are brought together. This is an external action, which starts the individual formative process. From that point on, the process is internal, initially driven by causes internal to the combined fluids. The process then leads to formation of the individual’s type, since “once a thing has been formed, it must of necessity grow” (Aristotle GA 1.735a18–19). (See Lennox 2001 for discussion of Aristotle’s predecessors on these points; see Van Speybroeck et al. 2002; Vinci & Robert 2005; Connell 2016, 2020; Falcon & Lefebvre 2017; Henry 2017; Hopwood et al. 2018; on Aristotle’s theory of generation and subsequent scientific development of these ideas.)

An individual organic life requires an internal source of motion, or “soul”, which resides in the material body from the outset. This soul guides the gradual epigenetic process of development. This is the Aristotelian and not the Christian soul. Soul consists of the vegetative (for all organisms), locomotory (for animals), and rational (for humans). The soul, consisting of one to three parts depending on the kind of living being, resides in the combination of male and female semen. The living differs from the dead because of the action of the soul. Therefore, it is the teleological drive of the potential that actualizes the individual and its form and function, epigenetically, gradually, and internally.

Aristotelians followed Aristotle and without much further study of embryos interpreted the process of generation, including human development, as gradual and epigenetic. Traditional Catholicism agreed. St. Augustine and St. Thomas Aquinas both held that hominization, or the coming into being of the human, occurs only gradually. Quickening was thought to occur around 40 days, and to be the point at which the merely animal mix of material fluids was ensouled. Until 1859, when Pope Pius IX decreed that life begins at “conception”, the Church was epigenetic along with the Aristotelians (see Maienschein 2003).

4. Eighteenth-Century Debates

Shirley Roe’s discussion of the eighteenth-century debates is an excellent examination of the context. Enthusiasm for scientific study of natural phenomena of all sorts was combined with particular interest in natural history and changes over time and with newly available microscopic methods to stimulate interest in development (Roe 1981). Aristotelian epigenesis still provided the background assumptions about individual development as the eighteenth century began, and researchers sought to observe the gradual emergence of form from non-form. Yet Aristotelian accounts called for the efficacy of the causes, acting through the process of ensoulment. In effect, this interpretation of epigenesis depended on a life force within the organism driving its emergence of form. Those who accepted epigenesis also accepted a form of vitalism (see Detlefsen 2006, Zammito 2018 for more on early modern vitalism debates).

Matter in motion, by itself, would not seem to have the capacity to produce these results. How could unformed matter become formed? How could the emerging form acquire capacity to function without some vital force or factor that was not strictly material? This was the problem for materialists. Those who began with a materialist metaphysics, assuming that all that can exist is matter in motion, could not see how gradual epigenetic emergence of form could occur. The early modern period brought debates between those who started from metaphysical assumptions of materialism and those who started from epistemological assumptions that empirical observation should provide the basis for scientific knowledge.

One popular representation of the alternative, preformationist view was the homunculus. Whether initially intended seriously or as a way to capture alternative ideas, the idea of a tiny preformed little person did capture attention. Nicolaas von Hartsoeker gave us the image in 1694 of a tiny man in the sperm, which became the starting point for spermists. Others, ovists, accepted the idea of a preformed organism—but in the egg rather than sperm. Both views are preformationism taken quite literally. The form that the individual adult organism would assume was, physically and materially, preformed from the earliest stages of development. The subsequent process was just growth.

Not all preformationists took their preformationism quite so literally or graphically. But that view did present a competing alternative to Aristotelian epigenesis by the eighteenth century (see Bowler 1971, Pinto-Correia 1997). As Iris Fry has argued in her study of origins of life debates, only with preformation could a materialistic mechanist be a good Christian in the eighteenth century (Fry 2000: 26, citing Farley 1977: 29). This debate played out, for example, in the work of Caspar Friedrich Wolff and Charles Bonnet, both looking at chick development (Detlefsen 2006). They looked at the same thing and even fundamentally agreed about what they saw, but their conclusions were quite different. This story can be seen as a debate about scientific theory. Wolff was an epigenesist, maintaining that form emerges only gradually. Bonnet was a preformationist, insisting that form exists from the beginning of each individual organism and only experiences growth over time. In addition to these theoretical and epistemological issues, there is also a story about metaphysics. The eighteenth century brought debates between metaphysical materialists who were forced into preformationism, and epistemological epigenesists who observed form emerging only gradually and who were willing to accept vitalism as the only apparent causal explanation for the emergence of form from the not-formed (Roe 1981; Maienschein 2000; Nicoglou & Wolfe 2018 [and references therein]; Wolfe 2021).

5. Evolution and Embryos: A New Preformationism

In 1859, Darwin focused on embryos and their usefulness for understanding evolutionary relationships. Ernst Haeckel brought the study of embryos to popular attention. And histologists and embryologists, especially in Germany and the United States, used rapidly improving microscopic techniques to observe far more than had been possible before. These observations, in the context of evolutionary interpretations, raised new questions and provoked new answers. The understanding of both epigenesis and preformation underwent transformation so that the debates brought new questions along with the traditional differences.

Darwin pointed to embryology as fundamental for interpreting historical relationships. In Chapter 13 of the Origin he asked

How, then, can we explain these several facts in embryology,—namely the very general, but not universal difference in structure between the embryo and the adult;—of parts in the same individual embryo, which ultimately become very unlike and serve for diverse purposes, being at this early period of growth alike;—of embryos of different species within the same class, generally, but not universally, resembling each other;—of the structure of the embryo not being closely related to its conditions of existence, except when the embryo becomes at any period of life active and has to provide for itself;—of the embryo apparently having sometimes a higher organisation than the mature animal, into which it is developed. (1859: 442–443)

But we know that this was a rhetorical question, and sure enough he concluded that

I believe that all these facts can be explained, as follows, on the view of descent with modification. (1859: 443)

And that furthermore,

the leading facts in embryology, which are second in importance to none in natural history, are explained on the principle of slight modifications not appearing, in the many descendants from some one ancient progenitor, at a very early period in the life of each, though perhaps caused at the earliest, and being inherited at a corresponding not early period. Embryology rises greatly in interest, when we thus look at the embryo as a picture, more or less obscured, of the common parent-form of each great class of animals. (Darwin 1859: 450)

Haeckel saw ontogeny as the brief and rapid recapitulation of phylogeny and saw each individual’s development as following the sequence of, and indeed caused by, the evolutionary history of that individual organism’s species. In his highly popular books, widely translated and widely read, Haeckel offered pictures of comparative embryology. See, he seemed to suggest, the human form emerges following the evolutionary development and adaptations of its ancestors. Form comes from form of the ancestors, and it unfolds following pre-scripted stages (Haeckel 1866).

Darwin was not an embryologist, and he did not contribute to our understanding of embryogenesis as such. Nor did Haeckel, really. But while Darwin’s use of the embryo in supporting evolutionary theory and in helping to interpret evolutionary relationships was consistent with various versions of either epigenetic or preformationist development, Haeckel’s view was decidedly preformationist. Here, then, was a preformationist interpretation based not on additional embryological observations but on adherence to Haeckel’s own metaphysical view—monistic materialism—and to his desire to provide evidence for evolution. The Haeckelian approach reflected the context in which those studying cells and embryos worked at the end of the nineteenth century.

6. Late Nineteenth-Century Debates: Weismann and Hertwig

In 1899, American biologist William Morton Wheeler suggested that there are just two different kinds of thinkers. Some see change and process, while others see stability. Heraclitus, Aristotle, physiology, and epigenesis characterize one way of looking at the world, while Parmenides, Plato, morphology, and preformationism characterizes another. These are, Wheeler felt, stable and persistent classes, with just the nature and details of their differences changing over time. Yet by the end of the nineteenth century, he argued, neither a strict preformationist nor a strict epigeneticist should prevail. Rather he called for a middle ground, for:

The pronounced “epigenecist” of to-day who postulates little or no pre-determination in the germ must gird himself to perform Herculean labors in explaining how the complex heterogeneity of the adult organism can arise from chemical enzymes, while the pronounced “preformationist” of to-day is bound to elucidate the elaborate morphological structure which he insists must be present in the germ.

Furthermore, it is not to philosophy but to science that we must look to resolve the relative contributions of each, for “Both tendencies will find their correctives in investigation” (Wheeler 1899: 284).

Wheeler was stimulated by recent late nineteenth-century debates, themselves provoked by a flood of new discoveries. August Weismann and Oscar Hertwig provided particularly strong and contrasting positions. Weismann had begun from an epigenetic viewpoint and initially rejected the idea that individual form emerges through the unfolding, or evolution, of pre-existent form in the inherited germ. But by the time his Das Keimplasm appeared in 1892 (translated into English in 1893), Weismann had changed his mind. As Weismann wrote:

My doubts as to the validity of Darwin’s theory were for a long time not confined to this point alone: the assumption of the existence of preformed constituents of all parts of the body seemed to me far too easy a solution of the difficult, besides entailing an impossibility in the shape of an absolutely inconceivable aggregation of primary constituents. I therefore endeavoured to see if it were not possible to imagine that the germ-plasm, though of complex structure, was not composed of such an immense number of particles, and that its further complication arose subsequently in the course of development. In other words, what I sought was a substance from which the whole organism might arise by epigenesis, and not by evolution. After repeated attempts in which I more than once imagined myself successful, but all of which broke down when further tested by facts. I finally became convinced that an epigenetic development is an impossibility. Moreover, I found an actual proof of the reality of evolution, which … is so simple that I can scarcely understand how it was possible that it should have escaped my notice so long. (Weismann 1892 [1893: xiii–xiv])

His “proof” provided an account of how, within the context of cell theory and given that the entire body begins in one fertilized cell, all the diverse body parts can become so diversely differentiated. The key is in the special material of the germ cells, Weismann decided. Within these cells lies all the determinants necessary to direct development. Inheritance, that is, causes development and differentiation.

Weismann’s theory postulated the existence of several levels of hypothetical units. By the 1890s, it was agreed that individuals begin as cells, those cells contain nuclei, and that nuclei contain chromosomes. The chromosomes are the material of heredity, Weismann postulated, and they consist of a string of determinants, correlated with characters in the organism. Each determinant consisted of a number of material particles called biophores, inherited from both parents. These biophores compete with each other and some prevail, which then determines the character of the determinant, which in turn determines the character of the organism. During each cell division, the original whole chromosomal material is divided up, so that the effect is like a mosaic. Each cell becomes the right type just because of the action of the determinants distributed to it. As Weismann put it,

Ontogeny, or the development of the individual, depends therefore on a series of gradual qualitative changes in the nuclear substance of the egg-cell.

Cells are self-differentiating

that is to say, the fate of the cells is determined by forces situated within them, and not by external influences. (Weismann 1892 [1893: 32, 134])

Conditions external to the cell itself cannot guide development, but rather the causes lie within. And cell differentiations that make up complex organisms are predetermined. Frederick Churchill’s magnificent biography of Weismann discusses these ideas in depth (Churchill 2015).

Oscar Hertwig disagreed. He felt that Weismann made too many assumptions and actually provided no real explanation of development and differentiation at all. In his work of 1894, Präformation oder Epigenese, Hertwig complained that Weismann’s theory:

merely transfers to an invisible region the solution of a problem that we are trying to solve, at least partially, by investigation of visible characters; and in the invisible region it is impossible to apply the methods of science. So, by its very nature, it is barren to investigation, as there is no means by which investigation may be put to the proof. In this respect it is like its predecessor, the theory of preformation of the eighteenth century. (Hertwig 1894 [1900: 140])

In contrast to Weismann’s preformationism, Hertwig pointed to the interactions of cells and to the differences among cells for the source of differentiation. Complexity is not built in from the beginning, but emerges over time, dynamically, and interactively. A cytologist himself, Hertwig saw the intricate structures already part of the unfertilized egg, and the changes that occur with fertilization. The egg is not a completely unstructured blob, but rather a complex of different materials that can respond to influences both within the egg and from the external environment. Cells behave like small organisms, and it is the interactions of these separate organisms that makes the whole. As Hertwig put it:

I shall explain the gradual, progressive organization of the whole organism as due to the influences upon each other of these numerous elementary organisms in each stage of the development. I cannot regard the development of any creature as a mosaic work. I hold that all the parts develop in connection with each other, the development of each part always being dependent upon the development of the whole.


during the course of development, there are forces external to the cells that bid them assume the individual characters appropriate to their individual relations to the whole; the determining forces are not within the cells, as the doctrine of determinants supposed. (Hertwig 1894 [1900: 105–106, 138])

Hertwig and Weismann continued to argue, as did others, both about the metaphysical nature of the organism as well as about the epistemological demands for gaining knowledge about it, with no generally accepted way to resolve the issues. Given the information at hand, it seemed that Wheeler was right. There were just two different types of people, drawing on two different sets of values and emphases. Both relied on assumptions, and only new evidence could move the discussion forward.

7. Late Nineteenth-Century Debates: Roux and Driesch

Wilhelm Roux adopted much the same approach as Weismann’s and so, at first, did Hans Driesch. Yet their experiments ultimately led to new approaches and revised interpretations of what was at issue with epigenesist and preformationist accounts of development (Maienschein 1991b and Weber 2022). In 1888, Roux published results of his experiments on frog eggs. Working on the assumption of a mosaic type preformationism, Roux was persuaded that starting from the very first cell division, each cell would be different because it was already predetermined to be different.

Roux proposed an experiment, a simple and elegant experiment on the face of it. He proposed to take a developing frog egg, after the first cell division, and to separate the two cells. Finding it impossible to separate the two cells, however, he simply killed one by inserting a hot needle. That cell just hung there like a blob of material and no longer differentiated. The other half organism, or single cell proceeded to develop, in Roux’s interpretation, as it normally would have developed (Roux 1888). The half became a half, just as it should if it were already preformed or predetermined as to its fate in the organism. Roux had, it seemed, confirmed the mosaic hypothesis.

A few years later, Driesch was working at Naples and had access to sea urchin eggs. Fortunately, because of Oscar and his brother Richard Hertwig’s study of these eggs, Driesch knew that if he shook the two cells they would separate completely. Driesch reported agreeing with Roux and intending to confirm Roux’s results. But since the sea urchin eggs could actually be separated, he felt that his results would be even more convincing. Imagine his surprise when he looked the next morning after separating the eggs and found not two half embryos but two smaller sized urchin larvae. As he noted,

I must confess that the idea of a free-swimming hemisphere or a half gastrula open lengthwise seemed rather extraordinary. I thought the formations would probably die.

Not so.

Instead, the next morning I found in their respective dishes typical, actively swimming blastulae of half size. (Driesch 1892 [1964: 46])

In later experiments they developed even further, into apparently perfectly normal pluteus larvae, and even the four cell stage could do the same.

Driesch concluded with an epigenetic account, but an epigenesis relying strictly on materialistic factors (at least that was his initial response; Driesch did turn later to a version of vitalism). The early embryo retains its totipotency, he concluded. The fertilized egg clearly has the capacity to become a whole organism and so, apparently, do the cells after the early cell divisions. Not a mosaic of cells already predetermined by their inherited determinants in the nucleus, the early embryonic stages are instead a population of separate totipotent organisms, each capable of becoming a whole. It is only the interactions among them under normal conditions that lead to a complex, organized, integrated differentiated organism.

It might seem that Roux would have had to acknowledge the superiority of Driesch’s approach, since Driesch had actually separated the cells. But no. Instead Roux countered with an additional hypothesis. The nucleus retains the capacity to adapt, especially in simpler organisms. They need the capacity to regenerate when injured, and therefore the mosaic determination simply has not occurred yet. Each cell retains a “reserve idioplasm”, he argued, and this provides the necessary backup determination needed to form a whole organism (see Churchill 1966, 1973).

It seems that Wheeler was right. Roux, Weismann, and others had decided that development must be guided by predetermined mosaic differences. Preformation, stability, and predictability stood on one side, with epigenesis, dynamic process, and change on the other. And, as Wheeler noted, by 1899 the way forward lay between the extremes of strict preformation or epigenesis. Wheeler’s dissertation director Charles Otis Whitman agreed. Whitman felt that what biology needed was a clear statement of the alternative views, and then movement to a new standpoint examining how much depends on the organism’s developmental response to external conditions drawing on preformation, rather than on programmed internal unfolding alone.

Whitman, Edmund Beecher Wilson, and others at the Marine Biological Laboratory in Woods Hole, Massachusetts, dedicated considerable energy to discovering the nature of each cell and its internal organization and relationships, in an attempt to discover the relative contributions of preformation and epigenetic development to a materialistic explanation of development. By the early twentieth century, they had moved toward an understanding that included a fertilized egg that was to some extent preorganized and differentiated, including in the nuclear chromosomes, and also a capacity of the individual organism to respond to changes in its environment or to self-regulate. This was epigenesis allowing some minimal predeterminism.

8. Regulative Theories of Development

This “epigenesis-first” view of development set the stage for a strand of theorizing that continued well into the twentieth century. The main theoretical tension in twentieth- and twenty-first-century studies of development is not between classic preformation and epigenesis, but between different views about control of developmental processes. If genes are the primary source of control, then organismal development is preformationist in an important sense: it is genetically determined. But if control is more distributed or holistic, such that developing organisms are (in some sense) self-organizing, then the process is regulated in a way recalling classic theories of epigenesis. Several influential theories of morphogenesis and pattern formation take the latter view. Gene-based accounts of development take the former. In this way, the classic theoretical opposition between preformation and epigenesis is transformed and carried forward into the twentieth and twenty-first centuries. In the first half of the twentieth century, theoretical concepts associated with epigenesis played a significant role in studies of development. This section surveys the main theoretical efforts along these lines.

8.1 Organicism, gradients, and fields

Driesch’s experiments (see Section 7) demonstrated regulative development: the developing embryo compensated for experimental intervention rather than following a pre-determined plan. To account for this phenomenon without resorting to vitalism, a new theoretical approach was needed. One such was organicism, which Donna Haraway (1976) casts as a new Kuhnian paradigm for embryology in the first half of the twentieth century. Its tenets included:

  1. the organism is a unified whole, with multiple connections between levels of complexity/organization;
  2. development is a goal-directed process, regulated throughout rather than pre-determined; and
  3. organismal shape and structure should be understood in terms of principles for achieving form.

Lenoir (1982) traces these ideas to Kant’s Critique of Judgment, notably reciprocal determination of parts and the whole organism during the process of development. A more explicit influence was von Bertalanffy’s systems theory of development (1928 [1933, trans. Woodger]; see the entries on levels of organization in biology and systems and synthetic biology). Another influence was D’Arcy Thompson’s seminal On Growth and Form (1917; see the entry on developmental biology). A key idea was that organismal form emerges from a self-organizing system, not the unfolding of a pre-existing program.

Haraway (1976) identifies four main elements of organicism:

  1. the goal of explaining organismal form;
  2. concepts of symmetry, polarity, and pattern;
  3. field-particle duality (analogous to physics); and
  4. links to structuralism in philosophy (i.e., a structure as a self-regulating, complex system involving multiple interacting levels of organization and spatio-temporal scales).

She examines these elements in the work of the paradigm’s principal architects in twentieth-century developmental biology: Ross Harrison, Joseph Needham, and Paul Weiss. Organicists sought mathematical yet autonomously biological laws to account for emergent order in developmental processes. Although such laws did not materialize, Haraway argues that metaphors (principally those of crystals and fields) played significant theoretical roles in their stead. More abstract theoretical concepts—of polarity, gradients, and fields—were also used to explain organismal form in the first half of the twentieth century. For example, Hans Spemann (1936 [1938]) proposed that

the body of many, if not all animals, at least in the embryonic state, possesses one or several axes with unequal poles along which there exists a gradient of some sort. The course of development depends upon these gradients to a high degree. (1936 [1938: 318]).

Similarly, Charles Manning Child hypothesized that organismal development is based on “activity gradients” grounded in metabolism. Others objected that these concepts are unclear, metaphysically murky, and unscientifically vitalist (see Gilbert, Opitz, & Raff 1996).

An important spur to gradient and field theories was the phenomenon of “the organizer”, demonstrated by Hilde Mangold’s experiments transplanting newt tissue. She moved a small piece from the dorsal lip of a developing Triton cristatus embryo into the early gastrula of another newt species (Triton taeniatus). Donor tissue thus came in contact with undifferentiated ectoderm of another species. The result: two conjoined embryos with different body axes. This indicated that dorsal lip tissue somehow “organized” host cells and tissues into another embryonic body. Spemann designated the dorsal lip of the embryo “the organization-center” or “organizer”. But how did this work? The proposed answer suggested that body axes result from a gradient of some chemical substance emanating from cells of the organizer. This was the starting-point for “field theories”; e.g.,

…the egg and early embryo consist of fields—gradients or differentiation centers in which the specific properties drop off in intensity as the distance from the field center increases…. (Harrison 1969: 258)

In discussions with other members of Cambridge’s Theoretical Biology Club, Joseph Needham sought a theory of the chemical nature of the “organizer”. Building on D’Arcy Thompson’s theories of biological form and insights from biochemistry, he conceptualized fields as spatial regions of a developing embryo, which determine for all points within a region a specific quality, direction, and intensity. The field as a whole exhibits (in)stability and equilibrium positions. Organismal development is thus defined as

a progressive restriction of potencies by determination of the parts to pursue fixed fates…this state of affairs can best be pictured in the manner of a series of equilibrium states. (Needham 1936: 58)

The overall process is to be explained by probabilistic “field laws” describing a sequence of equilibrium positions for a field, extending from proteins and fibers to cell shape and organismal morphology. Although Needham did not flesh out his theoretical ideas in detail, they show clear parallels with Waddington’s view of development, as well as recent systems approaches (see Section 9.1 and section 10.2).

Working in the US, Paul Weiss also elaborated field and gradient concepts to sketch a theory of development that anticipated key ideas of systems biology today (see the entry on systems and synthetic biology). His mature theory (“molecular ecology”) posited an array of molecular species in a cell, distributed, arranged, grouped in ways determined by their sterically-mediated interactions and physical environment (1968). Steric interactions are based on molecules’ shape and charge; biochemical features such as bonding and repulsion. Weiss theorized that these molecular interactions are organized by higher-level fields so as to produce patterns of cell differentiation, growth, and morphogenesis according to the principle of “gradual determination”. There is no pre-existing “seat” of embryonic organization in the egg or early embryo—instead, organization emerges in the process itself, through a physiological gradient. Weiss’s theory was based on extensive research on limb regeneration, neural development, grafting, and cell culture. A regenerated amphibian limb, for example, shows the correct orientation and organization of parts, even if derived from different cell types in another body part. How do the new parts acquire a “sense of direction” yielding correct morphological organization? Weiss’s answer is that some physiological gradient in the body, tells the cells “where they are and what to do”.

Weiss theorized this idea in terms of fields:

factors which cause the originally indefinite course of the individual parts of a germ to become definite and specific, and, furthermore, cause this to occur in compliance with a typical pattern. (1939: 290)

A field is organized from center to periphery, with a focal point of maximal intensity and gradual decrease from this center. This organization entails a “physiological gradient”: a robust distribution of (molecular) properties, which vary along the three spatial dimensions and along one or more axes (polarity). Its causal activity is holistic, determining cell behavior, which in turn produces growth, differentiation, and morphogenesis. Haraway (1976), Keller (2002), and Vecchi and Hernández (2014) examine the complex and uneven history of gradient and field concepts in developmental biology. Haraway, as discussed above, is concerned primarily with these concepts as metaphors structuring the organicist paradigm via the work of Harrison, Needham, and Weiss. Evelyn Fox Keller considers these concepts as part of the (so far largely unsuccessful) tradition of mathematicizing biology to understand development. Davide Vecchi and Isaac Hernández elaborate on Keller’s view, arguing that the concept of “morphogenetic field” was supplanted by Wolpert’s concept of “positional information”, part of the mid-twentieth-century theoretical shift from organicist ideas to genetic control of development (see Section 8.3).

8.2 Turing’s reaction-diffusion model

Eschewing genetics, Turing’s theory of morphogenesis (1952) sought to explain how patterns first emerge in an early embryo. His answer was a simple model consisting of two reaction-diffusion equations, representing chemical “morphogens” X and Y diffusing through a tissue at rates determined by constants \(D_x\) and \(D_y,\) coupled to chemical reactions with effects represented by functions f and g:

\[\begin{align} X_t &= f(X,Y) + D_x\nabla^2X \\ Y_t &= g(X,Y) + D_y\nabla^2Y \end{align}\]

(These equations follow Keller’s 2002 presentation, which is more streamlined than Turing’s original.) One morphogen is an activator, the other an inhibitor. Both are made and destroyed at constant rates. Initially, the tissue is homogeneous, lacking any spatial organization. Crucially, for stable patterns to emerge X and Y must diffuse at different rates, the inhibitor having the larger diffusion coefficient. Under these parameter values, random fluctuations in the system lead to instability resulting in pattern-formation. That is, from an initially stable, homogeneous system of cells/tissue, interaction between two diffusing chemicals (morphogens) leads to emergence of a stable chemical pattern. Turing assumes that steady-state chemical patterns determine patterns at the cell/tissue level (through mechanisms wholly unspecified). Given that assumption, the model accounts for pattern formation in a group of cells or a tissue.

Turing’s model of morphogenesis has several striking features. First, it is based on physics and chemistry rather than biology: reaction-diffusion equations incorporating Fourier series and the law of mass action. Reaction-diffusion equations are a class of non-linear partial differential equations. (Hodgkin and Huxley’s model of neural propagation is also of this class—at the time, one of the few applications of these equations to biology; see the entry on mechanisms in science.) Turing’s use of these equations to model the transition from homogeneity to spatial patterning is rather counterintuitive, as diffusion is a characteristically homogenizing process. So his model was a theoretical advance, extending the insight that reaction-diffusion equations can model transitions and “waves of advance” (e.g., in neurons) to morphogenesis (Berestycki 2013). Second, the model is strikingly abstract—“…a simplification and an idealization, and consequently a falsification” (Turing 1952: 37). Yet it has many biological applications. Turing (1952) explored mainly simple cases of chemical diffusion through a tissue of fixed size. But he also applied the model to chemical waves on spheres to represent gastrulation. That more complex case, with three interacting morphogens, can produce traveling waves and out-of-phase oscillations. Turing also applied his model to plant development, specifically phyllotaxis (arrangement of leaves on a stem; see S. B. Cooper & van Leeuwen 2013). Subsequent generalizations of Turing’s equations have been used to model a wide variety of developmental phenomena, including fish pigmentation patterns, human mesenchymal cell differentiation, butterfly wing patterns, mouse hair follicles/coat color patterns, limb and tooth development, and bacterial colony growth dynamics (Meinhardt 1982, Murray 1989). However, its explanatory role is controversial, primarily because it is hard to show that Turing’s model describes how development actually proceeds in real organisms.

Keller (2002) discusses this issue, as well as major features of Turing’s model. One key problem (noted by Waddington at the time) is that “pure homogeneity” as a starting point for development is unrealistic; the egg or early embryo is never a “blank slate” as Turing assumed. She argues that Turing’s was a premature attempt at mathematical biology, noting as well the challenge it posed to prevalent ideas about causality: organismal form as emergent, self-organizing; holistic, arising from the system rather than driven by genes. Vecchi and Hernández (2014) build on Keller’s view, diagnosing “a clash of causal ideologies” in the different possible interpretations of initiating cause in Turing’s model. They are more optimistic about its biological relevance and influence. Scientists continue to apply and reflect on Turing’s model of morphogenesis (e.g., Kondo & Miura 2010). As the latter scholars note, Francis Crick’s source-sink model of embryonic development (1970) can be considered the simplest form of a reaction-diffusion model, with the reaction term removed. However, Crick’s model is mechanistically simpler, with morphogenesis controlled by a single morphogen diffusing along a line of cells:

At one end of a line of cells one postulates a source—a cell that produces a chemical (which I shall call a morphogen) and maintains it at a constant level. At the other end the extreme cell acts as a sink: that is, it destroys the molecule, holding the concentration at that point to a fixed low level. The morphogen can diffuse from one cell to another along a line of cells. (Crick 1970: 420)

Unlike Turing’s more holistic model, in which patterns emerge from initial random instability due to interaction of multiple morphogens, Crick’s model grounds morphogenesis in simple chemical diffusion. Agutter, Malone, and Wheatley (2000) and Vecchi and Hernández (2014) argue that Crick’s model lacks explanatory power. However, Minelli (2009) suggests an updated source-sink model, informed by advances in molecular and cell biology.

8.3 Positional information

More influential for mainstream developmental biology was the concept of positional information. Though originally a contribution to regulative theories of development, the concept soon transformed to support theories of genetic control. This epitomizes the shift in biological thought that followed breakthroughs on DNA structure, protein coding, and other phenomena of molecular genetics (see the entry on molecular genetics). Lewis Wolpert (1969) introduced the concept of positional information to solve (like Turing)

the problem of assigning specific states to an ensemble of identical cells, whose initial states are relatively similar, such that the resulting ensemble of states forms a well-defined spatial pattern. (1969: 4)

Wolpert’s answer was that each cell in a developing system has a unique value reflecting its position in that system, encoded by the spatial gradient of a diffusible molecule across the system. Specification of a cell’s position in the system is relative to one or more points in the system: the source(s) of the diffusible molecule or cell property. Cells that share the same set of points relative to which their position is specified make up a field. Wolpert used this model to explain a range of experimental results and observations of development in various species (as well as the toy “French flag” example). In 1969, Wolpert saw the next task as discovering and articulating rules (and underlying mechanisms) for specification of positional information and polarity, the nature of points and boundaries, and “new meaning to classical concepts such as induction, dominance and field” (1969: 1).

Wolpert’s theoretical approach differed from predecessors in its relation to genetic information. Positional information was proposed as a “universal mechanism” for “translation of genetic information into spatial patterns of differentiation” (Wolpert 1969: 1). The concept was designed to integrate gene-based and organicist approaches to development. Cells “interpret” changes in their positional information, so as to change the pattern of gene activation in a cell. Changing patterns of gene expression drive cell differentiation in a developing organism. This in turn effects spatial distribution of cell forces (e.g., contraction, motility, cell-cell contact), which drives organism-level morphogenesis. However, by 1975, Wolpert’s thinking about development had undergone a conceptual shift (Keller 2002). Between 1971 and 1975, Wolpert’s ideas were “geneticized”, after which he accepted the idea of a genetic program for development and the embryo as “computable” from an egg. In this way, the idea of a morphogen gradient establishing positional information for cells was put under genetic control (see Section 9).

Wolpert and Lewis (1975) proposed a research program of computational embryology aimed at a

theory of development [that] would effectively enable one to compute the adult organism from the genetic information in the egg. The problem may be approached by viewing the egg as containing a program for development. (1975: 14)

Philosopher Alexander Rosenberg (1997) endorses this version of Wolpert’s theory as vindication of strong molecular reductionism in developmental biology. Manfred Laubichler and Günter Wagner (2001), alongside other biological theorists, reject this version of reductionism (see Section 10). Jaeger, Irons, and Monk (2008) propose to reverse Wolpert’s conceptual shift with their “relativistic theory of positional information”, adding a role for regulative feedback by responding cells. Vecchi and Hernández (2014) criticize Wolpert’s and Rosenberg’s reductionist computational embryology as classically preformationist and note explanatory lacunae of the idea of a genetic program pre-established in the egg. This follows Keller (2002), who argues that the twentieth-century consensus on development is essentially preformationist. This brings us to

the widespread reductionist and deterministic view of development as programmed in genes…with the implicit idea that the final form of the organism is “already there” in the instructions contained in its genome as early as the egg stage. (Minelli & Pradeu 2014b: 4)

9. Twentieth-Century Genetics: A New Predeterminism

Early twentieth-century embryology highlighted epigenesis. But a new twist on preformationism soon arose in the form of genetics. This pointed to the nuclear chromosomes as loci for the causes of differentiation. Yet unlike Weismann and Roux, new geneticists did not see the genetic material as divided up into a mosaic to explain ensuing cell and tissue differences. Rather, the inherited nuclear material was the same in every cell, but it acted differently according to an internal program. This interpretation appealed to some scientists for metaphysical reasons since it focused on the material units of heredity and apparently of causation. Epistemologically, it was more difficult to point to evidence that inherited genes explain development.

This is not the place for a history of genetics, which has been offered many times elsewhere. The important point here is that genetics brought a new form of preformationism. Instead of a dynamically acting organism taking its cues from the environmental conditions and from the way that cells interact with each cell division, the twentieth century brought a dominant and popular view that has often emphasized genes as programmed to carry the information of heredity, which was also the information necessary to construct an individual. Of course, there have been calls for alternatives or interactionist models where heredity and development, epigenesis and preformation, work together, but these have often been offered as alternatives than as central interpretations (see Section 10).

In the beginning of the twentieth century, at first Thomas Hunt Morgan resisted the Mendelian-chromosome theory of inheritance that saw inherited units of heredity carried on chromosomes as determinants of developed characters. If all the cells contain the same chromosomes, then how can their inheritance explain anything, he asked. Instead, he insisted that “We have two factors determining characters: heredity and the modification during development” (Morgan 1910a: 477). Morgan wrote to a friend that “my field is experimental embryology” and not the genetics with which he became associated (Morgan 1908). Like his Woods Hole colleagues at the Marine Biological Laboratory, Morgan did not see how inherited chromosomes could explain development of form from non-form. He had rejected Weismann’s interpretations and continued to reject the idea of inherited determinants.

Also in 1910, however, he was studying many different kinds of organisms in pursuit of explanations of heredity as well as differentiation. A white-eyed male Drosophila fly famously caught his attention, and led him to the conclusion that some inherited factors must, indeed, cause expression in the emerging organism (Morgan 1910b). It is not that Morgan changed his mind about how to do science, but rather that the evidence carried him in new directions (Maienschein 1991a).

The fertilized egg cell contains a nucleus made up of chromosomes inherited from both parents. Along these chromosomes are lined up units of heredity that serve like Weismann’s determinants, now called genes. These genes correlate with some characters in the resulting organism, and therefore in some sense the resulting form was predetermined in the egg. Yet it was not already formed. And, indeed, the mere correlation of genes and characters tells us virtually nothing about how the differentiation occurs nor about how form becomes formed (the problem of morphogenesis). Therefore, yes, genetics brings a sort of new preformation or more accurately predeterminism. But that in itself brings a description and a correlation but no explanation. Or so Morgan initially felt, as did his embryologist colleagues. Advances in genetics soon changed the theoretical landscape. In 1934, Morgan posited differential gene activity as the key to understanding organismal development. On his view, genes are inherited, their activity controlled by cytoplasmic factors. The latter are originally heterogeneously distributed in the egg. Differential gene activity so-driven leads in turn to differential cytoplasmic factor distribution, and the cycle continues, influenced by signals from a cell’s environment (primarily neighboring cells). Ideas of preformation and epigenesis are combined in pre-determined genes acting in response to diverse environmental factors. Burian (2005) argues that the old theoretical opposition was reinscribed in the disciplinary separation of embryology and genetics, particularly in the US. In that context, studies of development emphasizing the nucleus endorsed preformationism, while those focusing on cytoplasm and cell lineage differentiation tended to epigenesis. This theoretical rift was healed when research focus shifted from “cytoplasm vs. nucleus” to mechanisms of gene expression (Burian 2005). Theoretical concepts grounded in genetics and molecular biology thereafter increasingly dominated thinking about development.

By mid-twentieth century, and especially after the discovery of DNA’s structure (which apparently also explained its function), researchers began to forget or at least ignore questions about morphogenesis and epigenesis (see, for example, Olby 1974, Judson 1979). Instead they asked how, actually, genes give rise to differentiated form? Somehow that works, seemed to be the answer. Genetics predominated over what C.H. Waddington referred to as the epigenetics of development (Waddington 1942). Of course not everyone ignored development, but it became a seriously neglected field and even professional societies and journals that had focused on “embryology” shifted to “developmental genetics” (Oppenheimer 1967). When Robert Briggs and Thomas King cloned frogs in the 1950s and John Gurdon extended the research in the 1960s, it seemed that nuclear transfer could come from only early stages of development. Furthermore, the resulting clones were like their donors from whom the nuclei came rather than like the mothers from whom the eggs came (Briggs & King 1952; Gurdon & Colman 1999; McLaren 2000). Apparently development brings differentiation that is unidirectional. Preformationist/ predeterminist thinking prevailed. Epigenetic development and regulatory response to environmental conditions seemed to have strict limits for those adopting the mid-twentieth-century predeterminist emphasis.

9.1 Waddington’s landscape

In this context, Waddington’s theoretical approach was distinctive, aiming to integrate genetics and epigenetic development. His main device for doing so was “the epigenetic landscape”, first articulated in 1939 and iconically diagrammed in The Strategy of the Genes (1957). Waddington’s landscape model represents developmental potential as

a more or less flat, or rather undulating surface, which is tilted so that points representing later states are lower than those representing earlier ones … Then if something, such as a ball, were placed on the surface, it would run down toward some final end state at the bottom edge. (1957: 29).

The model visualizes three “essentially formal” properties of development: unidirectionality in time (via the landscape’s tilt), multiple discrete termini from a single undifferentiated start (via branching tracks), and robustness of developmental processes (via steepness of valley walls).

These topographic features reflect generalizations about animal development, based mainly on experiments on chick and Drosophila. A rolling ball’s path down the incline corresponds to the development of some cell or tissue from an early undifferentiated state to a mature differentiated state.

What controls the path taken by a cell or piece of developing tissue—a pre-determined genetic program or ongoing orchestration of stimuli? Waddington (1939, 1940, 1957) identified genes as the determinants of epigenetic landscape topography. This is depicted in a companion diagram showing the landscape’s “underside” as a network of interacting biochemical products “which are ultimately controlled by genes” (1957: 36). Waddington first articulated the landscape analogy in 1939, as a generalization of time- and dose-effect curves representing the role of genes in producing specific phenotypic effects. The landscape model results from including interactive effects of the entire genome on a particular pathway:

[o]ne might roughly say that all these genes correspond to the geological structure which moulds the form of the valley. (1939: 182)

Although he featured genetic control, Waddington’s designation of the landscape as “epigenetic” suggests a view of development allowing more of a role for epigenesis than more gene-focused contemporaries. Scott Gilbert (1991) argues that the branching-track lineage structure unifies development and genetics, visualizing a formal analogy between cellular, genetic, and organismal development. Fagan (2012, 2013a) extends this argument, focusing on Waddington’s unification of two complementary landscape images: robust pathways above, and interacting gene products below, with genes at the bottom, metaphorically “pulling the strings”. Nicoglou and Merlin (2017) and Nicoglou (2018) discuss this unifying, integrative feature of Waddington’s landscape model as one strand of twentieth-century epigenetics.

Waddington’s own later theorizing took a mathematical turn, interpreting the notion of a field in terms of spatial relations and using Réné Thom’s topology to theorize developmental pathways as an epigenetic system (1968). This work emphasized the concept of “chreod”, a trajectory (directed path) of normal development within multidimensional space, with axes for time, three spatial dimensions, and concentrations of chemicals. Although not fruitful in biology at the time, Waddington’s mathematical approach anticipated twenty-first-century alternatives to the idea of genetic control (see Section 10). In that context, the landscape model has experienced a renaissance. The underside image is replaced by complex gene regulatory networks, topside surfaces explicated in terms of systems biology and/or stem cell concepts (Fagan 2012, 2013a). Fusco and colleagues (2014) discuss recent theoretical proposals (e.g., Wang, Wang, & Huang 2010) to “rehabilitate” Waddington’s landscape as a dynamical systems model, which require significant changes from the original. They conclude that landscape models (updated or not) are good for visualizing cell differentiation but not other important developmental processes—and so not well-suited for a comprehensive theory of development. As a metaphorical aid to understanding, however, Waddington’s landscape remains influential. Jan Baedke (2013) examines its broader impact across the life sciences, extending beyond organismal development to developmental psychology and cultural anthropology.

9.2 The genetic program

In his influential book What is Life (1944)? Erwin Schrödinger speculated that development is controlled by “a code-script structure” localized to chromosomes, information-patterns

instrumental in bringing about the development they foreshadow…architect’s plan and builder’s craft all in one. (1944: 18–19)

Twentieth-century triumphs in genetics bolstered this idea. The main challenge for such theories is how invariant genes, the same in every cell of an organism, can control the process of diversification of those cells, their temporally-orchestrated movements and organization into tissues, bodily structures, and complex organs. Frank Lillie (1927) put the point starkly (discussed in Burian 2005):

The essential problem of development is precisely that differentiation in relation to space and time within the life-history of the individual which genetics appears implicitly to ignore… Those who desire to make genetics the basis of physiology of development will have to explain how an unchanging complex can direct the course of an ordered developmental stream. (1927: 365–367)

Responses to what Burian has labelled “Lillie’s paradox” hinge on differences in gene expression among cells and tissues. Chromosomal DNA is a linear template for an mRNA transcript, which is in turn a template for a sequence of amino acids making up a protein. Cell phenotype depends on which genes are transcribed and then translated. But DNA does not express itself. The challenge then is to account for gene expression in a way that preserves genetic control of development. The concept of a “genetic program for development” responds to this challenge.

The idea was forcefully articulated by François Jacob and Jacques Monod:

During embryonic development, the instructions contained in the chromosomes of the egg are gradually translated and executed… The whole plan of growth, the whole series of operations to be carried out, the order and the site of syntheses and their coordination are all written down in the nucleic-acid message. (Jacob 1970 [1973: 313])

Jacob and Monod’s view was grounded on their pioneering work on bacterial gene expression (1961a, 1961b). Their key result, the operon model, explains how gene expression in E. coli bacteria is regulated by environmental signals. Briefly, the model represents interactions among various components: protein-encoding DNA sequences, regulatory DNA sequences, the “operator region” of DNA located near the start of protein-encoding genes, repressor protein, and small molecules (e.g., allolactose). If a repressor binds the operator region, this blocks protein synthesis at nearby coding sequences. Small molecules like allolactose bind the repressor, inhibiting its inhibition, so the protein-encoding genes associated with the “de-repressed” operator are expressed. Those genes encode enzymes involved in metabolizing the small molecules, neatly closing the regulatory loop. Jacob and Monod singled out DNA as the controlling molecule of this regulatory system. Furthermore, as Michael Morange (2000) discusses, they extrapolated the E. coli operon model to gene regulation in general, positing that all organismal development is controlled by a small set of regulatory genes.

Jacob and Monod’s subsequent work emphasized molecular genetic reductionism and the idea of a genetic program for development. For example, Jacob began The Logic of Life (1970 [1973]) with reflections on “The Programme”:

… the structure of macromolecules is determined down to the last detail by sequences of four chemical radicals contained in the genetic heritage. What are transmitted from generation to generation are the “instructions” specifying the molecular structures: the architectural plans of the future organism. They are also the means of executing those plans and of coordinating the activities of the system. In the chromosomes received from its parents, each egg therefore contains its entire future: the stages of its development, the shape and the properties of the living being which will emerge. The organism thus becomes the realization of a programme prescribed by its heredity. (1970 [1973: 1–2])

However, extrapolation from bacterial gene regulation to development in multicellular organisms proved unfounded. Limitations of the operon model soon became evident. In eukaryotic, multicellular organisms, gene expression is far more complex. Fifty years of molecular biology have revealed a menagerie of mechanisms implicated in the complex cellular machinery of gene expression (see the entry on molecular biology). And this is not to mention interactions among cells and tissues, about which classic molecular biology was silent. Brian Goodwin, a student of Waddington’s, charted an alternative theoretical path that skirted these limitations. In the 1960s, he developed equations to model genetic oscillation, building on Jacob and Monod’s operon model (Goodwin 1965). But his subsequent theorizing about development emphasized self-organization due to chemical gradients and mechanical strain in cytoplasm, presaging dynamic and physical theories that gained prominence around the turn of the millennium (Goodwin & Trainor 1985, see Section 10.2 and the entry on systems and synthetic biology).

The next experimental milestone for theories of genetic control of development was Christiane Nüsslein-Volhard and collaborators’ painstaking characterization of mechanisms of body patterning and polarity in Drosophila (e.g., Driever & Nüsslein-Volhard 1988). They distinguished three regions along the early embryo’s anteroposterior body axis (anterior, posterior, and terminal), the basic patterns and structures of which are controlled by distinct sets of maternal genes. A few such genes have long-range “organizing” effects. Notably, Driever and Nüsslein-Volhard (1988) showed that bicoid protein acts as a morphogen, controlling formation of a fly’s anterior (including head and thorax) in accordance with its concentration gradient. Significantly, their experimental manipulations were DNA sequence mutations (known to effect anterior body plan development or bicoid copy number). The experiments thereby charted a causal pathway from DNA to mRNA to protein to cell differentiation to morphogenesis. This demonstration of changes in body-plan correlated with maternal genetic mutations was powerful vindication of the idea that genes control development. Moreover, central concepts of the organicist alternative (gradients and positional information) were brought under the rubric of that theory. Nüsslein-Volhard’s gene-based approach remains influential in developmental biology (see the entry on developmental biology).

9.3 The regulatory genome

The above and other experimental successes underpin Eric Davidson’s theory of “the regulatory genome” (2006), which combines new experimental data (mainly from Drosophila and sea urchin) with systems and network concepts—in effect, updating Jacob and Monod’s notion of the genetic program. On this view, development is controlled by a DNA-encoded program made up of short sequences that specifically bind transcription factor proteins and thereby make a difference to gene expression. The first step of gene expression in higher organisms is typically the binding of one or more protein factors to a regulatory region of DNA located near the sequence to be transcribed (“read” into mRNA and thence to protein). Davidson terms these DNA sequences “cis-regulatory modules”. Each module’s effect is represented as a conditional rule of the form: “If protein X is present, then gene Y is expressed at level Z”. Each gene has a set of such modules associated with it, which collectively specify its expression pattern under various conditions. That expression pattern, in turn, determines a cell’s phenotype and developmental fate. Control of development is therefore attributed entirely to the DNA components of molecular complexes that make a difference to gene expression. Transcription factor proteins and other components are conceived as “inputs” to the information-processing modules, and effects on gene expression as “outputs”.

These basic “cis-regulatory” units are organized into systems of interacting modules. Because transcription factor proteins are products of gene expression, the regulatory modules that control their expression are sites of “primary core control” for development. These core control modules form an interconnected network, reflecting the influences of transcription factor proteins on one another’s expression. All organisms have a genetic regulatory network composed of DNA sequences distributed throughout its genome, which constitutes a stable underlying program for development. Collectively, DNA modules act as “a vast, delocalized computational device” that processes regulatory states of a cell (Davidson 2006: 185). Furthermore, regulatory DNA sequences are (for the most part) invariant across cells of an organism, and organisms of a species, with a relatively small set of “hub” transcription factors conserved throughout much of the animal kingdom. The regulatory genome therefore offers a unified explanation of animal evolution and development. However, there are good reasons to think the role of DNA sequences in gene expression is not distinctive, causally or informationally (see the entries on gene, genetics, and reductionism in biology). Other recent theoretical approaches tend toward more inclusive, less gene-centric explanations of development.

10. Twenty-First-Century Alternatives: A New Epigenesis?

The end of the twentieth century brought discoveries that challenged prevailing genetic determinism, and also began to replace the extreme forms of either preformationism or epigenesis with the sorts of interactionist models that were only offered as outlying alternatives in earlier decades. A modified form of epigenesis, in which the organism is seen as beginning from an inherited egg and sperm that do include genes, seems to be on the rise again. Research on cell development, stem cells, and tissue engineering shows that the identity of any particular cell is not predetermined, but also depends on interactions with its neighbors and context. Ian Wilmut’s team’s success in cloning Dolly, reported in 1997, and John Gearhart and James Thomson’s successes with developing human stem cell lines, both reported in 1998, challenged prevailing assumptions (Wilmut et al 1997, Wilmut, Campbell, & Tudge 2000; Thomson et al. 1998; Shamblott et al. 1998; Gearhart 1998). Both suggested that development is a good deal more flexible, plastic, and interactive than preformationist interpretations allow. These experimental results, alongside conceptual issues, spur alternative theories of development. Gilbert (2004) notes increased emphasis on interaction, change, emergence, and reciprocal “determination” relations between whole and component parts. His own work emphasizes the need for multiple perspectives in understanding development; notably diversification in the location of causal control beyond genes alone (see the entry on evolution and development). This section focuses on philosophical efforts along these lines.

10.1 Developmental systems and cycles

Susan Oyama’s monograph The Ontogeny of Information (1985 [2000a]) critiques gene-based theories of development. She argues that genetic information for development is causally derivative, existing as such only in the context of an ongoing developmental process. That process, in all its contingency and historical specificity, is causally primary. Neither DNA nor environmental factors are causes of development outside the interactive context that makes features of the physical world an organism’s environment and induces patterns of gene activation within cells. Genetic information emerges from the interactions of heterogeneous, dispersed, developmental resources. Central to Oyama’s view is the

conception of a developmental system, not as the reading off of a preexisting code, but as a complex of interacting influences, some inside the organism’s skin, some external to it, and including its ecological niche in all its spatial and temporal aspects. (1985 [2000a: 39])

As in earlier organicism, patterns and form emerge from ongoing interaction, within and among multiple levels of organization, on multiple time-scales. But unlike the organicists, Oyama has an established theoretical alternative to contend with. Much of her argument is negative, rejecting the gene/environment dichotomy, primacy of genes as causes, and lingering preformationism of the idea of a genetic program for development. Her theoretical perspective aims to overcome entrenched (and often unrecognized) dichotomies in biological thought. Although criticized for their complexity, apparent incompatibility with scientific generalization, and lack of connection to experimental practices, Oyama’s ideas about developmental systems have been influential in twenty-first-century philosophy of biology.

One impact is further articulation of developmental systems theory (DST; see the entries on inheritance systems and replication and reproduction). In the introduction to their 2001 edited volume, Cycles of Contingency, Oyama, Paul Griffiths, and Russell Gray set out DST’s major themes and commitments: joint determination by multiple causes (causal parity), context sensitivity and contingency, extended inheritance, development as construction, distributed control, and evolution as construction. Another core tenet is rejection of opposed dualities such as nature/nurture, gene/environment, and biology/culture—not arguing that an adequate theory of development must include both sides of opposition, but that the oppositions themselves have no place in an adequate theory of development. Relatedly, genes are not privileged causes of development (Griffiths & Knight 1998). This “parity thesis” is sometimes misunderstood as a theoretical claim that all causes of development are equally important. But it is better understood as a constraint on theories of development (and evolution): to not presuppose any fundamental distinction between genes and all other causes (Oyama et al. 2001: 3). DST’s other themes are similarly arrayed against twentieth-century predeterminism. In this way, DST entails a conceptual reorientation in thinking about inheritance, development, and evolution, and a point of departure for philosophical exploration of alternatives to gene-centrism and entrenched dichotomies. Much of this research focuses on integrating development and evolution—i.e., evo-devo theories (see the entry on evolution and development). DST-affiliated projects that focus on organismal development are discussed here.

A developmental system is

a heterogeneous and causally complex mix of interacting entities and influences that produces the life cycle of an organism. (Oyama 2000b: 1)

James Griesemer (2000a, 2000b, 2014a, 2014b) further articulates this idea by conceptualizing development as part of a more general theory of reproduction (see the entry on replication and reproduction). In this theory,

development is the acquisition of the capacity to reproduce, where reproduction involves material propagation of developmental capacities from parents to offspring. (2014b: 199)

If development is so conceived,

…then it turns out all traditional life cycles are complex…[i.e.] there is typically at least one substantial change of developmental context or niche, with multiple generations of progenerants, before a life cycle is completed. (2014b: 191–192)

Complex life cycles of parasites and viruses, then, are not idiosyncratic but rather exemplars of complex, context-dependent developmental processes. Griesemer’s theoretical reorientation departs from the traditional idea of development as proceeding linearly from egg to embryo to adult. Instead, developmental capacities are properties of life cycles involving multiple organismal forms. This motivates a new theoretical concept: scaffolding interactions that bring a developing entity and aspects of the environment into such close association as to qualify as a new “hybrid” entity with new developmental potentialities (Griesemer 2014a). The original entity and environment are as “parents” to the new “hybrid” developmental system (e.g., HIV integrated into host genome vs. free virus and uninfected human cell/genome). Genes are demoted to “a special kind of evolved class of scaffolding developmental mechanisms” (2014b: 198).

Biologist Alessandro Minelli (2009, 2014) endorses a similar view of development, arguing that the first step toward a satisfactory theory is characterizing the full range of developmental processes, beyond the traditional “adultocentric perspective” tracing the formation of a mature organism from an egg cell. Although Minelli does not theorize development in terms of reproducers, he does conceptualize the process in terms of life cycles (see also Bonner 1974). Life cycles can be multigenerational, multigenomic, unicellular—and so developmental processes include these too, implicating haploid stages in sexually-reproducing organisms, alternation of generations, mixed sexual/asexual reproduction as in colonial tunicates and plants, etc. Minelli proposes to use this expanded view of “developmental disparity”, encompassing the full range of diversity of life cycles of living things, alongside “traditional, or naïve, concepts of development” to arrive at a satisfactory general framework (2014: 228).

Jason Scott Robert (2004) extends Oyama’s critique of the prevailing view that

development is now standardly construed as the epigenesis of something preformed in the DNA. (2004: 35)

This combination of old theoretical opposites, he argues, is unbalanced in favor of preformationism. Robert proposes instead “creative development”:

the organism’s semi-autonomous self-constitution from a range of ontogenetic raw materials,

co-constructed with its environment (2004: 87). Burian (2005) similarly challenges the adequacy of genetic determinism for understanding development, arguing that experimental results better support multilevel causation. Although grounded in experimental practices and associated concepts rather than abstract theory, Burian’s arguments motivate search for new theories to account for robustness of developmental processes and outcomes.

10.2 Physical and dynamic systems

Another strand of theorizing development draws on physics of materials. Stuart Newman (2003) argues that physical factors played a major role in the early evolutionary history of multicellular organisms. Living tissues undergoing development have properties of liquid-like “soft matter”, such as viscous flow, elasticity, surface tension. They are also “excitable”,

simultaneously hav[ing] chemical, mechanical, and electrical properties, they behave in a multiscale fashion, continuously and simultaneously changing their composition and organizational properties on several temporal and spatial scales. (2003: 96)

These material properties allow living tissues to be analyzed in terms of physical theories and constraints. Although developmental processes in organisms today appear to follow pre-determined genetic programs, physical forces and constraints are at the origin of developmental systems and still play a vital role within them.

Newman’s theoretical approach “link[s] the modern physics of materials with contemporary knowledge of genetic determinants” (2014: 107; see also Newman 2003; Forgacs & Newman 2005). A core thesis of this theoretical approach is that excitable soft matter can exhibit self-organization in the absence of any pre-existing program; e.g., synchronized oscillations, local diffusion gradients, compartment-formation via cell adhesion. (This theoretical approach is anticipated in the work of Brian Goodwin, see Section 9.2.) Newman posits that the earliest multicellular organisms underwent development spurred by these physical processes, together yielding a basic body plan. Over long evolutionary timescales, gene regulatory networks are overlaid upon physics-driven self-organizing processes. The result is a highly-conserved set of dynamical patterning modules (DPMs) that make basic shapes in a developing embryo: layers, lumens, folds, tubes, segments, etc. Importantly, DPMs are not predetermined genetic programs, but more inclusive systems capable of self-organization. Newman and colleagues use computer simulation to study the possible patterns generated by dynamical gene network models representing DPMs (Salazar-Ciudad, Newman, & Solé 2001). This method brings in dynamical systems theory, which has recently become central to systems biology (see the entry on systems and synthetic biology).

Dynamical systems approaches to development, being committed to holism and temporal unfolding, echo classic epigenesis and early twentieth-century organicism. These earlier ideas are brought to bear on new high-throughput quantitative datasets using simulation technology—updating and revitalizing the earlier systems theoretic approaches of D’Arcy Thompson and von Bertalanffy. Although most work in systems biology focuses on single-cell organisms and intracellular networks, some researchers look to dynamical systems theory to construct a general theory of development. Following Goodwin’s theories, Johannes Jaeger and colleagues seek to identify a finite core set of basic developmental processes implemented by genetic-epigenetic-cellular regulatory systems (e.g., Jaeger & Sharpe 2014). They use computer simulation of regulatory network models to identify classes of geometrically similar networks that perform specific functions (such as producing stripe patterns). The goal is a rational classification scheme for functionally-characterized developmental mechanisms, which can in turn serve as groundwork for a general theory of development. It remains unclear, however, if biological functions in development can be characterized in a context-independent (modular) way, allowing for a tractable theory. Relatedly, Jonathan Bard (2011, 2013) posits a relatively small set of developmental networks driving “patterning, signaling, proliferation, differentiation, and morphogenesis”, “themes used over and over again” in networks of signaling pathways. Bard’s graphical network approach is distinctive in cutting across spatial scales and levels of hierarchical organization. Core processes (as networks) are distributed across levels; there is no preferred level of developmental activity, but all involved simultaneously. The resulting network structures are quite complex.

10.3 Stem cells and lineages

Results of stem cell experiments prompt re-examination of now-standard assumptions about the nature of development. At early stages of mammalian development when embryonic stem cells are most plentiful, in the blastocyst stage just before implantation, stem cells can be harvested and cultured to become a large number of different kinds of cells (Thomson et al. 1998). In theory, they have the capacity to become any kind of differentiated cell, but it is impossible to prove that conclusively (Fagan 2013b). Position in the organism and with respect to other cells seems to be decisive in directing differentiation. Although genetics provides information about the range of possibilities, regulation of gene expression involves diverse factors—and stem cells’ plasticity and context-dependence fits a more epigenetic view. Cell reprogramming, for example, is a method of producing stem cells (induced pluripotent stem cells) from more differentiated cells, effectively reversing normal development (Takahashi & Yamanaka 2006). This contradicts any strict principle of development as irreversible and internally-directed, undermining the notion of a fixed program for development (Brandt 2010). Melinda Cooper (2003) examines how central concepts of stem cell research (potency, differentiation, form, and regeneration) fit within the long tradition of theorizing about epigenesis and self-organization, dating from seventeenth-century revivals of Aristotelian embryology.

Ariane Dröscher (2014) traces the history of conceptual change concerning stem cells via lineage tree diagrams, a form of visual representation common to studies of development and of evolution. Lineage diagrams track relations between generations of reproducing entities. From Haeckel’s speculative image of the Tree of Life and Weismann’s introduction of “cytogenetic tree diagrams”, Dröscher examines this cell-centric way of understanding development from the mid-nineteenth century onward. Scott Gilbert (1991) shows that branching tracks have been used to represent cell development since the late nineteenth century, most prominently in cell lineage diagrams that track cell pedigrees and division events. In these models, branch-points represent cell division events and branching tracks represent genealogical relations among cells. Other cell characteristics are also represented, such as position within the developing embryo, morphology, and developmental fate. Waddington’s landscape is a model of this type (see Section 8.1). Fagan (2013a) uses this modeling approach to characterize cell development in general. Any process of cell development produces a cell lineage tree with a specific topology, representing developmental and reproductive relations between cells. Different stem cell concepts correspond to models that differentially constrain the space of possible topologies for cell lineage trees. This framework provides a systematic representation of the many different varieties of stem cell.

Fagan (2013a, 2017) extends this cell lineage framework to cell-molecular and cell-organism relations, yielding a cell-centric multi-level model of development. Her view of the cell-molecular relation is that of systems biology: a cell state is a pattern of gene expression and molecular interactions that determines a cell’s structural and functional characteristics. The cell-organism relation is “enkaptic”—that is, cells reproduce and differentiate (the two defining stem cell abilities) and are collected or encapsulated into a higher-level system: gastrula, tissue, organ, or an experimentally-produced organoid or embryo-like structure. The higher-level system emerges via formation of a boundary separating it from its environment. So different levels or scales of a developmental process are related by “boundary-formation”. On this view, development is a process comprised of multi-layered interactive networks, arranged in strata (layers) related by an encapsulating boundary. Each network is related to the one below by boundary-formation, conceived as emerging out of (and imposing constraints on) smaller-scale interactions such that an encapsulating system is distinguished from its environment.

Jane Maienschien and Kate MacCord offer a suggestive look at regeneration as a response of complex systems to injury through repair. (Maienschein and MacCord, 2022) The repair draws on inherited and in some ways predelineated organization, as well as on responses to changing environments. Both Fagan’s stem cell-based alternatives to predetermined development and Maienschein and MacCord’s suggestions about regeneration across all scales of life hark back to Morgan’s suggestion that

a process of pure epigenetic development, as generally understood nowadays, may also be predetermined in the egg. (Morgan 1901: 968)

The nowadays of the twenty-first century may take us back to some of the understanding and insights of the early twentieth, a time when a balance of epigenesis and preformation seemed likely.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


The authors would like to thank Alan Love and Karin Ekholm for helpful and constructive comments on a earlier draft. This entry includes portions of the former entry on Epigenesis and Preformationism (Spring 2017).

Copyright © 2022 by
Melinda Bonnie Fagan <>
Jane Maienschein

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