Molecular Biology

First published Sat Feb 19, 2005; substantive revision Thu Jun 27, 2019

The field of molecular biology studies macromolecules and the macromolecular mechanisms found in living things, such as the molecular nature of the gene and its mechanisms of gene replication, mutation, and expression. Given the fundamental importance of these macromolecular mechanisms throughout the history of molecular biology, a philosophical focus on the concept of a mechanism generates the clearest picture of molecular biology’s history, concepts, and case studies utilized by philosophers of science.

1. History of Molecular Biology

Despite its prominence in the contemporary life sciences, molecular biology is a relatively young discipline, originating in the 1930s and 1940s, and becoming institutionalized in the 1950s and 1960s. It should not be surprising, then, that many of the philosophical issues in molecular biology are closely intertwined with this recent history. This section sketches four facets of molecular biology’s development: its origins, its classical period, its subsequent migration into other biological domains, and its more recent turn to genomics and post-genomics. The rich historiography of molecular biology can only be briefly utilized in this shortened history (see, for example, Abir-Am 1985, 1987, 1994, 2006; Burian 1993a; Canguillhem 1989; de Chadarevian 2002, 2003; de Chadarevian and Gaudilliere 1996; de Chadarevian and Strasser 2002; Deichmann 2002; Fisher 2010; Hausmann 2002; Holmes 2001; Judson 1980, 1996; Kay 1993; Marcum 2002; Morange 1997a, 1998; Olby 1979, 1990, 1994, 2003; Powell et al. 2007; Rheinberger 1997; Sapp 1992; Sarkar 1996a; Stegenga 2011; van Holde and Zlatanova 2018; Witkowski 2005; Zallen 1996. Also see autobiographical accounts by biologists, such as Brenner 2001; Cohen 1984; Crick 1988; Echols 2001; Jacob 1988; Kornberg 1989; Luria 1984; Watson 1968, 2002, 2007; Wilkins 2003).

1.1 Origins

The field of molecular biology arose from the convergence of work by geneticists, physicists, and structural chemists on a common problem: the nature of inheritance. In the early twentieth century, although the nascent field of genetics was guided by Mendel’s laws of segregation and independent assortment, the actual mechanisms of gene reproduction, mutation and expression remained unknown. Thomas Hunt Morgan and his colleagues utilized the fruit fly, Drosophila melanogaster, as a model organism to study the relationship between the gene and the chromosomes in the hereditary process (Morgan 1926; discussed in Darden 1991; Darden and Maull 1977; Kohler 1994; Roll-Hanson 1978; Wimsatt 1992). A former student of Morgan’s, Hermann J. Muller, recognized the “gene as a basis of life”, and so set out to investigate its structure (Muller 1926). Muller discovered the mutagenic effect of x-rays on Drosophila, and utilized this phenomenon as a tool to explore the size and nature of the gene (Carlson 1966, 1971, 1981, 2011; Crow 1992; Muller 1927). But despite the power of mutagenesis, Muller recognized that, as a geneticist, he was limited in the extent to which he could explicate the more fundamental properties of genes and their actions. He concluded a 1936 essay:

The geneticist himself is helpless to analyse these properties further. Here the physicist, as well as the chemist, must step in. Who will volunteer to do so? (Muller 1936: 214)

Muller’s request did not go unanswered. The next decade saw several famous physicists turn their attention to the nature of inheritance (Keller 1990; Kendrew 1967). In What is Life, the physicist Erwin Schroedinger (1944) proposed ways in which the principles of quantum physics might account for the stability, yet mutability, of the gene (see the entry on life) (Elitzur 1995; Moore 1989; Olby 1994; Sarkar 1991; for a reinterpretation see Kay 2000). Max Delbrueck also became interested in the physical basis of heredity after hearing a lecture by his teacher, quantum physicist Niels Bohr (1933), which expounded a principle of complementarity between physics and biology (McKaughan 2005; Roll-Hansen 2000). In contrast to Schroedinger, Bohr (and subsequently Delbrueck) did not seek to reduce biology to physics; instead, the goal was to understand how each discipline complemented the other (Delbrueck 1949; Sloan and Fogel 2011). To investigate the self-reproductive characteristic of life, Delbrueck used bacteriophage, viruses that infect bacteria and then multiply very rapidly. The establishment of “The Phage Group” in the early 1940s by Delbrueck and another physicist-turned-biologist Salvador Luria marked a critical point in the rise of molecular biology (Brock 1990; Cairns et al. 1966; Fischer and Lipson 1988; Fleming 1968; Lewontin 1968; Luria 1984; Morange 1998: Ch. 4; Stent 1968). Delbrueck’s colleague at Cal Tech, Linus Pauling, utilized his knowledge of structural chemistry to study macromolecular structure. Pauling contributed both theoretical work on the nature of chemical bonds and experimental work using x-ray crystallography to discover the physical structure of macromolecular compounds (Pauling 1939, 1970; Olby 1979; Hager 1995; Crick 1996; Sarkar 1998).

As suggested in the brief history above, experimentation figured prominently in the rise of molecular biology (see the entry on experiment in biology). X-ray crystallography allowed molecular biologists to investigate the structure of macromolecules. Alfred Hershey and Martha Chase (1952) used phage viruses to confirm that the genetic material transmitted from generation to generation was DNA and not proteins (see Hershey-Chase Experiment in Other Internet Resources). Muller (1927) used x-rays to intervene on and alter gene function, thus revealing the application of methods from physics to a biological domain (see Elof Carlson on Muller’s Research in Other Internet Resources).

Recognizing quite early the importance of these new physical and structural chemical approaches to biology, Warren Weaver, then the director of the Natural Sciences section of the Rockefeller Foundation, introduced the term “molecular biology” in a 1938 report to the Foundation. Weaver wrote,

And gradually there is coming into being a new branch of science—molecular biology—which is beginning to uncover many secrets concerning the ultimate units of the living cell….in which delicate modern techniques are being used to investigate ever more minute details of certain life processes (quoted in Olby 1994: 442).

But perhaps a more telling account of the term’s origin came from Francis Crick, who said he started calling himself a molecular biologist because:

when inquiring clergymen asked me what I did, I got tired of explaining that I was a mixture of crystallographer, biophysicist, biochemist, and geneticist, an explanation which in any case they found too hard to grasp. (quoted in Stent 1969: 36)

This brief recapitulation of the origins of molecular biology reflects themes addressed by philosophers, such as reduction (see Section 3.1), the concept of the gene (see Section 2.3), and experimentation (see Section 3.4). For Schroedinger, biology was to be reduced to the more fundamental principles of physics, while Delbrueck instead resisted such a reduction and sought what made biology unique. Muller’s shift from Mendelian genetics to the study of gene structure raises the question of the relation between the gene concepts found in those separate fields of genetics. And the import of experimental methods from physics to biology raised the question of the relation between those disciplines.

1.2 Classical Period

Molecular biology’s classical period began in 1953, with James Watson and Francis Crick’s discovery of the double helical structure of DNA (Watson and Crick 1953a,b). Watson and Crick’s scientific relationship unified the various disciplinary approaches discussed above: Watson, a student of Luria and the phage group, recognized the need to utilize crystallography to elucidate the structure of DNA; Crick, a physicist enticed by Schroedinger’s What is Life? to turn to biology, became trained in, and contributed to the theory of, x-ray crystallography. At Cambridge University, Watson and Crick found that they shared an interest in genes and the structure of DNA (see the entry on scientific revolutions).

Watson and Crick collaborated to build a model of the double helical structure of DNA, with its two helical strands held together by hydrogen-bonded base pairs (Olby 1994). They made extensive use of data from x-ray crystallography work on DNA by Maurice Wilkins and Rosalind Franklin at King’s College, London, appallingly without Franklin’s permission or even knowledge (Maddox 2002), Crick’s theoretical work on crystallography (Crick 1988), and the model building techniques pioneered by Pauling (de Chadarevian 2002; Judson 1996; Olby 1970, 1994, 2009).

With the structure of DNA in hand, molecular biology shifted its focus to how the double helical structure aided elucidation of the mechanisms of genetic replication and function, the keys to understanding the role of genes in heredity (see the entries on replication and reproduction and inheritance systems). This subsequent research was guided by the notion that the gene was an informational molecule. According to Lily Kay,

Up until around 1950 molecular biologists…described genetic mechanisms without ever using the term information. (Kay 2000: 328)

“Information” replaced earlier talk of biological “specificity”. Watson and Crick’s second paper of 1953, which discussed the genetical implications of their recently discovered (Watson and Crick 1953a) double-helical structure of DNA, used both “code” and “information”:

…it therefore seems likely that the precise sequence of the bases is the code which carries the genetical information…. (Watson and Crick 1953b: 244, emphasis added)

In 1958, Francis Crick used and characterized the concept of information in the context of stating the “central dogma” of molecular biology. Crick characterized the central dogma as follows:

This states that once “information” has passed into protein it cannot get out again. In more detail, the transfer of information from nucleic acid to nucleic acid, or from nucleic acid to protein may be possible, but transfer from protein to protein, or from protein to nucleic acid is impossible. Information means here the precise determination of sequence, either of bases in the nucleic acid or of amino acid residues in the protein. (Crick 1958: 152–153, emphasis in original)

It is important not to confuse the genetic code and genetic information. The genetic code refers to the relation between three bases of DNA, called a “codon”, and one amino acid. Tables available in molecular biology textbooks (e.g., Watson et al. 1988: frontispiece) show the relation between 64 codons and 20 amino acids. For example, CAC codes for histidine. Only a few exceptions for these coding relations have been found, in a few anomalous cases (see the list in a small table in Alberts et al. 2002: 814). In contrast, genetic information refers to the linear sequence of codons along the DNA, which (in the simplest case) are transcribed to messenger RNA, which are translated to linearly order the amino acids in a protein.

With the genetic code elucidated and the relationship between genes and their molecular products traced, it seemed in the late 1960s that the concept of the gene was secure in its connection between gene structure and gene function. The machinery of protein synthesis translated the coded information in the linear order of nucleic acid bases into the linear order of amino acids in a protein. However, such “colinear” simplicity did not persist. In the late 1970s, a series of discoveries by molecular biologists complicated the straightforward relationship between a single, continuous DNA sequence and its protein product. Overlapping genes were discovered (Barrell et al. 1976); such genes were considered “overlapping” because two different amino acid chains might be read from the same stretch of nucleic acids by starting from different points on the DNA sequence. And split genes were found (Berget et al. 1977; Chow et al. 1977). In contrast to the colinearity hypothesis that a continuous nucleic acid sequence generated an amino acid chain, it became apparent that stretches of DNA were often split between coding regions (exons) and non-coding regions (introns). Moreover, the exons might be separated by vast portions of this non-coding, supposedly “junk DNA”. The distinction between exons and introns became even more complicated when alternative splicing was discovered the following year (Berk and Sharp 1978). A series of exons could be spliced together in a variety of ways, thus generating a variety of molecular products. Discoveries such as overlapping genes, split genes, and alternative splicing forced molecular biologists to rethink their understanding of what actually made a gene…a gene (Portin 1993; for a survey of such complications see Gerstein et al. 2007: Table 1).

These developments in molecular biology have received philosophical scrutiny. Molecular biologists sought to discover mechanisms (see Section 2.1), drawing the attention of philosophers to this concept. Also, conceptualizing DNA as an informational molecule (see Section 2.2) was a move that philosophers have subjected to critical scrutiny. Finally, the concept of the gene (see Section 2.3) itself has intrigued philosophers. Complex molecular mechanisms, such as alternative splicing, have obligated philosophers to consider to what the term “gene” actually refers. Experimentation also figured prominently in the classical period (see Section 3.4); Matthew Meselson and Frank Stahl utilized bacteria grown with different weights combined with centrifugation to determine how DNA, as modeled by Watson and Crick, was replicated (Meselson and Stahl 1958; see also The Semi-Conservative Replication of DNA in Other Internet Resources).

1.3 Going Molecular

In a 1963 letter to Max Perutz, molecular biologist Sydney Brenner foreshadowed what would be molecular biology’s next intellectual migration:

It is now widely realized that nearly all the “classical” problems of molecular biology have either been solved or will be solved in the next decade…. Because of this, I have long felt that the future of molecular biology lies in the extension of research to other fields of biology, notably development and the nervous system. (Brenner, letter to Perutz, 1963)

Along with Brenner, in the late 1960s and early 1970s, many of the leading molecular biologists from the classical period redirected their research agendas, utilizing the newly developed molecular techniques to investigate unsolved problems in other fields. Francois Jacob, Jacques Monod and their colleagues used the bacteria Escherichia coli to investigate how environmental conditions impact gene expression and regulation (Jacob and Monod 1961; discussed in Craver and Darden 2013; Morange 1998: Ch. 14; Schaffner 1974a; Weber 2005; see also the entry on the developmental biology). The study of behavior and the nervous system also lured some molecular biologists. Finding appropriate model organisms that could be subjected to molecular genetic analyses proved challenging. Returning to the fruit flies used in Mendelian genetics, Seymour Benzer induced behavioral mutations in Drosophila as a “genetic scalpel” to investigate the pathways from genes to behavior (Benzer 1968; Weiner 1999). And at Cambridge, Sydney Brenner developed the nematode worm, Caenorhabditis elegans, to study the nervous system, as well as the genetics of behavior (Brenner 1973, 2001; Ankeny 2000; Brown 2003). In subsequent decades, the study of cells was transformed from descriptive cytology into molecular cell biology (Alberts et al. 1983; Alberts et al. 2002; Bechtel 2006). Molecular evolution developed as a phylogenetic method for the comparison of DNA sequences and whole genomes; molecular systematics sought to research the evolution of the genetic code as well as the rates of that evolutionary process by comparing similarities and differences between molecules (Dietrich 1998; see also the entries on evolution, heritability, and adaptationism). The immunological relationship between antibodies and antigens was recharacterized at the molecular level (Podolsky and Tauber 1997; Schaffner 1993; see also the entry on the philosophy of immunology). And the study of oncogenes in cancer research as well as the molecular bases of mental illness were examples of advances in molecular medicine (Morange 1997b; see also the entry on philosophy of psychiatry).

This process of “going molecular” thus generally amounted to using experimental methods from molecular biology to examine complex phenomena (be it gene regulation, behavior, or evolution) at the molecular level. The molecularization of many fields introduced a range of issues of interest to philosophers. Inferences made about research on model organisms such as worms and flies raised questions about extrapolation (see Section 3.3). And the reductive techniques of molecular biology raised questions about whether scientific investigations should always strive to reduce to lower and lower levels (see Section 3.1).

1.4 Going Genomic and Post-Genomic

In the 1970s, as many of the leading molecular biologists were migrating into other fields, molecular biology itself was going genomic (see the entry on genomics and postgenomics). The genome is a collection of nucleic acid base pairs within an organism’s cells (adenine (A) pairs with thymine (T) and cytosine (C) with guanine (G)). The number of base pairs varies widely among species. For example, the infection-causing Haemophilus influenzae (the first bacterial genome to be sequenced) has roughly 1.9 million base pairs in its genome (Fleischmann et al. 1995), while the infection-catching Homo sapiens carries more than 3 billion base pairs in its genome (International Human Genome Sequencing Consortium 2001, Venter et al. 2001). The history of genomics is the history of the development and use of new experimental and computational methods for producing, storing, and interpreting such sequence data (Ankeny 2003; Stevens 2013).

Frederick Sanger played a seminal role in initiating such developments, creating influential DNA sequencing techniques in the 1950s and 1960s (Saiki et al. 1985; for historical treatments see Sanger 1988; Judson 1992; Culp 1995; Rabinow 1996; Morange 1998; de Chadarevian 2002; Little 2003; Garcia-Sancho 2012; Sanger Method of DNA Sequencing in Other Internet Resources). Equally important was Edwin Southern’s development of a method to detect specific sequences of DNA in DNA samples (Southern 1975). The Southern Blot, as it came to be known, starts by digesting a strand of DNA into many small DNA fragments; those fragments are then separated (in a process called gel electrophoresis) based on size, placed on filter paper which “blots” the DNA fragments on to a new medium, and then chemically labeled with DNA probes; the probes then allow for identification and visualization of the DNA fragments (see also The Southern Blot in Other Internet Resources). Playing off the “southern” homonym, subsequent blotting techniques that detect RNA and proteins came to be called Northern blotting and Western blotting.

In the mid 1980s, after the development of sequencing techniques, the United States Department of Energy (DoE) originated a project to sequence the human genome (initially as part of a larger plan to determine the impact of radiation on the human genome induced by the Hiroshima and Nagasaki bombings). The resulting Human Genome Project (HGP) managed jointly by the DoE and the United States National Institutes of Health (NIH), utilized both existent sequencing methodologies and introduced new ones (Kevles and Hood 1992, see also the entry on the human genome project). While the human genome project received most of the public attention, hundreds of genomes have been sequenced to date, including the cat (Pontius et al. 2007), the mouse (Waterson et al. 2002), rice (Goff et al. 2002) and a flock of bird genomes (Zhang et al. 2014). One of the most shocking results of those sequencing projects was the total number of genes (defined in this context as stretches of DNA that code for a protein product) found in the genomes. The human genome contains 20,000 to 25,000 genes, the cat contains 20,285 genes, the mouse 24,174, and rice 32,000 to 50,000. So in contrast to early assumptions stemming from the classical period of molecular biology about how genes produced proteins which in turn produced organisms, it turned out that neither organismal complexity nor even position on the food chain was predictive of gene-number (see the entry on genomics and postgenomics).

The increased attention to sequencing genomes encouraged a number of disciplines to “go genomic”, including behavioral genetics (Plomin et al. 2003), developmental biology (Srinivasan and Sommer 2002), cell biology (Taniguchi et al. 2002), and evolutionary biology (Ohta and Kuroiwa 2002). What’s more, genomics has been institutionalized with textbooks (Cantor and Smith 1999) and journals, such as Genomics and Genome Research. And the human genome project itself has turned its attention from a standardized human genome to variation between genomes in the form of the Human Genome Diversity Initiative (Gannett 2003) and the HapMap Project (International HapMap Consortium 2003).

But just as a number of disciplines “went molecular” while molecular biology itself was wrestling with the complexities posed by split genes and overlapping genes, so too are fields going genomic while genomics itself is wrestling with the complexities posed by how a mere 20,000 genes can construct a human while a grain of rice requires 50,000 genes (Baedke 2018; Brigandt, Green, and O’Malley 2017; Green 2017). A related challenge was making sense of the genetic similarity claims. For example, how to interpret the finding that human and pumpkin genomes are 75% similar? Does this finding tell us anything substantive about our overall similarity to pumpkins (Piotrowska 2009)? To help answer such questions, genomics is now supplemented by post-genomics. There is ongoing debate about what actually constitutes post-genomics (Morange 2006), but the general trend is a focus beyond the mere sequence of As, Cs, Ts, and Gs and instead on the complex, cellular mechanisms involved in generating such a variety of protein products from a relatively small number of protein-coding regions in the genome. Post-genomics utilizes the sequence information provided by genomics but then situates it in an analysis of all the other entities and activities involved in the mechanisms of transcription (transcriptomics), regulation (regulomics), metabolism (metabolomics), and expression (proteomics). (See ENCODE Project Consortium 2012; Germain et al. 2014; (see also the entry on philosophy of systems and synthetic biology).

Developments in genomics and post-genomics have sparked a number of philosophical questions about molecular biology. Since the genome requires a vast array of other mechanisms to facilitate the generation of a protein product, can DNA really be causally prioritized (see Section 2.3)? Similarly, in the face of such interdependent mechanisms involved in transcription, regulation, and expression, can DNA alone be privileged as the bearer of hereditary information, or is information distributed across all such entities and activities (see Section 2.2)? And is it appropriate to extrapolate from information about other species’ genomes to how the human genome operates (see Section 3.3)?

2. Concepts in Molecular Biology

The concepts of mechanism, information, and gene all figured quite prominently in the history of molecular biology. Philosophers, in turn, have focused a great deal of attention on these concepts in order to understand how they have been, are, and should be used.

2.1 Mechanism

Molecular biologists discover and explain by identifying and elucidating mechanisms, such as DNA replication, protein synthesis, and the myriad mechanisms of gene expression. The phrase “theory of molecular biology” was not used above and for good reason; general knowledge in the field is represented by diagrams of mechanisms (Machamer, Darden, and Craver 2000; Darden 2006a, 2006b; Craver and Darden 2013; Baetu 2017). Discovering the mechanism that produces a phenomenon is an important accomplishment for several reasons. First, knowledge of a mechanism shows how something works: elucidated mechanisms provide understanding. Second, knowing how a mechanism works allows predictions to be made based upon the regularity in mechanisms. For example, knowing how the mechanism of DNA base pairing works in one species allows one to make predictions about how it works in other species, even if conditions or inputs are changed. Third, knowledge of mechanisms potentially allows one to intervene to change what the mechanism produces, to manipulate its parts to construct experimental tools, or to repair a broken, diseased mechanism. In short, knowledge of elucidated mechanisms provides understanding, prediction, and control. Given the general importance of mechanisms and the fact that mechanisms play such a central role in the field of molecular biology, it is not surprising that philosophers of biology pioneered analyzing the concept of mechanism (see the entry on mechanisms in science).

Starting in the 1990s, a number of philosophers focused squarely on how the concept of a mechanism functions in science generally and molecular biology specifically (Glennan and Illari 2017; see also the entry on mechanisms in science). A number of characterizations of what a mechanism is have emerged over the years (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2005; Glennan 2002; Machamer, Darden, and Craver 2000). Phyllis McKay Illari and Jon Williamson have more recently offered a characterization that draws on the essential features of all the earlier contributions:

A mechanism for a phenomenon consists of entities and activities organized in such a way that they are responsible for the phenomenon. (Illari and Williamson 2012: 120)

As an example, consider the phenomenon of DNA replication. As Watson and Crick (1953a) famously noted upon discovery of the structure of DNA, the macromolecule’s structure pointed to the mechanism of DNA replication:

It has not escaped our notice that the specific pairing we have postulated immediately suggests a possible copying mechanism for the genetic material.

In short, the double helix of DNA (an entity with an organization) unwinds (an activity) and new component parts (entities) bond (an activity) to both parts of the unwound DNA helix. DNA is a nucleic acid composed of several subparts: a sugar-phosphate backbone and nucleic acid bases. When DNA unwinds, the bases exhibit weak charges, properties that result from slight asymmetries in the molecules. These weak charges allow a DNA base and its complement to engage in the activity of forming hydrogen (weak polar) chemical bonds; the specificity of this activity is due to the topological arrangements of the weak polar charges in the subparts of the base. Ultimately, entities with polar charges enable the activity of hydrogen bond formation. After the complementary bases align, then the backbone forms via stronger covalent bonding. The mechanism proceeds with unwinding and bonding together (activities) new parts, to produce two helices (newly formed entities) that are (more or less faithfully) copies of the parent helix. (This process of “semi-conservative replication” and the Meselson-Stahl experiment that confirmed it are discussed in more detail in Section 3.4.)

Scientists rarely depict all the particular details when describing a mechanism; representations are usually schematic, often depicted in diagrams (see the entry on models in science). Such representations may be called a “model of a mechanism”, or “mechanism schema”. A mechanism schema is a truncated abstract description of a mechanism that can be instantiated by filling it with more specific descriptions of component entities and activities. An example is James Watson’s (1965) diagram of his version of the central dogma of molecular biology:

DNA → RNA → protein.

This is a schematic representation (with a high degree of abstraction) of the mechanism of protein synthesis, which can be instantiated with details of DNA base sequence, complementary RNA sequence, and the corresponding order of amino acids in the protein produced by the more specific mechanism. Molecular biology textbooks are replete with diagrams of mechanism schemas. A mechanism schema can be instantiated to yield a description of a particular mechanism. In contrast, a mechanism sketch cannot (yet) be instantiated; components are (as yet) unknown. Sketches have black boxes for missing components or grey boxes whose function is known but whose entities and activities that carry out that function are not yet elucidated. Such sketches guide new research to fill in the details (Craver and Darden 2013).

2.2 Information

The language of information appears often in molecular biology. Genes as linear DNA sequences of bases are said to carry “information” for the production of proteins. During protein synthesis, the information is “transcribed” from DNA to messenger RNA and then “translated” from RNA to protein. With respect to inheritance, it is often said that what is passed from one generation to the next is the “information” in the genes, namely the linear ordering of bases along complementary DNA strands. Historians of biology have tracked the entrenchment of information-talk in molecular biology (Kay 2000) since its introduction.

The question for philosophers of biology is whether an analysis of the concept of information can capture the various ways in which the concept is used in molecular biology (e.g., Maynard Smith 2000). The usage of “information” in the mathematical theory of communication is too impoverished to capture the molecular biological usage, since the coded sequences in the DNA are more than just a signal with some number of bits that may or may not be accurately transmitted (Sarkar 1996b,c; Sterelny and Griffiths 1999; Shannon and Weaver 1949). Conversely, the usage in cognitive neuroscience, with its talk of “representations” (e.g., Crick 1988) may be said to be too rich, since the coded sequences in the DNA are also not said to have within them a representation of the structure of the protein (Darden 2006b). No definition of “information” as it is used in molecular biology has yet received wide support among philosophers of biology.

Stephen Downes (2006) helpfully distinguishes three positions on the relation between information and the natural world:

  1. Information is present in DNA and other nucleotide sequences. Other cellular mechanisms contain no information.
  2. Information is present in DNA, in other nucleotide sequences and other cellular mechanisms, for example cytoplasmic or extra-cellular proteins; and in many other media, for example, the embryonic environment or components of an organism’s wider environment.
  3. DNA and other nucleotide sequences do not contain information, nor do any other cellular mechanisms.

These options may be read either ontologically or heuristically. A heuristic reading of (1), for instance, views the talk of information in molecular biology as useful in providing a way of talking and in guiding research. And so the heuristic benefit of the information concept can be defended without making any commitment to the ontological status (Sarkar 2000). Indeed, one might argue that a vague and open-ended use of information is valuable for heuristic purposes, especially during early discovery phases in the development of a field.

Philosophers’ discussions of the concept of information in biology have also focused on its ontological reading. Three different philosophical accounts of information serve as exemplars of Downes’ three categories. Ulrich Stegmann (2005) provides an example of Downes’ first category with his analysis of template-directed synthesis. (Stegmann does explicitly allow that components other than nucleotide sequences might contain what he calls instructional information. However, his only example is a thought experiment involving enzymes linearly ordered along a membrane; nothing of the sort is known to actually exist or even seems very likely to exist.) Stegmann calls this the sequentialization view. Stegmann’s instructional account of genetic information requires that the component carrying the information satisfy the following conditions: an advance specification of the kind and order of steps that yield a determinate outcome if the steps are carried out. On his account, DNA qualifies as an instructional information carrier for replication, transcription and translation. The sequence of bases provides the order. The hydrogen bonding between specific bases and the genetic code provide the specific kinds of steps. And the mechanisms of replication, transcription, and translation yield certain outcomes: a copy of the DNA double helix, an mRNA, and a linear order of amino acids. Also, because DNA carries information for a specific outcome, an error can occur as the mechanism operates to produce that outcome; hence Stegmann’s account allows for errors and error-correcting mechanisms (such as proof reading mechanisms that correct DNA mutations). For more on this topic, see the entry on biological information.

Eva Jablonka (2002) is an example of Downes’ second category. She argues that information is ubiquitous. She defines information as follows: a source becomes an informational input when an interpreting receiver can react to the form of the source (and variations in this form) in a functional manner. She claims a broad applicability of this definition. The definition, she says, accommodates information stemming from environmental cues as well as from evolved signals, and calls for a comparison between information-transmission in different types of inheritance systems — the genetic, the epigenetic, the behavioral, and the cultural-symbolic. On this view, genes have no theoretically privileged informational status (Jablonka 2002: 583).

In line with Downes’ third category, C. Kenneth Waters argues that information is a useful term in rhetorical contexts, such as seeking funding for DNA sequencing by claiming that DNA carries information. However, from an ontological perspective, Waters claims that explication of DNA’s causal role has no need for the concept of information. Genes, he argues, should not be viewed as “immaterial units of information” (Waters 2000: 541). As discussed in Section 2.3 below, Waters’ focus is on stretches of DNA whose causal roles are as actual specific difference makers in genetic mechanisms (Waters 2007). Talk of information is not needed; causal role function talk is sufficient. (For more on Waters’ view see his entry on molecular genetics; for others who make similar points, see Sustar 2007; Weber 2005, 2006.)

2.3 Gene

The question of whether classical, Mendelian genetics could be (or already has been) reduced to molecular biology (to be taken up in Section 3.1 below) motivated philosophers to consider the connectability of the term they shared: the gene. Investigations of reduction and scientific change raised the question of how the concept of the gene evolved over time, figuring prominently in C. Kenneth Waters’ (1990, 1994, 2007, see entry on molecular genetics), Philip Kitcher’s (1982, 1984) and Raphael Falk’s (1986) work. Over time, however, philosophical discussions of the gene concept took on a life of their own, as philosophers raised questions independent of the reduction debate: What is a gene? And, is there anything causally distinct about DNA? (see the entry on the gene)

Falk (1986) explicitly asked philosophers and historians of biology, “What is a Gene?” Discoveries such as overlapping genes, split genes, and alternative splicing (discussed in Section 1.2) made it clear that simply equating a gene with an uninterrupted stretch of DNA would no longer capture the complicated molecular-developmental details of mechanisms such as gene expression (Downes 2004; Luc-Germain, Ratti and Boem 2015). In an effort to answer Falk’s question, two general trends have emerged in the philosophical literature: first, distinguish multiple gene concepts to capture the complex structural and functional features separately, or second, rethink a unified gene concept to incorporate such complexity. (For a survey of gene concepts defended by philosophers, see Griffiths and Stotz 2007, 2013.; Rheinberger and Muller-Wille 2018)

A paradigmatic example of the first line came from Lenny Moss’s distinction between Gene-P and Gene-D (Moss 2001, 2002). Gene-P embraced an instrumental preformationism (providing the “P”); it was defined by its relationship to a phenotype. In contrast, Gene-D referred to a developmental resource (providing the “D”); it was defined by its molecular sequence. An example will help to distinguish the two: When one talked about the gene for cystic fibrosis, the most common genetic disease affecting populations of Western European descent, the Gene-P concept was being utilized; the concept referred to the ability to track the transmission of this gene from generation to generation as an instrumental predictor of cystic fibrosis, without being contingent on knowing the causal pathway between the particular sequence of DNA and the ultimate phenotypic disease. The Gene-D concept, in contrast, referred instead to just one developmental resource (i.e., the molecular sequence) involved in the complex development of the disease, which interacted with a host of other such resources (proteins, RNA, a variety of enzymes, etc.); Gene-D was indeterminate with regards to the ultimate phenotypic disease. Moreover, in cases of other diseases where there are different disease alleles at the same locus, a Gene-D perspective would treat these alleles as individual genes, while a Gene-P perspective treats them collectively as “the gene for” the disease. (For other examples of gene-concept dividers, see Keller’s distinction between the gene as a structural entity and the gene as a functional entity as well as Baetu’s distinction between the gene as a syntax-based concept and the gene as a mapping concept (Baetu 2011; Keller 2000).)

A second philosophical approach for conceptualizing the gene involved rethinking a single, unified gene concept that captured the molecular-developmental complexities. For example, Eva Neumann-Held (Neumann-Held 1999, 2001; Griffiths and Neumann-Held 1999) claimed that a “process molecular gene concept” (PMG) embraced the complicated developmental intricacies. On her unified view, the term “gene” referred to “the recurring process that leads to the temporally and spatially regulated expression of a particular polypeptide product” (Neumann-Held 1999). Returning to the case of cystic fibrosis, a PMG for an individual without the disease referred to one of a variety of transmembrane ion-channel templates along with all the epigenetic factors, i.e., nongenetic influences on gene expression, involved in the generation of the normal polypeptide product. And so cystic fibrosis arose when a particular stretch of the DNA sequence was missing from this process. (For another example of a gene-concept unifier, see Falk’s discussion of the gene as a DNA sequence that corresponded to a single norm of reaction for various molecular products based on varying epigenetic conditions (Falk 2001).)

Relatedly, philosophers have also debated the causal distinctiveness of DNA. Consider again the case of cystic fibrosis. A stretch of DNA on chromosome 7 is involved in the process of gene expression, which generates (or fails to generate) the functional product that transports chloride ions. But obviously that final product results from that stretch of DNA as well as all the other developmental resources involved in gene expression, be it in the expression of the functional protein or the dysfunctional one. Thus, a number of authors have argued for a causal parity thesis, wherein all developmental resources involved in the generation of a phenotype such as cystic fibrosis are treated as being on par (Griffiths and Knight 1998; Robert 2004; Stotz 2006).

Waters (2007, see also his entry on molecular genetics), in reply, has argued that there is something causally distinctive about DNA. Causes are often conceived of as being difference makers, in that a variable (i.e., an entity or activity in a mechanism) can be deemed causal when a change in the value of that variable would counterfactually have led to a different outcome (see the entry on scientific explanation). According to Waters, there are a number of potential difference makers in the mechanisms involved in developing or not developing cystic fibrosis; that is, an individual with two normal copies of the gene could still display signs of cystic fibrosis if a manipulation was done to the individual’s RNA polymerase (the protein responsible for transcribing DNA to RNA), thereby undermining the functional reading of the stretch of DNA. So RNA polymerase is a difference maker in the development or lack of development of cystic fibrosis, but only a potential difference maker, since variation in RNA polymerase does not play a role in the development or lack of development of cystic fibrosis in natural populations. The stretch of DNA on chromosome 7, however, is an actual difference maker. That is, there are actual differences in natural human populations on this stretch of DNA, which lead to actual differences in developing or not developing cystic fibrosis; DNA is causally distinctive, according to Waters, because it is an actual difference maker. Advocates of the parity thesis are thus challenged to identify the other resources (in addition to DNA) that are actual difference makers.

Recently, Paul Griffiths and Karola Stotz (2013) have responded to this challenge by offering examples in which, depending on context, regulatory mechanisms can either contribute additional information to the gene products or create gene products for which there is no underlying sequence. Thus, according to Griffiths and Stotz, to assign a causally distinctive role to DNA, as Waters does, is to ignore key aspects of how the gene makes its product.

3. Molecular Biology and General Philosophy of Science

In addition to analyzing key concepts in the field, philosophers have employed case studies from molecular biology to address more general issues in the philosophy of science, such as reduction, explanation, extrapolation, and experimentation. For each of these philosophical issues, evidence from molecular biology directs philosophical attention toward understanding the concept of a mechanism for addressing the topic.

3.1 Reduction

Reduction may be understood in multiple ways depending on what it is that is being reduced (see the entry on scientific reduction). Theory reduction pertains to whether or not theories from one scientific field can be reduced to theories from another scientific field. In contrast, explanatory reduction (often united with methodological reduction) pertains to whether or not explanations that come from lower levels (often united with methodologies that investigate those lower levels) are better than explanations that come from higher levels. Philosophical attention to molecular biology has contributed to debates about both of these senses of reduction (see the entry on reductionism in biology).

Philosophy of biology first came to prominence as a sub-specialty of philosophy of science in the 1970s when it offered an apparent case study by which to judge how theories from one field may reduce to theories from another field. The specific question was: might classic, Mendelian genetics reduce to molecular genetics (see the entry on molecular genetics)? Kenneth Schaffner used and developed Ernst Nagel’s (1961) analysis of derivational theory reduction to argue for the reduction of classical Mendelian genetics (T2) to molecular biology (T1) and refined it over many years (summarized in Schaffner 1993). The goal of formal reduction was to logically deduce the laws of classical genetics (or its improved successor, “modern transmission genetics” T2*) from the laws of molecular biology. Such a derivation required that all the terms of T2* not in T1 had to be connected to terms in T1 via correspondence rules. Hence, Schaffner endeavored to find molecular equivalents of such terms as “gene”, as well as predicate terms, such as “is dominant”. David Hull (1974) criticized formal reduction, argued against Schaffner’s claims, and suggested, instead, that perhaps molecular biology replaced classical genetics.

Even though Schaffner and Hull were engaged in a debate over theory reduction, they simultaneously admitted that the question of formal theory reduction was rather peripheral to what scientists actually did and studied (Schaffner 1974b; Hull 1974). And indeed, while the theory reduction debate was playing out, a number of philosophers of biology switched attention from scientific theories to the stuff in nature that scientists investigated. William Wimsatt (1976) argued for a shift in the reduction debate from talk of relations between theories to talk of decompositional explanation via mechanisms. And Lindley Darden and Nancy Maull (1977) focused attention on the bridges between fields formed by part-whole relations, structure-function relations, and cause-effect relations.

This shift in attention was a precursor to understanding the philosophy of science through the lens of mechanisms. Darden, building on the work of Machamer, Darden, and Craver (2000), has more recently returned to the question of how Mendelian and molecular genetics are related and viewed it through this lens (Darden 2005). Rather than understanding the relationship as one of reduction, she suggests they can be understood as relating via a focus on different working entities (often at different size levels) that operate at different times. Thus, the relation was one of integration of sequentially operating chromosomal and molecular hereditary mechanisms rather than reduction. (For an alternative but still integrative reading of the relationship between classical genetics and molecular biology that focuses on their shared functional units, see Baetu 2010.)

Reduction can also be about explanation and methodology. That is, reduction can be about using reductive methodologies to dig down to lower levels because the thought is that this exercise leads to more reductive explanations and more reductive explanations are better than explanations at higher levels. Alex Rosenberg (1997, 2006) controversially divided biology into molecular biology and everything else, which he dubbed “functional biology”. “Reductionism”, Rosenberg argued,

is the thesis that biological theories and explanations that employ them do need to be grounded in molecular biology and ultimately physical science, for it is only by doing so that they can be improved, corrected, strengthened, and made more accurate and more adequate and completed. (Rosenberg 2006: 4)

Hence, the task of this explanatory reduction is to explain all functional biological phenomena via molecular biology.

Critics and defenders of Rosenberg’s view have discussed organizational and contextual features not captured by molecular biological principles. These included orientation of the embryo in the earth’s gravitational field and other spatial, regulatory, and dynamical properties of developing systems (e.g., see Delehanty 2005; Frost-Arnold 2004; Keller 1999; Laubichler and Wagner 2001; Love et al. 2008; Robert 2001, 2004). This particular debate can be understood as an instance of a more general debate occurring in biology and philosophy of biology about whether investigations of lower-level molecular biology are better than investigations of high-level systems biology (Baetu 2012a; Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2010; De Backer, De Waele, and Van Speybroeck 2010; Huettemann and Love 2011; Marco 2012; Morange 2008; Pigliucci 2013; Powell and Dupre 2009; see also the entries on feminist philosophy of biology, philosophy of systems and synthetic biology, and multiple realizability).

3.2 Explanation

Traditionally, philosophers of science took successful scientific explanations to result from derivation from laws of nature (see the entries on laws of nature and scientific explanation). On this deductive-nomological account (Hempel and Oppenheim 1948), an explanation of particular observation statements was analyzed as subsumption under universal (applying throughout the universe), general (exceptionless), necessary (not contingent) laws of nature plus the initial conditions of the particular case. Philosophers of biology have criticized this traditional analysis as inapplicable to biology, and especially molecular biology.

Since the 1960s, philosophers of biology have questioned the existence of biological laws of nature. J. J. C. Smart (1963) emphasized the earth-boundedness of the biological sciences (in conflict with the universality of natural laws). No purported “law” in biology has been found to be exceptionless, even for life on earth (in conflict with the generality of laws). And John Beatty (1995) argued that the purported “laws” of, for example, Mendelian genetics, were contingent on evolution (in conflict with the necessity of natural laws). (For further discussion, see Brandon 1997; Lange 2000; Mitchell 1997; Sober 1997; Waters 1998; Weber 2005.) Hence, philosophers’ search for biological laws of nature, characterized as universal, necessary generalizations, has ceased.

Without traditional laws of nature from which to derive explanations, philosophers of biology have been forced to rethink the nature of scientific explanation in biology and, in particular, molecular biology. Two accounts of explanation emerged: the unificationist and the causal-mechanical. Philip Kitcher (1989, 1993) developed a unificationist account of explanation, and he and Sylvia Culp explicitly applied it to molecular biology (Culp and Kitcher 1989). Among the premises of the “Watson-Crick” argument schema were “transcription, post-transcriptional modification and translation for the alleles in question”, along with details of cell biology and embryology for the organisms in question (Kitcher 1989). An explanation of a particular pattern of distribution of progeny phenotypes in a genetic cross resulted from instantiating the appropriate deductive argument schema: the variables were filled with the details from the particular case and the conclusion derived from the premises.

Working in the causal-mechanical tradition pioneered by Wesley Salmon (1984, 1998), other philosophers turned to understanding mechanism elucidation as the avenue to scientific explanation in biology (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2005; Bechtel and Richardson 1993; Craver 2007; Darden 2006a; Glennan 2002; Machamer, Darden, and Craver 2000; Sarkar 1998; Schaffner 1993; Woodward 2002, 2010). There are differences between the various accounts of a mechanism, but they hold in common the basic idea that a scientist provides a successful explanation of a phenomenon by identifying and manipulating variables in the mechanisms thereby determining how those variables are situated in and make a difference in the mechanism; the ultimate explanation amounts to the elucidation of how those mechanism components act and interact to produce the phenomenon under investigation. As mentioned above (see Section 2.1, see also entry on mechanisms in science), an elucidated mechanism allows for the explanatory features of understanding, prediction, and control.

There are several virtues of the causal-mechanical approach to understanding scientific explanation in molecular biology. For one, it is truest to molecular biologists’ own language when engaging in biological explanation. Molecular biologists rarely describe their practice and achievements as the development of new theories; rather, they describe their practice and achievements as the elucidation of molecular mechanisms (Baetu 2017; Craver 2001; Machamer, Darden, Craver 2000). Another virtue of the causal-mechanical approach is that it captures biological explanations of both regularity and variation. Unlike in physics, where a scientist assumes that an electron is an electron is an electron, a biologist is often interested in precisely what makes one individual different from another, one population different from another, or one species different from another. Philosophers have extended the causal-mechanical account of explanation to cover biological explanations of variation, be it across evolutionary time (Calcott 2009) or across individuals in a population (Tabery 2009, 2014). Tabery (2009, 2014) characterized biological explanations of variation across individuals in a population as the elucidation of “difference mechanisms”. Difference mechanisms are regular causal mechanisms made up of difference-making variables, one or more of which are actual difference makers (see Section 2.3 for the discussion of Waters’ (2007) concept of an actual difference maker). There is regularity in difference mechanisms; interventions made on variables in the mechanisms that change the values of the variables lead to different outcomes in the phenomena under investigation. There is also variation in difference mechanisms; interventions need not be taken to find differences in outcomes because, with difference mechanisms, some variables are actual difference makers which already take different values in the natural world, resulting in natural variation in the outcomes.

But philosophers have also raised challenges to the causal-mechanical approach. One complaint has been that mechanistic explanations don’t work well in systems biology, a field distinct from molecular biology but that nonetheless draws on the work of molecular biologists. While some argue that systems biology is best explained using mechanisms (cf. Boogerd et al. 2007; Matthiessen 2017; Richardson and Stephan 2007; Bechtel 2011; Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2013), others argue that it requires non-mechanistic explanation (cf. Braillard 2010; Kuhlmann 2011; Silberstein and Chemero 2013).

Another complaint has been that mechanistic explanations fail to provide a satisfactory account of the complexity of living systems because they fail to devote serious attention to the “thoroughly processual character of living systems” (Dupre 2012: 19). Those who prefer a “process-oriented” ontology (Bapteste and Dupre 2013; Bickhard 2011; Campbell 2015; Dupre 2012; Jaeger and Monk 2015; Jaeger et al. 2012; Meincke 2018; Nicholson and Dupre 2018) argue that mechanistic accounts mistakenly assume that parts composing a mechanism can be identified independently of the activities or processes in which they are involved. Instead, as Anne Sophie Maincke explains, if there are parts or substances, they must be “reconceptualised as stabilized higher-order processes that persist as long as stabilization can be maintained” (2018). Processes are ontologically primary. Recent literature in molecular biology on molecular pathways (cf. Boniolo and Campaner 2018; Brigandt 2018; Ioannides and Psillos 2017; Ross 2018) seems to be another instantiation of this shift from mechanistic to processual explanations. But Christopher Austin (2016) has recently challenged the idea that processual explanations can be sufficiently grounded “without the metaphysical underpinning of the very mechanisms which processes purport to replace” (639).

3.3 Extrapolation

As discussed earlier in the historical sections, molecular biologists have relied heavily on model organisms (see the entry on models in science). The model organisms that were used to lay down the foundation of molecular biology served as “exemplary models” in contrast to what today are called “surrogate models”—the distinction comes from Jessica Bolker (2009). According to Bolker, exemplary models are “representatives of a broader group” and the goal of using them is “to elucidate fundamental or general biological patterns and mechanisms” (487). But making inferences from a single exemplary model to general biological patterns has been cause for worry. What grounds do biologists have for believing that what is true of a mere model is true of many different organisms? One answer, provided by Marcel Weber (2005), is that the generality of biological knowledge obtained from studying exemplary models can be established on evolutionary grounds. According to Weber, if a mechanism is found in a set of phylogenetically distant organisms, this provides evidence that it is also likely to be found in all organisms that share a common ancestor with the organisms being compared.

Exemplary models still play an important role in molecular biology, but a new type of model organism, the “surrogate model”, has become increasingly popular. According to Bolker, surrogate models “act as proxies for specific targets” and are often used in biomedical research “where the objective is to understand the mechanisms and etiology of human disease, and ultimately to develop treatments” (Bolker 2009: 489). Unlike the aim of exemplary models, the representative aim of a surrogate model is not necessarily to be broad. Instead, it’s to faithfully replicate a specific target. For example, biomedical researchers frequently expose surrogate models to harmful chemicals with the aim of modeling human disease. However, if a chemical proves to be carcinogenic in rats, for example, there is no guarantee that it will also cause cancer in humans.

This difficulty of justifying the inference from rats to humans or, more broadly, of “transferring causal generalizations from one context to another when homogeneity cannot be presumed” (Steel 2008: 3) is known as the problem of extrapolation. Although this problem is not unique to surrogate models, it often arises when biomedical researchers use them to replicate human disease at the molecular level. Consequently, philosophers who write about the problem of extrapolation in the context of molecular biology often focus on such models (see, for example, Ankeny 2001; Baetu 2016; Bechtel and Abrahamsen 2005; Bolker 1995; Burian 1993b; Darden 2007; LaFollette and Shanks 1996; Love 2009; Piotrowska 2013; Schaffner 1986; Steel 2008; Weber 2005; Wimsatt 1998).

Within the context of surrogate models, any successful solution to the problem of extrapolation must explain how inferences can be justified given causally relevant differences between models and their targets (Lafollette and Shanks 1996). It must also avoid what Daniel Steel (2008) calls the “extrapolator’s circle”, which arises when attempting to determine whether the model and its target are similar enough in casually relevant respects.

One way to escape the extrapolator’s circle is to black box the mechanisms being compared and instead treat the problem of extrapolation as a statistical problem (cf. Cook and Campbell 1979). This method avoids the circle because it eliminates the need to know if two mechanisms are similar. All that matters is that two outcomes are produced to a statistically significant degree, given the same intervention. For this reason, statistically significant outcomes in clinical trials are at the top of the evidence hierarchy in biomedical research (Sackett et al. 1996). One problem with relying merely on statistics to solve the problem of extrapolation, however, is that it cannot show that an observed correlation between model and target is the result of intervention and not a confounder.

A different strategy for avoiding the extrapolator’s circle is to remove the black box and compare the two mechanisms but argue that they do not have to be causally similar at every stage for extrapolation to be justified. This approach avoids the circle because the suitability of a model can be established given only partial information about the target. For example, Steel argues that only the stages downstream from the point where the mechanisms in the model and target are likely to differ need to be compared, since the point where differences are likely will serve as a bottleneck through which the eventual outcome must be produced.

Though promising, criticisms have been raised against Steel’s mechanistic approach to extrapolation. One worry, raised by Jeremy Howick et al. (2013), is that in order to identify the bottlenecks and downstream differences, we must know more about the target than Steel admits. If what we know about the mechanism in the target exceeds what we know about the mechanism in the model, the extrapolator’s circle will not have been avoided. Another worry with Steel’s approach to extrapolation is that it doesn’t avoid the masking problem. According to Julian Reiss (2010), Federica Russo (2010), and Brendan Clarke et al. (2014), even if we establish that X causes Y through some mechanism, this doesn’t seem to eliminate the possibility of there being several paths that link X to Y. For example, there may be an upstream difference that affects the outcome but does not pass through the downstream stages of the mechanism. (This problem is taken up again below in Section 3.4.) A third worry with Steel’s approach, which comes from Tudor Baetu (2016), is that mechanistic accounts of the experimental model of interest “combine data from tens or even hundreds of distinct experimental setups” (956). The resulting big picture account of the experimental model is an aggregate of findings that do not describe a mechanism that actually exists in any cell or organism. Instead, as a number of authors have also pointed out (Huber and Keuck 2013; Lemoine 2017; Nelson 2013), the mechanism of interest is often stipulated first and then verified piecemeal in many different experimental organisms. The result is what Mael Lemoine (2017) has called a “theoretical chimera”, a hypothesis supported by heterogeneous partial models. On the chimera view of extrapolation, it’s possible that all one-to-one analogies work, and yet the aggregate theoretical chimera model fails.

While theoretical chimeras seem to further complicate Steel’s mechanistic account of extrapolation, actual chimeras also raise questions that Steel does not address. Consider, for example, humanized mice that have been engineered to carry a “partial or complete human physiological system” (Macchiarini et al. 2005: 1307). These genetically engineered rodents are supposed to make extrapolation more reliable by simulating a variety of human diseases, e.g., asthma, diabetes, cancer, etc. As Monika Piotrowska (2013) points out, however, this raises a new problem. The question is no longer how an inference from model to target can be justified given existing differences between the two, but rather, in what way should these mice be modified in order to justify extrapolation to humans? Piotrowska has proposed three conditions that should be met in the process of modification to ensure that extrapolation is justified. The first two requirements demand that we keep track of parts and their boundaries during transfer, which presupposes a mechanistic view of human disease, but the third requirement—that the constraints that might prevent the trait from being expressed be eliminated—highlights the limits of using a mechanistic approach when making inferences from humanized mice to humans. As Piotrowska explains,

without the right context, even the complete lack of differences between two mechanisms cannot justify the inference that what is true of one mechanism will be true of another (Piotrowska 2013: 453).

If Piotrowska is right, Steel’s mechanistic solution to the problem of extrapolation seems to have reached its limit. As our ability to manipulate biological models advances, philosophers will need to revisit the problem of extrapolation and seek out new solutions.

3.4 Experimentation

The history of molecular biology is in part the history of experimental techniques designed to probe the macromolecular mechanisms found in living things. Philosophers in turn have looked to molecular biology as a case study for understanding how experimentation works in science—how it contributes to scientific discovery, distinguishes correlation from causal and constitutive relevance, and decides between competing hypotheses (Barwich and Baschir 2017). In all three cases, the concept of a mechanism is central to understanding the function of experimentation in molecular biology (also see the entry on experimentation in biology).

Take discovery. Throughout much of the twentieth century, philosophers of science treated scientific discovery as if it were off-limits to philosophical analysis; philosophers could evaluate the rational process of confirmation, the argument went, but the psychological process of discovery (the “aha!” moment) fell into the realm of creativity (Popper 1965; see the entry on scientific discovery). Darden has countered with a focus on the strategies that scientists employ to construct, evaluate, and revise mechanical explanations of phenomena; on her view, discovery is a piecemeal, incremental, and iterative process of mechanism elucidation. In the 1950s and 1960s, for example, scientists from both molecular biology and biochemistry employed their own experimental strategies to elucidate the mechanisms of protein synthesis that linked DNA to the production of proteins. Molecular biologists moved forward from DNA using experimental techniques such as x-ray crystallography and model building to understand how the structure of DNA dictated what molecules it could interact with; biochemists simultaneously moved backward from the protein products using in vitro experimental systems to understand the chemical reactions and chemical bonding necessary to build a protein. They met in the middle at RNA, ultimately leading to Watson’s famous mechanism schema DNA → RNA → protein. Far from being philosophically inscrutable, Darden points out that the molecular biologists were “forward chaining” while the biochemists were “backward chaining”, using information about the working entities and activities that they knew about to infer what could come next or before in the mechanism of protein synthesis (Darden 2006a: chapters 3, 12; Craver and Darden 2013: chapter 10).

Tudor Baetu builds on the contemporary philosophy of mechanism literature as well to provide an account of how different experiments in molecular biology move from finding correlations, to establishing causal relevance, to establishing constitutive relevance (Baetu 2012b). Much recent philosophical attention has been given to the transition from correlation to causal relevance. On a manipulationist account of causal relevance, some factor X is determined to be causally relevant to some outcome Y when interventions on X can be shown to produce the change in Y. Experiments from molecular biology often take this form, which Baetu calls “one-variable experiments” because they involve a single intervention made on X in the experiment to establish the causal relevance to Y. But these one-variable experiments, Baetu cautions, do not necessarily provide information about the causal mechanism that links X to Y. Is X causally relevant to Y by way of mechanism A, mechanism B, or some other unknown mechanism? Baetu, drawing on his own experimental research in molecular oncology, shows that scientists probe the mechanical link by performing “two-variable experiments”. In a two-variable experiment, two interventions are simultaneously made on the initial factor and some component postulated in the mechanical link, thereby establishing both causal and constitutive relevance.

Experiments from molecular biology have also figured into philosophical discussions about the possibility of “crucial experiments”. An experiment is taken to be a crucial experiment if it is devised so as to result in the confirmation of one hypothesis by way of refuting other competing hypotheses. But the very idea of a crucial experiment, Pierre Duhem pointed out, assumes that the set of known competing hypotheses contains all possible explanations of a given phenomenon such that the refutation of all but one of the hypotheses deductively ensures the confirmation of the hypothesis left standing. However, if there are in fact unknown alternatives that weren’t considered in the set of competing hypotheses, Duhem warned, then the refutation cannot guarantee the confirmation of the last hypothesis standing (also see the entry on Pierre Duhem). (Duhem actually raised two problems for crucial experiments—the problem mentioned above, as well as the problem of auxiliary assumptions, which any hypothesis brings with it; for reasons of space, we will only discuss the former here.) Marcel Weber (2009) has utilized a famous experiment from molecular biology to offer a different vision of how crucial experiments work. After Watson and Crick discovered the double helical structure of DNA, molecular biologists turned their attention to how that macromolecule could be replicated (see Section 1.2 above). The focus was in part on the fact that the DNA was twisted together in a helix, and so the challenge was figuring out what process could unwind and replicate that complexly wound molecule. Three competing hypotheses emerged, each with their own prediction about the extent to which newly replicated DNA double helices contained old DNA strands versus newly synthesized material: semi-conservative replication, conservative replication, and dispersive replication. Matthew Meselson and Frank Stahl, at Cal Tech, devised a method for testing among these competing hypotheses (see The Semi-Conservative Replication of DNA in Other Internet Resources). They grew E.coli on a medium that contained a unique, heavier form of nitrogen which could be taken up into the E.coli DNA; then they transferred that E.coli with heavy DNA to a medium with the more common, lighter form of nitrogen and let the E.coli replicate there. By then taking regular samples of the replicating E.coli and examining the DNA of the subsequent generations, they determined the extent to which the new DNA was a mix of old DNA strands or newly synthesized material. The result was a clear victory for semi-conservative replication, and the Meselson-Stahl experiment became known as the “most beautiful experiment in biology” (Meselson and Stahl 1958; Holmes 2001). Weber argues that we should understand the quick uptake of Meselson and Stahl’s experimental result as an instance of inference to the best explanation (as opposed to Duhem’s deductive characterization). Meselson and Stahl, Weber claims, took the physiological mechanism of DNA replication and then embedded it in an “experimental mechanism”; that experimental mechanism then generated the data pattern of heavy-vs-light DNA in subsequent E.coli generations. Moreover, any hypothesis of DNA replication had to satisfy mechanistic constraints imposed by what was already known about the physiological mechanism—that DNA was a double helix, and that the sequence of nucleotides in the DNA needed to be preserved in subsequent generations. So Duhem’s concern about unknown alternatives was alleviated because known mechanistic constraints limited the set of possible hypotheses that could generate the phenomenon. On Weber’s reading, the mechanistic constraints culled the set of possible hypotheses for DNA replication to semi-conservative replication, conservative replication, and dispersive replication; then, among that set, Meselson and Stahl devised an experimental mechanism such that semi-conservative replication was the best explanation of the data pattern they found. (For a critique, see Baetu 2017.)

4. Conclusion

An overview of the history of molecular biology revealed the original convergence of geneticists, physicists, and structural chemists on a common problem: the nature of inheritance. Conceptual and methodological frameworks from each of these disciplinary strands united in the ultimate determination of the double helical structure of DNA (conceived of as an informational molecule) along with the mechanisms of gene replication, mutation, and expression. With this recent history in mind, philosophers of molecular biology have examined the key concepts of the field: mechanism, information, and gene. Moreover, molecular biology has provided cases for addressing more general issues in the philosophy of science, such as reduction, explanation, extrapolation, and experimentation.


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