Theory and Bioethics

First published Wed Nov 25, 2020

The relation between bioethics and moral theory is a complicated one. To start, we have philosophers as major contributors to the field of bioethics, and to many philosophers, their discipline is almost by definition a theoretical one. So when asked to consider the role of moral theorizing in bioethics, a natural position of such philosophers is that moral theory has a crucial, if not indispensable, role. At the same time, there are those who call into question the “applied ethics” model of bioethics. Roughly, on this model, one moral theory or other (e.g., utilitarianism, Kantian deontology, virtue theory) is imposed upon the applied ethics problem at hand, in the hopes of producing a resolution. Such a model, according to its detractors, overplays the separation of the theoretical from the applied. Still further, there are those such as Will Kymlicka (1993 [1996]) who hold that moral theory should not have a place in the making of public policy on bioethical issues.[1]

This entry starts by addressing the complexities surrounding the very notions of bioethics and moral theory. From there, we explore the question of what doing applied ethics amounts to. Moving on, the discussion centers upon the main methodological movements in bioethics’ relatively short history: its appeal to high moral theory, the emergence of mid-level approaches to bioethics, and approaches to bioethics that attribute a lesser role to theoretical tools, or no role at all. Feminist approaches to bioethics are treated next, followed by a look at the significance of moral theory to clinical bioethics.

1. What is Moral Theory? What is Bioethics?

The question of the relation between moral theory and bioethics is made difficult by a number of factors, not the least of which is the absence of any one account of what constitutes philosophical theory. There are, of course, the standard moral theories of introduction to moral philosophy—consequentialism, deontology, and virtue ethics. And we also speak of mid-level theories, such as moral principlism and casuistry, though the extent to which such approaches are strictly speaking theoretical is somewhat unsettled. What do we mean by moral theory? What characterizes an approach to moral philosophy and bioethics as theoretical? Add to such questions the fact that bioethics itself is not a monolithic discipline, and our topic is complicated right from the start.

1.1 Varying Accounts of Moral Theory

On some accounts, a theoretical approach to a philosophical issue or problem is defined by intellectual tendencies toward some combination of generalization, universality, systemization, abstraction, explicitness, and the capability to generate recommendations. For instance, Martha Nussbaum holds that there are certain necessary and sufficient criteria for ethical theory (Nussbaum 2000: 234–236). On her view, ethical theory:

  • Gives recommendations about practical problems;
  • Shows how to test correctness of beliefs, rules, and principles;
  • Systematizes and extends beliefs;
  • Has some degree of abstractness and generality;
  • Is universalizable;
  • Is explicit.

Generalization, universality, and abstraction are also taken by others to be hallmarks of moral theory (Arras 1997: 74; 2003; Louden 1990). Even so, some philosophical approaches to moral and bioethical questions that do not satisfy all or even any of the criteria set out above are referred to as theories. For instance, moral particularism, which aspires neither to the formulation of generalizations nor to systemization [2] is sometimes referred to as a moral theory.[3] Further still, one might even hold that beyond the criteria listed above, moral theory employs a certain argumentative mode, with a certain tone and style (Louden 1992: 156; Nussbaum 2000: 239).

There is more one could say here on agreement and disagreement on what counts as theoretical within philosophy, including something about what might qualify as an anti-theoretical approach to morality and bioethics (Clarke 1987; Clarke & Simpson 1989; Fotion 2014; Louden 1990). But our main point for the moment is that what counts as moral theory is not perfectly clear, which complicates the question of the relation between moral theory and bioethics. We need not here stipulate one definition of what we shall count as a theoretical approach to bioethical problems moving forward. Suffice it to say that the question of the relation between theory and bioethics will be approached by canvassing various methodological approaches to treating problems and questions in bioethics.

1.2 The Pursuits of Bioethics

Turning now to what counts as bioethics, the label does not indicate a unitary pursuit, what with bioethics’ academic, policy-oriented, and clinical instantiations (McMillan 2018: 11–16; Battin 2013: 2). When it comes to bioethics as an academic or scholarly pursuit, the practical constraints of clinical decision making, and the timelines imposed by commissions, are non-existent, freeing the bioethicist of the need to reach closure on a decision or to resolve a complex issue. As it has been put, for the academic bioethicist and her students, it does not matter if you end the seminar more confused than when you started it. It is within this academic domain that the relationship between bioethics and moral theory will be most explicit, the role of moral theory most intently debated, and moral theory probably most welcome.

Looking at policy-oriented bioethics, here the bioethicist assists in the development of policies affecting large numbers of people on issues of bioethical relevance (such as the rationing of kidney dialysis services, or the availability of medical assistance in dying). There are challenges upfront with the bioethicist’s invoking moral theory of any sort in tackling policy challenges as a member of a national commission, say, or as a member of her regional health authority’s ethics committee, or as a member of any other sort of policy-oriented working group. For starters, there is the fact that she is likely to be in the vast minority as a group member with philosophical training. But that aside, there is the further challenge of the unlikelihood of agreement amongst working group members on which moral theory should rule the day or govern the decision at stake.[4] There is the third category of clinical ethics, a pursuit taking place as health care is practiced on the ground. As we will see in more detail shortly, the relevance of moral theory to clinical ethics turns heavily on the operative conception of clinical ethics. In particular, it relies upon our conception of the goals of the clinical ethics consultation (the main activity of clinical bioethics), and upon our conception of the role of the clinical ethics consultant.

What constitutes what we call applied ethics is just as fraught a question as the one of the relationship between theory and bioethics, and it implicates our take on that relationship. We now turn to that question.

2. What is the Nature of Applied Ethics?

We have briefly reviewed the variety of tasks and problems to which bioethics addresses itself. But we should also briefly examine the ways in which bioethics, and its broader cousin applied ethics, is and has been conceptualized. Such an examination is important within the context of this entry in that questions about the nature of applied ethics are often implicitly questions about the relation between the theoretical and the applied, or between “theory” and “practice”. The very term applied ethics suggests that the discipline involves an application of some sort or other moral theory to the practical problem or question at hand. Arthur Caplan writes that many contributors to the field of bioethics take applied ethics to involve the application of existing theories and principles to moral problem in medicine (Caplan 1980: 25–26). But what does it mean to apply an existing theory to a practical problem? How easily can the distinction between applied ethics and ethical theory be sustained? As it turns out, many say that the field of applied ethics cannot be what the name would lead us to suppose it is.

2.1 Problems with the “Applied Model” of Applied Ethics

Caplan argues that there are problems with such a model of applied ethics (which many call “the applied model”). To start, many moral problems arise within medicine for which moral theories have no answers. The applied model of applied ethics also presumes that those involved in the analysis and solution of a moral problem take it that the nature and description of the problem or quandary is not in dispute, where in reality it is often not clear exactly what is the moral issue at stake (Caplan 1980: 28; 1989; Agich 2001; and Magelssen, Pedersen, & Førde 2016). This model also implicitly involves a naïve suggestion, argues Caplan, namely that by dint of expertise in moral theory, the well-trained philosopher can almost immediately solve moral dilemmas in the intensive care unit or the emergency department (Caplan 1980: 27). Moreover, adherence to such a model of applied ethics forecloses the opportunity for medical ethics (or other fields of applied ethics) to inform theory construction, as the direction of influence on that model moves only from theory to the practical.

2.2 Applied Ethics and Disagreement on Theory

Further disruption of the application model came shortly afterwards from both Tom Beauchamp and Alasdair MacIntyre.[5] Beauchamp challenges the application model of applied ethics, defined largely as above: ethical theory develops general and fundamental principles, virtues, rules, and the like, and applied ethics treats particular contexts through less general, derived principles, virtues, and so on. In a 1984 issue of The Monist dedicated to “Ethics and the Modern World”, Beauchamp and MacIntyre each probe the relation between moral theory and applied ethics. Beauchamp argues for the elimination of the distinction between the two, citing the lack of significant difference between them in terms of philosophical activity or method. Philosophers doing applied ethics do what philosophers have always done, says Beauchamp—they analyze concepts, for instance, and submit to critical scrutiny various strategies that are used to justify beliefs, policies, and actions. The application model also problematically presumes a unilateral direction to the flow of ethical knowledge, from moral theory to practical cases and problems. But in fact, says Beauchamp, moral theory has much to learn from practical contexts (Beauchamp 1984).

2.3 Applied Ethics and Rule Application

MacIntyre tells us that applied ethics cannot be the sort of activity it is commonly supposed to be. He turns our attention to the complexities surrounding the notion of what it would mean to apply a moral rule. If applied ethics is in fact an application to cases of the rules of morality, we should expect to find that disagreements over moral rules reproduce themselves within debates on matters of practical ethics. But in a high proportion of cases these theoretical disagreements, of which there are plenty, are not in fact replicated. Large disagreement on what are the rules of morality turn out to be compatible with large agreement within the domain of applied ethics. Noting how common such situations are (situations in which clear disagreement exists on what are the rules of morality, while fairly easy agreement can be reached on concrete moral issues), MacIntyre holds that it cannot be the case that we first and independently comprehend the rules of morality and then secondly enquire as to their application under particular circumstances.

As MacIntyre has it, no rule exists apart from its application (and he admits that his argument entails the rejection of any conception of moral principles or rules as timeless and ahistorical). Often times, he suggests, it appears as though agreements among a group of decision makers is being reached through rational argumentation, but in fact often group members are reopening debates about perennial philosophical questions. This is particularly so in medical ethics, MacIntyre tells us. Our common conception of applied ethics does indeed rest on a mistake (MacIntyre 1984).

2.4 Toulmin on the Tyranny of Principles

Stephen Toulmin, in his well-known paper “The Tyranny of Principles”, recounts his experience on the National Commission for the Protection of Human Subjects of Biomedical and Behavioral Research (Toulmin 1981). Agreement amongst members of the commission was relatively easy to reach even on difficult cases, even in the face of thoroughgoing moral theoretical disagreement amongst members. His main point in the paper is not to directly address the nature of applied ethics, but to argue for a regaining of what he calls the “ethics of discretion”, calling into question the role of moral principles. En route, though, he undermines the application model of applied ethics, through his discussion of how much agreement on practical problems there can be among theorists of radically different stripes. According to Toulmin, this shows us that applied ethics is not a matter of applying a theory to a problem, in that there can be agreement on how to resolve a practical issue amongst those who strongly disagree on which moral theory ought to prevail. Again, we have an emphasis upon a lack of reproduction of theoretical disagreement in dealing with issues in practical ethics. One might question whether such agreement on particular cases paired with theoretical disagreement shows that the applied model ought to be abandoned. Nevertheless, Toulmin’s experience prompted him to wonder what final appeals to principles really achieved.

One final point for the moment on the disruption of the distinction between ethical theory and applied ethics: as will be discussed in more detail in section 4, many would say there recently has been widespread adoption of reflective equilibrium as the method of justification in bioethics (Arras 2007). One important implication of this adoption is a blurring of the distinction between moral theory and applied ethics, what with the fact that on reflective equilibrium, our responses to real cases inform our theorizing as much as our theories inform our handling of cases.

We have just seen reasons to think that we cannot neatly separate moral theory and applied ethics. Even so, moral theory in some form plays a crucial if not indispensable role in bioethics. We will now look at the relevance of high theory.

3. Bioethics and High Moral Theory

As the discipline we now call bioethics emerged in the early 1970s, moral philosophers and political theorists were primed to contribute to debates on any number of practical issues in areas such as law, economics, the environment, business, research on human beings, and medical practice. These academics were understandably hopeful both that their knowledge of moral theory would prepare them to apply their theoretical understanding to real-world problems, and that their skills in critical analysis would be appreciated. Even today, such confidence in the usefulness of moral theory to the solving of practical problems is manifest in the introductions to bioethics textbooks, many of which include discussions of at least the basics of consequentialism, virtue theory, deontology, and so on.

3.1 The Attractions of High Theory

The attractions of high theory were, and are, significant, and indeed, such moral theories have provided the groundwork for many an approach to bioethical issues. Examples here include Alan Donagan’s Kantian-inspired work on informed consent (Donagan 1977), Tristram Engelhardt’s libertarian critique of redistribution in health care (Engelhardt 1986 [1996]), and Joseph Fletcher’s utilitarian approach to a broad range of issues in bioethics (Fletcher 1974).

What might explain such recourse to high moral theory? What are the attractions of high moral theory for the bioethicist? Let us consider three important possibilities. First, in bioethics as in everyday life, our routine moral coping skills work often enough. When they do not, though, we need recourse to more structured and systematic moral guidance. On these occasions, high moral theory, such as consequentialism and deontology, looks helpful and attractive. Besides offering guidance, such theory provides the resources for moral justification, especially helpful when we are pressed to explain our bioethical or everyday moral decisions. Second, when we appeal to mid-level principles (such as the principle of justice or the principle of beneficence), we sometimes need help in weighing, balancing, and adjudicating between those principles. High moral theory could well provide such help, by providing a form of moral standard. Recall Sidgwick’s argument in support of utilitarianism, that it could provide guidance in resolving conflicts among ordinary duties that everyday (non-theoretical) moral thinking cannot resolve on its own (Sidgwick 1874). In a similar vein, Martha Nussbaum defends the need for moral theory in part by emphasizing what she takes to be its power in helping us weigh various rules against each other in varying circumstances through its setting of a normative standard (Nussbaum 2000). Third, high moral theory can help us achieve consistency in our moral lives, as well as a systematic perspective. There is benefit, the thought goes, to bringing moral theory to bear upon various facets of our ordinary and bioethical lives, because of the systematicity and coherence it can provide. Bernard Gert is one for whom such systematization, at least within bioethics, takes priority (Gert, Culver, & Clauser 2006).

3.2 Problems with Bioethics Conceived as An Appeal to High Moral Theory

The days of bioethics conceived of as high theory were short lived, however, and the reasons plentiful. For starters, there is the question of which moral theory should prevail. Even if one has no problem choosing a moral theory in the first place, one is bound to have difficulty in successfully defending that choice of theory against its alternatives (Magelssen, Pedersen, & Førde 2016: 27). The intractability of the debates between utilitarians and deontologists, say, should give anyone pause when staking out her positions on bioethical matters with the guidance of her preferred moral theory. This is one thing for the academic bioethicist. But it is quite another for the clinical ethicist (for instance) to attempt to settle the moral matter at hand through recourse to (say) Kant’s categorical imperative. Not only is she likely to be surrounded by non-philosophers (where recourse to the intricacies of such high flying moral theory is liable to fall flat), but we must ask why the public to whom she might be accountable should be subject to her preference for Kantianism. The same would hold true for the bioethicist working in the public policy arena.

Second, that challenge aside, there are disagreements within the ranks of any given theory. Consider rule versus act utilitarianism, for instance, or disagreement amongst Rawlsians. Third, some cite tensions between some versions of high theory and democracy. Publicity, many hold, ought to be a fundamental norm governing policy making in a democratic society (Rawls 1971). Requiring such publicity would preclude justifications that no one outside an elite class of philosophers can understand. One need not be a theory sceptic, then, in order to demote the place of high theory within bioethics; one need only recognize the tension between doing bioethics in a democracy, and rarefied moral theory (Bertram 1997; London 2001).

Fourth, and this is focused on the usefulness or lack thereof of high moral theory within the clinical ethics context, using theories in the prescribed way may be very demanding for the clinical ethicist without high level philosophical training. Furthermore, the comprehensiveness of the justifications promised by high moral theory may be unnecessary within that context (Magelssen,, Pedersen, & Førde 2016: 27). Fifth, and reminiscent of Caplan’s problems with the applied model of applied ethics earlier discussed, it is doubtful that any high-level philosophical theory can generate straightforward answers to complicated applied problems. Norman Daniels, whose work on justice and access to health care was inspired by Rawls’ theory of justice, came to admit that philosophical theory is insufficiently fine-grained for actual policy making, and that it needs to be complemented by justly structured political deliberation (Daniels 1996: 144–175; 2007: ch. 4). The general thought here is that high philosophical theory is ill-equipped to deal with practical decision making on the concrete level (Gutmann & Thompson 1998). After all, one’s preferred moral theory could well, for instance, endorse several possible policy options, leaving decision makers wanting for further guidance.

In sum, bioethics as conceived of as an appeal to high moral theory has been found to have significant limitations, despite its initial promise. We now to what appears to be a more promising approach.

4. The Move to Mid-Level Theorizing: a Principles-Centered Approach

The move to what is often referred to as mid-level theorizing was (partly) a result of the challenges with high theory just discussed, and manifested most prominently by the 1979 publication of Tom Beauchamp and James Childress’ influential Principles of Biomedical Ethics (PBE). The approach set out in that book, and its revised versions appearing in the book’s subsequent editions, feature mid-level moral norms, which take the form of four moral principles.[6] Beauchamp and Childress’ four principles are:

  1. the principle of autonomy (the value of self-direction regarding one’s life and choices),
  2. the principle of beneficence (the value of enhancing the welfare of others),
  3. the principle of nonmaleficence (the value of avoiding imposing harm on others), and
  4. the principle of justice (the value of according each person her due) (Beauchamp & Childress 2019a; Arras 2017: 5).

Coming on the heels of Joseph Fletcher and Paul Ramsey’s early work in what we now call bioethics—both Fletcher and Ramsey were moral theologians, whose work, while very different from one another’s, was based on Christian moral theology—Beauchamp and Childress offered the promise of a moral framework that could appeal to a pluralist and secular society.[7] Beauchamp and Childress have different theoretical starting points, with Beauchamp describing himself as a rule-utilitarian, and Childress a Christian deontologist (Arras 2017: 3; Beauchamp & Childress 1979: 40: 2019b: 9). This underlines the approach as one that refrains from promoting a single theory over all others, and as one that requires no underlying theoretical or metaphysical commitments for its uptake.

4.1 A Move Away from Deduction, and Reflective Equilibrium

Beauchamp and Childress’ approach has evolved since the book’s first edition, and one important aspect of this evolution is the move away from deductive reasoning, or (in other words) away from a “top down” application of principles to cases. Their initial take on the relation between moral theory, principles and cases was that

theory justified principles, that principles justified moral rules, and that rules justified moral judgments in particular cases. (Arras 2017: 11)

This, at least, was the impression given by a diagram appearing in the first edition of the book (Beauchamp & Childress 1979: 5), which many took to endorse such a top down model. The approach was met with resistance, with those in favor of case-based reasoning (also known as casuistry) objecting to what at least appeared to be a unidirectional movement from principles to cases. Intuitive, case-based judgments seemed to be left out of the picture, and the possibility of a dialectical relationship between principles and our responses to cases ignored. In fact, and as a result of an evolution of their approach, Beauchamp and Childress now fully ascribe to this position on the reciprocal relationship between our responses to cases and moral principles. This is evidenced by their current commitment to reflective equilibrium as the methodology of bioethics. Briefly, reflective equilibrium is a process by which our considered responses to actual cases influence our moral principles, and those improved-upon principles then provide enhanced guidance for our response to further cases. This is a way of doing moral philosophy originally formulated by Rawls (Rawls 1971: 48–51; Daniels 1979; Arras 2007: 47). Cases and principles work in tandem, then, as opposed to moral principles being applied deductively to cases. A distinction is made between narrow and wide reflective equilibrium. Narrow reflective equilibrium involves interplay between our responses (or intuitions) about cases and the moral principles used to structure such intuitions, as explained above, where wide reflective equilibrium brings in additional moral and social theories. Beauchamp and Childress endorse wide reflective equilibrium (Arras 2017: 182).

That Beauchamp and Childress take (wide) reflective equilibrium to be such a crucial component of their approach is an important aspect of their approach as it currently stands. As their view has evolved over subsequent editions of PBE, reflective equilibrium has grown to have a more and more prominent role. An important result of this embrace of reflective equilibrium is that, paired with Beauchamp and Childress’ appeal to the common morality, we have a hybrid approach to justification, hybrid in the sense of embracing both coherentism and foundationalism. Reflective equilibrium is the source of coherentism, with the appeal to the common morality meant to provide a foundation. Before moving on to a closer look at the notion of the common morality, we should note that this hybrid approach differs from accounts of reflective equilibrium we might find in political theory, for example, and in other areas of practical ethics. Those more standard accounts involve achieving moral justification by bringing the various elements of our moral reflection into contact with one another, with none of these elements regarded as foundational and all of them regarded as open to revision. By contrast, Beauchamp and Childress accord foundational status to the common morality, and it is the common morality that underwrites their four principles.

4.2 The Common Morality

Since the third edition of PBE, the source of the four principles has been not high theory but the common morality. For Beauchamp and Childress, the common morality is what they take to be a universal morality, one to which all morally serious persons are committed (Beauchamp & Childress 2019b). The content of the common morality is dictated by the primary objectives of morality, which include, for example, the amelioration of human misery. It encompasses certain rules of obligation (tell the truth, keep promises), and endorses certain standards of moral character, such as honesty and integrity (Arras 2017: 21–3).

Importantly, this common morality is historicist, in that its authority is established historically, through the success of its related norms in advancing human flourishing across time and place. However, unlike many historicist accounts, the common morality is not relativist, as its norms are to be applied universally. Beauchamp and Childress accord the common morality a special place within their approach, a place shielded from the jostling involved in the quest for coherence through wide reflective equilibrium. The common morality is thus the foundationalist aspect of their account. Moral conclusions, then, are justified through both coherence (via the method of reflective equilibrium), and through foundationalism, being connected to the principles of the common morality (Arras 2017: 23; Beauchamp & Childress 2019b: 11).

4.3 Criticisms of the Principles-Centered Approach

There is a pluralistic element to Beauchamp and Childress’ approach, which is manifested, in part, by the fact that the approach avoids a single overarching principle in favor of the short list of four moral principles. This has lead some to criticize Beauchamp and Childress’ approach for an alleged lack of systematicity—a fatal flaw, according to some, in any philosophical theory (Gert, Culver, & Clauser 2006). Such critics claim that without a clear prioritizing of principles, Beauchamp and Childress’ principles-centered approach lacks rigor and leaves too much room for intuitive judgments in cases where principles conflict. Beauchamp and Childress respond, first, by rejecting the very idea that they are offering a philosophical theory, rather than a framework or practical guide. But perhaps more importantly, they doubt that any priority ranking of their principles would stand the test of time (Arras 2017: 6–9).

A fairly recent criticism comes from John McMillan, according to whom Beauchamp and Childress’ approach stifles careful reflection about real issues. McMillan claims that principle-centered methods cannot lead to the formulation of what he calls “reasoned convictions about moral problems”, and writes that the four principles approach hinders bringing moral reason to bear upon practical questions. This is because, as McMillan has it, newcomers to bioethics will subsume whatever issues are under consideration under one of the four principles, and then rule that the principle of autonomy should trump the other three principles. While recognizing that such a method is not what Beauchamp and Childress intended, McMillan writes that it is in fact the way the four principles approach is typically employed (McMillan 2018: 51–53).

Two interesting criticisms of Beauchamp and Childress’ latest moves come from the late John Arras. Arras questions the plausibility of Beauchamp and Childress’ hybrid account, specifically the account’s reliance upon the common morality as a foundation. Arras asks why Beauchamp and Childress distinguish the norms of the common morality from (what John Rawls called) our considered moral judgments, which are themselves revisable. Arras recognizes that Beauchamp and Childress might motivate their appeal to a foundation on the ground that coherence alone cannot secure moral truth. In that case, though, Arras wonders how much additional justificatory advantage is leveraged by appealing to the foundational common morality, as reflective equilibrium itself is maximally inclusive of all pieces of the moral picture (including, presumably, the common morality’s norms). The problem, as Arras has it, is the conception of the common morality as being in its own moral sphere, removed from reflective equilibrium’s dialectic. Arras is skeptical that the common morality is in fact untouched by the vicissitudes of time and the dialectics of reflective equilibrium (Arras 2017: 24–26).

A second criticism from Arras deals with Beauchamp and Childress’ embrace of wide reflective equilibrium. According to Arras, it is difficult to comprehend how moral principles can retain their priority in conceptual analysis in the face of this endorsement of wide reflective equilibrium (Arras 2017: 182–3). Arras asks us to recall that within wide reflective equilibrium, no single cluster of moral considerations (e.g., considered case judgments, background theories, moral principles) is privileged. What matters in reflective equilibrium’s revising process, in fact, is our level of commitment to those considerations, rather than the form of the commitments themselves (Scanlon 1992; DePaul 1993: 57). Thus, our beliefs about principles, just like our beliefs in background theories and considered case judgments, are always subject to revision. The principles-centered approach seems to have sacrificed its methodological distinctiveness, so Arras’ criticism goes, given how principles appear to have been robbed of their conceptual priority.

Finally, Beauchamp and Childress themselves recently acknowledge two misunderstandings of their four principles framework. The first misunderstanding is that the framework represents American individualism, with the principle of autonomy taking priority. Their response is, first, to contest any connection between American individualism and a respect for autonomy. Further, they emphasize that their framework’s principles are all only prima facie binding. The second misunderstanding is that the framework downplays the virtues. It has been argued that medical ethics should be underwritten by virtue-based ethics rather than by principle-based ethics, and that that approach has a better chance of restoring humanity to health care (de Zulueta 2015). Here, Beauchamp and Childress point to various discussions of virtue theory and moral character appearing in various editions of PBE, including a discussion in the eighth edition of how virtues and principles might work together in certain practical scenarios (Beauchamp & Childress 2019b: 11).

5. Other Methods of Bioethics

5.1 Casuistry

There are other approaches to bioethics that embody alternatives to high theory. The first, casuistry, can in some sense be understood as a critical response to early versions of Beauchamp and Childress’ four principles approach. Recall a certain response to at least early versions of Beauchamp and Childress’ approach, namely that that approach was too abstract and that its alleged deductivism was objectionable. Advocates of casuistry, or case-based reasoning, objected to what they at least took to be the unidirectional “downward” movement from principles to cases (Arras 2017: 11). Instead, they argued for a more “bottom up” approach, which would see actual cases, rather than any one moral theory, as the starting point, and would conceive of moral principles as in fact emerging from our consideration of cases.

We often speak of casuistry full-stop, and when we do we generally have in mind an approach to ethics that emphasizes analogical reasoning with concrete actual cases (the one before us, and relevantly similar past cases). When one encounters a case, one harkens back to a relevantly similar case from the past, recalls how one responded in that case, and “applies” that reasoning to the case before one. We should, however, recognize the distinction between two versions of the approach. To start, there is casuistry understood simply as the practice of addressing particular cases, treating them through the application of (abstract) principles. Understood as such, casuistry would seem to be rightly viewed as a logical complement to approaches to bioethics that take moral principles to be morally binding (Arras 2017: 46). Casuists here hold that principles can have an action-guiding or normative force that is not reducible to our responses to cases, and that the moral knowledge represented by such principles is not reducible to responses to cases (Jonsen 1995). Note that when defined in this way, differences between this moderate version of casuistry and a more traditional top-down application of moral principles to cases might be difficult to pinpoint.

A more radical interpretation of casuistry, though, has a different story to tell about the derivation of moral principles. Where on the moderate version we approach cases with our moral principles already established, on this more radical version, principles develop through our analysis of actual cases (Arras 2017: 47). So the two different versions adopt different pictures of the source of our moral knowledge. On the radical version, it is at the level of the concrete case, rather than at the level of theory, where we find the greatest confidence in our moral judgments. The claim here is that moral principles are, at base, merely formalizations of our intuitive responses to cases, without independent normative force (Toulmin 1981).

5.1.1 Advantages of casuistry

According to its proponents, casuistry as an approach to bioethics has specific advantages. One is its potential to offer chances of reaching agreement amongst those of different theoretical commitments, rendering it particularly well-suited for decision making in a pluralistic society (Sunstein 1996). Turning to the more applied medical context, casuistry is well-suited to use by health care workers, whose orientation is already case-focused, and whose time for and interest in moral theory is likely quite limited. When it comes to teaching bioethics, casuistry would call for the use of richly detailed case studies, which many whose teaching responsibilities include teaching those in health care would count as a strength (Arras 2017: 55–57).

5.1.2 Criticisms of casuistry

Despite these sorts of advantages, casuistry has been met with criticism. One is that the approach seems to assume a straightforwardness when it comes to deciding what counts as a case. However, as some would have it, deciding what counts as a case (or not) might well be underwritten by the bioethicist’s picture of the sorts of problems worthy (or unworthy) of appearance on the moral agenda (O’Neill 1988). It has been argued that that agenda is overly narrow and sculpted by the interests of, for example, the medical profession, and a male outlook (Carse 1991). A related but distinct point concerns what counts as an adequate description of the issues at play in a case. Casuistry, to its detriment, seems silent on this matter. Some argue that a strike against the radical version of casuistry is its recourse to analogical reasoning. Such recourse, so the thought goes, fails to properly recognize that such reasoning is not self-standing. Analogical reasoning would seem to need pre-established principles to give it direction, and radical casuistry rejects such principles. Moderate casuistry, which does use principles or generalizations to provide some structure in identifying what is morally relevant to a case and across cases (Jonsen 1995) would not be subject to this criticism.

Another concern is that given its disregard for theoretically-derived principles, radical casuistry may amount to no more than a refinement of our intuitive responses to cases. It might be thought to be morally conservative, ill-equipped for social critique, with the casuist as mere expositor of pre-ordained moral norms (Arras 2017: 60–67). Finally, the approach seems to require pre-established agreement on fundamental values in order to reach conclusions, agreement that may well be lacking in pluralistic modern society.

5.2 Narrative Ethics

A further alternative approach to ethics in general and bioethics in particular is narrative ethics. According to many commentators, it emerged in response to a so-called “theory-driven” approach to bioethics, an approach that prioritizes the Enlightenment ideas of objectivity and universality (Arras 1997: 65). Put differently, narrative ethics emerged as a response to an impartialist ethics, one working on the assumption that ethics is mainly a matter of “right conduct among strangers”. According to Hilde Lindemann Nelson, two proposals on which narrative approaches to ethics are based are that moral principles are not lawlike but are modifiable in light of context (presumably by being made more specific, or by being treated as defeasible), and that the particulars of a situation “either naturally take a narrative form, or must be given a narrative structure if they are to have moral meaning” (Lindemann Nelson 1997a: viii–ix).

Though some will say narrative ethics is somewhat difficult to pin down as a method, we can think of it as an approach to ethics that emphasizes storytelling, the importance of the voice and perspective of the storyteller and/or patient, and a literary sensibility on the bioethicist’s part. Possibilities have been proposed as to what a narrative approach to ethics might look like, suggestions as to the sorts of activities in which we might engage when we adopt a narrative approach to bioethics. These include i) simply reading stories (which sharpens one’s moral sensibilities) (Nussbaum, 1992, 1995), ii) telling stories (which is a way of making moral sense of an experience), iii) comparing stories (which brings to mind the work of the casuists), iv) conducting literary analysis in some form or other, and v) invoking stories (which we do when we introduce bioethics case studies) (Lindemann Nelson 1997a: x–xii).

Accounts vary of how narrative ethics actually functions as a tool of ethical analysis. A first option is that a narrative approach acts as a supplement to moral principles rather than as a replacement of them. On this version of narrative ethics, we are looking at a way of doing bioethics that requires sensitive attention to so-called “narrative elements” of human experience, such as stories told by patients, caregivers, and family members. There is no thought of doing away with a bioethics driven by theories and principles, just a call to use those tools with a sensitive appreciation of the first-person accounts of others (Charon 1994). Another way of thinking about narrative as a supplement to principles is to consider the way in which principles and cases share a dialectical relationship within the context of reflective equilibrium. Here, the cases in response to which we develop considered judgments are themselves narratives. So again, this conception is accommodating of moral theory, as moral theorizing and stories are mutually interdependent.

A second option has a narrative approach emphasizing the importance to ethics of history and culture over a more universalist rationality. This version of narrative ethics is sometimes known as historical narrative. Here, right action is endorsed by appeal to the traditions, norms, and traditional stories of a particular social group. Recourse is also made to one’s social role, and the foundational narrative underlying that role (think of the physician’s social role in Western culture as shaped by the Hippocratic Oath) (MacIntyre 1981; Burrell & Hauerwas, 1977).

A third option sees a narrative approach acting as a total substitute for the process of moral justification (Arras 1997: 67– 78), and as a replacement of theory-driven or principle-centered bioethics. On this option, which some associate with postmodernism, the emphasis is upon continual conversation between traditions and narratives. No one view (tradition or narrative) can be justified over others through reference to a theory of human nature, of history, and so on. The ultimate goal here then is not the pursuit of justification for one’s view, but the keeping open of the “moral space” for continuing conversation between rival views (Rorty 1989). A related aspect of this option is the claim that those who suffer should tell their own story, without risk of being dominated and objectified by the case summaries typical of modern medicine (Frank 1995). While quite specific in their vision of how narrative ethics might supplement or replace a more standardly theory-driven or principles-centered approach to bioethics, none of these versions seem to identify a unique framework for moral reasoning (in the way that, for example, utilitarianism or deontology do).

5.2.1 Criticisms of Narrative Ethics

Questions have been raised about the viability of a narrative approach. A general concern is that how an emphasis on narrative relates to ethics in general. There is also question about how a narrative approach reaches conclusions about what we are supposed to do.

Insofar as two central tasks of bioethics are to pass judgments on actions, policies, and character, and to morally justify actions, decisions, and policies (or to show that justification is not possible), it is not clear how narrative ethics can satisfy the aims of bioethics, or so the concern goes. What is the relationship between narrative and moral justification? What is the connection between telling a story, say, and the moral decency of a particular action, policy, or character?

More specific concerns about the approach track the version of narrative ethics under consideration. For instance, on the historical narrative picture (the second option above), some argue there is the risk of falling back into either a version of ethics at least somewhat guided by principles, or finding oneself having to sort through incommensurable narratives with nothing to decide between them. A worry about the third option (the version on which narrative acts as a substitute for moral justification) is the threat of an objectionable subjectivism, brought on by the possibility of mistaking the narrator’s story for ethical truth. A related criticism is that this version of narrative ethics seems to prioritize individual coherence over the passing of moral judgment. Some stories, so the thought goes, may well be internally coherent, while at the same time being morally questionable (Arras 1997: 81–83).

6. Feminist Theory and Bioethics

Another distinctive approach to bioethics employs the insights of feminist ethics. Feminist approaches to bioethics offer a framework for approaching bioethics at least in the sense of developing and adhering to a certain set of theoretical commitments. Some of those commitments address forms of moral reasoning, some address substantive commitments about how to bring about a more just social order, and some address questions about which perspective should take priority in the analysis of a bioethical issue. Some contend that bioethics has largely ignored work in feminist ethics more broadly, making it all the more crucial that a feminist approach to bioethics act as a corrective to various trends (such as an inattentiveness to social context, and an emphasis on liberal individualism) (Wolf 1996a). Suggestions abound as to how a feminist approach can, and in fact does, do that.

To start, a feminist approach can pay special attention to the experiences of women. Further, it can subject to critical scrutiny the employment of the concept of a common morality, a concept which allegedly entrenches bioethics as a conversation amongst experts. Bioethics as such a conversation excludes alternative viewpoints, including the viewpoints of laypeople, and of those on the margins. A feminist approach might invoke standpoint theory, which would draw upon the insights of the most disadvantaged in society. Finally, a feminist theoretical approach could demand attention to lived experience, turning the emphasis away from the abstract theorizing of non-feminist moral philosophy and bioethics (Wolf 1996a).

Two further benefits of a feminist approach to bioethics have been set out, apart from how it might directly correct for the effects of a masculinist moral philosophy and bioethics. First, a feminist approach both attunes us to the effects of androcentric reasoning in the analysis of bioethical issues, and mitigates those effects. Second, it draws our attention to the gendered nature of many concepts key to bioethical analysis. For instance, in looking at the concepts of reason and emotion, a feminist approach helps us to see that the concepts themselves seem partly to be gendered concepts. Reason is, or at least traditionally has been, associated with the male, and emotion with the female. The same holds true with the distinction between the public and private spheres, with the public domain belonging to men, the private the women’s realm. But what’s more, we see that that which is associated with woman (emotion, for example) tends to be undervalued. As Margaret Little lays it out, traditional moral epistemology takes reason, and not emotion, to be critical to moral understanding. It is also important to notice the dualistic nature of the picture presented above. Just as men and women have traditionally occupied different spheres, so too have gendered concepts occupied fixed places on either side of a divide. The domestic sphere, for instance, is taken to have nothing instructive to offer the world of economic or political relations, or bioethics (Little 1996).

We can see these sorts of commitments played out in Susan Sherwin’s approach to the abortion question. According to her, a recognition of gender and sexual politics, and of women’s vulnerability in general and to sexual coercion in particular, are on her view crucial aspects of a feminist approach. Further, a feminist approach takes as central the moral prerogative of the women concerned, rather than focusing on such questions as fetal moral status, or on the task of formulating a set of general rules as to when abortion is or is not morally justified. In keeping with this, a feminist approach denies the possibility of a gender-neutral account of pregnancy, or of abortion decisions. From a feminist perspective, the most morally salient feature of pregnancy

is that it takes place in women’s bodies and has profound effects on women’s lives (Sherwin 1992: 363).

When we look at feminist treatments of physician-assisted dying (PAS), we again see certain kinds of theoretical commitments come to the fore. For instance, an adherence to the feminist care perspective leads Leslie Bender to support PAS (Bender 1992). By contrast, Susan M. Wolf’s application of a feminist approach as manifest by an emphasis upon the significance of gender leads her to conclude that PAS should not be legitimized. Pointing to the insidiousness of certain familiar images—images of feminine self-sacrifice, for instance—as well as to early prominent cases of physician-assisted dying and euthanasia in which the physician was male, the patient female, Wolf warns us of the dangers of the dynamic between the “powerful expert physician and the woman surrendering to his care” (Wolf 1996b: 293).

In thinking about feminist approaches to bioethics in connection to the relation between theory and bioethics, it is not a uniform approach, seeing as its proponents will not always adhere to the same set of commitments. (For example, in her work referenced above Bender adheres to a care-oriented thinking, where other feminist bioethicists will be more representative of liberal feminism.) A feminist approach is theoretical at least in its adherence to certain (feminist intellectual) commitments, even if there is not agreement across the board as to what those should be. Overall, feminist approaches to bioethics have made a significant impact and have changed the course of the conversation in bioethics, even if those approaches are somewhat varied and represent a theoretical approach to bioethics in less strictly defined a way than other approaches might. The preceding discussion focuses upon scholarly contributions; feminist scholars have also addressed clinical ethics (Sherwin & Baylis 2003). It is to the clinical realm, and moral theory’s role there, that we now turn.

7. Moral Theory and Clinical Bioethics

There are two main areas of discussion within clinical ethics that relate to the relevance of moral theory to clinical bioethics. The first concerns what is the appropriate model for clinical ethics consultation. This has implicit consequences for the role of moral theory. The second directly examines whether clinical ethics consultations should rely upon moral theory.

7.1 Models of Clinical Ethics Consultation

The American Society for Bioethics and Humanities (ASBH) sets out three possible models of clinical ethics consultation, endorsing one of them. Each model implicitly involves a picture of the role, or lack thereof, of moral theory. On the pure consensus model, the sole goal of ethics consultation is to forge agreement among those involved in the consult (ASBH 2011: 7). It would seem that there is no role for moral theory on this approach to clinical consultation, as mediation is the sole objective, with no eye held toward whether the consensus reached is morally justified through appeal to moral norms, accepted values, or moral theory. This model is generally taken to involve too weak a picture of the aims of clinical ethics consultation, and too minimal a picture of the clinical ethicist’s expertise and role. On the second model, the authoritarian model, the clinical ethicist is, by contrast, the primary moral decision maker. This model is generally taken to involve an overblown picture of the clinical ethicist’s authority and abilities, and of the infallibility of her perspective. The major downfall of this model, according to the ASBH, is that the clinical ethicist disregards the decision-making authority of others, such as a patient’s family and the health care team. Here again, moral theory has no explicit role, though it does seem possible and even likely that the clinical ethicist, in making her unilateral decision, invokes some moral theory or other in doing so.

The third model, the ethics facilitation approach, is the approach endorsed by the ASBH, and there is general consensus in the field that this is the best model for clinical ethics consultation. Here, the consultant helps to make clear the moral issues at play, aids in communication, integrates the viewpoints of relevant stakeholders (ASBH 2011: 7). Importantly for the current discussion, this approach involves two main parts: identifying and analyzing of what is the moral issue at stake, and facilitating of a principled ethical resolution. This second task is of particular interest to us here, because one would think that the building of such a resolution would involve looking to moral theory of some type or other, in addition to simply consulting the ethics literature. How else will one adjudicate whether the resolution falls within clearly accepted ethical principles? After all, the clinical ethicist is tasked not only with facilitating a resolution, but with suggesting a range of ethically acceptable options and providing a rationale for each option. In specifying an acceptable range of possible options, an ethics consultant will draw on a knowledge of relevant institutional policies, laws, the scholarly literature, and presumably also of moral theory.

7.2 Clinical Ethics and Moral Theory

Turning to the second area of discussion, we have a more explicit look at the role of moral theory in clinical ethics consultation. Four important roles for moral theory in clinical ethics consultation have been suggested:

  1. aiding in the initial awareness and identification of the moral challenges;
  2. assisting in the analysis of moral challenges;
  3. contributing to a sound process and dialogue;
  4. inspiring an attitude of reflexivity and interpretation (Magelssen, Pedersen, & Førde 2016, 27–31).

The advantages of a clinical ethicist’s being familiar with moral theory have also been discussed. There is some advantage not just in using a moral theory to help one analyze and formulate arguments, but also in considering the variety of perspectives and questions made perspicuous by various ethical theories, and the issues they illuminate. As well, when it comes to the consistency of a clinical ethicist’s own argumentation, familiarity with moral theory will help clinical ethicists spot weaknesses in their own arguments or in those of others.

However, matters are not quite so simple. To start, it is possible for those with no training in moral philosophy to have a solid handle on the moral dilemma with which they are dealing. And at the same time, some say, having a philosopher, one who is an expert in moral theory, as a clinical ethicist does not guarantee that the ethics consult will be of high quality. Knowledge of moral theory within the clinical ethics realm is not always clearly helpful, and its possible benefits are not without accompanying drawbacks. First, if used too strictly, and adhered to too inflexibly, moral theories can hamper moral imagination and intuition, and obscure access to the insights of, for example, common morality. Second, those in command of a wide range of moral theories might be tempted to draw upon the moral theory that actually justifies a course of action already preferred or even settled upon, rather than use what is deemed in advance to be the best moral theory to work through what is the justifiable course of action (or what are the best action options). Third, moral theories can mislead, by, for instance, being used to frame cases in ways that emphasize irrelevancies. And fourth, without quite advanced knowledge and skill, ethical theories may easily be misunderstood and used improperly. An example here would be taking Kantian moral theory to mandate no person ever being treated as a means (Magelssen, Pedersen, & Førde 2016). The message here is that knowledge of moral theory can sometimes actually be an impediment to good clinical ethics.

Overall, moral theory has a role to play in clinical ethics, at least if we accept the goals of ethics consultation as assumed by the generally accepted model of ethics consultation. The more explicit conversation in this area recognizes the advantages the use of moral theory offers clinical ethics and the consultation process. However, the discussion in the literature also cautions against a wholesale endorsement of the notion that those working in clinical ethics are always better for having an in-depth knowledge of moral theory.

8. Conclusion

What is the relation between moral theory and bioethics? There is no straightforward answer to this question. So much depends upon whether we consider bioethics in its academic, clinical, or policy-oriented instantiations. And further, there is wide variance in what we have in mind when we talk about moral theory. Besides this, the very distinction between moral theory, on the hand, and the problems and issues to be addressed in the practical realm, on the other, has been called into serious question. Still and all, it is difficult to imagine bioethics (in any form) in the total absence of moral theory. Especially if modestly conceived as a set of substantive organizing assumptions about morality, and a commitment to a certain approach to moral reasoning, it is difficult to view moral theory as anything other than indispensable to bioethics.


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Other Internet Resources

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