Feminist Ethics

First published Mon May 27, 2019

Feminist Ethics aims “to understand, criticize, and correct” how gender operates within our moral beliefs and practices (Lindemann 2005, 11) and our methodological approaches to ethical theory. More specifically, feminist ethicists aim to understand, criticize, and correct: (1) the binary view of gender, (2) the privilege historically available to men, and/or (3) the ways that views about gender maintain oppressive social orders or practices that harm others, especially girls and women who historically have been subordinated, along gendered dimensions including sexuality and gender-identity. Since oppression often involves ignoring the perspectives of the marginalized, different approaches to feminist ethics have in common a commitment to better understand the experiences of persons oppressed in gendered ways. That commitment results in a tendency, in feminist ethics, to take into account empirical information and material actualities.

Not all feminist ethicists correct all of (1) through (3). Some have assumed or upheld the gender binary (Wollstonecraft 1792; Firestone 1970). They criticize and aim to correct the privileging of men as the more morally worthy half of the binary, or argue against the maintenance of a social order that oppresses others in gendered ways. More recently, feminist ethicists have commonly criticized the gender binary itself, arguing that upholding a fixed conception of the world as constituted only by “biological” men and women contributes to the maintenance of oppressive and gendered social orders, especially when doing so marginalizes those who do not conform to gender binaries (Butler 1990; Bettcher 2014; Dea 2016a). Feminist ethicists who are attentive to the intersections of multiple aspects of identity including race, class, and disability, in addition to gender, criticize and correct assumptions that men simpliciter are historically privileged, as if privilege distributes equally among all men regardless of how they are socially situated. They instead focus more on criticizing and correcting oppressive practices that harm and marginalize others who live at these intersections in order to account for the distinctive experiences of women whose experiences are not those of members of culturally dominant groups (Crenshaw 1991; Khader 2013). Whatever the focus of feminist ethicists, a widely shared characteristic of their works is at least some overt attention to power, privilege, or limited access to social goods. In a broad sense, then, feminist ethics is fundamentally political (Tong 1993, 160). This is not necessarily a feature of feminist ethics that distinguishes it from “mainstream” ethics, however, since feminist analyses of ethical theory as arising from material and nonideal contexts suggest that all ethics is political whether its being so is recognized by the theorist or not.

Since feminist ethics is not merely a branch of ethics, but is instead “a way of doing ethics” (Lindemann 2005, 4), philosophers engaged in the above tasks can be concerned with any branch of ethics, including meta-ethics, normative theory, and practical or applied ethics. The point of feminist ethics is, ideally, to change ethics for the better by improving ethical theorizing and offering better approaches to issues including those involving gender. Feminist ethics is not limited to gendered issues because the insights of feminist ethics are often applicable to analyses of moral experiences that share features with gendered issues or that reflect the intersection of gender with other bases of oppression. Feminist philosophical endeavors include bringing investigations motivated by feminist ethics to bear on ethical issues, broadly conceived.

1. Feminist Ethics: Historical Background

Feminist ethics as an academic area of study in the field of philosophy dates to the 1970s, when philosophical journals started more frequently publishing articles specifically concerned with feminism and sexism (Korsmeyer 1973; Rosenthal 1973; Jaggar 1974), and after curricular programs of Women’s Studies began to be established in some universities (Young 1977; Tuana 2011). Readers interested in themes evident in the fifty years of feminist ethics in philosophy will find this discussion in section (2) below, “Themes in Feminist Ethics.”

Prior to 1970, “there was no recognized body of feminist philosophy” (Card 2008, 90). Of course, throughout history, philosophers have attempted to understand the roles that gender may play in moral life. Yet such philosophers presumably were addressing male readers, and their accounts of women’s moral capacities did not usually aim to disrupt the subordination of women. Rarely in the history of philosophy will one find philosophical works that notice gender in order to criticize and correct men’s historical privileges or to disrupt the social orders and practices that subordinate groups on gendered dimensions. An understanding that sex matters to one’s ethical theorizing in some way is necessary to, but not sufficient for, feminist ethics.

Some philosophers and writers in almost every century, however, constitute forerunners to feminist ethics. Representative authors writing in the seventeenth, eighteenth, and nineteenth centuries discussed below explicitly address what they perceive to be moral wrongs resulting from either oppression on the basis of sex, or metaethical errors on the part of public intellectuals in believing ideal forms of moral reasoning to be within the capacities of men and not women. In the early-to-mid-twentieth century, at the same time that feminism became a more popularly used term in Europe and the Americas, more theorists argued influentially for ending unjust discrimination on the basis of sex. Some authors concertedly argued that philosophers and theorists erred in their understanding of what seemed to be gendered differences in ethical and moral reasoning.

1.1 Seventeenth- and Eighteenth-Century Forerunners of Feminist Ethics

In the seventeenth century, some public intellectuals published treatises arguing that women were as rational as men and should be afforded the education that would allow them to develop their moral character. They argued that since females are rational, their unequal access to learning was immoral and unjustifiable. They explored meta-ethical questions about the preconditions for morality, including what sorts of agents can be moral and whether morality is equally possible for different sexes. For example, in 1694, Mary Astell’s first edition of A Serious Proposal to the Ladies for the Advancement of their True and Greatest Interest was published, advocating for access to education. It was controversial enough that Astell issued a sequel three years later, A Serious Proposal, Part II, that challenged “those deep background philosophical and theological assumptions which deny women the capacity for improvement of the mind” (Springborg, “Introduction,” in Astell 2002, 21). At the time, some apparently attributed the first Serious Proposal not to Astell, but to Damaris Cudworth Masham, a one-time companion of John Locke, since such criticisms of the injustice of women’s lot and the background assumptions maintaining their subordinate situation were familiar to Masham (Springborg, “Introduction,” in Astell 2002, 17). Although Masham sharply disagreed with aspects of Astell’s work, she too would later come to be credited with “explicitly feminist claims,” including objections to “the inferior education accorded women” (Frankel 1989, 84), especially when such obstacles were due to “the ignorance of men” (Masham 1705, 169, quoted in Frankel 1989, 85). Masham also deplored “the double standard of morality imposed on women and men, especially … the claim that women's ‘virtue’ consists primarily in chastity” (Frankel 1989, 85).

A century later, Mary Wollstonecraft, in her Vindication of the Rights of Women ([1792] 1988), renewed attention to girls’ lack of access to education. Criticizing the philosophical assumptions underpinning practices that denied girls adequate education, Wollstonecraft articulated an Enlightenment ideal of the social and moral rights of women as the equal of men. Wollstonecraft also broadened her critique of social structures to encompass ethical theory, especially in resistance to the arguments of influential men that women’s virtues are different from men’s and appropriate to perceived feminine duties. Wollstonecraft asserted: “I here throw down my gauntlet, and deny the existence of sexual virtues,” adding that “women, I allow, may have different duties to fulfil; but they are human duties, and the principles that should regulate the discharge of them … must be the same” (51). The revolutions of the Enlightenment age motivated some men as well as women to reconsider inequities in education at a time when notions of universal human rights were gaining prominence. As Joan Landes observes, Marie-Jean-Antoine-Nicolas de Caritat, Marquis de Condorcet was an extraordinary advocate for the rights of women in France during the same period who argued in 1790 for “the admission of women to the rights of citizenship” and “woman's equal humanity on the grounds of reason and justice” (Landes 2016). Like many theorists of their time and places, including Catherine Macaulay (Tomaselli 2016), Olympe de Gouges, and Madame de Staël (Landes 2016), Wollstonecraft and Condorcet granted that there were material differences between the sexes, but advanced moral arguments against ethical double-standards on the basis of universal humanism. Yet the notion of universal humanism tended to prioritize virtues traditionally seen as masculine. Wollstonecraft, for example, argued against perceptions that women lacked men’s capacities for morality, but praised rationality and “masculinity” as preconditions for morality (Tong 1993, 44).

1.2 Nineteenth-Century Influences and Issues

In Europe and North America, nineteenth-century moral arguments coalesced around material issues that would later be appreciated by feminist ethicists as importantly intersecting. A remarkably diverse array of activist women and public intellectuals advanced recognizably feminist arguments for women’s moral leadership and greater freedoms as moral imperatives. The resistance of enslaved women and the political activism of their descendants, the anti-slavery organizations of women in Europe and North America, the attention to inequity in women’s access to income, property, sexual freedom, full citizenship, and enfranchisement, and the rise of Marxist and Socialist theories contributed to women’s participation in arguments for the reductions of militarism, unfettered capitalism, domestic violence and the related abuse of drugs and alcohol, among other concerns.

Offering the first occurrence of the term feminisme (Offen 1988), the nineteenth century is characterized by a plurality of approaches to protofeminist ethics, that is, ethical theorizing that anticipated and created the groundwork for modern feminist concepts. These include some theories consistent with the universal humanism of Wollstonecraft and Condorcet and others emphasizing the differences between the sexes in order to argue for the superiority of feminine morality. The most well-known of the former in philosophy are John Stuart Mill’s The Subjection of Women ([1869] 1987), which he credits Harriet Taylor Mill with co-authoring, and Harriet Taylor Mill’s essay, “The Enfranchisement of Women” (H. T. Mill [1851] 1998). Like their Enlightenment forerunners, Mill and Taylor argue that women ought to have equal rights and equal access to political and social opportunities. As a utilitarian philosopher, Mill further emphasizes the benefits to society and to the human species of improving women’s lives and social situations. Mill expresses skepticism about claims that women are morally superior to men, as well as claims that women have “greater liability to moral bias,” emotionality, and poor judgment in ethical decision-making ([1869] 1987, 518 and 519). Mill and Taylor tend to overemphasize the roles of women who are wives. They grant some differences between men and women that are controversial today; Mill’s works especially emphasize the benefits to family and domestic life as reasons to support the liberation of women from subjugation. Despite these views, both argue for the benefits of women’s liberation to scholarly and political spheres. For example, they describe differences in achievement and behavior to be the result mainly of women’s social situations and education, making their view consistent with the arguments of both the Enlightenment scholars noted above, and some, but not all, of the nineteenth- and twentieth-century authors discussed below.

Attitudes about the reasons for the moral goodness of such achievements differed. Some early utopian and Socialist movements in Europe that influenced women’s rights activists in America and would later influence British thinkers, including John Stuart Mill, lauded feminine virtues and women’s importance, but did so in ways that would reinforce views of women as “superior” because of innate qualities of gentleness, love, spirituality, and sentimentality (Moses 1982). In contrast, other Socialist movements expressed radical views of the equality of men and women not by attributing distinctive or greater moral virtues to women, but by challenging systems of privilege due to sex, race, and class (Taylor 1993). Although Mill and Taylor would later argue that “sexual inequality is an impediment to the cultivation of moral virtue,” some American activists such as Catherine Beecher forwarded a “separate-but-equal” vision of men and women as psychologically and essentially different, a view “according to which female virtue is ultimately better than male virtue” (Tong 1993, 36 and 37). In the pivotal year of 1848, Frederick Douglass insisted that “all that distinguishes man as an intelligent and accountable being, is equally true of woman” (quoted in Davis 2011, 51). In the same year, the Declaration of Sentiments was signed at a women’s rights convention in Seneca Falls, New York, and socialist and anarchist revolutions took place in Europe. The revolutionaries included public thinkers who advocated communal property and sexual equality, and who criticized the involvement of state and church in marriage. Their arguments about practical and feminist ethics influenced Emma Goldman and other turn-of-the-century thinkers.

Philosophical thinkers of different backgrounds gained greater access to education and printing presses in the nineteenth century, resulting in a plurality of approaches to the project of understanding, criticizing, and correcting how gender operates within our moral beliefs and practices. For example, the attachment of some protofeminist thinkers to the domestic virtues shaped their ethical recommendations. Some white and middle-class activists argued for the end of slavery and, later, against the subordination of emancipated women of color precisely on the grounds that they wished to extend the privileges that white and middle-class women enjoyed in the domestic and private sphere, maintaining the social order while valorizing domestic feminine goodness. As Clare Midgley says, “Women’s role was discussed in terms of family life. Emancipation would mark the end of the sexual exploitation of women and of the disruption of family life, and the creation of a society in which the black woman was able to occupy her proper station as a Daughter, a Wife, and a Mother” (Midgley 1993, 351).

In contrast, some former slaves including Anna Julia Cooper and Ida B. Wells-Barnett, and descendants of slaves including Mary Church Terrell, grounded their work for women’s rights and arguments for women’s moral and sociopolitical equality in rather different priorities, asserting more interest in equal protection of the laws, economic liberation, political representation, and in Wells-Barnett’s case, self-defense and the exertion of the right to bear arms, as necessary to the very survival and liberation of Black Americans (Giddings 2007). Cooper, who rightly criticized white feminists for racist (and female-supremacist) statements when they were offered as reasons to work for white women’s voting rights rather than Black men’s, advanced a view of virtues and truth as having masculine and feminine sides. A century before care ethics would become a strain of academic feminist ethics, Cooper urged that both masculine reason and feminine sympathy “are needed to be worked into the training of children, in order that our boys may supplement their virility by tenderness and sensibility, and our girls may round out their gentleness by strength and self-reliance” (Cooper [1892] 2000, 60). Her timeless concern for the U.S. was that a nation or a people “will degenerate into mere emotionalism on the one hand, or bullyism on the other, if dominated by either exclusively” (61). Hers is a normative argument for appreciating the contributions that both traditionally feminine and masculine values could offer to a well-balanced ethics.

Explicitly arguing that standpoints matter to knowledge claims and moral theorizing, Cooper insisted that historical knowledge necessary to a nation’s self-understanding depends on the representation of Black Americans’ voices, and especially the “open-eyed but hitherto voiceless Black Woman of America” (Cooper [1892] 2000, 2; Gines 2015). Manifesting Cooper’s call for representations, Wells-Barnett determinedly included accounts of girls and women killed by lynching along with the narratives of murdered men and boys, and challenged the “racial-sexual apologies for lynching to trample the twin myths of white (female) sexual purity and black (male) sexual savagery” (James 1997, 80). Wells-Barnett’s investigative journalism led her to the blunt suggestion that some of the sexual relationships giving rise to cover stories of rape as justifications for lynching were consensual relationships between white women and Black men, while rapes of Black women and girls, “which began in slavery days, still continues without reproof from church, state or press” (quoted in Sterling 1979, 81).

1.3 Twentieth-Century Influences and Issues

Like Wells-Barnett, anarchist and socialist writers, some from working-class backgrounds, advanced frank arguments for differently understanding women’s capacities and desires as sexual beings with their own moral agency. Leaders included Emma Goldman, whose anarchism was developed as a response to Marx and Marxism (Fiala 2018). Goldman argued for broader understandings of love, sexuality, and family, because she believed that traditional social codes of morality resulted in the corruption of women’s sexual self-understanding (112). Like Wells-Barnett, Goldman coupled arguments against feminine sexual purity with attention to the sexual exploitation of, and trafficking in, women who did not enjoy the state’s protection (Goldman 2012). Some suffragists’ “emphasis on female morality repulsed Goldman. Yet, while she ridiculed the claim that women were morally superior to men … she also emphasized that women should be allowed and encouraged to express freely their ‘true’ femininity” (Marso 2010, 76).

Although early twentieth-century protofeminists differed in their beliefs as to whether men and women were morally different in character, they generally shared a belief in Progressive ideals of moral and social improvement if only humankind brought fair and rational thinking to bear on ethical issues. Progressive-era pragmatists, including Wells-Barnett, Charlotte Perkins-Gilman, Jane Addams, and Alice Paul, “saw the social environment as malleable, capable of improvement through human action and philosophic thought” (Whipps and Lake 2016). The beginning of the century was characterized by remarkably optimistic thinking even on the part of more radical theorists who appreciated the deep harms of oppressive social organizations. Most of the Progressive activists and suffragists of this era never described themselves with the new term, “feminist,” but as the immediate forerunners of feminism, they are described as feminists today.

Although belief in the possibilities for change seems widely shared, Progressive-era feminists did not always share common ground regarding women’s moral natures or how to achieve moral progress as a nation. For example, both Goldman and pro-suffrage Charlotte Perkins-Gilman argued for individual self-transformation and self-understanding as keys to women’s better moral characters (Goldman 2012), while maintaining that a person’s efforts were best supported by a less individualistic and more communitarian social and political framework (Gilman 1966). While Goldman included greater access to birth control and reproductive choice among the morally urgent routes to women’s individual self-discovery, Gilman and many feminists argued for women’s access to contraception in ways that reflected increasingly popular policies of eugenics in North and South America and Europe (Gilman 1932). Eugenics-friendly white women’s contributions of feminist ethical arguments to disrupt oppressive pronatalism or to avert the measurable costs of parenthood in sexist societies often took the form of deepening other forms of marginalization, including those based on race, disability, and class (Lamp and Cleigh 2011).

In the U.S., the centrality of sex and gender issues in public ethics reached a high-water mark during the Progressive Era, moving one magazine to write in 1914 that “The time has come to define feminism; it is no longer possible to ignore it” (Cott 1987, 13). Unfortunately, this sentiment would decline with the start of World War I and the consequent demise of optimistic beliefs in the powers of human rationality to bring about moral progress. Yet throughout the 1920s, 1930s, and 1940s, as economic difficulties, military conflicts, and wealth disparity fluctuated internationally, women’s groups and feminist activists in many countries would advance, with some success, feminist and moral arguments for workplace, professional, electoral, and educational access, for the liberalization of contraception, marriage, and divorce laws, and against militarism. Some of their gains in greater access to voting, education, and prosperity may have contributed to the wide audience that was receptive to Simone de Beauvoir’s publications in Europe and, after translations were available, in North America.

Beauvoir first self-identified as a feminist in 1972 (Schwarzer 1984, 32), and consistently refused the label of a philosopher despite having taught courses in philosophy (Card 2003, 9). Yet beginning in the 1950s, both her Ethics of Ambiguity ([1947] 1976) and The Second Sex ([1949] 2010) were widely read and quickly appreciated as important to feminist ethics (Card 2003, 1). As works of existentialist morality, they emphasized that we are not all simply subjects and individual choosers but also objects shaped by the forces of oppression (Andrew 2003, 37). Like the protofeminists described above, Beauvoir focused on the embodied experiences and social situations of women. In these pivotal works, she advanced the case that embodiment and social situatedness are not only relevant to human existence, but are the stuff of human existence, so crucial that philosophy ought not ignore them (Andrew 2003, 34). In The Second Sex, she argued that some men in philosophy managed the bad-faith project of both ignoring their own sex-situatedness and yet describing women as the Other and men as the Self. Because men in philosophy take themselves to be paradigmatically human and take it upon themselves to characterize the nature of womankind as different from men, Beauvoir said that men socially construct woman as the Other. Famously, Beauvoir said, “one is not born, but rather becomes, woman,” that is, one may be born a human female, but “the figure that the human female takes on in society,” that of a “woman,” results from “the mediation of another [that] can constitute an individual as an Other” (Beauvoir [1949] 2010, 329). The embodied human female may be a subject of her own experiences and perceptions, but “being a woman would mean being an object, the Other” (83), that is, the objectified recipient of the speculations and perceptions of men. Beauvoir described a woman who would transcend this situation “as hesitating between the role of object, of Other that is proposed to her, and her claim for freedom” (84), that is, her freedom to assert her own subjectivity, to make her own choices as to who she is, especially when she is not defined in relation to men. A woman’s position is therefore so deeply ambiguous—one of navigating “a human condition as defined in its relation with the Other” (196)—that if one is to philosophize about women, “it is indispensable to understand the economic and social structure” in which women aim to be authentic or ethical, necessitating “an existential point of view, taking into account her total situation” (84). In other words, philosophers speculating about women ought to take into account the obstacles to women’s opportunities for subjecthood and choice that are created by those who constructed an oppressive situation for women to navigate.

Beauvoir’s positions—that woman has been defined by men and in men’s terms, that ethical theory must attend to women’s social situation and their capacity to be moral decision-makers, and that women’s oppression impedes their knowing themselves and changing their situation—reflect the concerns of many forerunners of feminist ethics. Beauvoir’s work profoundly shaped the emergence of feminist ethics as a subfield of philosophy at a time when philosophers more generally had moved away from the eighteenth- and nineteenth-century tendencies to describe women as lacking morally worthy rational capacities. Instead, by the middle of the twentieth century, some influential philosophers in Europe and the Americas had moved toward approaches that often led to describing both gender and ethics as irrelevant to philosophical discourse (Garry 2017).

2. Themes in feminist ethics

In the fifty years that feminist ethics has been a subject of philosophical scholarship in (initially) Western and (increasingly) international discourse, theorists have considered metaethical, theoretical, and practical questions. Questions that occupied scholars in preceding centuries, especially those regarding moral agents’ natural (and gendered) capacities for moral deliberation, are critically reconsidered in debates that arose in the 1970s and 1980s. One main area of inquiry addresses whether and why there may be meaningful differences in feminine and masculine priorities of care and justice in normative theory. Concern about feminist methods of articulating ethical theories arise during this time and continue. These debates can be found in the scholarship of intersectionality, Black feminist thought and women of color feminism, transnational feminism, queer theory, disability studies, and twenty-first century criticisms of feminist ethics. They are of special concern whenever feminist ethicists seem to uphold a gender binary and simplistic conceptualizations of woman as a category. Questions about the shortcomings of traditional ethical theories, about which virtues constitute morally good character in contexts of oppression, and about which kinds of ethical theories will ameliorate gendered oppressions and evils generate critical scholarship in every decade.

2.1 Gender binarism, essentialism, and separatism

Gender binarism, which is the view that there are only two genders—male and female—and that everyone is only one of them (Dea 2016a, 108), is assumed by most feminist ethicists in the 1970s and 1980s (Jaggar 1974; Daly 1979). Some of these feminists criticize male supremacy without thereby preferring female supremacy (Frye 1983; Card 1986; Hoagland 1988). They argue that although the categories of “men” and “women” are physiologically distinct, the potential of feminism to liberate both men and women from oppressive gendered social arrangements suggests that men and women do not have different moralities or separate realities, and that we do not need to articulate separate capacities for ethics (Jaggar 1974; Davion 1998).

Other feminist ethicists offer radically different views. Mary Daly, for example, argues in Gyn/Ecology: The Metaethics of Radical Feminism that women were traditionally defined throughout intellectual history as being subversive of rationality, impartiality, and morality as traditionally conceived. Daly argues that women ought to embrace, as essential to women’s natures and good, some of the very qualities that she says men have ascribed to women as essential to women’s natures and bad. Daly suggests valuing both women’s capacities for childbearing and birth (as opposed to capacities to engage in war and killing) and women’s emotionality (versus rationality) (Daly 1979).

Radical feminists and lesbian feminists who disagree with Daly as to whether women’s moral natures are innately better than men’s agree with Daly in arguing either for essentialism (Griffin 1978; cf. Spelman 1988 and Witt 1995) or for women’s separation from men (Card 1988; Hoagland 1988). Some of them argue that separatism allows a setting in which to create alternative ethics, rather than merely responding to the male-dominated ethical theories traditionally discussed in the academy. They also argue that separatism better fosters women’s increased connection to each other and denies men the access to women that men might expect (Daly 1979; Frye 1983; Hoagland 1988).

In deep disagreement, philosophers such as Alison Jaggar argue against separatism as being in any way productive of a different and morally better world. Jaggar maintains that “what we must do instead is to create a new androgynous culture which incorporates the best elements of both …, which values both personal relationships and efficiency, both emotion and rationality. This result cannot be achieved through sexual separation” (Jaggar 1974, 288). Related arguments for androgynous approaches to ethics are influential in arguments supporting androgyny, gender bending, and gender-blending that are prevalent in the 1990s (Butler 1990; Butler 1993), and gender-eliminativist and humanist approaches to feminist ethics and social philosophy that are prevalent in the twenty-first century (LaBrada 2016; Mikkola 2016; Ayala and Vasilyeva 2015; Haslanger 2012).

One criticism of gender binarism is that its assumption marginalizes nonconforming individuals. In efforts described as promoting coalition between trans activists and non-trans feminists, some feminists argue that we ought to examine the gender privilege inherent in presuming a binary that reflects one’s own experience better than the experiences of others (Dea 2016a; Bettcher 2014). Yet such “beyond-the-binary” approaches, in turn, have been cautioned against as well-intentioned but, at times, invalidating trans identities, “by invalidating the self-identities of trans people who do not regard their genitals as wrong” or “by representing all trans people as problematically positioned with regard to the binary” (Bettcher 2013). Recognition of “reality enforcement” and its interconnection with racist and sexist oppression may better defray the harms of normalizing a gender binary (Bettcher 2013).

2.2 Ethic of care as a feminine or gendered approach to morality

Jaggar argues against separatism or separate gendered realities, noting that there is no reason “to believe in a sexual polarity which transcends the physiological distinction” (Jaggar 1974, 283). The work of psychologist Carol Gilligan therefore has great influence on philosophers interested in just such evidence for substantial sex differences in moral reasoning, despite the fact that Gilligan herself does not describe these differences as polar. In her landmark work, In a Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women’s Development (1982), Gilligan disputes accounts of moral development that do not take into account girls’ moral experiences (18–19), or that describe women as stuck at an interpersonal stage short of full moral development as in the theories of Lawrence Kohlberg (30). Gilligan argues that Kohlberg wrongly prioritizes a “morality of rights” and independence from others as better than, rather than merely different from, a “morality of responsibility” and intimate relationships with others (19).

Gilligan’s research follows Nancy Chodorow’s in suggesting that for boys and men, “separation and individuation are critically tied to gender identity” (Gilligan 1982, 8). Further, the development of masculinity typically involves valuing autonomy, rights, disconnection from others, and independence, while seeing other persons and intimate relationships as dangers or obstacles to pursuing those values. This perspective is referred to as the “perspective of justice” (Held 1995; Blum 1988). Women, in Gilligan’s studies, were as likely to express the perspective of justice as they were to express a perspective that valued intimacy, responsibility, relationships, and caring for others, while seeing autonomy as “the illusory and dangerous quest” (Gilligan 1982, 48), in tension with the values of attachment. This perspective is known as the perspective of “care” (Friedman 1991; Driver 2005).

Philosophers who apply Gilligan’s empirical results to ethical theory differ about the role that a care perspective should play in normative recommendations. Nel Noddings’s influential work, Caring: A Feminine Approach to Ethics and Moral Education (1984), argues for the moral preferability of a care perspective as both feminine and, as she later says explicitly, feminist (Noddings 2013, xxiv), orienting moral agents to focus on the needs of those one cares for in relational contexts rather than on abstract, universal principles. Like her historical predecessors discussed above, Noddings emphasizes the feminine “to direct attention to centuries of experience more typical of women than men” (xxiv), in part to correct the extent to which “the mother’s voice has been silent” (1). Noddings’s normative theory endorses the moral value of partiality that justifies prioritizing interpersonal relationships over more distant connections. Virginia Held’s (1993; 2006) and Joan Tronto’s (1993) different applications of the perspective of care endorse care as social and political rather than limited to interpersonal relationships, and suggest that an ethic of care provides a route to realizing better societies as well as better treatment of distant others. Both Held and Sara Ruddick (1989) urge societal shifts to prioritize children’s vulnerabilities and the perspectives of mothers as necessary correctives to moral and political neglect of policies that would ensure the well-being of vulnerable people in relationships requiring care. This concern is further elaborated in Eva Feder Kittay’s attention to caregivers as “secondarily” or “derivatively dependent” (1999). In normative theory and applied ethics, care-work and caring in workplace relationships have come to receive more attention in twenty-first century philosophy than previously, as appreciation for the ethical demands of relational support-provision and client-centered or helping professions come to be influenced by variations on the ethic of care (Kittay 1999; Feder and Kittay 2002; Tronto 2005; Lanoix 2010; Reiheld 2015).

Robin Dillon observes that, “Care ethics was for some time the dominant approach in feminist ethics and so feminist discussions of virtue” (2017b, 574). Although the ethic of care continues to be strongly associated with feminist ethics, Gilligan’s work in psychology and Noddings’s work in philosophy were immediately contested (Superson 2012). Some feminist ethicists have argued that the ethic of care valorizes the burdened history of femininity associated with caring (Card 1996). The complex history of femininity and caregiving practices were shaped in contexts of oppression that may permit “moral damage” to women’s agency (Tessman 2005). If that burdened feminine history includes attention to particular relationships at the expense of attention to wider social institutions and systematic political injustice, then the ethic of care runs the risk of lacking a feminist vision for changing systematic and institutional forms of oppression (Hoagland 1990; Bell 1993). Further worries about the ethic of care include whether unidirectional caring enables the exploitation of caregivers (Houston 1990; Card 1990; Davion 1993), and whether such caring excludes moral responsibilities to strangers and individuals we may affect without meeting interpersonally (Card 1990), thereby risking an insular ethic that ignores political and material realities (Hoagland 1990). Another concern is whether we risk generalizing some women’s prioritizing caring to all women, which disregards the complex pluralism of many women’s voices (Moody-Adams 1991). Finally, preoccupation with women’s kinder and gentler feelings may prevent or distract from attention to women’s capacities for harm and injustice, especially the injustices borne of racial and class privilege (Spelman 1991).

The above criticisms tend to proceed from a view that it is problematic that an ethic of care is predicated on seeing femininity as valuable. They suggest that critical feminist perspectives require us to doubt the value of femininity. However, it remains controversial whether femininity is necessarily defined in relationship to masculinity and is thereby an inauthentic or insufficiently critical perspective for feminist ethics, or whether femininity is a distinctive contribution of moral and valuing agents to a feminist project that rejects or corrects some of the errors and excesses of legacies of masculinity (Irigaray 1985; Harding 1987; Tong 1993; Bartky 1990).

2.3 Intersectionality

One way that some philosophers offer to resolve the possible tension between conceptions of femininity and feminism is to bring intersectional approaches to the question as to whose femininity is being discussed. Concerns that femininity is antithetical to a critical feminist perspective seem to presuppose a conception of femininity as passive, gentle, obedient, emotional, and dependent, in contrast with a conception of masculinity as its opposite. In a philosophical tradition dominated by white and masculine philosophers, describing femininity as necessarily the opposite of one’s conception of masculinity in a gender binary makes limited sense. Scholars of intersectionality point out, however, that identities are not binary: “the masculinity and femininity in play here are not racially unmarked (if only for the reason that gender is never racially unmarked)” (James 2013, 752). The insights of philosophers of Black Feminism, intersectionality, queer theory, critical race theory, disability studies, and transfeminism, among others, contribute to a view that there is no universal definition of femininity or of the category of woman that neatly applies to all women. Some of these philosophers suggest that the distinctive moral and valuing experiences of women and individuals of all genders may be unjustly ignored or denied by a conception of women or femininity that turns out to be white, ableist, and cisgender (Crenshaw 1991; Collins 1990; Wendell 1996; hooks 1992; Tremain 2000; Serano 2007; McKinnon 2014). Intersectional approaches reject binaries such as “masculinity/femininity” that tend to take the social positions of privileged people as generic. Minimally, intersectionality is “the predominant way of conceptualizing the relation between systems of oppression which construct our multiple identities and our social locations in hierarchies of power and privilege,” offering a remedy to histories of exclusions in feminist theory (Carastathis 2014, 304).

Although intersectional insights can be found in the works of writers even from the distant past, the predominance of intersectionality in feminist ethics today is largely owed to Black feminists and critical race theorists, who were the first to argue for the significance of intersectionality (Crenshaw 1989; Collins 1990; Gines 2014; Bailey 2009). Kimberlé Crenshaw describes intersectionality in different senses: as an experience, an approach, and a problem (Crenshaw 1989; Crenshaw 1991). Crenshaw’s description of intersectionality as an experience includes the phenomena of oppressive practices and harms that occur at, and because of, intersections of aspects of identity. For example, when Black men, but not any women, were permitted to work on a General Motors factory floor, and white women, but not any Black persons, were permitted to work in the General Motors secretarial pool, then Black women were discriminated against as Black women. That is, they were not permitted to have any job at General Motors due to living at an intersection of categories of identity that are treated separately in the law (Crenshaw 1989). Crenshaw’s description of intersectionality as an approach includes centering the lives and testimony of those whose experiences with living at intersections of oppressions have been ignored or denied in traditional philosophical and political theories (Crenshaw 1989; Crenshaw 1991; hooks 1984; Dotson 2014; Lorde 1990; Lugones 1987; Lugones 2014). Crenshaw’s description of intersectionality as a problem includes disrupting the traditional overlooking of Black women’s experiences, and offering the experiences and the approaches described above as challenges to the doctrine that discrimination occurs only along one axis of identity (Crenshaw 1989, 141). Intersectionality is pursued in the interests of expanding understandings of differences and accounting for the experiences of people previously spoken for, if addressed at all, rather than consulted.

Not all philosophers who embrace appreciation of the insights of intersectionality agree on whether it yields a distinct methodology, or a starting point for better inquiry, or a better conception of experiences of oppression (Khader 2013; Garry 2011). Serene Khader suggests that intersectional theories “are united by a critique of what Crenshaw (1991) calls ‘additive’ models of identity” that assume that individuals at intersections of traditionally oppressed identity categories are “necessarily worse off than the individual facing a single oppression,” as if each dimension on which one can be oppressed is easily separable in categories traditionally conceived in isolation (Khader 2013, 75). Instead, “intersectional theorists argue that the oppressions facing multiply oppressed women co-constitute one another and situate those women such that attempts to advance the interests of ‘all women’ may fail to advance theirs” (Khader 2013, 75).

Intersectionality is not without its critics in feminist ethics. For example, Naomi Zack (2005) argues that an intersectional approach to concepts such as that of woman successfully demonstrates problems with essentialism with respect to women’s natures, but degrades the category of woman, “multiplying axes of analysis and thus gender categories beyond necessity” (Bailey 2009, 21) to an extent that may thereby fragment attempts to advocate for women (Zack 2005; Ludvig 2006; Sengupta 2006). Some feminists who support intersectionality have responded to Zack’s concerns by arguing that everyday concepts such as woman include an array of identities, including distinct gender identities that bear a family resemblance and include a range of manifestations (Garry 2011). Other feminists have responded to Zack’s concerns for feminist movement or solidarity by arguing for the possibilities of working in coalitions that do not require widely shared commonality, working to learn from and about positions of difference, and cultivating more humility and less arrogance in theorizing (Lorde 1984; Lugones 1987; Reagon 2000; Bailey 2009; Carastathis 2014; Sheth 2014; Ruíz and Dotson 2017). Other feminist ethicists raise tensions in intersectional theory that are not intended to undermine the approach but to ask for elaboration of its details, including its very definition (Nash 2008). The appeal for these clarifications, however, may reflect traditions that intersectionality is dedicated to disrupting, since it is made in the context of the pursuit of justification, habits of opposition, and a narrow sense of definitional work that is typical in philosophy, a field that has a reputation for lacking appreciation for diverse practitioners (Dotson 2013).

2.4 Feminist criticisms and expansions of traditional moral theories

If there is a commonality between all of the above feminist ethicists, it is their interest in provoking reconsideration of ethical theories that failed either to notice or to care when the perspective of the philosopher so criticized was taken for either a generic truth about moral theory or a gender-specific and false description of human nature. Elena Flores Ruíz observes that “professional philosophy sleepwalks; its somnambulatory practices stroll silently, policing checkpoints without the burden of consciousness of its actions and practices” (2014, 199). In other words, philosophers have at times presumed that they speak for many without sufficient attention to their own presumptions. Ruíz’s claim is akin to Rosemarie Tong’s observation made decades earlier, that traditional ethical theory demonstrates “a sleepy inattentiveness to women’s concerns” (1993, 160). The provocation to alertness is evident in feminist critiques of traditional ethical theories such as deontology, consequentialism, social contract theory, and virtue ethics. Some feminist ethicists sympathetically extend canonical work to concerns that male theorists did not address, while other feminist ethicists resoundingly reject traditional ethical theories because the theories rely on a conception of moral agency or moral value with which they disagree.

2.4.1 Deontology, rights, and duties

Some feminist ethicists endorse deontological moral theories on the grounds that granting women—who have been subordinated in private and public spheres—the same rights routinely granted to men in positions of power would enable women’s freedom and flourishing, especially in contexts of political liberalism. Feminist ethicists have long argued that we should acknowledge women’s equal capacities for moral agency and extend human rights to them (Astell 1694; Wollstonecraft 1792; Stanton [1848] 1997; Mill [1869] 1987; Nussbaum 1999; Baehr 2004; Stone-Mediatore 2004; Hay 2013). While building on existing frameworks of liberalism, rights theory, and deontology, feminist ethicists have argued for granting rights where they have been previously neglected (Brennan 2010). They have argued for rights in the issues of enfranchisement (Truth [1867] 1995), reproduction (Steinbock 1994), abortion (Thomson 1971), bodily integrity (Varden 2012), women’s and non-heterosexual people’s sexuality (Goldman 2012; Cuomo 2007), sexual harassment (Superson 1993), pornography (Easton 1995), violence against women (Dauer and Gomez 2006), rape (MacKinnon 2006), and more. While recognizing limits to the universality of women’s experiences, feminist philosophers have argued for global human rights as a remedy for gendered oppression and dehumanization (Cudd 2005; Meyers 2016).

Feminist criticism of duty-centered frameworks, or, deontology, include those articulated by authors of the ethic of care, who argue against an ethic of duty, especially Kantian ethics, on several grounds. First, they claim that it proceeds from absolutist and universal principles which are unduly prioritized over consideration of the material contexts informing embodied experiences, particularities, and relationships. Second, they claim that it inaccurately separates capacities for rationality from capacities for emotion, and that it wrongly describes the latter as morally uninformative or worthless most likely because of their traditional association with women or femininity (Noddings 1984; Held 1993; Slote 2007). Moreover, an ethic of duty is likely to overly idealize moral agents’ capacities for rationality and choice (Tronto 1995; Tessman 2015). Some feminist ethicists embrace forms of obligation yet reject Kantian deontology when it denies the possibility of moral dilemmas (Tessman 2015). Feminists who argue that duties are socially constructed, rather than a priori, ground the nature of obligations in the normative practices of the nonideal world (Walker 1998; Walker 2003).

Transnational feminists, scholars of intersectionality, and postcolonial feminists argue that feminist advocates of global human rights routinely impose their own cultural expectations and regional practices upon the women who are purportedly the objects of their concern (Mohanty 1997; Narayan 1997; Narayan 2002; Silvey 2009; Narayan 2013; Khader 2018a; Khader 2018b). Critical analyses of some feminist deontologists’ concerns include arguments that universal morals, rights, and duties are not the best bulwark against relativist condonation of any and all possible treatments of women and subordinated people (Khader 2018b) and suggest that advocacy of human rights is perhaps well-intentioned but “entangled with imperialist precommitments in the contemporary West” (Khader 2018a, 19).

2.4.2 Consequentialism and utilitarianism

Since John Stuart Mill and Harriet Taylor Mill argued both for utilitarianism and against the subjection of women, one could say that there have been feminists as long as there have been utilitarians. In The Subjection of Women ([1869] 1987), Mill argues that the desirable outcome of human moral progress generally is hindered by women’s legal and social subordination. He adds that not only each woman’s, but each man’s personal moral character is directly harmed by the injustice of unequal social arrangements (Okin 2005). Mill expresses special concern that “the object of being attractive to men had … become the polar star of feminine education and formation of character,” an immoral “influence over the minds of women” (Mill [1869] 1987, 28–29), as well as an immoral influence on the understandings of the boys and girls that such women raise. Consistent with the utilitarian principle that everyone counts equally and no single person’s preferences count more than another’s, Mill argues that men and women are fundamentally equal in their capacities for higher and lower pleasures and, arguably, in their responsibilities and interests (Mendus 1994). Harriet Taylor likewise argues in The Enfranchisement of Women for the moral improvement of humankind generally and “the elevation of character [and] intellect” that would permit each woman and man to be both morally better and happier, which are overlapping and important considerations to Taylor (1998, 65).

Contemporary feminist ethicists who address utilitarianism either critique Mill’s work in particular (Annas 1977; Mendus 1994; Morales 2005), or defend a feminist version of consequentialism (Driver 2005; Gardner 2012), or apply consequentialist aims to feminist issues (Tulloch 2005; Dea 2016b). Some consequentialist feminists provide reasons for thinking that utilitarianism can accommodate feminist aims because it is responsive to empirical information, can accommodate the value of relationships in good lives, and is appreciative of distinctive vulnerabilities (Driver 2005).

Critics of utilitarianism include those who specifically resist the expectation of utilitarian impartiality, insofar as impartiality in decision-making ignores emotional connections or personal relationships with particular beings. Feminists have advanced criticisms of impartiality from the points of view of care ethics (Noddings 1984; Held 2006; Ruddick 1989), ecofeminist or environmental ethics (Adams 1990; Donovan 1990; George 1994; Warren 2000), and analytical social ethics (Baier 1994; Friedman 1994). Impartiality may yield implausible requirements to value the well-being of all equally regardless of one’s commitments, material circumstances in a nonideal world, or obligations of caring (Walker 1998; Walker 2003). Impartiality as a desirable quality of moral agents may overly idealize moral agency (Tessman 2015) or tacitly presume a biased perspective in favor of adult, racially privileged, masculine agents in a formal or public sphere whose decisions are unencumbered by relationships of unequal power (Kittay 1999).

Some feminists criticize consequentialism for failing to capture the qualitatively problematic nature of oppressions that are not reducible to harms (Frye 1983; Card 1996; Young 2009). For example, Card argues that even if certain behavior does not produce more harm than good, its symbolism could violate one’s dignity. Her example is the case of women being barred from Harvard’s Lamont Law library even when helpful male classmates provided them photocopies of course readings (2002, 104–105). Card also objects on Rawlsian grounds that the wrongness of slavery was not the balance of benefits and harms, contra consequentialism, but the fact that trade-offs could never justify slavery (2002, 57).

Anti-imperialist and non-Western feminists argue that Mill’s views in particular purport to be universal but include “Western European biases and instrumental reasoning” that establish “problematic rhetorical models for women’s rights arguments” (Botting and Kronewitter 2012). For example, Eileen Botting and Sean Kronewitter argue that The Subjection of Women contains several examples of primitivist and Orientalist rhetorical moves, such as associating “the barbarism of patriarchal marriage with Eastern cultures and religions” (2012, 471). They also object that Mill offers instrumental arguments for women’s rights, such as favoring the reduction of men’s selfishness and the increase in men’s intellectual stimulation in marriage, as well as doubling mental resources for the higher service of humanity (2012, 470), suggesting that women’s liberation is secondary to greater purposes.

2.4.3 Moral contractarianism

Some feminist ethicists argue for forms of contractarian ethics, that is, the view “that moral norms derive their normative force from the idea of contract or mutual agreement” (Cudd and Eftekhari 2018). Contractarian ethics permit moral agents to critically assess the value of any relationship, especially family relationships that may be oppressive on gendered dimensions (Okin 1989; Hampton 1993; Sample 2002; Radzik 2005). Other feminist contractarians appreciate Hobbes’s social contract theory for its applicability to women in positions of vulnerability. For example, Jean Hampton endorses Hobbes’s view that “you are under no obligation to make yourself prey to others” (Hampton 1998, 236). Hampton combines insights of both Kant and Hobbes in her version of feminist contractarianism, “building in the Kantian assumption that all persons have intrinsic value and thus must have their interests respected” (Superson 2012; see also Richardson 2007). Contractarianism arguably corrects gross injustices and inequities traceable to gendered oppressions and the most serious evils that are socially constructed (Anderson 1999; Hartley and Watson 2010).

Some feminists argue for the usefulness of contractarian ethics to evaluate one’s adaptive preferences, that is, “preferences formed in unconscious response to oppression” (Walsh 2015, 829). For example, Mary Barbara Walsh argues that social contract theory models “the conditions of autonomous choice, independence and dialogical reflection,” and therefore “exposes preferences that fail to meet” the conditions of autonomy. Feminist contractarianism may thereby generate new understandings of social contracts grounded in appreciation of material conditions, commitments, and consent (Stark 2007; Welch 2012). Feminist contractarians whose moral theories are influenced by John Rawls’s political philosophy suggest that his methodology, which involves reasoning from behind a veil of ignorance to decide which rules persons are rational to agree to, promotes critical appraisal of preferences that one would not hold in a better world (Richardson 2007, 414).

Feminist critics of contractarianism also raise concerns about adaptive preferences. In the actual, nonideal conditions in which individuals and groups develop, dominant perspectives and oppressive social arrangements can make persons come to prefer things that they would not otherwise prefer, such that the resultant preferences, when satisfied, are not for the agent’s own good, and may even contribute to her group’s oppression (Superson 2012). Feminists who are concerned that not all moral agents can meaningfully consent to contracts point to examples of women who are denied access to the public sphere, the market, education, and information (Held 1987; Pateman 1988). Others point out that traditionally, social contract theory has not attended to the inclusion of the needs of children, disabled community members, or their caregivers (Held 1987; Kittay 1999; Edenberg and Friedman 2013). Feminist critics of contractarianism tend to argue both for full consideration of needs born of differences between bodies and social locations, and against describing gender, embodiment, or dependency as a mere secondary characteristic irrelevant to what a body in need of care requires to flourish and thus what a “reasonable man” would choose behind a veil of ignorance (Nussbaum 2006; Pateman and Mills 2007).

2.4.4 Virtue ethics

Some feminist ethicists contend that virtue ethics, which focuses on living a good life or flourishing, offers the best approach to ensuring that ethical theory correctly represents the conditions permitting vulnerable bodies to flourish in oppressive contexts. Although virtue ethics is most notably associated with Aristotle, whose idealized and masculine agent is not generally considered paradigmatically feminist (Berges 2015, 3–4), feminists and their forerunners have engaged critically for several centuries with questions about which virtues and qualities of character would promote a good life in the context of what we now describe as women’s subordination. Philosophers who argue for feminist ethical virtues raise concerns that sexist oppression presents challenges to the exercise of virtues on the part of women and gender non-conforming people. Robin Dillon observes that feminist virtue ethics “identifies problems for character in contexts of domination and subordination and proposes ways of addressing those problems, and it identifies problems of unreflective theory and proposes power-conscious alternatives” (2017a, 381). Because the history of traditional virtue ethics is freighted with past characterizations of virtues as either gendered or as universal but less accessible to women, Dillon proposes what she calls “feminist critical character ethics” as an alternative to feminist virtue ethics (2017a, 380). Advocates of feminist virtue ethics and critical character ethics consider the relationships of gender to accounts of character, virtues, vices, and good lives (Baier 1994; Card 1996; Cuomo 1998; Calhoun 1999; Dillon 2017a; Snow 2002; Tessman 2005; Green and Mews 2011; Berges 2015; Broad 2015; Harvey 2018).

Like the ethic of care, virtue ethics is often described as offering a theory that is not beholden to abstract and universal principles (Groenhout 2014), but instead acknowledges “that moral reasoning might be an extraordinarily complex phenomenon …, a view on which what the ethical life requires of us cannot be codified or reduced to a single principle or set of principles” (Moody-Adams 1991, 209–210). A further commonality between care and virtue that is of interest to feminists is that “virtue theory, like care ethics, rejects a simplistic dichotomy between reason and emotion, and does not begin from the assumption that all human beings are essentially equal” (Groenhout 2014, 487). Ethical theories of virtue or character tend to appreciate the importance of emotions and interpersonal relationships to a person’s moral development. Some virtue ethics also focus on what opportunities for virtue are available to agents in particular social contexts, which is useful in feminist ethics when it comes to delineating our responsibilities as relational beings and as characters who may exhibit vices resulting from oppression (Bartky 1990; Potter 2001; Bell 2009; Tessman 2009a; Slote 2011; Boryczka 2012).

Indeed, the ethic of care bears so many important similarities to virtue ethics that some authors have argued that a feminist ethic of care just is a form or a subset of virtue ethics (Groenhout 1998; Slote 1998; McLaren 2001; Halwani 2003). Others believe that at a minimum, care and virtue ethics should inform each other and are compatible with each other (Benner 1997; Sander-Staudt 2006). Here, too, however, feminist ethicists disagree. Some contend that lumping together care and virtue might render the complexity of moral experiences and available moral responses less understandable rather than more articulate (Groenhout 2014). Others suggest that this consolidation might overlook important theoretical distinctions, including the capacity for virtue ethics to be gender-neutral while the ethic of care maintains a commitment to embodied, particular, and gendered experiences (Sander-Staudt 2006).

Virtue ethics provides wider opportunities for feminist ethics to attend to virtues such as integrity and courage in oppressive contexts that the ethic of care tends not to prioritize (Davion 1993; Sander-Staudt 2006). Resistance itself may be a “burdened virtue,” which is Lisa Tessman’s term for virtues that allow moral agents, even ones damaged by oppression, to endure and resist oppression, permitting a form of nobility that falls short of eudaimonia (Tessman 2005). Tessman argues that when agents live under conditions of systemic injustice, their opportunities to flourish are blocked and their pursuits may even be hopeless. She suggests that “the burdened virtues include all those traits that make a contribution to human flourishing—if they succeed in doing so at all—only because they enable survival of or resistance to oppression …, while in other ways they detract from their bearer's well-being, in some cases so deeply that their bearer may be said to lead a wretched life” (Tessman 2005, 95). Feminist ethicists have explored virtues that permit the sort of “conditioned flourishing” that Tessman describes (2009, 14), extending discussion of the virtues to specific applications in nonideal circumstances in which vulnerability is fundamental to the nature of a moral agent (Nussbaum 1986; Card 1996; Walker 2003). For example, feminists have argued for distinctive virtues in contexts such as whistleblowing and organizational resistance (DesAutels 2009), healthcare (Tong 1998), and ecological activism (Cuomo 1998).

Feminist criticisms of the limits of virtue ethics point to its emphasis on the personal as potentially problematic when it comes to “accounting for the possibility of social criticism and resistance on the part of the self who is constituted by the very social relationships and cultural traditions that would be the target of her resistance” (Friedman 1993). Virtue ethics may also include intrusive requirements to self-evaluate one’s every feeling or practice to an extent that an ethic of duty, for example, would not require (Conly 2001). Some care ethicists, most notably Nel Noddings (1984), argue that virtue ethics can be overly self-regarding rather than attentive to the point of view of another, and that it locates moral motivation in rational, abstract, and idealized conceptions of the good life rather than in the natural well-spring of moral motivation that is generated by encounters with particular persons.

2.5 Rejections of absolutism: pragmatism, transnational feminism, and nonideal theory

As is evident from the foregoing, feminist ethics is not monolithic. Feminists have sometimes clashed over being essentialist or anti-essentialist. Some feminist work is authored by members of privileged groups, while other feminist work is written by and attends to concerns of those in marginalized groups. Some feminists have located solidarity in commonality, while others advocate coalition in the presence of intersectionality. The different approaches of feminists to ethics raise questions as to whether feminist ethics can be either universalist or absolutist. Feminists have observed that just as some men in the history of philosophy have falsely universalized from their own experience to describe the experiences of all humans, some feminists have presumed false universal categories of women or feminists that elide differences between women or presume to speak for all women (Grimshaw 1996; Herr 2014; Tremain 2015). Relatedly, some feminist philosophers have criticized absolutism in ethical theory, that is, the prioritization of rigorous applications of principles to ethical situations regardless of the particularities of context or the motivations of the individuals affected, in part because absolutism, like universalism, takes the absolutists’ priorities to be rational for all (Noddings 1984; Baier 1994). Feminist ethicists who have endorsed visions of universal human rights as liberating for all women have been criticized by other feminists as engaging in absolutism in ways that may prescribe solutions for women in different locations and social situations rather than attending to the perspectives of the women described as needing such rights (Khader 2018b; Herr 2014).

The predominant association of feminist ethics with an ethic of care, which is dichotomous with traditional ethical theories on many levels, together with decades of feminist critiques of the work of canonical absolutist theorists, might lead to a perception that feminist ethics is fundamentally opposed to universalism and absolutism in ethics. This perception, however, is not built into the nature of feminist ethics, which has been employed to understand, criticize, and correct the role of gender in our moral beliefs and practices by deontologists, utilitarians, contractarians, and virtue ethicists, who hold some universal principles or absolute requirements to be basic to their views. However, it is evident that the preponderance of scholarship in feminist ethics tends to prioritize all of the following: the moral contexts in which differently situated and differently gendered agents operate, the testimony and perspectives of the situated agent, the power relationships and political relationships manifest in moral encounters, the vulnerabilities of embodied actors that yield a plurality of approaches to ethical situations, and the degrees of agency or capacity that are shaped by experiences with oppression and misogyny. Such priorities tend not to result in relativism, though they certainly depart from rigid forms of absolutism. Feminist ethics is often expressed in morally plural ways, including pragmatism (Hamington and Bardwell-Jones 2012), transnationalism (Jaggar 2013; Herr 2014; McLaren 2017; Khader 2018b), nonideal theory (Mills 2005; Schwartzman 2006; Tessman 2009b; Norlock 2016), and disability theory (Wendell 1996; Garland-Thomson 2011; Tremain 2015).

The following sub-entries included under “feminism (topics)” in the Table of Contents to this Encyclopedia are relevant to the multiplicity of applications of feminist ethics:

See also the entries in the Related Entries section below.


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  • Collins, Patricia Hill, 1990, Black Feminist Thought, Boston: Unwin Hyman.
  • Conly, Sarah, 2001, “Why Feminists Should Oppose Feminist Virtue Ethics,” Philosophy Now, 33: 12–14.
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  • Cott, Nancy F., 1987, The Grounding of Modern Feminism, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Crenshaw, Kimberlé, 1989, “Demarginalizing the Intersection of Race and Sex: A Black Feminist Critique of Antidiscrimination Doctrine, Feminist Theory and Antiracist Politics,” The University of Chicago Legal Forum, 140: 139–67.
  • –––, 1991, “Mapping the Margins: Intersectionality, Identity Politics, and Violence Against Women of Color,” Stanford Law Review, 43 (6): 1241–1299.
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  • –––, 1998, Feminism and Ecological Communities: An Ethic of Flourishing, New York: Routledge.
  • Daly, Mary, 1979, Gyn/Ecology the Metaethics of Radical Feminism, Boston: Beacon Press.
  • Davion, Victoria, 1993, “Autonomy, Integrity, and Care,”Social Theory and Practice, 19(2): 161–182.
  • –––, 1998, “How Feminist is Ecofeminism?”, in D. V. Veer and C. Pierce (eds.), The Environmental Ethics and Policy Book, Belmont: Wadsworth Publishing, pp. 278–284.
  • Davis, Angela Y., 2011, Women, Race, and Class, New York: Knopf Doubleday Publishing Group.
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  • Dea, Shannon, 2016a, Beyond the Binary: Thinking About Sex and Gender, Broadview Press.
  • –––, 2016b, “A Harm Reduction Approach to Abortion,” in S. Stettner (ed.), Without Apology: Writings on Abortion in Canada, Edmonton: Athabasca University Press, pp. 317–332.
  • DesAutels, Peggy, 2009, “Resisting Organizational Power,” in L. Tessman (ed.), Feminist Ethics and Social and Political Philosophy: Theorizing the Non-Ideal, New York: Springer. pp. 223-236.
  • Dillon, Robin, 2017a, “Feminist Approaches to Virtue Ethics,” in Nancy E. Snow (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Virtue, New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 377–397.
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This entry exists thanks to the steady work of Research Assistant Collin Chepeka and the funds of the Kenneth Mark Drain Chair in Ethics at Trent University. Thanks to Noëlle McAfee for helpful comments on a first draft, and thanks to Anita Superson for extensive comments on every section of this entry.

Copyright © 2019 by
Kathryn Norlock <kathrynnorlock@trentu.ca>

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