Transformative experiences are experiences that radically change the experiencer in both an epistemic and personal way (see Paul 2014). When a person transforms epistemically, they gain knowledge of “what the experience is like” that they could not have had without the experience. For instance, falling in love for the first time—be it with a romantic partner, child, friend, or pet—is the only way to truly know what it’s like to fall in love and allows one to better understand human bonds and relationships. A person might also transform personally, or such that key agential features—like their core preferences, life goals, and way they maneuver through the world—change. For instance, falling in love has a tendency to radically reshape the people and activities one prefers, change one’s major future plans, and alter the way one moves through the world. While these personal transformations might be caused epistemic ones, they also just could arise alongside the epistemic transformation as a result of the new experience. Experiences like falling in love that transform people both epistemically and personally are transformative experiences.
Though the concept of transformative experience sketched above comes from Paul (2014), elements of her account can be traced back to earlier work. For instance, antecedents include Lewis’s (1988 ) discussion of what experience teaches with respect to the phenomenal character of the experience, as well as Ullmann-Margalit’s (2006) work that highlights how making big decisions isn’t subject to rationality precisely because these decisions tend to involve personal transformation. However, Paul’s work has brought a resurgence of attention to the topic. Transformative experiences give us a way to understand the richness of our experiences, and also raise important questions in diverse areas of philosophy. Thus, this topic permeates both our lives and philosophical conversations. This entry discusses the different contexts in which transformative experiences may arise and the wide set of philosophical questions that surround transformative experience.
- 1. Varieties of Transformative Experience
- 2. Epistemology: Can We Know What It’s Like?
- 3. Metaphysics: Can I Become Someone New?
- 4. Decision Theory: Is It Rational to Choose Transformative Experiences?
- 5. Existentialism: Choosing Authentically
- 6. Applied Ethics: In Light of Transformation, How Should We Treat Others?
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Varieties of Transformative Experience
Transformative experiences permeate our everyday lives—at least if we’re to believe the growing literature that has sprung up around this topic. To fully appreciate its significance, this section offers a brief, non-exhaustive sampling of various purported cases of transformative experience. It’s up to the reader to determine whether these examples qualify as transformative in the sense of the strict definition offered above. But perhaps more important than whether each of these qualifies, is the fact that considering whether they do raises important issues that help us better understand the myriad dimensions of our own lives.
Parenthood is Paul’s paradigm case of transformation (2014, 2015a). Prior to having a child, one cannot anticipate what it will be like to become a parent. Further, having a child changes the parent in a personally transformative way. Core preferences and life goals are often reshaped around a new priority: the child. The way the new parent sees the world and perceives terror and joy shifts. Zadie Smith (2013 ) eloquently puts the previously unknown complexity of having a child thusly:
Occasionally the child, too, is a pleasure, though mostly she is a joy, which means in fact she gives us not much pleasure at all but rather that strange admixture of terror, pain, and delight that I have come to recognize as joy and now must find some way to live with daily. This is a new problem. (Smith 2013 [2018, 331])
And of course, the transformation associated with parenthood is not restricted to one’s first biological child. It extends to adopted children, and even can extend beyond humans to feline, canine, and other beings who depend on us and with whom we can bond.
1.2 Sense Modality and Sensory Experiences
Children who grow up in the United States rather than Australia generally don’t experience the distinctive taste of vegemite. People born with color blindness don’t see certain colors. Tasting vegemite and seeing color for the first time are radically new sensory experiences with distinctive phenomenal characters, and probably only involve epistemic transformation. Some people experience even more radical changes when they gain or lose a sense modality. Someone who has always been sighted or hearing cannot appreciate what it is like to be blind or deaf. Likewise, people who have always been blind or deaf cannot appreciate what it is like to be sighted or hearing. In addition to not knowing what gaining or losing a sense modality might be like, one cannot anticipate how that gain or loss might personally change them and the way they navigate the world. The fact that most of society is structured to accommodate sighted and hearing people increases the difference between a change in sense modality. And of course, appreciating the transformative nature of gaining a sense modality carries practical implications since many people are in a position to decide for themselves or others whether to gain a sense modality via surgical interventions.
1.3 Love and Relationships
Love has the power to transform us little by little. In fact, this incremental change is one of the fascinating features of love when put in the context of transformative experience (see Paul 2014). Smiling at a new acquaintance is not transformative, nor is grabbing coffee with them. Once you’ve had coffee, eating dinner together is not transformative either. On and on each step goes. Yet, by the end of things, when you look back at a relationship that’s decades long, you realize that you could not have imagined what it would be like to bond with another person in such an intimate way. The way you approached life, the preferences and life projects you developed, and the way love’s rose-tinted glasses filtered the way you see the world have radically changed you. On the flip side, ending this sort of relationship is also wildly transformative, especially if you’ve formed a sense of identity that revolves around your beloved. Furthermore, because it’s not clear that reason ever requires that you love someone in a romantic way, it’s difficult to explain how choosing love or rejecting it could be done rationally. Thus, opening oneself up to love or boldly ending it invites transformation and raises questions about whether doing so could ever be defended rationally.
1.4 Social Identity
All of us inhabit a place in society that’s determined in part by race, gender, sexual orientation, ability, religion, country of origin, education, socioeconomic status, political affiliation, and much more. Due to contingent but very real injustices, our place in society shapes our experiences. Sometimes, it’s possible to change our place in society (McKinnon 2015 discusses gender transitions and Barnes 2015 offers the fictional case of Pip from Great Expectations), and when we do so, that change is transformative. But the way in which these social changes are transformative underlines some troubling features these social divides have created. First, just as, for instance, Pip, cannot explain to his past self what social elevation is like, it is generally extremely difficult for people in one social group to communicate what it is like to be a member of that group to someone who is outside of it. This partially explains the phenomenon of situated knowledge and also gives rise to the possibility of testimonial epistemic injustice (see, e.g., Fricker 2007). Hermeneutical issues also arise. People’s self-conceptions aren’t developed in a vacuum, and shared norms and concepts contribute to the way in which one’s self-conception can develop, thus influencing the ways in which one can transform. For instance, “brave inspiration” is a readily available self-conception for disabled people while “thriving person in an unconventional body” is not—and this is an unjust state of affairs (Barnes 2015). Social identities and structures contribute an ethically rich dimension to the conversation on transformative experience.
Unfortunately, life also contains tragedies. The trauma of war leaves veterans and civilians physically and emotionally scarred in ways that can change their outlook on life forever. We aren’t morally perfect, and often fail in extremely regrettable ways. To top it all off, people die, sometimes after extended periods of pain and suffering. Experiences of negative valence are often epistemically surprising. There’s no way to predict what the death of a close loved one will feel like, even if the death is anticipated. Life’s tragedies also have the capacity to change who we are. Sometimes, this change can happen for the better. Cashman and Cushman (2020) suggest that although we don’t want to intentionally morally fail, moral failure can often teach incredibly valuable lessons and change how we act for the better. When it comes to death, dying creates a chasm of understanding between those who are dying and those who are not. Chung (2017 [Other Internet Resources]), a philosopher who wrote about his impending death, tells of the chasm that death opens up between those who are dying and those who are not. Truly acknowledging that one is dying changes your priorities and the way you experience the world in a way that can’t be explained to someone who isn’t dying. The same holds for someone forced to witness their beloved slowly fade away. Thompson (2020) offers an insightful meta-point, arguing that dying is an “ultimate” transformation because it forces us to adopt a perspective of our life as a whole that allows us to reconsider which of our prior experiences truly were transformative.
Our beliefs shape who we are, and changes to our core beliefs have the potential to transform us. For instance, De Cruz (2018) and Chan (2016, 2019) argue that religious conversions are transformative. The mission statements of universities appear to acknowledge and strive for transformation among students (Paul & Quiggin 2020). Schwenkler (2020) and Stump (2020) both investigate the nuances of opening oneself up to ideological conversion in light of the potential for doxastic and philosophical transformation, respectively. Crucially, when ideological difference are too great, people lose the ability to adopt the perspective of others. This applies both intrapersonally, such as when we look back at our past selves and marvel at how we believed in Santa Claus, and interpersonally, which leads to the sort of breakdown we see in hyper-polarized political contexts. Speaking of politics, holding office or participating in politics in some deep way might also be transformative, both because they involve encountering people with different perspectives and also because they require representing them in a meaningful way (see Allen 2017). It’s tempting to think that changes in belief are merely epistemically transformative since they clearly change our epistemic states. But in the New Testament (Acts 9), Saul’s conversion on the road to Damascus into the Apostle Paul isn’t just a change in beliefs, it’s a deeper change that completely alters the way he lives his life. The scales falling off his eyes does not merely signify seeing the truth; it also represents a change to who he is.
1.7 Art and Fiction
Paul (2014) opens Transformative Experience with thought experiment about transforming into glamorous, slightly murderous, creatures of the night: vampires. Obviously, none of us actually face this choice. However, rhetorically, thinking about turning into a fictional creature helps motivate the idea that doing so would be both epistemically and personally transformative. After all, who can say for sure what becoming a vampire would really be like or how it would change a person? Furthermore, this case reveals something further about the connection between fiction, art, and transformative experience. It could be that art is transformative—or at least quasi-transformative—because it helps us understand things that we have not (or cannot) experience (Aumann 2022). Furthermore, art and fiction might be transformative from the perspective of the creator as well as the audience. For instance, the expression of oneself through art may be a transformative experience (Riggle 2020). Finally, art clearly involves our imaginations, and imagination may provide a way to gain knowledge about what a transformative is like prior to experiencing it. (More on this in §2.)
2. Epistemology: Can We Know What It’s Like?
Epistemically transformative experiences are experiences where one cannot know what they are like before having them. In the paradigm case of parenthood, the experience of becoming a parent for the first time has “an epistemically unique phenomenal character” (Paul 2015a, 157). One cannot know what these are experiences are like prior to having them.
Prior work, such as Jackson (1986), provides support for this epistemic claim. Jackson’s “What Mary Didn’t Know” invites us to engage in a thought experiment about Mary, a person who has lived in a black and white room her entire life. Prior to encountering color, can Mary know what it is like to see the color red? Does it matter whether Mary is a color scientist who has studied the physics of color and read extensive testimonies about what the color red is like? Jackson’s objective—to show that physicalism is false because it cannot give us knowledge of qualia—applies to transformative experience as well. In general, experiential, or “what it’s like”, knowledge cannot be obtained prior to experience. Thus, what transformative experiences are like cannot be known without having the relevant experience.
Many philosophers reject the claim that one cannot know what transformative experiences are like prior to having them. These rejections tend to center upon one of two strategies. First, one might turn to paradigm cases such parenthood and offer reasons to believe that one can in fact know quite a lot about what it’s like to be a parent prior to becoming one. For instance, Harman (2015) argues that caring for a significantly younger sibling in a quasi-paternal way or witnessing a close friend or family member become a parent provides at least some evidence regarding what becoming a parent is like. Krishnamurthy (2015, 180) offers a similar suggestion, arguing that “we can on the basis of experiences of similar types know what it is like to have a child”. For instance, babysitting or raising a cat shares common elements with parenting. Knowing what these elements are like allows one to know something about what being a parent is like.
Sharadin (2015) offers a variation of this type of strategy that focuses on non-phenomenal elements of parenthood. For instance, becoming a parent typically involves things like financial and sleep deprivation, and we can know that becoming a parent typically involves these things. Plausibly, there is a supervenience relation between these non-phenomenal elements and an agent’s phenomenal experience of them. Further, many people, such as philosophy graduate students, are intimately familiar with the phenomenal experience of financial and sleep deprivation. By building upon the non-phenomenal elements that parenthood shares with other experiences a person has had, that person can develop an idea of what parenthood is like prior to actually experiencing parenthood.
Some empirical research work focusing on how people model uncertainty suggests that people do in fact attempt to use this first strategy of building on what one knows to figure out what one does not know. Zimmerman and Ullman (2020, 73) model epistemic uncertainty and purportedly demonstrate that “people can make informed decisions about trying unfamiliar things”. For instance, suppose that someone encounters an unfamiliar yellow grape. Though they wouldn’t know what the yellow grape is like, they might appeal to their knowledge of what green and red grapes are like to form a judgment about what the yellow grape might be like. At the very least, it seems like they are justified in believing that the yellow grape will not wildly diverge from their other grape experiences. Based on this information, they can rationally choose to try the yellow grape. Even if they are completely unfamiliar with grapes, they might use their knowledge of other fruits to form an informed decision. In general, novel experiences fall into a taxonomy of the types of experiences one might have, and agents can use the next closest experiences to project what the novel one might be like.
Even if this strategy is successful, it’s unclear that it shows that we can know what transformative experiences are like prior to having them. Recall that transformative experiences are supposed to have “unique phenomenal character” (Paul 2015a, 157). If one knows enough about what the experience is like, then it’s not in fact transformative. For instance, Paul (2015b) responds to Harman’s case by suggesting that through having similar enough experiences, Harman might in fact have known what becoming a parent is like. Thus, becoming a parent for the first time would not have been transformative because the relevant transformative experience already occurred earlier. Whether a type of experience is transformative may be agent-relative. Furthermore, while this strategy is promising, some cases may still elude it. For instance, when it comes to gaining or losing a sense modality, it really does seem that the pre-transformed person cannot have any relevantly similar experiences.
The second strategy does not deny that we often don’t know what transformative experiences are like. Rather, it locates our experiential ignorance in a lack of imagination rather than an in principle difference in types of knowledge (i.e., propositional and experiential knowledge). Kind (2020), for instance, argues that the difference between projecting what transformative and non-transformative experiences amounts to a difference of degree rather than kind. Plausibly, it’s possible to imagine what it’s like to babysit for the first time. Further, imagining what it’s like to be a first-time babysitter might be easier than imagining what it’s like to become first-time parent. For someone with a sufficiently good imagination—and our imaginative abilities do also come in degrees—one can gradually scale up from the babysitting experience to the experience of becoming a parent. It may even be that we can augment our imaginations through aids such as art and thus approximate what foreign experiences are like (see Aumann 2022). The effectiveness of artistic aids as well as the understanding gained from them also plausibly admit of degrees. Thus, the imagination strategy can explain why it’s easier to figure out what some experiences are like than others, and why this can vary from individual to individual. Since paradigm transformative experiences tend to be among the most difficult to imagine, positing distinct “what it’s like” knowledge is tempting. However, the difficulty in imagining what paradigm transformative experiences are like merely generates the appearance of a distinct kind of knowledge. The upshot is that in principle, we can know what a transformative experience is like prior to experiencing it.
Arpaly (2020) offers a wrinkle on the imagination strategy, blaming our “crappy” imaginations for our inability to project what transformative experiences are like. Sometimes, what an experience is like is opaque because the “devilish details” of the experience simply haven’t occurred to us. For example, most people have not considered that if a giraffe were to drink coffee, the coffee would cold by the time it reaches the giraffe’s stomach. Other times, we overestimate our ability to imagine things, and our overconfidence prevents us from accepting testimony or other evidence that would be illuminating. These cases can be tragic, such as when a depressed person’s family doesn’t believe their reports of depression. The failure to correctly imagine what things would be like thus causes it to appear as if our lack of experience is the problem, since experience would quickly correct this misimpression. Crucially, there is nothing special about the “what it’s like” quality of these experiences. Though we are ignorant, we are not in principle ignorant and could theoretically figure out what the transformative experience would be like.
Like the first strategy, this second one is most vulnerable when it comes to extreme transformations in experience such as gaining or losing a sense modality. One might also wonder whether the second strategy significantly undermines the core epistemic claim: that one cannot know what transformative experiences are like prior to having them. Even if there is no in principle difference propositional and “what it’s like” knowledge, it does seem like imagination-based responses do acknowledge that some experiences elude our imaginative abilities.
Finally, Moss (2018) offers an interestingly different defense of the claim that we cannot know what a transformative experience is like prior to having it. Moss argues that we often have “probabilistic knowledge”. For instance, suppose that 50% of the people who experience childbirth report that the experience is miraculous. Based on that, it seems reasonable to conclude that there is a 50% chance that experiencing childbirth is miraculous. While an individual can’t know that the experience will be miraculous for them, it does seem that they can know that there’s a 50% chance that the experience will be miraculous for them. But crucially, before one knows that probabilistic claim, one must know that they aren’t exceptional. For instance, suppose it turns out that of the people who decline epidurals, only 10% of them report that the childbirth experience is miraculous. If one is going to decline an epidural, then they do not know that there’s a 50% chance the experience will be miraculous since they are part of a group—what Moss (2018, 173) calls “an alternative reference class”—for whom the probability does not apply. Furthermore, those who can’t rule out that they are in the alternative reference class (in this case, perhaps those who are unsure of whether they will have an epidural) also lack probabilistic knowledge. Plausibly in the case of parenthood and other transformative experiences, probabilistic claims can be formed based on testimony gathered from those who have had the experience. However, it could be that among those giving the testimony, there is significant variance that’s based on whether individuals belong to an alternative reference class. Given the nature of transformative experience, it may be unobvious whether a particular individual has a trait that places them into an alternative reference class. Thus, even if there’s ample data regarding how likely it is to have a particular parenting experience, that won’t result in probabilistic knowledge of what it’s like to be a parent. This defense also works even if it turns out that there isn’t a distinctive “what it’s like” knowledge and our imaginations can sometimes help us understand what foreign experiences are like.
3. Metaphysics: Can I Become Someone New?
Personally transformative experiences are ones that change who an agent is. Certainly, there are epistemic elements associated with personal transformation: agents may not know how an experience will personally transform them and they won’t know what it’s like to be transformed. There might also be de se knowledge, or self-locating knowledge of the kind that occurs when one knows who or where one is within a world (see Lewis 1979). Significantly for the context of transformative experience, de se knowledge can apply to a temporal part of a person, so it’s possible that someone who undergoes a transformative experience will “locate” themselves as being the person who results from the transformation, while their earlier self would have lacked this de se knowledge since they may not have taken the future, radically transformed person to be themselves. In any case, many of the considerations in the previous section apply to these epistemic elements. However, personal transformation also introduces interesting metaphysical issues, and this section focuses upon those.
Paul describes the situation as being one that “radically changes what it is like to be you, perhaps by replacing your core preferences with very different ones” (Paul 2015a, 156). Life goals, core preferences, or the way one experiences the world may constitute part of the change that occurs. Ullmann-Margalit (2006, 159) adds that because our beliefs and desires shape the core of who we are, changes to them turn us into a “different person”. There’s also a terrifying sense of finality since these personal transformations are “irrevocable” (Ullman-Margalit 2006, 160) or at least potentially irrevocable. This picture painted by Paul and Ullmann-Margalit is sometimes characterized as a “Replacement Model” (see Lambert & Schwenkler 2020b, § 5) because the agent contemplating undergoing transformation ends up “replaced” by the transformed person. There’s supposed to be a literal sense in which the pre-transformation agent ceases to exist.
Spelling out the sense in which the agent no longer exists is tricky. Focusing on core features is one natural way to explain the difference between the pre-transformed agent and future transformed person. Perhaps when enough core features are lost, the pre-transformed agent ceases to exist. (In essentialist language, perhaps some of these core features are essential, or such that the agent cannot survive the loss of them.) There’s an open question regarding which of our features count as core in this way, and some empirical studies suggest that we at least do regard some our features as being essential in this way. Molouki, Chen, Urminsky, and Bartels (2020) have done empirical work to see whether people exhibit semi-uniform views about which features are central to their selves. Their findings support earlier work by Strohminger and Nichols (2014) suggesting that features concerning morality (e.g., character traits) and personality are taken to be most central. Changes that are perceived as most drastic involve morality and personality, as well as features that are taken to be causally central. For instance, if someone takes “being a philosopher” to be causally central to how they navigate the world, then they tend to regard losing that feature as a drastic change. Valence and desires also matter: people take negative and undesired change to be more drastic. The explanation for asymmetric valence and desire perceptions rests upon the fact that people project their future selves to undergo positive development, so negative and undesired changes lie outside their self-conception. These finding cohere with many of the sorts of personal transformations that constitute personal transformations.
A second sort of claim that’s frequently made is that the pre-transformed agent cannot identify first-personally with the future transformed person, and vice versa. For instance, Velleman (1996) draws a distinction between imagining what Napoleon saw when looking out at Austerlitz and imagining oneself as Napoleon looking out at Austerlitz. The latter removes all first-personal traces of the imaginer (and is likely impossible to do). Paul (2017) makes a similar claim when distinguishing between affective and cognitive empathy. The former involves projecting our current selves into potential future scenarios, like if I imagine what it will be for me (a childless person) to have a child. It’s akin to the way we empathize with others. The latter is much richer, and it involves experiencing the potential future from the perspective of the future, rather than current self. To cognitively empathize with my future self who has a child, I would have to put myself into the first-personal experience of that person who now has the preferences and perspective of a parent. According to Paul, I lack the ability to cognitively empathize with my future parent self because that self is too unrelated to my current self. In general, we are not able to empathize with our distant future selves, even if those selves haven’t undergone a dramatic transformation. If Velleman and Paul are right, then the severing of the first-personal perspective and empathy that occurs after transformation is one way in which the pre-transformed agent ceases to exist.
Finally, it’s helpful to take a step back and consider the ways in which the future-transformed person is a different person. Suppose that losing central features and a disconnect in first-personal perspective are sufficient for replacing the pre-transformed agent with a new person. How do we explain the connection between the future and past person? On the replacement theory, transformative change results in a new person. Can we coherently say that the pre-transformed person has become the new person? Or does transformation annihilate and replace them?
The trick to explaining how one can become someone new without being annihilated involves articulating two different senses of “sameness”: one in which the past and future persons are the same and one in which they are not. For instance, Glazier (2020) notes that the type of explanation demanded mirrors a debate about whether contingentism is a coherent view. On contingentism, it’s possible that I (or anyone else) could be someone else. Philosophers who champion the necessity of identity tend to reject this claim as straightforwardly absurd. To explain how their account is coherent, the contingentist must identify two senses in which identity claims are necessary. Glazier’s suggestion rests on the claim that that no one’s perspective is impossible. Roughly, there’s a proprial, or perspectival, sense in which a claim like “I am Fred” is necessary. It’s necessary from “I’s” perspective that they are Fred because from their perspective the world is centered upon both the “I” and “Fred”. However, it’s possible that the world could have centered on someone else, say Georgia. In that case, there’s a non-proprial sense in which “I” should have been Georgia. This latter, non-proprial sense in which “I should have been Georgia” generates the contingency of identity.
Chan (2019) offers a different account on which the past and future persons might be the same metaphysically speaking, but different in terms of their practical identities. These practical identities are characterized by the traits that are changed in personal transformation: core preferences, life goals, ways of navigating the world, continuity of first-personal identity, and the like. Importantly, these traits form the person’s self, or at least the self that’s relevant for considerations of self-interest. This explains why ordinary decision-making procedures have difficulty when it comes to transformative experiences. (More on this in the next section.) Furthermore, distinguishing between metaphysical and practical senses of sameness explains the (practical) sense in which the person becomes someone new and the (metaphysical) sense in which they endure and are not annihilated.
4. Decision Theory: Is It Rational to Choose Transformative Experiences?
Transformative experiences present several challenges for traditional models of decision theory. First, the epistemically transformative component of the transformative experience involves a lack of “what it’s like” knowledge. Purportedly, this in turn involves a type of uncertainty that is different from the type of uncertainty decision theory is designed to handle. Second, the personally transformative component means that the post-transformation person may be extremely different from the pre-transformed person. Their preferences may radically change in unpredictable ways, and decision procedures must find a way to accommodate these changing preferences. Third, the personal transformation may be so extreme that the pre-transformed person considering whether to undergo the transformative experience can’t make the decision in the straightforwardly self-interested way that’s presupposed in standard decision-making models. Any of these challenges make using decision-making procedures impossible in the case of transformative experience. And if that’s the case, then it looks like one can’t rationally choose to undergo a transformative experience—the choice is either arational or irrational. Given that so many of our momentous choices in life involve potentially transformative outcomes, it would be disturbing if we discovered that these choices could not be made rationally.
4.1 “What It’s Like” Uncertainty
Standard decision models take probabilities and values as inputs and produce expected values as outputs. For instance, suppose ESPN’s outcome predictor projects the Kansas City Chiefs as having a 50% chance to win the Super Bowl, yet the moneyline, which is based on betting activity, is +105 (meaning that if you bet $100 on them and they win, you receive $105 in winning plus your initial $100 wager). By weighting the possible outcomes with their corresponding probabilities, we can calculate the expected value of betting $100 on the Chiefs:\[ .5(105) + .5 (-100) = 2.5 \]
If one uses a decision procedure where one maximizes expected value, it’s rational to bet on the Chiefs since betting $100 has an expected value of $2.50 while not betting has an expected value of 0 since there are no gains or losses. There are other decision procedures one might use as well. For instance, one might prefer a maximin procedure, in which one chooses the option with the best worst outcome. Since the worst outcome of betting on the Chiefs is losing money and the worst outcome of not betting is neither gaining nor losing money, not betting is the best worst outcome. Thus, a maximin procedure would recommend not betting. Crucially for our purposes, it doesn’t matter which decision procedure one utilizes. Rather, what matters is that values and probabilities (or at least possibilities) are required for any decision procedure to operate.
On the first challenge for decision theory, transformative experiences are epistemically transformative, and agents do not know what the experience will be like. What an experience is like determines the value associated with the experience. At the most basic level, part of what an experience is like involves the pain or pleasure of the experience. Pain detracts from the value of the experience while pleasure enhances it. More complex components of what the experience is like also affect the value of the experience. While some other factors—such as moral or social ones—may affect the value of the experience, what the experience itself is like clearly plays a large role in determining value. Without knowing what the experience is like, agents can’t reliably project its value. If the value of the experience is not known, then the value of any outcome involving transformative experiences also remains unknown. Thus, an agent choosing between options that may involve transformative experience cannot use standard decision procedures since those procedures require values as inputs.
This purported challenge is highly contested. Recall from §2 that many philosopher reject the claim that experiences like parenthood are epistemically transformative (e.g., Harman, Krishnamurthy, etc.). Denying that the experiences are epistemically transformative means that agents can know something about what the experiences are like prior to having them. For instance, the testimony of parents or the non-phenomenal elements of the experience might provide some sense of what becoming a parent is like. If that’s right, then perhaps at least rough values can be used in a decision procedure.
Alternatively, one might grant that we can’t know anything about what transformative experiences are like. Nevertheless, one might still be able to use standard decision procedures since we may know about the values associated with the experience even if we don’t know what the experience is like. For instance, Dougherty, Horowitz, and Sliwa (2015) invite us to consider a mystery box. Everyone who looks into the mystery box has a positive experience, though they cannot describe what the experience is like. On the basis of this information—that the value associated with the box is always positive—one can rationally choose to look in the box without knowing what that will be like.
Similarly, knowing the valence of outcomes can often provide rational grounds on which to make a decision even if what the outcome is like is unknown. Pascal’s Wager offers one such scenario: the infinite positive value of eternal happiness swamps any finite value. Thus, one is rationally justified—or perhaps even required!—to try to believe in God. McKinnon (2015) offers the opposite sort of case by inviting us to consider an individual considering transitioning. Prior to transitioning, many trans people suffer from severe depression and are at risk of suicide. Even if they do not know exactly what it will be like to transition, the alternative is sufficiently horrible, and thus the decision to transition can be rational.
Paul (2015b) suggests that all these responses miss the mark. First, people who choose transformative experience purely on the basis of values without knowing what the experience will be like are not choosing on the basis of what the experience is like. Of course, it can often be appropriate to make choices without considering what the outcomes will be like—cases involving moral stakes are one such scenario. However, in many paradigm cases such as parenthood, agents often do envision what their future lives will be like and base their decisions, at least partially, on that vision. Second, Paul emphasizes the importance of the values being subjective, or assigned by the agent. Because decisions involving transformative experience are personally significant, agents need to make the choice authentically. On Paul’s account, authenticity requires that the agents themselves ascribe value to the experience. (More on authenticity in §5.) Thus, testimony from others about the values they’ve ascribed to an experience won’t help an agent choose authentically for themselves.
4.2 Future Preference Uncertainty
Suppose that the approximate values of associated with outcomes can be known. The second challenge for standard decision theory procedures arises from the fact that transformative experiences have the potential to be personally transformative. Since personal transformation can involve extreme preference changes, the way outcomes are valued might not remain stable from before and after the transformation. For instance, a prospective parent might not value sleep, but once they become a parent confronted with a screaming infant that needs to be fed every few hours throughout the night, the way they value sleep may drastically shift. The values of outcomes used as inputs typically correspond to the preferences of the pre-transformed agent making the decision. If those preferences will shift unpredictably post-transformation, then knowing the values associated with the outcomes still may not be enough to allow an agent to make a rational decision.
In some sense, the challenge of changing preferences blends two familiar problems. First, preferences change over time. For instance, people with the means to save for retirement must balance their current preferences with what they believe will be their future ones. An extreme saver’s later self may look back and wish their earlier self had spent more on vacations. Transformative experiences add a further wrinkle by making the future preferences unknown. Second, changing preferences present a diachronic problem in which past, present, and future preferences must be balanced against each other. Presumably, this balancing involves aggregating all of these preferences, as well as deciding how to weigh them. For instance, many people are near-biased, and tend to weigh the preferences of their current and near-future selves far heavier than the preferences of their distant-future selves. The preferences of past selves rarely receive any attention at all. (Parfit  has a series of thought experiments generating the intuition that it’s better for pain to be in the past, even if past pain is more severe than future pain. Sullivan  and Boonin  offer uncommonly held dissenting views: the former argues for temporal neutrality, or not engaging in any temporal discounting of the past or distant future, while the latter argues that the past preferences—even those belonging to people who are no longer alive—matter.)
Pettigrew (2019) offers a sophisticated account that has two components aimed at tackling both of these problems. The first, aimed at the uncertainty surrounding what the future preferences will be, bears similarity to responses to the challenge of assigning values given the “what it’s like” uncertainty. Basically, just as we can gather information about how people value transformative experiences, we can gather information about how people’s preferences change after undergoing transformative experiences. In an oversimplified example, if it turned out that 95% of new parents would prefer to be childless again, then given that one chooses to have a child, there would be a 95% chance that their future self would have the childless preference while there’d be a 5% chance that their future self would have a child-full preference. Then, just as decision procedures weigh the values of potential outcomes by their likelihood when we make decisions, they could include weighted preferences.
The second component, aimed at tackling the diachronic aspect of changing preferences, introduces a weighted general value function that aggregates the “local” value functions that correspond to the past, present, and future selves that make up the entire life of the agent. Further, the way in which the local value functions are aggregated can incorporate differences in the ways in which local selves handle probability assignments, decision procedures, and the weighing of, e.g., past versus future preferences. Aggregating the local value functions thus begins to resemble a social choice problem. Agents faced with choosing for changing selves ought to maximize the general value function, which aggregates the local value functions accounting for each temporally located local self.
Paul (2022) points out that Pettigrew’s account is vulnerable in two ways. First, the type of solution proposed by Pettigrew likens future selves to third parties. As noted, the weighted general value function closely resembles functions that aggregate individual preferences to group ones in social contexts. But it seems inappropriate to treat our future selves as third persons instead of fully integrated selves—and this is precisely the thrust of the problem that transformative experience presents! Second, it assumes that meaningful intrapersonal comparisons can be made. There’s some empirical work, especially regarding how people with disabilities judge their own welfare, that suggests these comparisons are difficult to make. Pettigrew (2019, § 8.6) attempts to address this issue with his “matching intervals solution”, which attempts to scale the different utility functions to each other. Briggs (2015) offers a prudence-inspired alternative that rests on privileging a person’s actual preferences (as opposed to their counterfactual preferences) without privileging their present preferences (as opposed to privileging present over future ones). Though success of any of these intrapersonal comparisons is an open question, there is widespread agreement that they are necessary to explain how future preferences can matter.
4.3 Self Uncertainty
Finally, the personally transformative aspect of transformative experiences creates the possibility of future selves who are so different from their pre-transformed selves that neither the earlier nor later selves regards the other as being “the same” person. As Ullmann-Margalit (2006, 158) puts it, “big” decisions are “core-affecting” and “transform one’s future self in a significant way” such that one emerges from the situation a different person. As we saw in §3, spelling out the exact sense of in which one can become a different person is tricky. However, examples illustrate how one might regard a temporally related self as a different person, and shed light on the exact nature of the problem for standard decision-making procedures.
Parfit (1984, 326) tells the story of a young Russian who holds his socialist ideals close to his heart. The young Russian also happens descend from the aristocracy, and stands to inherit a fortune when his relatives die. He realizes that when this happens, he may lose his socialist ideals. His instructions to his wife—“if I lose these ideals, I want you to think that I cease to exist”—reveals that he regards that potential future self as a different person. This type of example reinforces Paul’s (2017) claim that we cannot first-personally project into futures that are too distant or different. Agents who fully appreciate the personally transformative element of transformative experiences realize that these experiences may potentially transform them into someone different. Thus, from the perspective of the agent deciding whether to undergo a transformative experience, they must treat outcomes involving transformation as ones in which they may no longer exist.
The possibility of non-existence (or something regarded as equivalent to non-existence) means that even if an agent knows all the fact about value and future preferences, they cannot use standard decision-making procedures in a straightforward way—at least not if they’re self-interested. After all, even if a future transformed self would be incredibly happy and live a good, meaningful life, that doesn’t help the agent contemplating transformation if that future transformed self is not them in the relevant sense. Chan (2019) makes exactly this point in the context of Pascal’s Wager. The infinite happiness of the believer doesn’t benefit the non-believer precisely because becoming transformed by faith would change them into a different person (which in turn undermines the Wager’s appeal to self-interest). This point is closely related to the challenge raised by Paul for Pettigrew’s view in the previous subsection (§4.2). The future self is alien, and though there might be some decision procedure by which to make a rational decision to bring about that future self, that procedure is not the one related to the sense of self-interested that is under discussion.
A response to this challenge requires choosing in a way that bridges the gap between the pre-transformed agent and the future transformed self. Given the nature of transformative experience, it’s difficult to see how this could occur precisely since the pre-transformed agent lacks the ability to connect in the right way to the future transformed self. That connection goes beyond knowing the relevant values, probabilities, and value functions. It gets at the agent’s ability to choose authentically, to which §5 turns.
4.4 Reasonable, Not Rational
Finally, it’s worth considering the possibility that rational choice is simply not possible when it comes to transformative experience. Ullmann-Margalit and Morgenbesser (1977) discuss “picking,” which is characterized by indifference between alternatives, such as when one pick's between cans of the same flavor of Cambell's soup. By stipulation, picking can't appeal to values, preferences, or the sense of rationality discussed above—those things undertermine which alternative is optimal, which gives rise to the indifference in the first place. Importantly for Ullmann-Margalit and Morgenbesser, picking extends beyond trivial “Cambell's soup” choices to bigger ones, including transformative experiences. Even our values and preferences themselves (assuming we have control over them) may be subject to picking, since it's would be circular to appeal to them in order to explain why we hold them. Thus, many of our major life decisions, including potentially transformative ones, are subject to picking, rather than rational choice.
Continuing this line of thought, Ullmann-Margalit (2006) suggests that rather than focusing on acting rational in the sense of “optimizing” (as one does with standard decision-procedures), one ought to focus on “acting reasonably”. For instance, transformation involves both discontinuity in one’s life as well as a point of no return. A reasonable way of navigating choices that involve these two features involves attempting to minimize those features. For instance, a person contemplating a transformative decision like marriage might try to ease into it by first moving in with their potential spouse. Doing so minimizes the discontinuity and gives them an out, which makes the decision revocable. If Ullmann-Margalit is correct in suggesting that one might be able to build up to a transformative experience little by little, this raises an extremely interesting question for transformations that unfold gradually over time. Is it possible that each incremental step can be made rationally while a giant leap to transformation cannot be made rationally?
5. Existentialism: Choosing Authentically
Investigating decisions involving transformative experiences magnifies an existential problem as well. Recall from §4 that many of the strategies for making rational transformative decisions fail to also preserve authenticity. When transformation is on the table, who we are is at stake. And the choice of who we are is more fundamental than the other types of decisions we make. Who we are provides the framework from which we make other choices, so a choice that could change who we are is a choice between frameworks that itself lacks a framework from which to deliberate. As Ullmann-Margalit puts it:
At bottom, we make our most fundamental choices of the canons of morality, logic and rationality in total freedom and without appeal to reasons. They embody acts that this literature variously describes as nihilist, absurd, or leaps (of faith). (2006: 172)
On the flip side, what “this literature” does permit is authentic choice. For instance, deciding to transform without appealing to reason (perhaps because one cannot appeal to reason) coheres well to the Sartrean idea that persons do not antecedently have a particular telos. Rather, we are free to be our authentic selves precisely because are unconstrained and can choose who we want to be.
On this existentialist gloss, authenticity stands in tension with rationality when it comes to transformative experiences. On the one hand, we want to be able to rationally defend our big decisions to have a child, marry a particular person, or commit to a vocation. But on the other, these are the types of decisions that we also want to make authentically, and that doesn’t seem possible if we’re merely following what a decision procedure recommends. In fact, empirical research suggests that people do care deeply about authenticity. Furthermore, people approach decisions perceived to involve authenticity differently from more ordinary ones. Oktar and Lombrozo (2022) gave subjects vignettes in which deciding based on “deliberation” (which was akin to standard decision making) conflicted with deciding based on intuition. For instance, one scenario involved picking between two people with whom to pursue a romantic relationship. One person is a better “on paper” match, and it’s stipulated that you believe the method that determines them as such is accurate. The other person is one with whom you vibe with better in that sort of intangible, gut-feeling sort of way. Subjects leaned strongly toward pursuing a relationship with the latter person (the “intuition” choice) instead of the former (the “deliberation” choice). They also perceived this case as one that involves authenticity. In fact, when a choice was perceived to involve authenticity, subjects favored intuition-based decisions over deliberation-based ones. The preference of for intuition over deliberation raises the question of whether there are non-deliberative (in the sense of standard decision-making) procedures that can help us choose in transformative decisions in a way that preserves authenticity.
In fact, there are accounts that purport to preserve authenticity while also preserving rationality. Paul (2014) favors choosing on the basis of revelation. According to Paul, the decision should be reframed as one that asks whether the agent wants to discover what life will be like and who the agent will become, post-transformation. Essentially, the agent chooses transformation for its own sake. In doing so, the agent chooses rationally by choosing in accordance with the preference for discovery. The agent also chooses authentically by choosing based on the desire to know what the experience will be like for them and who they will become once transformed. The problem is that choosing based on revelation does not always seem appropriate given the import of many transformative experience. For instance, many transformative experiences involve other people, such as becoming a parent or marrying someone. Choosing these experiences on the basis of revelation fails to capture concern for the resulting child or the future spouse. Paul might respond that this objection to revelation is a moral one, and that a similar objection could be levied if the choice were made on the basis of self-interest. Thus, the objection might not count specifically against revelation. However, there’s a second worry, which is that revelation doesn’t help in cases where the decision lies between two transformative outcomes as opposed to a decision between the status quo and one transformative outcome.
Callard (2018) picks up on this last worry and points out that revelation for its own sake lacks a mechanism for valuing different revelations differently. Instead, Callard favors an account based on aspiration and proleptic reasons. For Callard, proleptic reasons are provisional ones aimed at a good to which one aspires but may only have an “inchoate, anticipatory, and indirect grasp”. For instance, someone who aspires to be a wine connoisseur initially lacks any conception of what they are trying to appreciate or experience when they take a sip of wine. Importantly, proleptic reasons allow the aspirant to act rationally when they start the process even though they lack knowledge of what the end goal is like. Interestingly, these types of cases typically lack the sharp discontinuity that are associated with paradigm transformative experiences like parenthood. In fact, Callard suggests that parenthood is not as discontinuous as assumed because potential parents often dedicate a lot of mental energy to the decision and learning all they can about parenthood. What appears to be a climactic “let’s go for it” is “embedded in a longer transformative journey” (Callard 2018, 63). Putting all of this together, transformative decisions can be made rationally via proleptic reasons and are authentic since they result from intentional deliberation about who the agent hopes to become.
Chang (2015) offers an interestingly different way of approaching transformative decision making. Chang starts by distinguishing between event-based and choice-based transformations. The former are the type that fit how transformative experiences are typically described. They involve experiences that are downstream from the choice—like becoming a parent—that transform the agent. The latter is where Chang’s interest lies. Choice-based transformation is one in which “the making of the choice itself transforms you” (Chang 2015, 240). Here, Chang has in mind cases in which one invokes voluntarist reasons when making a decision. Voluntarist reasons are reasons generated by the will that—on Chang’s account—are appropriate when all other existing reasons underdetermine what an agent ought to do. (Chang favors an account in which the will strengthens an existing reasons, but there are other voluntarists like Korsgaard (1996) who hold that the will can create reasons ex nihilo.) Crucially, in willing a voluntarist reason, one simultaneously reveals themself to be the type of person for whom that choice is rational. This type of account also appears to preserve authenticity (since what could be more authentic than one’s own will) and rationality (since adding the voluntarist reason to the mix tips the scales in favor of the choice that’s been made). Of course, voluntarist accounts are somewhat controversial, so Chang’s account of how to make transformative choices would inherit all the worries that voluntarism does.
Alhough these accounts—Paul’s, Callard’s, or Chang’s—all face worries, it is worth noting that if any of them work, then there is a way to preserve both authenticity and rationality even while respecting the original challenge of transformative experience to standard decision making procedures. None require knowing what the experience will be like or who will come out the other end. Nevertheless, one can still rationally and authentically plunge into the unknown.
6. Applied Ethics: In Light of Transformation, How Should We Treat Others?
Transformative experiences also demand that we revisit how we treat others in light of the fact that they potentially may undergo transformative experiences. As seen in §1, transformation may arise in many contexts, far too many to attempt to tackle here. Instead, this section will focus on three types of contexts in which the issue of how we should treat others given the possibility of transformation might arise: when we choose for others, when we make long-term decisions involving others, and when we create environments that (dis)favor transformation.
6.1 Choosing for Others
Plausibly, it’s wrong to interfere with the autonomy of others, especially when it comes to important personal decisions. As Akhlaghi (2022, 7) points out, interference is even less defensible when others are choosing to undergo transformative experiences because there is a
moral duty not to interfere with the autonomous self-making of others, through their choosing to undergo transformative experience to discover who they will become.
However, people often find themselves in situations in which they need to make decisions on behalf of others that may lead to transformative experiences. In fact, those who take the leap and become parents then find themselves in a position to make transformative decisions on behalf of their children. For instance, some parents of deaf children must decide whether to get cochlear implants for their child. Ideally, children receive these implants when they are extremely young, usually before the age of three. The early age at which the decision must be made forces parents to choose on behalf of their children. In addition to being a choice that affects how their children will perceive and navigate the world, the choice carries incredibly significant social consequences. Deaf communities offer distinctive goods that hearing communities cannot, and vice versa. Furthermore, as disability advocates point out, the difference between being deaf and non-deaf is “mere-difference” rather than “bad-difference” (see, e.g., Barnes 2014). This offers a further reason to believe that the decision to give a child a cochlear implant is a transformative one that must be made on the basis of the child’s future experiences as deaf or hearing as opposed to on the basis of value.
Put this way, parental choices, especially significant ones like deciding whether to get a child a cochlear implant, also resemble the non-identity problem. Parfit (1984) raises the non-identity problem as a puzzle for decisions that affect who will exist in the future. For instance, suppose a potential parent is choosing between implanting one of two embryos, and chooses one that has a genetic defect that causes monthly migraines that the other embryo lacks. Given that there are no other relevant differences between the two embryos, it appears that the parent has done something wrong by bringing into existence a person who will have a lower level of welfare than the other person who could have existed instead. However, it’s not obvious who the potential parent has harmed. Assuming the migraine-inflicted person prefers existing to never having existed, they have not been harmed since the alternative is non-existence. If that’s right, then perhaps the parents have done nothing wrong since no one has been harmed.
Similarly, the personally transformative aspect of transformative experiences affects who exists after undergoing the experience. Receiving a cochlear implant and growing up in a hearing community will transform the child into a radically different person from who the child would be if they did not receive an implant and grew up in a deaf community. The person who develops won’t have grounds to complain since wishing their parents had chosen otherwise would be like wishing they did not exist. But even if one does not believe that the cochlear implant is an existence-affecting decision point, the fact that the two potential futures are so foreign to each other means that a person situated in one of those futures cannot project what it would be like to have had the other life. If the earlier points about projecting value are correct, the person who has grown up in the deaf community cannot assign a subjective value to the alternate life in which they had the cochlear implant, and vice versa. Without those value assignments, it doesn’t appear that either person can claim that they would have been better off in the alternate scenario. Thus, whether the person receives the cochlear implant or not, articulating how that transformation harmed them will be challenging. Perhaps the parent can choose either option without harming or wronging anyone. The situation is also similar from the perspective of the parents and their preferences, for they will have grown to love their child and the particular person into whom they have developed.
Philosophers diverge on how parents should choose in these cases. (See, e.g., Harman (2015) for an interesting discussion on when “I’ll be glad I did it” reasoning is appropriate.) However, there’s a more interesting lesson to be drawn from these types of cases. Recall from §4.1 and §4.2 that Paul objects to certain types of decision-making strategies because they treat future selves as if they were third persons rather than integrated parts of the same self. These cases show that even in the third person case, standard decision-making procedures are not particularly helpful. Transformative experiences still create major challenges for decision-making.
At the other end of life, decisions must sometimes be made for people post-transformation. People suffering from dementia or Alzheimer’s transform in myriad ways, and their preferences often diverge from the preferences of their earlier selves. Sometimes, these preferences regard end of life care. Since the person with dementia or Alzheimer’s is not considered legally competent to change their advanced directives, others must make important medical decisions on their behalf. These people must decide whether to respect the preferences of the past self, or the current one. In some ways, this a questions about the weight that ought to be assigned to past preferences, and we might resolve in the way Pettigrew (2019) suggests by constructing a general value function that aggregates the past and current preferences. However, if the personal transformation is taken seriously, the current self is a different person. Binding them to the preferences of the past self is akin to binding them to the preferences of another person.
6.2 Long Term Decisions
In addition to transforming in the early and late stages of life, people transform throughout their lives, either via momentous “big” changes or via an accumulation of “small” changes. Long-term decisions must factor the potential for transformative change into account. For instance, Lackey (2020) and Chan (2020) independently address this issue in the context of punishment. Lackey’s argument demands that those with the power to issue long-term punishments, like judges, must consider the possibility of transformative change. Plausibly, punishment should be sensitive to the relevant evidence available at that time. We know that people change, often in transformative ways, and imprisonment seems like exactly the type of experience that would be transformative. Issuing strict, long-term prison sentences—such as life sentences without the possibility of parole—screens off the possibility of taking relevant future evidence into account. Thus, recognizing the possibility of transformation offers a powerful argument for sentencing reform.
Extended partnerships also provide another context in which transformative changes need to be accounted for when making long term decisions. For instance, marriage vows typically involve some type of life-long pledge. And, as anyone familiar with married people knows, people change in ways that disrupt the marriage. In a way, identifying these changes as transformative makes sense of an already common phenomenon. But it also raises a further question: how can one felicitously make a life-long promise to someone knowing that both they and their partner may transform in a way involving a radical shift of preferences and life goals? The centrality of transformation to this decision is doubled because the marriage itself is often transformative. It’s true that transformations connected with relationships tend to involve incremental changes because the relationship develops incrementally. But these incremental changes can lead people away from each other and won’t be noticeable until the larger schism develops due to their incremental nature.
These long-term decisions involving others suggest that the normative questions transformative experiences raise go beyond self-interested decision making. Furthermore, some of the proposed ways of making transformative decisions have interesting implications for these types of cases. For instance, Ullmann-Margalit suggests that there simply is not a rational way to make transformative decisions. Applying that to these cases gives the radical result that decision to marry or sentence someone to prison cannot be made rationally! Ullmann-Margalit’s further suggestion that perhaps these decisions can be made reasonably also has interesting implications. She suggests that minimizing the discontinuity of a big decision and backing off the point of no return might help, and includes moving in before marriage as one such way to ease reasonably into a big decision like marriage. The application for the prison case is even more interesting, for it suggests that life in prison should not be such a radical departure from life outside of it, and that there must be meaningful short term possibilities for parole.
6.3 Transformative Environments
Finally, special attention must be paid to our social environments since they shape the way in which members of society may transform. Education provides the most obvious instance of this. Fights over parental rights to control their children’s educations are so contentious precisely because early experiences shape who children grow up to become. Even higher education is taken to have a transformative goal (see Paul & Quiggin 2020). College students are typically in their early twenties—the last age at which people tend to undergo radical change before developing fairly stable preferences and goals that tend to endure through most of adulthood. In addition, the transformative environment of education shapes more than the individual students who experience it. Students go on to become members of society who in turn create an environment that will shape those who come after them. Morton (2021) points out that this tends to have a self-reinforcing effect because elite institutions like the Ivy League schools disproportionately influence social policy. Even if students enter these institutions without the goal of maintaining the status quo of the elite, by the time they graduate, they can be transformed into members of the elite who are now invested in safeguarding the interests of their newfound group. This, in turn, shapes social policies that reinforce which transformative experiences are most readily available to members of society.
This idea that social policies can shape individual choices and preferences creates both an opportunity and a responsibility to reconsider which policies ought to be adopted in light of the potential for transformative experience. For instance, Pettigrew (2023) examines the concept of nudging introduced by Thaler and Sunstein (2008). In a nutshell, nudging is a sort of intervention that pushes people toward making a particular choice while leaving open the possibility that they choose otherwise. Opt-out retirement programs offer a paradigm case of nudging since they increase the likelihood that people will put money away for retirement while still allowing people the ability to opt-out. Thaler and Sunstein label nudging policies as “libertarian paternalism” because while these interventions look paternalistic, they purportedly help people make the decision that their future idealized selves will deem to be best “as judged by themselves” (Thaler and Sunstein 2008, 4). Of course, if the decisions are transformative, or incremental parts of multiple decisions that become transformative, simply looking at the judgment of the future self does not seem appropriate at all! (And Pettigrew makes precisely this argument before proposing a modification to the “as judged by themselves” test that’s based on his weighted general value function.)
There are at least two bigger-picture issues that come out of this discussion of nudging people, potentially toward transformation. First, the norms regarding nudging people toward potential transformation requires further examination. Most policies, nudging or otherwise, exhibit some degree of interventionism. In addition to which transformations might be preferable for society as a whole, there’s also the question of whether we should adopt policies that maximize individual autonomy. Second, we might wonder why nudging works in the first place, and if it really does work for transformative experiences. Recall that part of the nature of transformative experiences is that one cannot know what they will be like or how they will change prior to having the experience. Nudging, on the other hand, only works if these things are somewhat predictable. Of course, unpredictability with respect to an individual is compatible with predictability with respect to overall social trends. But, if nudging really works, it does lend credence to the idea certain elements of transformative experience are predictable and perhaps strengthens the case of those from §4 who believe that one can make rational choices with respect to transformative experiences.
Finally, we’ve structured our society in many unfortunate ways. This goes beyond the discrimination that people suffer on the basis of race, sex, ability, socioeconomic status, and the like. More subtle conceptual structures shape and limit the way we form our self-identities. These injustices are obviously bad in themselves, and they also interact with transformative experience in a way that furthers the injustice. Barnes (2015) argues that one’s “self-conception and self-identity aren’t developed in cultural isolation” and that “social norms and structures make certain ways of interpreting or thinking about ourselves readily available” (185). For example, society makes it easy for women to “re-shape their self-conception to cohere with the image of a dutiful, submissive wife” (186). Similarly, “brave inspiration” is a readily available self-conception for disabled people while “thriving person in an unconventional body” is not (185–186). These states of affairs are bad for women and disabled people. Since personal transformation involves changes to one’s self-conception, society plays an outsized role in the types of transformations that are available to us.
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Other Internet Resources
- Chung, Ken, 2017, “Is Dying a Transformative Experience?”, Ken Chung’s blog, 23 August 2017,
- Paul, L.A., “Teaching Guide for Transformative Experience”
- “L.A. Paul on Transformative Experience”, Philosophy Bites Podcast, 8 October, 2022
- “Transformative Experiences”, Philosophy Talk Podcast, 16 November 2014