The Identity Theory of Truth

First published Fri May 1, 2015; substantive revision Tue Dec 29, 2020

The identity theory of truth was influential in the formative years of modern analytic philosophy, and has come to prominence again recently. Broadly speaking, it sees itself as a reaction against correspondence theories of truth, which maintain that truth-bearers are made true by facts. The identity theory maintains, against this, that at least some truth-bearers are not made true by, but are identical with, facts. The theory is normally applied not at the level of declarative sentences, but to what such sentences express. It is these items—or, again, some of them—that are held to be identical with facts. Identity theorists diverge over the details of this general picture, depending on what exactly they take declarative sentences to express, whether Fregean thoughts (at the level of sense), Russellian propositions (at the level of reference), or both, and depending also on how exactly facts are construed. But, to give a precise illustration, an identity theorist who thinks that declarative sentences express Russellian propositions will typically hold that true such propositions are identical with facts. The significance of the identity theory, for its supporters, is that it appears to make available the closing of a certain gap that might otherwise be thought to open up between language and world and/or between mind and world. If its supporters are right about this, the identity theory of truth potentially has profound consequences both in metaphysics and in the philosophies of mind and language.

1. Definition and Preliminary Exposition

Declarative sentences seem to take truth-values, for we say things like

“Socrates is wise” is true.

But sentences are apparently not the only bearers of truth-values: for we also seem to allow that what such sentences express, or mean, may be true or false, saying such things as

“Socrates is wise” means that Socrates is wise,[1]


That Socrates is wise is true


It is true that Socrates is wise.

If, provisionally, we call the things that declarative sentences express, or mean, their contents—again provisionally, these will be such things as that Socrates is wise—then the identity theory of truth, in its most general form, states that (cf. Baldwin 1991: 35):

A declarative sentence’s content is true just if that content is (identical with) a fact.

A fact is here to be thought of as, very generally, a way things are, or a way the world is. On this approach, the identity theory secures an intimate connection between language (what language expresses) and world. Of course there would in principle be theoretical room for a view that identified not the content of, say, the true declarative sentence “Socrates is wise”—let us assume from now on that this sentence is true—with the fact that Socrates is wise, but rather that sentence itself. But this is not a version of the theory that anyone has ever advanced, nor does it appear that it would be plausible to do so (see Candlish 1999b: 200–2; Künne 2003: 6). The early Wittgenstein does regard sentences as being themselves facts, but they are not identical with the facts that make them true.

Alternatively, and using a different locution, one might say that, to continue with the same example,

That Socrates is wise is true just if that Socrates is wise is the case.

The idea here is that (6) makes a connection between language and reality: on the left-hand side we have something expressed by a piece of language, and on the right-hand side we allude to a bit of reality. Now (6) might look truistic, and that status has indeed been claimed for the identity theory, at least in one of its manifestations. John McDowell has argued that what he calls true “thinkables” are identical with facts (1996: 27–8, 179–80). Thinkables are things like that Socrates is wise regarded as possible objects of thought. For we can think that Socrates is wise; and it can also be the case that Socrates is wise. So the idea is that what we can think can also be (identical with) what is the case. That identity, McDowell claims, is truistic. On this approach, one might prefer one’s identity theory to take the form (cf. Hornsby 1997: 2):

All true thinkables are (identical with) facts.

On this approach the identity theory explicitly aims to secure an intimate connection between mind (what we think) and world.

A point which has perhaps been obscured in the literature on this topic, but which should be noticed, is that (7) asserts a relation of subordination: it says that true thinkables are a (proper or improper) subset of facts; it implicitly allows that there might be facts that are not identical with true thinkables. So (7) is not to be confounded with its converse,

All facts are (identical with) true thinkables,

which asserts the opposite subordination, and says that facts are a (proper or improper) subset of true thinkables, implicitly allowing, this time, that there might be true thinkables that are not identical with facts. (8) is therefore distinct from (7), and if (7) is controversial, (8) is equally or more so, but for reasons that are at least in part different. (8) denies the existence of facts that cannot be grasped in thought. But many philosophers hold it to be evident that there are, or at least could be, such facts—perhaps certain facts involving indefinable real numbers, for example, or in some other way going beyond the powers of human thought. So (8) could be false; its status remains to be established; it can hardly be regarded as truistic. Accordingly, one might expect that an identity theorist who wished to affirm (7), and certainly anyone who wanted to say that (7) (or (6)) was truistic, would—at least qua identity theorist—steer clear of (8), and leave its status sub judice. In fact, however, a good number of identity theorists, both historical and contemporary, incorporate (8) as well as—or even instead of—(7) into their statement of the theory. Richard Cartwright, who published the first modern discussion of the theory in 1987, wrote that if one were formulating the theory, it would say “that every true proposition is a fact and every fact a true proposition” (1987: 74). McDowell states that

true thinkables already belong just as much to the world as to minds [i.e., (7)], and things that are the case already belong just as much to minds as to the world [i.e., (8)]. It should not even seem that we need to choose a direction in which to read the claim of identity. (2005: 84)

Jennifer Hornsby takes the theory to state that true thinkables and facts coincide (1997: 2, 9, 17, 20)—they are the same set—so that she in effect identifies that theory with the conjunction of (7) and (8), as also, in effect, does Julian Dodd (2008a: passim). Now, (8) is certainly an interesting thesis that merits much more consideration than it has hitherto received (at least in the recent philosophical literature), and, as indicated, some expositions of the identity theory have as much invested in (8) as in (5) or (7): on this point see further §2 below. Nevertheless, it will make for clarity of discussion if we associate the identity theory of truth, more narrowly, with something along the lines of (5) or (7), and omit (8) from this particular discussion.[2] That will be the policy here.

Whether or not (6) is truistic, both (5) and (7) involve technical or semi-technical vocabulary; moreover, they have been advanced as moves in a technical debate, namely one concerning the viability of the correspondence theory of truth. For these reasons it seems difficult to regard them as truisms (see Dodd 2008a: 179). What (5) and (7) mean, and which of them one will prefer as one’s statement of the identity theory of truth, if one is favorably disposed to that theory—one may of course be happy with both—will depend, among other things, on what exactly one thinks about the nature of such entities as that Socrates is wise. In order to get clear on this point, discussion of the identity theory has naturally been conducted in the context of the Fregean semantical hierarchy, which distinguishes between levels of language, sense, and reference. Frege recognized what he called “thoughts” (Gedanken) at the level of sense corresponding to (presented by) declarative sentences at the level of language. McDowell’s thinkables are meant to be Fregean thoughts: the change of terminology is intended to stress the fact that these entities are not thoughts in the sense of dated and perhaps spatially located individual occurrences (thinking events), but are abstract contents that are at least in principle available to be grasped by different thinkers at different times and places. So a Fregean identity theory of truth would regard both such entities as that Socrates is wise and, correlatively, facts as sense-level entities: this kind of identity theory will then state that true such entities are identical with facts. This approach will naturally favor (7) as its expression of the identity theory.

By contrast with Frege, Russell abjured the level of sense and (at least around 1903–4) recognized what, following Moore, he called “propositions” as worldly entities composed of objects and properties. A modern Russellian approach might adopt these propositions—or something like them: the details of Russell’s own conception are quite vague—as the referents of declarative sentences, and identity theorists who followed this line might prefer to take a particular reading of (5) as their slogan. So these Russellians would affirm something along the lines of:

All true Russellian propositions are identical with facts (at the level of reference),

by contrast with the Fregean

All true Fregean thoughts are identical with facts (at the level of sense).

This way of formulating the relevant identity claims has the advantage of suggesting that it would, at least in principle, be open to a theorist to combine (9) and (10) in a hybrid position that (i) departed from Russell and followed Frege by admitting both a level of Fregean sense and one of reference, and also, having admitted both levels to the semantic hierarchy, (ii) both located Fregean thoughts at the level of sense and located Russellian propositions at the level of reference. Sense being mode of presentation of reference, the idea would be that declarative sentences refer, via Fregean thoughts, to Russellian propositions (for this disposition, see Gaskin 2006: 203–20; 2008: 56–127). So someone adopting this hybrid approach would affirm both (9) and (10). Of course, the facts mentioned in (9) would be categorially different from the facts mentioned in (10), and one might choose to avoid confusion by distinguishing them terminologically, and perhaps also by privileging one set of facts, ontologically, over the other. If one wanted to follow this privileging strategy, one might say, for instance, that only reference-level facts were genuine facts, the relata of the identity relation at the level of sense being merely fact-like entities, not bona fide facts. That would be to give the combination of (9) and (10) a Russellian spin. Alternatively, someone who took the hybrid line might prefer to give it a Fregean spin, saying that the entities with which true Fregean thoughts were identical were the genuine facts, and that the corresponding entities at the level of reference that true Russellian propositions were identical with were not facts as such, but fact-like correlates of the genuine facts. Without more detail, of course, these privileging strategies leave the status of the entities they are treating as merely fact-like unclear; and, as far as the Fregean version of the identity theory goes, commentators who identify facts with sense-level Fregean thoughts usually, as we shall see, repudiate reference-level Russellian propositions altogether, rather than merely downgrading their ontological status, and so affirm (10) but reject (9). We shall return to these issues in §4 below.

2. Historical Background

The expression “the identity theory of truth” was first used—or, at any rate, first used in the relevant sense—by Stewart Candlish in an article on F. H. Bradley published in 1989. But the general idea of the theory had been in the air during the 1980s: for example, in a discussion first published in 1985, concerning John Mackie’s theory of truth, McDowell criticized that theory for making

truth consist in a relation of correspondence (rather than identity) between how things are and how things are represented as being. (1985 [1998: 137 n. 21])

The implication is that identity would be the right way to conceive the given relation. And versions of the identity theory go back at least to Bradley (see, e.g., Bradley 1914: 112–13; for further discussion and references, see Candlish 1989; 1995; 1999b: 209–12; T. Baldwin 1991: 36–40), and to the founding fathers of the analytic tradition (Sullivan 2005: 56–7 n. 4). The theory can be found in G. E. Moore’s “The Nature of Judgment” (1899), and in the entry he wrote on “Truth” for J. Baldwin’s Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology (1902–3; reprinted Moore 1993: 4–8, 20–1; see T. Baldwin 1991: 40–3). Russell embraced the identity theory at least during the period of his 1904 discussions of Meinong (see, e.g., 1973: 75), possibly also in his The Principles of Mathematics of 1903, and for a few years after these publications as well (see T. Baldwin 1991: 44–8; Candlish 1999a: 234; 1999b: 206–9). Frege has a statement of the theory in his 1919 essay “The Thought”, and may have held it earlier (Frege 1918–19: 74 [1977: 25]; see Hornsby 1997: 4–6; Milne 2010: 467–8).

Wittgenstein’s Tractatus (1922) is usually held to propound a correspondence rather than an identity theory of truth; however this is questionable. In the Tractatus, declarative sentences (Sätze) are said to be facts (arrangements of names), and states of affairs (Sachlagen, Sachverhalte, Tatsachen) are also said to be facts (arrangements of objects). If the Tractatus is taken to put forward a correspondence theory of truth, then presumably the idea is that a sentence will be true just if there is an appropriate relation of correspondence (an isomorphism) between sentence and state of affairs. However, the problem with this interpretation is that, in the Tractatus, a relation of isomorphism between a sentence and reality is generally conceived as a condition of the meaningfulness of that sentence, not specifically of its truth. False sentences, as well as true, are isomorphic with states of affairs—only, in their case the states of affairs do not obtain. For Wittgenstein, states of affairs may either obtain or fail to obtain—both possibilities are, in general, available to them.[3] Correlatively, it has been suggested that the Tractatus contains two different conceptions of fact, a factive and a non-factive one. According to the former conception, facts necessarily obtain or are the case; according to the latter, facts may fail to obtain or not be the case. This non-factive conception has been discerned at Tractatus 1.2–1.21, and at 2.1 (see Johnston 2013: 382). Given that, in the Tractatus, states of affairs (and perhaps facts) have two poles—obtaining or being the case, and non-obtaining or not being the case—it seems to follow that, while Wittgenstein is committed to a correspondence theory of meaning, his theory of truth must be (some version of) an identity theory, along the lines of

A declarative sentence is true just if what it is semantically correlated with is identical with an obtaining state of affairs (a factive fact).

(Identity theorists normally presuppose the factive conception of facts, so that “factive” is redundant in the phrase “factive facts”, and that is the policy which will be followed here.) Though a bipolar conception of facts (if indeed Wittgenstein has it) may seem odd, the bipolar conception of states of affairs (which, it is generally agreed, he does have) seems quite natural: here the identity theorist says that a true proposition is identical with an obtaining state of affairs (see Candlish & Damnjanovic 2018: 271–2).

Peter Sullivan has suggested a different way of imputing an identity theory to the Tractarian Wittgenstein (2005: 58–9). His idea is that Wittgenstein’s simple objects are to be identified with Fregean senses, and that in effect the Tractatus contains an identity theory along the lines of (7) or (10). Sullivan’s ground for treating Tractarian objects as senses is that, like bona fide Fregean senses, they are transparent: they cannot be grasped in different ways. An apparent difficulty with this view is that there is plausibly more to Fregean sense than just the property of transparency: after all, Russell also attached the property of transparency to his basic objects, but it has not been suggested that Russellian basic objects are really senses, and the suggestion would seem to have little going for it (partly, though not only, because Russell himself disavowed the whole idea of Fregean sense).The orthodox position, which will be presupposed here, is that the Tractarian Wittgenstein like Russell, finds no use for a level of Fregean sense, so that his semantical hierarchy consists exclusively of levels of language and reference, with nothing of a mediatory or similar nature located between these levels. (Wittgenstein does appeal to the concepts of sense and reference in the Tractatus, but it is generally agreed that they do not figure in a Fregean way, according to which both names and sentences, for example, have both sense and reference; for Wittgenstein, by contrast, sentences have sense but not reference, whereas names have reference but not sense.)

3. Motivation

What motivates the identity theory of truth? It can be viewed as a response to difficulties that seem to accrue to at least some versions of the correspondence theory (cf. Dodd 2008a: 120, 124). The correspondence theory of truth holds that truth consists in a relation of correspondence between something linguistic or quasi-linguistic, on the one hand, and something worldly on the other. Generally, the items on the worldly end of the relation are taken to be facts or (obtaining) states of affairs. For many purposes these two latter kinds of entity (facts, obtaining states of affairs) are assimilated to one another, and that strategy will be followed here. The exact nature of the correspondence theory will then depend on what the other relatum is taken to be. The items mentioned so far make available three distinct versions of the correspondence theory, depending on whether this relatum is taken to consist of declarative sentences, Fregean thoughts, or Russellian propositions. Modern correspondence theorists make a distinction between truth-bearers, which would typically fall under one of these three classifications, and truth-makers,[4] the worldly entities making truth-bearers true, when they are true. If these latter entities are facts, then true declarative sentences, Fregean thoughts, or Russellian propositions—whichever of these one selects as the relata of the correspondence relation on the language side of the language–world divide—correspond to facts in the sense that facts are what make those sentences, thoughts, or propositions true, when they are true. (Henceforth we shall normally speak simply of thoughts and propositions, understanding these to be Fregean thoughts and Russellian propositions respectively, unless otherwise specified.)

That, according to the correspondence theorist (and the identity theorist can agree so far), immediately gives us a constraint on the shape of worldly facts. Take our sample sentence “Socrates is wise”, and recall that this sentence is here assumed to be true. At the level of reference we encounter the object Socrates and (assuming realism about properties)[5] the property of wisdom. Both of these may be taken to be entities in the world, but it is plausible that neither amounts to a fact: neither amounts to a plausible truth-maker for the sentence “Socrates is wise”, or for its expressed thought, or for its expressed proposition. That is because the man Socrates, just as such, and the property of wisdom, just as such, are not, so the argument goes, propositionally structured, either jointly or severally, and so do not amount to enough to make it true that Socrates is wise (cf. D. Armstrong 1997: 115–16; Dodd 2008a: 7; Hofweber 2016: 288). Even if we add in further universals, such as the relation of instantiation, and indeed the instantiation of instantiation to any degree, the basic point seems to be unaffected. In fact it can plausibly be maintained (although some commentators disagree; Merricks 2007: ch. 1, passim, and pp. 82, 117, 168; Asay 2013: 63–4; Jago 2018: passim, e.g., pp. 73, 84, 185, 218, 250, though cf. p. 161) that the man Socrates, just as such, is not even competent to make it true that Socrates exists; for that we need the existence of the man Socrates. Hence, it would appear that, if there are to be truth-makers in the world, they will have to be structured, syntactically or quasi-syntactically, in the same general way as declarative sentences, thoughts, and propositions. For convenience we can refer to structure in this general sense as “propositional structure”: the point then is that neither Socrates, nor the property of wisdom, nor (if we want to adduce it) the relation of instantiation is, just as such, propositionally structured. Following this line of argument through, we reach the conclusion that nothing short of full-blown, propositionally structured entities like the fact that Socrates is wise will be competent to make the sentence “Socrates is wise”, or the thought or proposition expressed by that sentence, true. (A question that arises here is whether tropes might be able to provide a “thinner” alternative to such ontologically “rich” entities as the fact that Socrates is wise. One problem that seems to confront any such strategy is that of making the proposed alternative a genuine one, that is, of construing the relevant tropes in such a way that they do not simply collapse into, or ontologically depend on, entities of the relatively rich form that Socrates is wise. For discussion see Dodd 2008a: 7–9.)

The question facing the correspondence theorist is now: if such propositionally structured entities are truth-makers, are they truth-makers for sentences, thoughts, or propositions? It is at this point that the identity theorist finds the correspondence theory unsatisfactory. Consider first the suggestion that the worldly fact that Socrates is wise is the truth-maker for the reference-level proposition that Socrates is wise (see, e.g., Jago 2018: 72–3, and passim). There surely are such facts as the fact that Socrates is wise: we talk about such things all the time. The problem would seem to be not with the existence of such facts, but rather with the relation of correspondence which is said by the version of the correspondence theory that we are currently considering to obtain between the fact that Socrates is wise and the proposition that Socrates is wise. As emerges from this way of expressing the difficulty, there seems to be no linguistic difference between the way we talk about propositions and the way we talk about facts, when these entities are specified by “that” clauses. That suggests that facts just are true propositions. If that is right, then the relation between facts and true propositions is not one of correspondence—which, as Frege famously observed (Frege 1918–19: 60 [1977: 3]; cf. Künne 2003: 8; Milne 2010: 467–8), implies the distinctness of the relata—but identity.

This line of argument can be strengthened by noting the following point about explanation. Correspondence theorists have typically wanted the relation of correspondence to explain truth: they have usually wanted to say that it is because the proposition that Socrates is wise corresponds to a fact that it is true, and because the proposition that Socrates is foolish—or rather: It is not the case that Socrates is wise (after all, his merely being foolish is not enough to guarantee that he is not wise, for he might, like James I and VI, be both wise and foolish)—does not correspond to a fact that it is false. But the distance between the true proposition that Socrates is wise and the fact that Socrates is wise seems to be too small to provide for explanatory leverage. Indeed the identity theorist’s claim is that there is no distance at all. Suppose we ask: Why is the proposition that Socrates is wise true? If we reply by saying that it is true because it is a fact that Socrates is wise, we seem to have explained nothing, but merely repeated ourselves (cf. Strawson 1971: 197; Anscombe 2000: 8; Rasmussen 2014: 39–43). So correspondence apparently gives way to identity as the relation which must hold or fail to hold between a proposition and a state of affairs if the proposition is to be true or false: the proposition is true just if it is identical with an obtaining state of affairs and false if it is not (cf. Horwich 1998: 106). And it would seem that, if the identity theorist is right about this disposition, explanatory pretensions will have to be abandoned: for while it will be correct to say that a proposition is true just if it is identical with a fact, false otherwise, it is hard to see that much of substance has thereby been said about truth (cf. Hornsby 1997; 2; Dodd 2008a; 135).

It might be replied here that there are circumstances in which we tolerate statements of the form “A because B” when an appropriate identity—perhaps even identity of sense, or reference, or both—obtains between “A” and “B”. For example, we say things like “He is your first cousin because he is a child of a sibling of one of your parents” (Künne 2003: 155). But here it is plausible that there is a definitional connection between left-hand side and right-hand side, which seems not to hold of

The proposition that Socrates is wise is true because it is a fact that Socrates is wise.

In the latter case there is surely no question of definition; rather, we are supposed, according to the correspondence theorist, to have an example of metaphysical explanation, and that is just what, according to the identity theorist, we do not have. After all, the identity theorist will insist, it seems obvious that the relation, whatever it is, between the proposition that Socrates is wise and the fact that Socrates is wise must, given that the proposition is true, be an extremely close one: what could this relation be? If the identity theorist is right that the relation cannot be one of metaphysical explanation (in either direction), then it looks as though it will be hard to resist the insinuation of the linguistic data that the relation is one of identity.

It is for this reason that identity theorists sometimes insist that their position should not be defined in terms of an identity between truth-bearer and truth-maker: that way of expressing the theory looks too much in thrall to correspondence theorists’ talk (cf. Candlish 1999b: 200–1, 213). For the identity theorist, to speak of both truth-makers and truth-bearers would imply that the things allegedly doing the truth-making were distinct from the things that were made true. But, since in the identity theorist’s view there are no truth-makers distinct from truth-bearers, if the latter are conceived as propositions, and since nothing can make itself true, it follows that there are no truth-makers simpliciter, only truth-bearers. It seems to follow, too, that it would be ill-advised to attack the identity theory by pointing out that some (or all) truths lack truth-makers (so Merricks 2007: 181): so long as truths are taken to be propositions, that is exactly what identity theorists themselves say. From the identity theorist’s point of view, truth-maker theory looks very much like an exercise in splitting the level of reference in half and then finding a bogus match between the two halves (see McDowell 1998: 137 n. 21; Gaskin 2006: 203; 2008: 119–27). For example, when David Armstrong remarks that

What is needed is something in the world which ensures that a is F, some truth-maker or ontological ground for a’s being F. What can this be except the state of affairs of a’s being F? (1991: 190)

the identity theorist is likely to retort that a’s being F, which according to Armstrong “ensures” that a is F,just is the entity (whatever it is) that a is F. The identity theorist maps conceptual connections that we draw between the notions of proposition, truth, falsity, state of affairs, and fact. These connections look trivial, when spelt out—of course, an identity theorist will counter that to go further would be to fall into error—so that to speak of an identity theory can readily appear too grand (McDowell 2005: 83; 2007: 352. But cf. David 2002: 126). So much for the thesis that facts are truth-makers and propositions truth-bearers; an exactly parallel argument applies to the version of the correspondence theory that treats facts as truth-makers and thoughts as truth-bearers.

Consider now the suggestion that obtaining states of affairs, as the correspondence theorist conceives them, make declarative sentences (as opposed to propositions) true (cf. Horwich 1998: 106–7). In this case there appears to be no threat of triviality of the sort that apparently plagued the previous version of the correspondence theory, because states of affairs like that Socrates is wise are genuinely distinct from linguistic items such as the sentence “Socrates is wise”. To that extent friends of the identity theory need not jib at the suggestion that such sentences have worldly truth-makers, if that is how the relation of correspondence is being glossed. But they might question the appropriateness of the gloss. For, they might point out, it does not seem possible, without falsification, to draw detailed links between sentences and bits of the world. After all, different sentences in the same or different languages can “correspond” to the same bit of the world, and these different sentences might have very different (numbers of) components. The English sentence “There are cows” contains three words: are there then three bits in the world corresponding to this sentence, and making it true? (cf. Neale 2001: 177). The sentence “Cows exist” contains only two words, but would not the correspondence theorist want to say that it was made true by the same chunk of reality? And when we take other languages into account, there seems in principle to be no reason to privilege any particular number and say that a sentence corresponding to the relevant segment of reality must contain that number of words: why might there not, in principle, be sentences of actual or possible languages such that, for any n ≥ 1, there existed a sentence comprising n words and meaning the same as the English “There are cows”? (In fact, is English not already such a language? Just prefix and then iterate ad lib. a vacuous operator like “Really”.)

In a nutshell, then, the identity theorist’s case against the correspondence theory is that, when the truth-making relation is conceived as originating in a worldly fact (or similar) and having as its other relatum a true sentence, the claim that this relation is one of correspondence cannot be made out; if, on the other hand, the relevant relation targets a proposition (or thought), then that relation must be held to be one of identity, not correspondence.

4. Identity, Sense, and Reference

Identity theorists are agreed that, in the case of any particular relevant identity, a fact will constitute the worldly relatum of the relation, but there is significant disagreement among them on the question what the item on the other end of the relation is—whether a thought or a proposition (or both). As we have seen, there are three possible positions here: (i) one which places the identity relation exclusively between true thoughts and facts, (ii) one which places it exclusively between true propositions and facts, and (iii) a hybrid position which allows identities of both sorts (identities obtaining at the level of sense will of course be quite distinct from identities obtaining at the level of reference). Which of these positions an identity theorist adopts will depend on wider metaphysical and linguistic considerations that are strictly extraneous to the identity theory as such.

Identity theorists who favor (i) generally do so because they want to have nothing to do with propositions as such. That is to say, such theorists eschew propositions as reference-level entities: of course the word “proposition” may be, and sometimes is, applied to Fregean thoughts at the level of sense, rather than to Russellian propositions at the level of reference. For example, Hornsby (1997: 2–3) uses “proposition” and “thinkable” interchangeably. So far, this terminological policy might be considered neutral with respect to the location of propositions and thinkables in the Fregean semantic hierarchy: that is to say, if one encounters a theorist who talks about “thinkables” and “propositions”, even identifying them, one does not, just so far, know where in the semantic hierarchy this theorist places these entities. In particular, we cannot assume, unless we are specifically told so, that our theorist locates either propositions or thinkables at the level of sense. After all, someone who houses propositions at the level of reference holds that these reference-level entities are thinkable, in the sense that they are graspable in thought (perhaps via thoughts at the level of sense). But they are not thinkables if this latter word is taken, as it is by McDowell and Hornsby, to be a technical term referring to entities at the level of sense. For clarity the policy here will be to continue to apply the word “proposition” exclusively to Russellian propositions at the level of reference. Such propositions, it is plausible to suppose, can be grasped in thought, but by definition they are not thoughts or thinkables, where these two latter terms have, respectively, their Fregean and McDowellian meanings. It is worth noting that this point, though superficially a merely terminological one, engages significantly with the interface between the philosophies of language and mind that was touched on in the opening paragraph. Anyone who holds that reference-level propositions can, in the ordinary sense, be thought—are thinkable—is likely to be unsatisfied with any terminology that seems to limit the domain of the thinkable and of what is thought to the level of sense (On this point see further below in this section, and Gaskin 2020: 101–2).

Usually, as has been noted, identity theorists who favor (i) above have this preference because they repudiate propositions as that term is being employed here: that is, they repudiate propositionally structured reference-level entities. There are several reasons why such identity theorists feel uncomfortable with propositions when these are understood to be reference-level entities. There is a fear that such propositions, if they existed, would have to be construed as truth-makers; and identity theorists, as we have seen, want to have nothing to do with truth-makers (Dodd 2008a: 112). That fear could perhaps be defused if facts were also located at the level of reference for true propositions to be identical with. This move would take us to an identity theory in the style of (ii) or (iii) above. Another reason for suspicion of reference-level propositions is that commentators often follow Russell in his post-1904 aversion specifically to false objectives, that is, to false propositions in re (Russell 1966: 152; Cartwright 1987: 79–84). Such entities are often regarded as too absurd to take seriously as components of reality (so T. Baldwin 1991: 46; Dodd 1995: 163; 1996; 2008a: 66–70, 113–14, 162–6). More especially, it has been argued that false propositions in re could not be unities, that the price of unifying a proposition at the level of reference would be to make it true: if this point were correct it would arguably constitute a reductio ad absurdum of the whole idea of reference-level propositions, since it is plausible to suppose that if there cannot be false reference-level propositions, there cannot be true ones either (see Dodd 2008a: 165). If, on the other hand, one is happy with the existence of propositions in re or reference-level propositions, both true and false,[6] one is likely to favor an identity theory in the style of (ii) or (iii). And, once one has got as far as jettisoning (i) and deciding between (ii) and (iii), there must surely be a good case for adopting (iii): for if one has admitted propositionally structured entities both at the level of sense (as senses of declarative sentences) and at the level of reference (propositions), there seems no good reason not to be maximally liberal in allowing identities between entities of these two types and, respectively, sense- and reference-level kinds of fact (or fact-like entities).

Against what was suggested above about Frege (§2), it has been objected that Frege could not have held an identity theory of truth (Baldwin 1991: 43); the idea here is that, even if he had acknowledged states of affairs as bona fide elements of reality, Frege could not have identified true thoughts with them on pain of confusing the levels of sense and reference. As far as the exegetical issue is concerned, the objection might be said to overlook the possibility that Frege identified true thoughts with facts construed as sense-level entities, rather than with states of affairs taken as reference-level entities; and, as we have noted, Frege does indeed appear to have done just this (see Dodd & Hornsby 1992). Still, the objection raises an important theoretical issue. It would surely be a serious confusion to try to construct an identity across the categorial division separating sense and reference, in particular to attempt to identify true Fregean thoughts with reference-level facts or states of affairs.[7] It has been suggested that McDowell and Hornsby are guilty of this confusion;[8] they have each rejected the charge,[9] insisting that, for them, facts are not reference-level entities, but are, like Fregean thoughts, sense-level entities.[10]

But, if one adheres to the Fregean version of the identity theory ((i) above), which identifies true thoughts with facts located at the level of sense, and admits no correlative identity, in addition, connecting true propositions located at the level of reference with facts or fact-like entities also located at that level, it looks as though one faces a difficult dilemma. At what level in the semantical hierarchy is the world to be placed? Suppose first one puts it at the level of reference (this appears to be Dodd’s favored view: see 2008a: 180–1, and passim). In that case the world will contain no facts or propositions, but just objects and properties hanging loose in splendid isolation from one another, a dispensation which looks like a version of Kantian transcendental idealism. (Simply insisting that the properties include not merely monadic but also polyadic ones, such as the relation of instantiation, will not in itself solve the problem: we will still just have a bunch of separate objects, properties, and relations.) If there are no true propositions—no facts—or even false propositions to be found at the level of reference, but if also, notwithstanding that absence, the world is located there, the objects it contains will, it seems, have to be conceived as bare objects, not as things of certain sorts. Some philosophers of a nominalistic bias might be happy with this upshot; but the problem is how to make sense of the idea of a bare object—that is, an object not characterized by any properties. (Properties not instantiated by any objects, by contrast, will not be problematic, at least not for a realist.)

So suppose, on the other hand, that one places the world at the level of sense, on the grounds that the world is composed of facts, and that that is where facts are located. This ontological dispensation is explicitly embraced by McDowell (1996: 179). The problem with this way out of the dilemma would seem to be that, since Fregean senses are constitutively modes of presentation of referents, the strategy under current consideration would take the world to be made up of modes of presentation—but of what? Of objects and properties? These are certainly reference-level entities, but if they are presented by items in the realm of sense, which is being identified on this approach with the world, then again, as on the first horn of the dilemma, they would appear to be condemned to an existence at the level of reference in splendid isolation from one another, rather than in propositionally structured combinations, so that once more we would seem to be committed to a form of Kantian transcendental idealism (see Suhm, Wagemann, & Wessels 2000: 32; Sullivan 2005: 59–61; Gaskin 2006:199–203). Both ways out of the dilemma appear to have this unattractive consequence. The only difference between those ways concerns where exactly in the semantic hierarchy we locate the world; but it is plausible that that issue, in itself, is or ought to be of less concern to metaphysicians than the requirement to avoid divorcing objects from the properties that make those objects things of certain sorts; and both ways out of the dilemma appear to flout this requirement.

To respect the requirement, we need to nest reference-level objects and properties in propositions, or proposition-like structures, also located at the level of reference. And then some of these structured reference-level entities—the true or obtaining ones—will, it seems, be facts, or at least fact-like. Furthermore, once one acknowledges the existence of facts, or fact-like entities, existing at the level of sense, it seems in any case impossible to prevent the automatic generation of facts, or fact-like entities, residing at the level of reference. For sense is mode of presentation of reference. So we need reference-level facts or fact-like entities to be what sense-level facts or fact-like entities present. One has to decide how to treat these variously housed fact-like entities theoretically. If one were to insist that the sense-level fact-like entities were the genuine and only facts, the corresponding reference-level entities would be no better than fact-like, and contrariwise. But, regardless whether the propositionally structured entities automatically generated in this way by sense-level propositionally structured entities are to be thought of as proper facts or merely as fact-like entities, it would seem perverse not to identify the world with these entities.[11] For to insist on continuing to identify the world with sense-level rather than reference-level propositionally structured entities would seem to fly in the face of a requirement to regard the world as maximally objective and maximally non-perspectival. McDowell himself hopes to avert any charge of embracing an unacceptable idealism consequent on his location of the world at the level of sense by relying on the point that senses present their references directly, not descriptively, so that reference is, as it were, contained in sense (1996: 179–80). To this it might be objected that the requirement of maximal objectivity forces an identification of the world with the contained, not the containing, entities in this scenario, which in turn seems to force the upshot—if the threat of Kantian transcendental idealism is really to be obviated—that the contained entities be propositionally structured as such, that is, as contained entities, and not simply in virtue of being contained in propositionally structured containing entities. (For a different objection to McDowell, see Sullivan 2005: 60 n. 6.)

5. Difficulties with the Theory and Possible Solutions

5.1 The modal problem

G. E. Moore drew attention to a point that might look (and has been held to be) problematic for the identity theory (Moore 1953: 308; Fine 1982: 46–7; Künne 2003: 9–10). The proposition that Socrates is wise exists in all possible worlds where Socrates and the property of wisdom exist, but in some of those worlds this proposition is true and in others it is false. The fact that Socrates is wise, by contrast, only exists in those worlds where the proposition both exists and is true. So it would seem that the proposition that Socrates is wise cannot be identical with the fact that Socrates is wise. They have different modal properties, and so by the principle of the indiscernibility of identicals they cannot be identical.

Note, first, that this problem, if it is a problem, has nothing especially to do with the identity theory of truth or with facts. It seems to arise already for true propositions and propositions taken simpliciter before ever we get to the topic of facts. That is, one might think that the proposition that Socrates is wise is identical with the true proposition that Socrates is wise (assuming, as we are doing, that this proposition is true); but we then face the objection that the proposition taken simpliciter and the true proposition differ in their modal properties, since (as one might suppose) the true proposition that Socrates is wise does not exist at worlds where the proposition that Socrates is wise is false, but the proposition taken simpliciter does. Indeed the problem, if it is a problem, is still more general, and purported solutions to it go back at least to the Middle Ages (when it was discussed in connection with Duns Scotus’ formal distinction; see Gaskin 2002 [with references to further relevant literature]). Suppose that Socrates is a cantankerous old curmudgeon. Now grumpy Socrates, one would think, is identical with Socrates. But in some other possible worlds Socrates is of a sunny and genial disposition. So it would seem that Socrates cannot be identical with grumpy Socrates after all, because in these other possible worlds, while Socrates goes on existing, grumpy Socrates does not exist—or so one might argue.

Can the identity theorist deal with this problem, and if so how? Here is one suggestion. Suppose we hold, staying with grumpy Socrates for a moment, that, against the assumption made at the end of the last paragraph, grumpy Socrates does in fact exist in worlds where Socrates has a sunny disposition. The basis for this move would be the thought that, after all, grumpy Socrates is identical with Socrates, and Socrates exists in these other worlds. So grumpy Socrates exists in those worlds too; it is just that he is not grumpy in those worlds. (Suppose Socrates is very grumpy; suppose in fact that grumpiness is so deeply ingrained in his character that worlds in which he is genial are quite far away. Someone surveying the array of possible worlds, starting from the actual world and moving out in circles, and stumbling at long last upon a world with a pleasant Socrates in it, might register the discovery by exclaiming, with relief, “Oh look! Grumpy Socrates is not grumpy over here!”.) Similarly, one might contend, the true proposition, and fact, that Socrates is wise goes on existing in the worlds where Socrates is not wise, because the true proposition, and fact, that Socrates is wise just is the proposition that Socrates is wise, and that proposition goes on existing in these other worlds, but in those worlds that true proposition, and fact, is not a true proposition, or a fact. (In Scotist terms one might say that the proposition that Socrates is wise and the fact that Socrates is wise are really identical but formally distinct.)

This solution was, in outline, proposed by Richard Cartwright in his 1987 discussion of the identity theory (Cartwright 1987: 76–8; cf. David 2002: 128–9; Dodd 2008a: 86–8; Candlish & Damnjanovic 2018: 265–6). According to Cartwright, the true proposition, and fact, that there are subways in Boston exists in other possible worlds where Boston does not have subways, even though in those worlds that fact would be not be a fact. (Compare: grumpy Socrates exists in worlds where Socrates is genial and sunny, but he is not grumpy there.) So even in worlds where it is not a fact that Boston has subways, that fact, namely the fact that Boston has subways, continues to exist. Cartwright embellishes his solution with two controversial points. First, he draws on Kripke’s distinction between rigid and non-rigid designation, suggesting that his solution can be described by saying that the expression “The fact that Boston has subways” is a non-rigid designator. But it is plausible that that expression goes on referring to, or being satisfied by (depending on how exactly one wants to set up the semantics of definite descriptions: see Gaskin 2008: 56–81), the fact that Boston has subways in possible worlds where Boston does not have subways; it is just that, though that fact exists in those worlds, it is not a fact there. But that upshot does not appear to derogate from the rigidity of the expression in question. Secondly, Cartwright allows for a true reading of “The fact that there are subways in Boston might not have been the fact that there are subways in Boston”. But it is arguable that we should say that this sentence is just false (David 2002: 129). The fact that there are subways in Boston would still have gone on being the same fact in worlds where Boston has no subways, namely the fact that there are subways in Boston; it is just that in those worlds this fact would not have been a fact. You might say: in that world the fact that there are subways in Boston would not be correctly described as a fact, but in talking about that world we are talking about it from the point of view of our world, and in our world it is a fact. (Similarly with grumpy Socrates.)

Now, an objector may want to press the following point against the above purported solution to the difficulty. Consider again the fact that Socrates is wise. Surely, it might be said, it is more natural to maintain that that fact does not exist in a possible world where Socrates is not wise, rather than that it exists there all right, but is not a fact. After all, imagine a conversation about a world in which Socrates is not wise and suppose that Speaker A claims that Socrates is indeed wise in that world. Speaker B might counter with

No, sorry, you’re wrong: there is no such fact in that world; the purported fact that Socrates is wise simply does not exist in that world.

It might seem odd to insist that B is not allowed to say this and must say instead

Yes, you’re right that there is such a fact in that world, namely the fact that Socrates is wise, but in that world that fact is not a fact;.

How might the identity theorist respond to this objection? One possible strategy would be to make a distinction between fact and factuality, as follows. Factuality, one might say, is a reification of facts. Once you have a fact, you also get, as an ontological spin-off, the factuality of that fact. The fact, being a proposition, exists at all possible worlds where the proposition exists, though in some of these worlds it may not be a fact: it will not be a fact in worlds where the proposition is false. The factuality of that fact, by contrast, only exists at those worlds where the fact is a fact—where the proposition is true. So factuality is a bit like a trope. Compare grumpy Socrates again. Grumpy Socrates, the identity theorist might contend, exists at all worlds where Socrates exists, though at some of those worlds he is not grumpy. But Socrates’ grumpiness—that particular trope—exists only at worlds where Socrates is grumpy. That seems to obviate the problem, because the suggestion being canvassed here is that grumpy Socrates is identical not with Socrates’ grumpiness—so that the fact that these two entities have different modal properties need embarrass no one—but rather with Socrates. Similarly, the suggestion is that the proposition that Socrates is wise is identical not with the factuality of the fact that Socrates is wise, but just with that fact. So the identity theorist would accommodate the objector’s point by insisting that facts exist at possible worlds where their factualities do not exist.

The reader may be wondering why this problem was ever raised against the identity theory of truth in the first place. After all, the identity theorist does not say that propositions simpliciter are identical with facts, but that true propositions are identical with facts, and now true propositions and facts surely have exactly the same modal properties: for regardless how things are with the sheer proposition that Socrates is wise, at any rate the true proposition that Socrates is wise must surely be thought to exist at the same worlds as the fact that Socrates is wise, whatever those worlds are. However, as against this quick way with the purported problem, there stands the intuition, mentioned and exploited above, that the true proposition that Socrates is wise is identical with the proposition that Socrates is wise. So long as that intuition is in play, the problem does indeed seem to arise—for true propositions, in the first instance, and then for facts by transitivity of identity. But the identity theorist will maintain that, as explained, the problem has a satisfactory solution.

5.2 The “right fact” problem

Candlish, following Cartwright, has urged that the identity theory of truth is faced with the difficulty of getting hold of the “right fact” (Cartwright 1987: 74–5; Candlish 1999a: 238–9; 1999b: 202–4). Consider a version of the identity theory that states:

The proposition that p is true just if it is identical with a fact.[12]

Candlish’s objection is now that (11)

does not specify which fact has to be identical with the proposition for the proposition to be true. But what the identity theory requires is not that a true proposition be identical with some fact or other, it is that it be identical with the right fact. (1999b: 203)

In another paper Candlish puts the matter like this:

But after all, any proposition might be identical with some fact or other (and there are reasons identified in the Tractatus for supposing that all propositions are themselves facts), and so all might be true. What the identity theory needs to capture is the idea that it is by virtue of being identical with the appropriate fact that a proposition is true. (1999a: 239)

The reference to the Tractatus is suggestive. Of course, it might be objected that the Tractatus does not have propositions in the sense of that word figuring here: that is, it does not recognize Russellian propositions (propositions at the level of reference). Nor indeed does it appear to recognize Fregean thoughts. In the Tractatus, as we have noted (§2), declarative sentences (Sätze) are facts (arrangements of names), and states of affairs (Sachlagen, Sachverhalte, Tatsachen) are also facts (arrangements of objects). Even so, Candlish’s allusion to the Tractatus reminds us that propositions (in our sense) are Tractarian inasmuch as they are structured arrangements of entities, namely objects and properties. (Correlatively, thoughts are structured arrangements of senses.) False propositions (and false thoughts) will equally be arrangements of objects and properties (respectively, senses). So the difficulty that Cartwright and Candlish have identified can be put like this. Plausibly any proposition, whether or not it is true, is identical with some fact or other given that a proposition is an arrangement of entities of the appropriate sort. But if propositions just are facts, then every proposition is identical with some fact—at the very least, with itself—whether it is true or false. So the right-to-left direction of (11) looks incorrect.

J. C. Beall (2000) attempts to dissolve this problem on the identity theorist’s behalf by invoking the principle of the indiscernibility of identicals. His proposal works as follows. If we ask, in respect of (11), what the “right” fact is, it seems that we can answer that the “right” fact must at least have the property of being identical with the proposition that p, and the indiscernibility principle then guarantees that there is only one such fact. This proposal is open to an obvious retort. Suppose that the proposition that p is false. That proposition will still be identical with itself, and if we are saying (in Wittgensteinian spirit) that propositions are facts, then that proposition will be identical with at least one fact, namely itself. So it will satisfy the right-hand side of (11), its falsity notwithstanding. But reflection on this retort suggests a patch-up to Beall’s proposal: why not say that the right fact is the fact that p? We would then be able to gloss (11) with

The proposition that p is true just if (a) it is a fact that p, and (b) the proposition that p is identical with that fact.

Falsity, it seems, now no longer presents a difficulty, because if it is false that p then it is not a fact that p, so that (a) fails, and there is no appropriate candidate for the proposition that p to be identical with.[13] Notice that, in view of the considerations already aired in connection with the modal problem ((i) of this section), caution is here required. Suppose that it is true that p in the actual world, but false in some other possible world. According to the strategy that we have been considering on the identity theorist’s behalf, it would be wrong to say that, in the possible world where it is false that p, there is no such fact as the fact that p. The strategy has it that there is indeed such a fact, because it is (in the actual world) a fact that p, and that fact, and the true proposition, that p, go on existing in the possible world where it is false that p; it is just that that fact is not a fact in that possible world. But (12), the identity theorist will maintain, deals with this subtlety. In the possible world we are considering, where it is false that p, though the fact that p exists, it is not a fact that p, so (a) fails, and there is accordingly no risk of our getting hold of the “wrong” fact. Note also that if a Wittgensteinian line is adopted, while the (false) proposition that p will admittedly be identical with a fact—at the very least with itself—it will be possible, given the failure of (a), for the identity theorist to contend with a clear conscience that that fact is the wrong fact, which does not suffice to render the proposition true.

5.3 The “slingshot” problem

If the notorious “slingshot” argument worked, it would pose a problem for the identity theory of truth. The argument exists in a number of different, though related, forms, and this is not the place to explore all of these in detail.[14] Here we shall look briefly at what is one of the simplest and most familiar versions of the argument, namely Davidson’s. This version of the argument aims to show that if true declarative sentences refer to anything (for example to propositions or facts), then they all refer to the same thing (to the “Great Proposition”, or to the “Great Fact”). This upshot would be unacceptable to an identity theorist of a Russellian cast, who thinks that declarative sentences refer to propositions, and that true such propositions are identical with facts: any such theorist is naturally going to want to insist that the propositions referred to by different declarative sentences are, at least in general, distinct from one another, and likewise that the facts with which distinct true propositions are identical are also distinct from one another. Davidson expresses the problem that the slingshot argument purportedly throws up as follows:

The difficulty follows upon making two reasonable assumptions: that logically equivalent singular terms have the same reference; and that a singular term does not change its reference if a contained singular term is replaced by another with the same reference. But now suppose that “R” and “S” abbreviate any two sentences alike in truth value. (1984: 19)

He then argues that the following four sentences have the same reference:

\(\hat{z}(z\! =\! z \amp R) = \hat{z}(z\! =\! z)\)
\(\hat{z}(z\! =\! z \amp S) = \hat{z}(z\! =\! z \))

(The hat over a variable symbolizes the description operator: so “\(\hat{z}\)” means the \(z\) such that …) This is because (13) and (14) are logically equivalent, as are (15) and (16), while the only difference between (14) and (15) is that (14) contains the expression (Davidson calls it a “singular term”) “\(\hat{z} (z\! =\! z \amp R)\)” whereas (15) contains “\(\hat{z} (z\! =\! z \amp S)\)”,

and these refer to the same thing if S and R are alike in truth value. Hence any two sentences have the same reference if they have the same truth value. (1984: 19)

The difficulty with this argument, as a number of writers have pointed out (see, e.g., Yourgrau 1987; Gaskin 1997: 153 n. 17; Künne 2003: 133–41), and the place where the identity theorist is likely to raise a cavil, lies in the first assumption on which it depends. Davidson calls this assumption “reasonable”, but it has been widely questioned. It states “that logically equivalent singular terms have the same reference”. But intuitively, the ideas of logical equivalence and reference seem to be quite distinct, indeed to have, as such, little to do with one another, so that it would be odd if there were some a priori reason why the assumption had to hold. And it is not difficult to think of apparent counterexamples: the sentence “It is raining” is logically equivalent to the sentence “It is raining and (either Pluto is larger than Mercury or it is not the case that Pluto is larger than Mercury)”, but the latter sentence seems to carry a referential payload that the former does not. Of course, if declarative sentences refer to truth-values, as Frege thought, then the two sentences will indeed be co-referential, but to assume that sentences refer to truth-values would be question-begging in the context of an argument designed to establish that all true sentences refer to the same thing.

5.4 The congruence problem

A further objection to the identity theory, going back to an observation of Strawson’s, takes its cue from the point that canonical names of propositions and of facts are often not straightforwardly congruent with one another: they are often not intersubstitutable salva congruitate (or, if they are, they may not be intersubstitutable salva veritate) (Strawson 1971: 196; cf. Künne 2003: 10–12). For example, we say that propositions are true, not that they obtain, whereas we say that facts obtain, not that they are true. How serious is this point? The objection in effect presupposes that for two expressions to be co-referential, or satisfied by one and the same thing, they must be syntactically congruent, have the same truth-value potential, and match in terms of general contextual suitability. The assumption of the syntactic congruence of co-referential expressions is controversial, and it may be possible for the identity theorist simply to deny it (see Gaskin 2008: 106–10, for argument on the point, with references to further literature; cf. Dodd 2008a: 83–6.). Whether co-referential expressions must be syntactically congruent depends on one’s conception of reference, a matter that cannot be further pursued here (for discussion see Gaskin 2008: ch. 2; 2020: chs. 3–5).

There has been a good deal of discussion in the literature concerning the question whether an identification of facts with true propositions is undermined not specifically by phenomena of syntactic incongruence but rather by failure of relevant intersubstitutions to preserve truth-values (see, e.g., King 2007: ch. 5; King in King, Soames, & Speaks 2014: 64–70, 201–8; Hofweber 2016: 215–23; Candlish & Damnjanovic 2018: 264). The discussion has focused on examples like the following:

Daniel remembers the fact that this is a leap year;
Daniel remembers the true proposition that this is a leap year;
The fact that my local baker has shut down is just appalling;
The true proposition that my local baker has shut down is just appalling.

The problem here is said to be that the substitution of “true proposition” for “fact” or vice versa generates different readings (in particular, readings with different truth-values). Suppose Daniel has to memorize a list of true propositions, of which one is the proposition that this is a leap year. Then it is contended that we can easily imagine a scenario in which (17) and (18) differ in truth-value. Another way of putting the same point might be to say that (17) is equivalent to

Daniel remembers that this is a leap year,

but that (18) is not equivalent to (21), because—so the argument goes—(18) but not (21) would be true if Daniel had memorized his list of true propositions without realizing that they were true. Similar differences can be argued to apply, mutatis mutandis, to (19) and (20). Can the identity theorist deal with this difficulty?

In the first place one might suggest that the alleged mismatch between (17) and (18) is less clear than the objector claims. (17) surely does have a reading like the one that is said to be appropriate for (18). Suppose Daniel has to memorize a list of facts. (17) could then diverge in truth-value from

Daniel remembers the fact that this is a leap year as a fact.

For there is a reading of (17) on which, notwithstanding (17)’s truth, (22) is false: this is the reading on which Daniel has indeed memorized a list of facts, but without necessarily realizing that the things he is memorizing are facts. He has memorized the relevant fact (that this is a leap year), we might say, but not as a fact. That is parallel to the reading of (18) according to which Daniel has memorized the true proposition that this is a leap year, but not as a true proposition. The identity theorist might then aver that, perhaps surprisingly, the same point actually applies to the simple (21), on the grounds that this sentence can mean that Daniel remembers the propositional object that this is a leap year (from a list of such objects, say, that he has been asked to memorize), with no implication that he remembers it either as a proposition or as a fact. So, according to this response, the transparent reading of (18)—which has Daniel remember the propositional object, namely that this is a leap year, but not necessarily remember it as a fact, or even as the propositional object that this is a leap year (he remembers it under some other mode of presentation)—is also available for (17) and for (21).

What about the opaque reading of either (17) or (21), which implies that Daniel knows for a fact that this is a leap year—is that reading available for (18) too? The identity theorist might maintain that this reading is indeed available, and then explain why we tend not to use sentences like (18) in the relevant sense, preferring sentences of the form of (17) or (21), on the basis of the relative technicality of the vocabulary of (18). The idea would be that it is just an accident of language that we prefer either (17) or (21) to (18) where what is in question is the sense that implies that Daniel has propositional knowledge that this is a leap year (is acquainted with that fact as a fact), as opposed to having mere acquaintance, under some mode of presentation or other, with the propositional object which happens to be (the fact) that this is a leap year. And if we ask why we prefer (17) or (21) to

Daniel remembers the proposition that this is a leap year,

then the answer will be the Gricean one that (23) conveys less information than (17) or (21), under the reading of these two sentences that we are usually interested in, according to which Daniel remembers the relevant fact as a fact, for (23) is compatible with the falsity of “This is a leap year”. Hence to use (23) in a situation where one was in a position to use (17) or (21) would carry a misleading conversational implicature. That, at any rate, is one possible line for the identity theorist to take. (It is worth noting here that, if the identity theorist is right about this, it will follow that the “know that” construction will be subject to a similar ambiguity as the “remember that” construction, given that remembering is a special case of knowing. That is: “A knows that p” will mean either “A is acquainted with the fact that p, and is acquainted with it as a fact” or merely “A is acquainted with the fact that p, but not necessarily with it as such—either as a fact or even as a propositional object”.)

5.5 The individuation problem

It might appear that we individuate propositions more finely than facts: for example, one might argue that the fact that Hesperus is bright is the same fact as the fact that Phosphorus is bright, but that the propositions in question are different (see on this point Künne 2003: 10–12; Candlish & Damnjanovic 2018: 266–7). The identity theorist has a number of strategies in response to this objection. One would be simply to deny it, and maintain that facts are individuated as finely as propositions: if one is a supporter of the Fregean version of the identity theory, this is likely to be one’s response (see, e.g., Dodd 2008a: 90–3). Alternatively, one might respond by saying that, if there is a good point hereabouts, at best it tells only against the Fregean and Russellian versions of the identity theory, not against the hybrid version. The identity theory in the hybrid version can agree that we sometimes think of facts as extensional, reference-level entities and sometimes also individuate propositions or proposition-like entities intensionally. Arguably, these twin points do indeed tell against either a strict Fregean or a strict Russellian version of the identity theory: they tell against the strict Fregean position because, as well as individuating facts intensionally, we also, sometimes, individuate facts extensionally; and they tell against the strict Russellian position because, as well as individuating facts extensionally, we also, sometimes, individuate facts intensionally. But it is plausible that the hybrid version of the identity theory is not touched by the objection, because that version of the theory accommodates propositionally structured and factual entities at both levels of sense and reference, though different sorts of these entities at these different levels—either propositions at the level of sense and correlative proposition-like entities at the level of reference or vice versa, and similarly, mutatis mutandis, for facts and fact-like entities. It will follow, then, for this version of the identity theory, that Fregean thoughts and Russellian propositions are available, if true, to be identical with the factual entities of the appropriate level (sense and reference, respectively), and the individuation problem will not then, it seems, arise. Propositions or propositionally structured entities will be individuated just as finely as we want them to be individuated, and at each level of resolution there will be facts or fact-like entities, individuated to the same resolution, for them to be identical with, if true.[15]

5.6 Truth and Intrinsicism

The solutions to these problems, if judged satisfactory, seem to direct us to a conception of truth that has been called “intrinsicist” (Wright 1999: 207–9), and “primitivist” (Candlish 1999b: 207). This was a conception recognized by Moore and Russell who, in the period when they were sympathetic to the identity theory, spoke of truth as a simple and unanalysable property (Moore 1953: 261; 1993: 20–1; Russell 1973: 75; Cartwright 1987: 72–5; Johnston 2013: 384). The point here would be as follows. There are particular, individual explanations of the truth of many propositions. For example, the true proposition that there was a fire in the building will be explained by alluding to the presence of combustible material, enough oxygen, a spark caused by a short-circuit, etc. So, case by case, we will (at least often) be able to provide explanations why given propositions are true, and science is expanding the field of such explanations all the time. But according to the intrinsicist, there is no prospect of providing a general explanation of truth, in the sense of an account that would explain, in utterly general terms, why any true proposition was true. At that general level, according to the intrinsicist, there is nothing interesting to be said about what makes true propositions true: there are only the detailed case-histories. An intrinsicist may embrace one or another version of the identity theory of truth: what has to be rejected is the idea that the truth of a true proposition might consist in a relation to a distinct fact—that the truth of the true proposition that Socrates is wise, for example, might consist in anything other than identity with the fact that Socrates is wise. On this approach, truth is held to be both intrinsic to propositions, and primitive.[16] Intrinsicism was not a popular position, at least until recently: Candlish described it as “so implausible that almost no one else [apart from Russell, in 1903–4] has been able to take it seriously” (1999b: 208); but it may be gaining in popularity now (see, e.g., Asay 2013).

Candlish (1999b: 208) thinks that intrinsicism and the identity theory are competitors, but perhaps that view is not mandatory. Intrinsicism says that truth is a simple and unanalysable property of propositions; the identity theory says that a true proposition is identical with a fact (and with the right fact). These statements will seem to clash only if the identity theory is taken to propound a heavy-duty analysis of truth. But if, following recent exponents of the theory, we take it rather to be merely spelling out a connection between two entities that we have in our ontology anyway, namely true propositions and facts, and which turn out (like Hesperus and Phosphorus) to be identical, on the basis of a realization that an entity like that Socrates is wise is both a true proposition and a fact, then any incipient clash between intrinsicism and the identity theory will, it seems, be averted. On this approach, a natural thing to say will be that the identity theory describes the way in which truth is a simple and unanalysable property.


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