Notes to The Identity Theory of Truth

1. Throughout “that”-clauses in relevant positions are italicized for clarity and ease of reading: the italicization has no grammatical significance, and could be omitted without solecism.

2. The inclusion of (8) in the definition of the identity theory pushes it in the direction of idealism: this emerges clearly from Hornsby’s discussion (at 1997: 9; cf. Candlish and Damnjanovic 2018: 277–8). That might be objectionable to some upholders of the theory; so for that reason too it makes sense to keep the two positions (i.e., (5)/(7) and (8)) definitionally separate.

3. There is a threat of inconsistency in the Tractatus hereabouts, concerning the status of the world: Wittgenstein says or implies both (i) that the world is everything that is the case, and (ii) that the world is everything that is the case as well as everything that is not the case (Tractatus 1.1, 2.04–2.063; see Stenius 1960: 51).

4. Strictly, this phrase is a solecism: it should be either “truth-donors” or “true-makers”, as Künne points out (2003: 158 n. 200). But the phrase has acquired currency, and I shall use it here.

5. But this assumption is not essential, and the ensuing discussion can easily be adapted to accommodate nominalist qualms about universals.

6. In defense of the possibility of unified false propositions in re, see Gaskin 2006: 215–20; 2008: 110–14.

7. Notwithstanding this point, the sense of one linguistic expression can itself be the referent of another such expression. What is ruled out is that that entity might be both the sense and referent of the same expression. At least, so one might naturally assume: but to discuss this issue fully would take us into the territory of Frege’s views on oratio obliqua.

8. Dodd 1995 and 1999; Suhm, Wagemann, & Wessels 2000; Gaskin 2006: 181–4. Dodd withdraws the charge against McDowell at 2008b: 82. See also his 2008a: 174–86, where the charge against Hornsby is not so much withdrawn as nuanced. It is actually not clear that Dodd is right to withdraw the charge against McDowell, given the latter’s insistence that facts are “perceptible … an aspect of the perceptible world” (McDowell 1996: 26; cf. Dodd 2008a: 182).

9. McDowell 2000; 2005: 84–5; Hornsby 1999: 241–2. It is clear from the final paragraph of one of Hornsby’s footnotes (1997: 4, n. 6) that she embraces an intensional conception of facts, and so locates them at the level of sense.

10. This issue has generated some discussion in the literature. Apart from the pieces already mentioned (in the last two footnotes), see Engel 2001, 2005; Fish and Macdonald 2007, 2009; Candlish and Damnjanovic 2018: 274–6.

11. One might wish to identify the world with more than merely the true or obtaining reference-level propositions/facts, but also with the false or non-obtaining ones. See Gaskin 2006: ch. 6; 2008: ch. 2. And there is also the problem (if it is one) of facts that cannot be expressed in language (§1) to worry about: see Gaskin 2020: ch. 8.

12. I reformulate Candlish’s statement of the problem at 1999b: 203.

13. In response to an objector who presses him with

You have shown that the true proposition that p is identical with a fact, but which fact is it identical with?,

Beall in effect gives the answer that we are here considering: “It is identical with the fact that p” (2000: 129). However, since he thinks he has “dissolved” Candlish’s problem by appeal to the indiscernibility of identicals, Beall is inclined to regard the question as a spurious one and the answer as unnecessary.

14. See supplement on the slingshot argument to the entry on facts for discussion and references.

15. In defense of a pluralistic approach to propositional individuation, with full discussion and references, see Gaskin 2020: ch. 5.

16. The account has to be slightly complicated to accommodate a distinction between simple and complex propositions: it will apply directly only to simple propositions, and indirectly to complex ones. See Gaskin 2006: 220–4.

Copyright © 2020 by
Richard Gaskin <>

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