Vienna Circle

First published Wed Jun 28, 2006; substantive revision Wed Apr 1, 2020

The Vienna Circle was a group of early twentieth-century philosophers who sought to reconceptualize empiricism by means of their interpretation of then recent advances in the physical and formal sciences. Their radically anti-metaphysical stance was supported by an empiricist criterion of meaningfulness and a broadly logicist conception of mathematics. They denied that any principle or claim was synthetic a priori. Moreover, they sought to account for the presuppositions of scientific theories by regimenting such theories within a logical framework so that the important role played by conventions, either in the form of definitions or of other analytical framework principles, became evident. The Vienna Circle’s theories were constantly changing. In spite (or perhaps because) of this, they helped to provide the blueprint for analytical philosophy of science as meta-theory—a “second-order” reflection of “first-order” sciences. While the Vienna Circle’s early form of logical empiricism (or logical positivism or neopositivism: these labels will be used interchangeably here) no longer represents an active research program, recent history of philosophy of science has unearthed much previously neglected variety and depth in the doctrines of the Circle’s protagonists, some of whose positions retain relevance for contemporary analytical philosophy.

1. Introductory Remarks

While it is in the nature of philosophical movements and their leading doctrines to court controversy, the Vienna Circle and its philosophies did so more than most. To begin with, its members styled themselves as conceptual revolutionaries who cleared the stables of academic philosophy by showing metaphysics not simply to be false, but to be cognitively empty and meaningless. In addition, they often associated their attempt to overcome metaphysics with their public engagement for scientific Enlightenment reason in the ever-darkening political situation of 1920s and 1930s central Europe. Small wonder then that the Vienna Circle has sharply divided opinion from the start. There is very little beyond the basic facts of membership and its record of publications and conferences that can be asserted about it without courting some degree of controversy. (For English-language survey monographs and articles on the Vienna Circle, see Kraft 1950, Jorgensen 1951, Ayer 1959b, Passmore 1967, Hanfling 1981, Stadler 1998, Richardson 2003. Particularly rich in background and bio-bibliographical materials is Stadler 1997 [2015]. The best short introductory book has remained untranslated: Haller 1993. For popular overviews see Sigmund 2015 [2018] and Edmonds [2020].)

Fortunately, more than three decades worth of recent scholarship in history of philosophy of science now allows at least some disputes to be put into perspective. (See, e.g., the following at least in part English-language collections of articles and research monographs: Haller 1982, McGuinness 1985, Rescher 1985, Gower 1987, Proust 1989, Zolo 1989, Coffa 1991, Spohn 1991, Uebel 1991, Bell and Vossenkuhl 1992, Sarkar 1992, Uebel 1992, Oberdan 1993, Stadler 1993, Cirera 1994, Salmon and Wolters 1994, Cartwright, Cat, Fleck and Uebel 1996, Giere and Richardson 1996, Nemeth and Stadler 1996, Sarkar 1996, Richardson 1998, Friedman 1999, Wolenski and Köhler 1999, Fetzer 2000, Friedman 2000, Bonk 2003, Hardcastle and Richardson 2003, Parrini, Salmon and Salmon 2003, Stadler 2003, Awodey and Klein 2004, Reisch 2005, Galavotti 2006, Carus 2007, Creath and Friedman 2007, Nemeth, Schmitz and Uebel 2007, Richardson and Uebel 2007, Uebel 2007, Wagner 2009, Manninen and Stadler 2010, McGuinness 2011, Symons, Pombo and Torres 2011, Creath 2012, Wagner 2012, Damböck 2016, Pihlström, Stadler and Weidtmann 2017, Schiemer 2017, Tuboly 2017, Carus 2018, Cat and Tuboly 2019, Makovec and Shapiro 2019.) What distinguishes these works from valuable collections like Schilpp 1963, Hintikka 1975 and Achinstein and Barker 1979 is that the unspoken assumption, to have understood Vienna Circle philosophy correctly enough so as to consider its consequences straightforward, is questioned in the more recent scholarship. Many other pieces of new Vienna Circle scholarship are spread throughout philosophical journals and essay collections with more systematic or wider historical scope; important work has also been done in German, Italian and French language publications but here must remain unreferenced.)

Two facts must be clearly recognized if a proper evaluation of the Vienna Circle is to be attempted. The first is, that, despite its relatively short existence, even some of the most central theses of the Vienna Circle underwent radical changes. The second is that its members were by no means of one mind in all important matters; occasionally they espoused perspectives so radically at variance with each other that even their ostensive agreements cannot remain wholly unquestioned. Behind the rather thin public front, then, quite different philosophical projects were being pursued by the leading participants with, moreover, changing alliances. One way of taking account of this is by speaking (as above) explicitly of the philosophies (in the plural) of the Vienna Circle (and to avoid the singular definite description) while using the expression “Vienna Circle philosophy” (without an article) in a neutral generic sense.

Recent scholarship has provided what the received view of Viennese neopositivism lacks: recognition and documentation of the sometimes sharply differentiated positions behind the generic surface. This does not invalidate all previous scholarship, including some fundamental criticisms of its positions, but it restores a depth to Vienna Circle philosophy that was absent from the standard histories. The value of this development must not be underestimated, for the recognition of the Vienna Circle’s sophisticated engagement with aspects of the philosophical tradition and contemporaneous challenges calls into question unwarranted certainties of our own self-consciously post-positivist era. While there remains support for the view that philosophical doctrines were held in the Vienna Circle that wholly merited many of the standard criticisms to be cited below, there is now also support for the view that in nearly all such cases, these doctrines were already in their day opposed within the Circle itself. While some of the Vienna Circle philosophies are dated and may even be, as John Passmore once put it, as dead as philosophies can be, others show signs of surprising vitality. Which ones these are, however, remains a matter of debate.

The lead pursued in this article is provided by the comments of a long-time associate of the Vienna Circle, C.G. Hempel, made in 1991:

When people these days talk about logical positivism or the Vienna Circle and say that its ideas are passé, this is just wrong. This overlooks the fact that there were two quite different schools of logical empiricism, namely the one of Carnap and Schlick and so on and then the quite different one of Otto Neurath, who advocates a completely pragmatic conception of the philosophy of science…. And this form of empiricism is in no way affected by any of the fundamental objections against logical positivism…. (quoted in Wolters 2003, 117)

While differing with Hempel’s specific claim about how the two “schools” divide, the aim here is to fill out his suggestive picture by indicating what Schlick, Carnap and Neurath stand for philosophically and why the different wings of the Vienna Circle require differentiated assessments. After reviewing the basic facts and providing an overall outline of Vienna Circle philosophy (in sect. 2), this article considers various doctrines in greater detail by way of discussing standard criticisms with the appropriate distinctions in mind (in sect. 3). No comprehensive assessment of the Vienna Circle and the work of its members can be attempted here, but some basic conclusions will be drawn (in sect. 4).

2. The Basics: People, Activities and Overview of Doctrines

2.1 People

The Vienna Circle was a group of scientifically trained philosophers and philosophically interested scientists who met under the (nominal) leadership of Moritz Schlick for often weekly discussions of problems in the philosophy of science during academic terms in the years from 1924 to 1936. As is not uncommon with such groups, its identity is blurred along several edges. Not all of those who ever attended the discussions can be called members, and not all who attended did so over the entire period. Typically, attention is focused on long-term regulars who gained prominence through their philosophical publications, but even these do not in all cases fall into the period of the Vienna Circle proper. It is natural, nevertheless, to consider under the heading “Vienna Circle” also the later work of leading members who were still active in the 1940s, 50s and 60s. Finally, there is the so-called periphery of international contacts and visitors that prefigured the post-World War II network of analytical philosophers of science. In the present article the emphasis will be placed on the long-term regulars whose contributions will be followed, selectively, into the post-Schlick era.

According to its unofficial manifesto (see section 2.3 below), the Circle had “members” and recognized others as “sympathetic” to its aims. It included as members, besides Schlick who had been appointed to Mach’s old chair in Philosophy of the Inductive Sciences at the University of Vienna in 1922, the mathematician Hans Hahn, the physicist Philipp Frank, the social scientist Otto Neurath, his wife, the mathematician Olga Hahn-Neurath, the philosopher Viktor Kraft, the mathematicians Theodor Radacovic and Gustav Bergmann and, since 1926, the philosopher and logician Rudolf Carnap. (Even before World War I, there existed a similarly oriented discussion circle that included Frank, Hahn and Neurath. During the time of the Schlick Circle, Frank resided in Prague throughout, Carnap did so from 1931.) Further members were recruited among Schlick’s students, like Friedrich Waismann, Herbert Feigl and Marcel Natkin, others were recruited among Hahn’s students, like Karl Menger and Kurt Gödel. Though listed as members in the manifesto, Menger and Kraft later wanted to be known only as as sympathetic associates, like, all along, the mathematician Kurt Reidemeister and the philosopher and historian of science Edgar Zilsel. (Karl Popper was never a member or associate of the Circle, though he studied with Hahn in the 1920s and in the early 1930s discussed its doctrines with Feigl and Carnap.) Over the years, other participants (not listed in the manifesto) included other students of Schlick’s and Hahn’s like Bela von Juhos, Josef Schächter, Walter Hollitscher, Heinrich Neider, Rose Rand, Josef Rauscher and Käthe Steinhardt, a secondary teacher, Robert Neumann, and, as notable thinkers with independent connections, the jurist and philosopher Felix Kaufmann (also a member of F.A. von Hayek’s “Geistkreis”) and the innovative psychologist Egon Brunswik (coming, like the even more loosely associated sociologists Paul Lazarsfeld and Marie Jahoda, from the pioneering Karl Bühler’s University Institute of Psychology).

Despite its prominent position in the rich, if fragile, intellectual culture of inter-war Vienna and most likely due to its radical doctrines, the Vienna Circle found itself virtually isolated in most of German speaking philosophy. The one exception was its contact and cooperation with the Berlin Society for Empirical (later: Scientific) Philosophy (the other point of origin of logical empiricism). The members of the Berlin Society sported a broadly similar outlook and included, besides the philosopher Hans Reichenbach, the logicians Kurt Grelling and Walter Dubislav, the psychologist Kurt Lewin, the surgeon Friedrich Kraus and the mathematician Richard von Mises. (Its leading members Reichenbach, Grelling and Dubislav were listed in the Circle’s manifesto as sympathisers.) At the same time, members of the Vienna Circle also engaged directly, if selectively, with the Warsaw logicians (Tarski visited Vienna in 1930, Carnap later that year visited Warsaw and Tarski returned to Vienna in 1935). Probably partly because of its firebrand reputation, the Circle attracted also a series of visiting younger researchers and students including Carl Gustav Hempel from Berlin, Hasso Härlen from Stuttgart, Ludovico Geymonat from Italy, Jørgen Jørgensen, Eino Kaila, Arne Naess and Ake Petzall from Scandinavia, A.J. Ayer from the UK, Albert Blumberg, Charles Morris, Ernest Nagel and W.V.O. Quine from the USA, H.A. Lindemann from Argentina and Tscha Hung from China. (The reports and recollections of these former visitors—e.g. Nagel 1936—are of interest in complementing the Circle’s in-house histories and recollections which start with the unofficial manifesto—Carnap, Hahn and Neurath 1929—and extend through Neurath 1936, Frank 1941, 1949a and Feigl 1943 to the memoirs by Carnap 1963, Feigl 1969a, 1969b, Bergmann 1987, Menger 1994.)

The aforementioned social and political engagement of members of the Vienna Circle and of Vienna Circle philosophy for Enlightenment reason had never made the advancement of its associates or protegées easy in Viennese academia. From 1934 onwards, with anti-semitism institutionalized and irrationalism increasingly dominating public discourse, this engagement began to cost the Circle still more dearly. Not only was the Verein Ernst Mach closed down early that year for political reasons, but the ongoing dispersal of Circle members by emigration, forced exile and death meant that after the murder of Schlick in 1936 only a small rump was able to continue meetings for another two years in Vienna. (1931: Feigl emigrated to USA; 1934: Hahn died, Neurath fled to Holland, 1940 to UK; 1935: Carnap emigrated to USA; 1936: Schlick murdered; 1937: Menger emigrated to USA, Waismann to UK; 1938: Frank, Kaufmann, Brunswik, Bergmann emigrated to USA; Zilsel, Rand to UK, later to USA; Hollitscher fled to Switzerland, later to UK; Schächter emigrated to Palestine; 1940: Gödel emigrated to USA; see Dahms 1995 for a chronology of the exodus.) But the end of the Vienna Circle as such did not mean the end of its influence due to the continuing development of the philosophy of former members (and the work of Kraft in post-World War II Vienna; on this see Stadler 2008). Particularly through their work in American exile (esp. Carnap at Harvard, Chicago and UCLA; Feigl at Iowa and Minnesota; less so Frank at Harvard) and that of earlier American visitors (esp. Quine, Nagel), as well as through the work of fellow emigrées from the Berlin Society (esp. Reichenbach, Hempel) and their students (Hilary Putnam, Wesley Salmon), logical empiricism strongly influenced the post-World War II development of analytic philosophy of science. By contrast, Waismann had little influence in the UK where Neurath, already marginalized, had died in 1945. (The full story of logical empiricism’s acculturation in the English speaking world remains to be written, but see Howard 2003, Reisch 2005, Uebel 2005a, 2010, Douglas 2009, and Romizi 2012 for considerations of aspects of Vienna Circle philosophy early and/or late that were neglected in the process and remained long forgotten.)

2.2 Activities

After its formative phase which was confined to the Thursday evening discussions, the Circle went public in 1928 and 1929 when it seemed that the time had come for their emerging philosophy to play a distinctive role not only in the academic but also the public sphere. In November 1928, at its founding session, Schlick accepted the presidency of the newly formed Verein Ernst Mach (Association Ernst Mach), Hahn accepted one of its vice-presidencies and Neurath and Carnap joined its secretariat. Originally proposed by the Austrian Freidenkerbund (Free Thinker Association), the Verein Ernst Mach was dedicated to the dissemination of scientific ways of thought and so provided a forum for popular lectures on the new scientific philosophy. In the following year the Circle stepped out under its own name (invented by Neurath) with a manifesto and a special conference. The publication of “The Scientific World Conception: The Vienna Circle”, signed by Carnap, Hahn and Neurath and dedicated to Schlick, coincided with the “First Conference for the Epistemology of the Exact Sciences” in mid-September 1929, organised jointly with the Berlin Society as an adjunct to the Fifth Congress of German Physicists and Mathematicians in Prague (where Frank played a prominent role in the local organising committee). (On the production history and early reception of the manifesto see Uebel 2008.) A distinct philosophical school appeared to be emerging, one that was dedicated to ending the previous disputes of philosophical schools by dismissing them, controversially, as strictly speaking meaningless.

Throughout the early and mid-1930s the Circle kept a high and increasingly international profile with its numerous publications and conferences. In 1930, the Circle took over, again together with the Berlin Society, the journal Annalen der Philosophie and restarted it under the name of Erkenntnis with Carnap and Reichenbach as co-editors. (Besides publishing original articles and sustaining lengthy debates, this journal featured selected proceedings of their early conferences and documented the lecture series of the Verein Ernst Mach and the Berlin Society as well as their international congresses.) In addition, from 1928 until 1936, Schlick and Frank served as editors of their book series “Schriften zur wissenschaftlichen Weltauffassung” (“Writings on the Scientific World Conception”), which published major works by leading members and early critics like Popper, while Neurath edited, from 1933 until 1939, the series “Einheitswissenschaft” (“Unified Science”), which published more introductory essays by leading members and sympathisers. Conference-wise, the Circle organized, again with the Berlin Society, a “Second Conference for the Epistemology of the Exact Sciences” as an adjunct to the Sixth Congress of German Physicists and Mathematicians in Königsberg in September 1930 (where Reidemeister played a prominent role in the organization and Gödel first announced his incompleteness result in the discussion) and then began the series of International Congresses on the Unity of Science with a “Pre-Conference” just prior to the start of the Eighth International Congress of Philosophy in Prague in September 1934. This, their last conference in Central Europe, was followed by the International Congresses of various sizes in Paris (September 1935, July 1937), Copenhagen (June 1936), Cambridge, England (July 1938), Cambridge, Mass. (September 1939), all in the main organized by Neurath; a smaller last gathering was held in Chicago in September 1941. By 1938 their collective publication activity began to centre on a monumentally planned International Encyclopedia of Unified Science, with Neurath as editor-in-chief and Carnap and Charles Morris as co-editors; by the time of Neurath’s death in 1945, only 10 monographs had appeared and the series was wound up in 1970 numbering 20 monographs under the title “Foundations of the Unity of Science” (notably containing Thomas Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions amongst them).

Individually, the members of the Vienna Circle published extensively before, during and after the years of the Circle around Schlick. For some (Frank, Hahn, Menger, Neurath), philosophy was only part of their scientific output, with numerous monographs and articles in their respective disciplines (mathematics, physics and social science); others (Schlick, Carnap, Feigl, Waismann) concentrated on philosophy, but even their output cared relatively little for traditional concerns of the field. Here it must be noted that two early monographs by Schlick (1918/25) and Carnap (1928a), commonly associated with the Vienna Circle, mostly predate their authors’ participation there and exhibit a variety of influences not typically associated with logical positivism (see section 3.7 below). Moreover, important monographs by Frank (1932), Neurath (1931a), Carnap (1934/37) and Menger (1934) in the first half of the 1930s represent moves away from positions that had been held in the Circle before and contradict its orthodox profile. Yet the Circle’s orthodoxy, as it were, is not easily pinned down either. Schlick himself was critical of the manifesto of 1929 and gave a brief vision statement of his own in “The Turning Point in Philosophy” (1930). A long-planned book by Waismann of updates on Wittgenstein’s thought, to which Schlick was extremely sympathetic, was never completed as originally planned and only appeared posthumously (Waismann 1965; for earlier material see Baker 2003). Comparison with rough transcripts of the Circle’s discussions in the early 1930s (for transcripts from between December 1930 and July 1931 see Stadler 1997 [2015, 69–123]) suggest that Waismann’s Wittgensteinian “Theses”, dated to “around 1930” (Waismann 1967 [1979, Appendix B]), come closest to an elaboration of the orthodox Circle position at that time (but which remained not undisputed even then). Again, what needs to be stressed is that all of the Circle’s publications are to be understood as contributions to ongoing discussions among its members and associates.

2.3 Overview of Doctrines

Despite the pluralism of the Vienna Circle’s views, there did exist a minimal consensus which may be put as follows. A theory of scientific knowledge was propagated which sought to renew empiricism by freeing it from the impossible task of justifying the claims of the formal sciences. It will be noted that this updating did not leave empiricism unchanged.

Following the logicism of Frege and Russell, the Circle considered logic and mathematics to be analytic in nature. Extending Wittgenstein’s insight about logical truths to mathematical ones as well, the Circle considered both to be tautological. Like true statements of logic, mathematical statements did not express factual truths: devoid of empirical content they only concerned ways of representing the world, spelling out implication relations between statements. The knowledge claims of logic and mathematics gained their justification on purely formal grounds, by proof of their derivability by stated rules from stated axioms and premises. (Depending on the standing of these axioms and premises, justification was conditional or unconditional.) Thus defanged of appeals to rational intuition, the contribution of pure reason to human knowledge (in the form of logic and mathematics) was thought easily integrated into the empiricist framework. (Carnap sought to accommodate Gödel’s incompleteness results by separating analyticity from effective provability and by postulating that arithmetic consisted of an infinite series of ever richer arithmetical languages; see the discussion and references in section 3.2 below.)

The synthetic statements of the empirical sciences meanwhile were held to be cognitively meaningful if and only if they were empirically testable in some sense. They derived their justification as knowledge claims from successful tests. Here the Circle appealed to a criterion of meaningfulness (cognitive significance) the correct formulation of which was problematical and much debated (and will be discussed in greater detail in section 3.1 below). Roughly, if synthetic statements failed testability in principle they were considered to be cognitively meaningless and to give rise only to pseudo-problems. No third category of significance besides that of a priori analytical and a posteriori synthetic statements was admitted: in particular, Kant’s synthetic a priori was banned as having been refuted by the progress of science itself. (The theory of relativity showed what had been held to be an example of the synthetic a priori, namely Euclidean geometry, to be false as the geometry of physical space.) Thus the Circle rejected the knowledge claims of metaphysics as being neither analytic and a priori nor empirical and synthetic. (On related but different grounds, they also rejected the knowledge claims of normative ethics: whereas conditional norms could be grounded in means-ends relations, unconditional norms remained unprovable in empirical terms and so depended crucially on the disputed substantive a priori intuition.)

Given their empiricism, all of the members of the Vienna Circle also called into question the principled separation of the natural and the human sciences. They were happy enough to admit to differences in their object domains, but denied the categorical difference in both their overarching methodologies and ultimate goals in inquiry, which the historicist tradition in the still only emerging social sciences and the idealist tradition in philosophy insisted on. The Circle’s own methodologically monist position was sometimes represented under the heading of “unified science”. Precisely how such a unification of the sciences was to be effected or understood remained a matter for further discussion (see section 3.3 below).

It is easy to see that, combined with the rejection of rational intuition, the Vienna Circle’s exclusive apportionment of reason into either formal a priori reasoning, issuing in analytic truths (or contradictions), and substantive a posteriori reasoning, issuing in synthetic truths (or falsehoods), severely challenged the traditional understanding of philosophy. All members of the Circle hailed the end of distinctive philosophical system building. In line with the Tractatus claim that all philosophy is really a critique of language, the Vienna Circle took the so-called linguistic turn, the turn to representation as the proper subject matter of philosophy. Philosophy itself was denied a separate first-order domain of expertise and declared a second-order inquiry. Whether the once queen of the sciences was thereby reduced to the mere handmaiden of the latter was still left open. It remained a matter of disagreement what type of distinctively philosophical insight, if any, would remain legitimate. Just as importantly, however, the tools of modern logic were employed also for metatheoretical construction, not just for the reduction of empirical claims to their observational base or, more generally, for the derivation of their observational consequences. For the price of abandoning foundationalist certainty this allowed for an enormous expansion of the domain of empirical discourse. Ultimately, it opened the space for the still ongoing discussions of scientific realism and its alternatives (see section 3.4 below).

The Circle’s leading protagonists differed in how they conceptualized this reflexive second-order inquiry that the linguistic turn had inaugurated. Nevertheless, they all agreed broadly that the ways of representing the world were largely determined by convention. A multitude of ideas hide behind this invocation of conventionality. One particularly radical one is the denial of the apodicity of all apriority, the denial of the claim that knowledge justified through reason alone represents truths that are unconditionally necessary. Another one is the imputation of agency in the construction of the logico-linguistic frameworks that make human cognition possible, the denial that conventionality could only mean acquiescence in tradition. Whether such ideas were followed by individual members of the Circle, however, depended on their own interests and influences. It is these often overlooked or misunderstood differences that hold the key to understanding the interplay of occasionally incompatible positions that make up Vienna Circle philosophy. (As can be seen from some of their internal disputes, moreover, these differences were also not always obvious to the protagonists themselves.)

To see a striking example, consider their overarching conceptions of philosophy itself. Some protagonists retained the idea that philosophy possessed a separate disciplinary identity from science and, like Schlick, turned philosophy into a distinctive, albeit non-formal activity of meaning determination. Others, like Carnap, agreed on the distinction between philosophy and science but turned philosophy into a purely formal enterprise, the so-called logic of science. Still others went even further and, like Neurath under the banner of “unified science”, also rejected philosophy as a separate discipline and treated what remained of it, after the rejection of metaphysics, as its partly empirical meta-theory, to be set beside the logic of science. With Schlick, then, philosophy became the activity of achieving a much clarified and deepened understanding of the cognitive and linguistic practices actually already employed in science and everyday discourse. By contrast, for Carnap, philosophy investigated and reconstructed existing language fragments, developed new logico-linguistic frameworks and suggested possible formal conventions for science, while, for Neurath, the investigation of science was pursued by an interdisciplinary meta-theory that encompassed empirical disciplines, again with a pragmatic orientation. Thus we find in apparent competition different conceptions of post-metaphysical philosophy: the projects of experiential meaning determination, of formal rational reconstruction and of naturalistic explications of leading theoretical and methodological notions. (For roughly representative early essay-length statements of their positions see Schlick 1930, Carnap 1932a and Neurath 1932a; later restatements are given in Schlick 1937, Carnap 1936b and Neurath 1936b.) In the more detailed discussions below these differences of overall approach will figure repeatedly (see also section 3.6 below).

Criticisms of the basic positions adopted in the Vienna Circle are legion, though it may be questioned whether most of them took account of the sophisticated variations on offer. (Sometimes the Circle’s own writings are disregarded altogether and “logical positivism” is discussed only via the proxy of Ayer’s popular exposition; see, e.g., Soames 2003.) But some Neo-Kantians like Ernst Cassirer may claim that they too accepted developments like the merely relative a priori and an appropriate conception of the historical development of science. Likewise, Wittgensteinians may claim that Wittgenstein’s own opposition to metaphysics only concerned false attempts to render it intelligible: his merely ineffable but uneliminated metaphysics concerned precisely what for him were essentials of ways of representing the world. The commonest criticisms, however, concerned not the uniqueness of the Vienna Circle’s doctrines, or their faithfulness to their supposed sources, but whether they were tenable at all. Prominent objects of this type of criticism include the verificationist theory of meaning and its claimed anti-metaphysical and non-cognitivist consequences as well as its own significance; the reductionism in phenomenalist or physicalist guises that appeared to attend the Circle’s attempted operationalisation of the logical atomism of Russell and Wittgenstein; and the Circle’s alleged scientism in general and their formalist and a-historical conception of scientific cognition in particular. These criticisms are discussed in some detail below in order to assess why which of the associated doctrines remain of what importance.

As noted, the Vienna Circle did not last long: its philosophical revolution came at a cost. Yet what was so socially, indeed politically, explosive about what appears on first sight to be a particularly arid, if not astringent, doctrine of specialist scientific knowledge? To a large part, precisely what made it so controversial philosophically: its claim to refute opponents not by proving their statements to be false but by showing them to be (cognitively) meaningless. Whatever the niceties of their philosophical argument here, the socio-political impact of the Vienna Circle’s philosophies of science was obvious and profound. All of them opposed the increasing groundswell of radically mistaken, indeed irrational, ways of thinking about thought and its place in the world. In their time and place, the mere demand that public discourse be perspicuous, in particular, that reasoning be valid and premises true—a demand implicit in their general ideal of reason—placed them in the middle of crucial socio-political struggles. Some members and sympathisers of the Circle also actively opposed the then increasingly popular völkisch supra-individual holism in social science as a dangerous intellectual aberration. Not only did such ideas support racism and fascism in politics, but such ideas themselves were supported only by radically mistaken arguments concerning the nature and explanation of organic and unorganic matter. So the first thing that made all of the Vienna Circle philosophies politically relevant was the contingent fact that in their day much political discourse exhibited striking epistemic deficits. That some of the members of the Circle went, without logical blunders, still further by arguing that socio-political considerations can play a legitimate role in some instances of theory choice due to underdetermination is yet another matter. This particular issue will not be pursued further here (see references at the end of section 2.1 above), nor the general topic of the Circle’s embedding in modernism and the discourse of modernity (see Putnam 1981b for a reductionist, Galison 1990 for a foundationalist, Uebel 1996 for a constructivist reading of their modernism, Dahms 2004 for an account of personal relations with representatives of modernism in art and architecture).

3. Selected Doctrines and their Criticisms

Given only the outlines of Vienna Circle philosophy, its controversial character is evident. The boldness of its claims made it attractive but that boldness also seemed to be its undoing. Turning to the questions of how far and, if at all, which forms of Vienna Circle philosophy stand up to some common criticisms, both the synchronic variations and the diachronic trajectories of its variants must be taken into account. This will be attempted in the sections below.

Before expectations are raised too high, however, it must also remembered that in this article only the views of members of the Vienna Circle can be discussed, even though the problematic issues were pervasive in logical empiricism generally. (Compare the SEP article “Logical Empiricism”; for articles on Reichenbach see, e.g, Spohn 1991 and Salmon and Wolters 1994, Richardson 2005, 2006, and, for the Berlin Group as a whole, Milkov and Peckhaus 2013.) Moreover, here the emphasis must lie on the main protagonists: Schlick, Carnap and Neurath. (Neither Hahn or Frank, nor Waismann or Feigl, for instance, can be discussed here as extensively as their work deserves; see, e.g., Uebel 2005b, 2011b, McGuinness 2011, Haller 2003, respectively.) What will be noted, however, is that Vienna Circle philosophy was by no means identical with the post-World War II logical empiricism that has come to be known as the “received view” of scientific theories, even though it would be hard to imagine the latter without the former. (For a systematic if schematic critical discussion of the received view, see Suppe 1977, for a partial defense Mormann 2007a.)

To deepen the somewhat cursory overview of Vienna Circle philosophy given above, we now turn to the discussion of the following issues: first, the viability of the conceptions of empirical significance employed by the Vienna Circle in its classical period; second, its uses of the analytic-synthetic distinction; third, its supposedly reductionist designs and foundationalist ambitions for philosophy; fourth, its stances in the debate about realism or anti-realism with regard to the theoretical terms in science; fifth, Carnap’s later ideas in response to some of the problems encountered; sixth, the issue of the status of the meaning criterion itself (variably referred to also as “criterion of significance” or “criterion of empirical significance”) and of the point of their critique of metaphysics; seventh, the Vienna Circle’s attitude towards history and of their own place in the history of philosophy.

These topics have been chosen for the light their investigation throws on the Circle’s own agendas and the reception of its doctrines amongst philosophers at large, as well as for the relative ease with which their discussion allows its development and legacy to be charted. There can be little doubt about the enormous impact that the members of the Vienna Circle had on the development of twentieth-century philosophy. What is less clear is whether any of its distinctive doctrines are left standing once the dust of their discussion has settled or whether those of its teachings that were deemed defensible merged seamlessly into the broad church that analytic philosophy has become (and, if so, what those surviving doctrines and teachings may be).

It must be noted, then, that the topics chosen for this article do not exhaust the issues concerning which the members of the Vienna Circle made significant contributions (which continue to stimulate work in the history of philosophy of science). Important topics like that of the theory and practice of unified science, of the nature of the empirical basis of science (the so-called protocol-sentence debate) and of the general structure of the theories of individual sciences can only be touched upon selectively. Likewise, while the general topic of ethical non-cognitivism receives only passing mentions, the Circle’s varied approaches to value theory cannot be discussed here (for an overview see Rutte 1986, for detailed analyses see Siegetsleitner 2014). Other matters, like the contributions made by Vienna Circle members to the development of probability theory and inductive logic, the philosophy of logic and mathematics (apart from the guiding ideas of Carnap) and to the philosophy of individual empirical sciences (physics, biology, psychology, social science), cannot be discussed at all (see Creath and Friedman 2007 and Richardson and Uebel 2007 for relevant essays with further references). But it may be noted that with his “logic of science” Carnap counts among the pioneers of what nowadays is called “formal epistemology”.

3.1 Verificationism and the Critique of Metaphysics

Not surprisingly, it was the Circle’s rejection of metaphysics by means of their seemingly devastating criterion of cognitive significance that attracted immediate opposition. (That they did not deny all meaning to statements thus ruled out of court was freely admitted from early on, but this “expressive” surplus was considered secondary to so-called “cognitive” meaning and discountable in science (see Carnap 1928b, 1932a).) Notwithstanding the metaphysicans’ thunder, however, the most telling criticisms of the criterion came from within the Circle or broadly sympathetic philosophers. When it was protested that failure to meet an empiricist criterion of significance did not make philosophical statements meaningless, members of the Circle simply asked for an account of what this non-empirical and presumably non-emotive meaning consisted in and typically received no convincing answer. The weakness of their position was rather that their own criterion of empirical significance seemed to resist an acceptable formal characterization.

To start with, it must be noted that long before the verification principle proper entered the Circle’s discourse in the late 1920s, the thought expressed by Mach’s dictum that “where neither confirmation nor refutation is possible, science is not concerned” (1883 [1960, 587]) was accepted as a basic precept of critical reflection about science. Responsiveness to evidence for and against a claim was the hallmark of scientific discourse. (Particularly the group Frank-Hahn-Neurath, who formed part of a pre-World War I discussion group (Frank 1941, 1949a) sometimes called the “First Vienna Circle” (Haller 1985, Uebel 2003), can be presumed to be familiar with Mach’s criterion.) Beyond this, still in the 1920s, Schlick (1926) convicted metaphysics for falsely trying to express as logically structured cognition what is but the inexpressible qualitative content of experience. Already then, however, Carnap (1928b, §7) edged towards a formal criterion by requiring empirically significant statements to be such that experiential support for them or for their negation is at least conceivable. Meaningfulness meant the possession of “factual content” which could not, on pain of rendering many scientific hypotheses meaningless, be reduced to actual testability. Instead, the empirical significance of a statement had to be conceived of as possession of the potential to receive direct or indirect experiential support (via deductive or inductive reasoning).

In 1930, considerations of this sort appeared to receive a considerable boost due to Waismann’s reports of Wittgenstein’s meetings with him and Schlick. Wittgenstein had discussed the thesis “The sense of a proposition is [the method of] its verification” in conversations with Schlick and Waismann on 22 December 1929 and 2 January 1930 (see Waismann 1967 [1979, 47 and 79]) and Waismann elaborated it in his “Theses” which were presented to the Circle as Wittgenstein’s considered views. While Wittgenstein appears to have thought of his dictum primarily as a constitutive principle of meaning, in the Circle it was put to work mainly as a demarcation criterion against metaphysics. Whether it was always noted that Wittgenstein’s thesis and the criterion of cognitive significance must be distinguished (the former entails the latter, but not vice versa) may be doubted, but striking differences emerged all the same. Like Carnap’s criterion of significance of 1928, the version of the criterion which followed from Wittgenstein’s dictum also allowed for verifiability in principle (and did not demand actual verifiability): like Carnap’s notion of experiential support, it worked with the mere conceivability of verifiability. Yet Wittgenstein’s criterion required conclusive verifiability which Carnap’s did not. (The demand for conclusive verifiability was discussed in the meetings with Wittgenstein.) By 1931, however, it had become clear to some that this would not do. What Carnap later called the “liberalization of empiricism” was underway and different camps became discernible within the Circle. It was over this issue that the so-called “left wing” with Carnap, Hahn, Frank and Neurath first distinguished itself from the “more conservative wing” around Schlick. (See Carnap 1936–37, 422 and 1963a, §9. Carnap 1936–37, 37n dated the opposition to strict verificationism to “about 1931”.)

In the first place, this liberalization meant the accommodation of universally quantified statements and the return, as it were, to salient aspects of Carnap’s 1928 conception. Everybody had noted that Wittgenstein’s criterion rendered universally quantified statements meaningless. Schlick (1931) thus followed Wittgenstein’s own suggestion to treat “hypotheses” instead as representing rules for the formation of verifiable singular statements. (His abandonment of conclusive verifiability is indicated only in Schlick 1936a.) By contrast, Hahn (1933, drawn from lectures in 1932) pointed out that hypotheses should be counted as properly meaningful as well and that the criterion be weakened to allow for less than conclusive verifiability. But other elements played into this liberalization as well. One that began to do so soon was the recognition of the problem of the irreducibility of disposition terms to observation terms (more on this presently). A third element was that disagreement arose as to whether the in-principle verifiability or support turned on what was merely logically possible or on what was nomologically possible, as a matter of physical law etc. A fourth element, finally, was that differences emerged as to whether the criterion of significance was to apply to all languages or whether it was to apply primarily to constructed, formal languages. Schlick retained the focus on logical possibility and natural languages throughout, but Carnap had firmly settled his focus on nomological possibility and constructed languages by the mid-thirties. Concerned with natural language, Schlick (1932, 1936a) deemed all statements meaningful for which it was logically possible to conceive of a procedure of verification; concerned with constructed languages only, Carnap (1936–37) deemed meaningful only statements for whom it was nomologically possible to conceive of a procedure of confirmation of disconfirmation.

Many of these issues were openly discussed at the Paris congress in 1935. Already in 1932 Carnap had sought to sharpen his previous criterion by stipulating that those statements were meaningful that were syntactically well-formed and whose non-logical terms were reducible to terms occurring in the basic observational evidence statements of science. While Carnap’s focus on the reduction of descriptive terms allows for the conclusive verification of some statements, it must be noted that his criterion also allowed universally quantified statements to be meaningful in general, provided they were syntactically and terminologically correct (1932a, §2). It was not until one of his Paris addresses, however, that Carnap officially declared the criterion of cognitive significance to be mere confirmability. Carnap’s new criterion required neither verification nor falsification but only partial testability so as now to include not only universal statements but also the disposition statements of science (see Carnap 1936–37; the English translation of the original Paris address (1936a [1949]) combines it with extraneous material). These disposition terms were thought to be linked to observation statements by a variety of reduction postulates or longer reduction chains, all of which provided only partial definitions (despite their name they provided no eliminative reductions). Though plausible initially, the device of introducing non-observational terms in this way gave rise to a number of difficulties which impugned the supposedly clear distinctions between logical and empirical matters and analytic and synthetic statements (Hempel 1951, 1963). Independently, Carnap himself (1939) soon gave up the hope that all theoretical terms of science could be related to an observational base by such reduction chains. This admission raised a serious problem for the formulation of a criterion of cognitive significance: how was one to rule out unwanted metaphysical claims while admitting as significant highly abstract scientific claims?

Consider that Carnap (1939, 1956b) admitted as legitimate theoretical terms that are implicitly defined in calculi that are only partially interpreted by correspondence rules between some select calculus terms and expressions belonging to an observational language (via non-eliminative reductions). The problem was that mere confirmability was simply too weak a criterion to rule out some putative metaphysical claims. Moreover, this problem arose for both the statement-based approach to the criterion (taken by Carnap in 1928, by Wittgenstein in 1929/30, and by Ayer both in the first (1936) and the second editions (1946) of Language Truth and Logic) and for the term-based approach (taken by Carnap since 1932). For the former approach, the problem was that the empirical legitimacy of statements obtained via indirect testing also transferred to any expressions that could be truth-functionally conjoined to them (for instance, by the rule of ‘or’-introduction). Statements thus became empirically significant, however vacuous they had been on their own. For the term-based approach, the problem was that, given the non-eliminability of dispositional and theoretical terms, empirical significance was no longer ascribable to individual expressions in isolation but became a holistic affair, with little guarantee in turn for the empiricist legitimacy of all the terms now involved.

For most critics (even within the ranks of logical empiricism), the problem of ruling out metaphysical statements while retaining the terms of high theory remained unsolved. By 1950, in response to the troubles of Ayer’s two attempts to account for the indirect testing of theoretical statements via their consequences, Hempel conceded that it was “useless to continue to search for an adequate criterion of testability in terms of deductive relationships to observation sentences” (1950 [1959, 116]). The following year, Hempel also abandoned the idea of using, as a criterion of empirical significance, Carnap’s method of translatability into an antecedently determined empirical language consisting only of observational non-logical vocabulary. Precisely because it was suitably liberalized to allow abstract scientific theories with merely partial interpretations, its anti-metaphysical edge was blunted: it allowed for combination with “some set of metaphysical propositions, even if the latter have no empirical interpretation at all” (1951, 70). Hempel drew the holistic conclusion that the units of empirical significance were entire theories and that the measure of empirical significance itself was multi-criterial and, moreover, allowed for degrees of significance. To many, this amounted to the demise of the Circle’s anti-metaphysical campaign. By contrast, Feigl’s reaction (1956) was to reduce the ambition of the criterion of significance to the mere provision of necessary conditions.

Some further work was undertaken on rescuing and, again, debunking a version of the statement-based criterion, but mostly not by (former) members of the Vienna Circle. However, in response to the problem of how to formulate a meaning criterion that suitably distinguished between empirically significant and insignificant non-observational terms, Carnap proposed a new solution in 1956. We will return to discuss it separately (see section 3.5 below); for now we need only note that these proposals were highly technical and applied only to axiomatized theories in formal languages. They too, however, found not much favor amongst philosophers. Yet whatever the problems that may or may not beset them, it would seem that far more general philosophical considerations contributed to the disappearance of the problem of the criterion of cognitive significance from most philosophical discussions since the early 1960s (other than as an example of mistaken positivism). These include the increasing opposition to the distinctions between analytic and synthetic statements and observational and theoretical terms as well as a general sense of dissatisfaction with Carnap’s approach to philosophy which began to seem both too formalist in execution and too deflationary in ambition. The entire philosophical program of which the search for a precise criterion of empirical significance was a part had begun to fall out of favor (and with it technical discussions about the criterion’s latest version).

The widely perceived collapse of the classical Viennese project to find in an empiricist meaning criterion a demarcation criterion against metaphysics—we reserve judgement about Carnap’s last two proposals here—can be interpreted in a variety of ways. It strongly suggests that cognitive significance cannot be reduced to what is directly observable, whether that be interpreted in phenomenalist or intersubjective, physicalist terms. In that important but somewhat subsidiary sense, the collapse spelt the failure of many of the reductivist projects typically ascribed to Viennese neopositivism (but see section 3.3 below). Beyond that, what actually had failed was the attempt to characterize for natural languages the class of cognitively significant propositions by recursive definitions in purely logical terms, either by relations of deducibility or translatability. What failed, in other words, was the attempt to apply a general conception of philosophical analysis as purely formal, pursued also in other areas, to the problem of characterizing meaningfulness.

This general conception can be considered formalist in several senses. It was formalist, first, in demanding the analysis of the meaning of concepts and propositions in terms of logically necessary and sufficient conditions: it was precise and brooked no exceptions. And it was formalist, second, in demanding that such analyses be given solely in terms of the logical relations of these concepts and propositions to other concepts and propositions: it used the tools of formal logic. There is also a third sense that is, however, applicable predominantly to the philosophical project in Carnap’s hands, in that it was formalist since it concentrated on the analysis of contested concepts via their explication in formal languages. (Discussion of its viability must be deferred until sections 3.5 and 3.6 below, since what’s at issue currently is only the formalist project as applied to concepts in natural language.) The question arises whether all Vienna Circle philosophers concerned with empirical significance in natural language were equally affected, for the collapse of the formalist project may leave as yet untouched other ways of sustaining the objection that metaphysics is, in some relevant sense, cognitively insignificant. (Such philosophers in turn would have to answer the charge, of course, that only the formalist project of showing metaphysics strictly meaningless rendered the Viennese anti-metaphysics distinctive.)

Even though the formalist project became identified with mainstream logical empiricism generally (consider its prominence in confirmation theory and in the theory of explanation), it was not universally subscribed to in the Vienna Circle itself. In different ways, neither Schlick nor Neurath or Frank adhered to it. As noted in the overview above, Schlick’s attempts to exhibit natural language meaning abjured efforts to characterize it in explicitly formal terms, even though he accepted the demand for necessary and sufficient conditions of significance. In the end, moreover, Schlick turned away from his colleagues’ search for a criterion of empirical significance. In allowing talk of life after death as meaningful (1936a), for the very reason that what speaks against it is only the empirical impossibility of verifying such talk, Schlick’s final criterion clearly left empiricist strictures behind.

By contrast, Neurath and Frank kept their focus on empirical significance. While they rarely discussed these matters explicitly, their writings give the impression that Neurath and Frank chose to adopt (if not retain) a contextual, exemplar-based approach to characterizing the criterion of meaninglessness and so decided to forego the enumeration of necessary and sufficient conditions. Mach’s precept cited earlier is an example of such a pragmatic approach, as is, it should be noted, Peirce’s criterion of significance, endorsed by Quine (1969), which claims that significance consists in making a discernible difference whether a proposition is likely to be true or false. Mach’s pragmatic approach had been championed already before verificationism proper by Neurath, Frank and Hahn who became, like Carnap, early opponents of conclusive verifiability. (Indeed, it is doubtful whether Neurath’s radical fallibilism, most clearly expressed already in 1913, ever wavered.) This pragmatic understanding found clear expression in Neurath’s adoption (1935a, 1938) of K. Reach’s formulation of metaphysical statements as “isolated” ones, as statements that do not derive from and hold no consequences for those statements that we do accept on the basis of empirical evidence or for logical reasons. (Hempel’s dismissal, in 1951, of this pragmatic indicator presupposes the desiderata of the formalist project.) Finally, there is Frank’s suggestion (1963), coupled with his longstanding advice to combine logical empiricism with pragmatism, that Carnap’s purely logical critique of metaphysics in (1932a) was bound to remain ineffective as long as the actual use of metaphysics remained unexamined. It would be worth investigating whether—if the critique of the alleged reductionist ambitions of their philosophy could also be deflected (see section 3.3 below)—the impetus of the anti-verificationist critique can be absorbed by those with a pragmatic approach to the demarcation against metaphysics. Much as with Quine’s Peirce, such a criterion rules out as without interest for epistemic activity all concepts and propositions whose truth or falsity make no appreciable difference to the sets of concepts and propositions we do accept already.

An entirely different moral was drawn by Reichenbach (1938) and thinkers indebted to his probabilistic conception of meaning and his probabilistic version of verificationism, which escaped the criticisms surveyed above by vagaries of its own. Such theorists perceive the failure of the formalist model to accommodate the empirical significance of theoretical terms to stem from its so-called deductive chauvinism. In place of the exclusive reliance on the hypothetical-deductive method these theorists employ non-demonstrative analogical and causal inductive reasoning to ground theoretical statements empirically. Like Salmon, these theorists adopt a form of “non-linguistic empiricism” which they sharply differentiate from the empiricism of the Vienna Circle (Salmon 1985, 2003 and Parrini 1998).

Now against both the pragmatic and the post-linguistic responses to the perceived failure of the attempt to provide a precise formal criterion of significance serious worries can be raised. Thus it must be asked whether without a precise way of determining when a statement ‘makes an appreciable difference’, criticism of metaphysics based on such a criterion may be not be considered as a biased dismissal rather than a demonstration of fact and so fall short of what is needed. Likewise in the case of the anti-deductivist response, it must be noted that a criterion based on analogical reasoning will only be as effective as the strength of the analogy which can always be criticized as inapt (and similarly for appeals to causal reasoning). The very point of exact philosophy in a scientific spirit—for many the very point of Vienna Circle philosophy itself—seems threatened by such maneuvres. Acquiescence in the perceived failure of the proposed criteria of significance thus comes with a price: if not that of abandoning Vienna Circle philosophy altogether, then at least that of formulating an alternative understanding to how some of its ambitions ought to be understood. (Recent reconstructive work on Carnap, Neurath and Frank may be regarded in this light.)

A still different response—but one emblematic for the philosophical public at large—is that of another of Reichenbach’s former students, Putnam, who came to reject the anti-metaphysical project that powered verificationism in its entirety. Repeatedly in his later years, Putnam called for a refashioning of analytic philosophy as such, providing, as it were, a philosophically conservative counterweight to Rorty’s turn to postmodernism. Putnam’s reasons (the alleged self-refutation of the meaning criterion) are still different from those surveyed above and will be discussed when we return to reconsider the very point of the Circle’s campaign against metaphysics (see section 3.6 below).

3.2 The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction and the Relative A Priori

Whether the verificationist agenda was pursued in a formalist or pragmatic vein, however, all members shared the belief that meaningful statements divided exclusively into analytic and synthetic statements which, when asserted, were strictly matched with a priori and a posteriori reasoning for their support. The Vienna Circle wielded this pairing of epistemic and semantic notions as a weapon not only against the substantive a priori of the Schoolmen but also against Kant’s synthetic a priori. Moreover, their notion of analyticity comprized both logical and mathematical truths, thereby extending Wittgenstein’s understanding of the former as “tautological” in support of a broadly logicist program.

It is well known that this central component of the Vienna Circle’s arsenal, the analytic/synthetic distinction, came under sharp criticism from Quine in his “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (1951a), less so that the criticism can only be sustained by relying on objections of a type first published by Tarski. The argument is more complex, but here is a very rough sketch. So as to discard the analytic/synthetic distinction as an unwarranted dogma, Quine in “Two Dogmas” argued for the in-principle revisability of all knowledge claims and criticised the impossibility of defining analyticity in a non-circular fashion. The first argument tells against the apodictic a priori of old (the eternal conceptual verities), but, as we shall see, it is unclear whether it tells against at least some of the notions of the a priori held in the Vienna Circle. The second argument presupposes a commitment to extensionalism that likewise can be argued not to have been shared by all in the Circle. By contrast, Tarski had merely observed that, at a still more fundamental level, he knew of no basis for a sharp distinction between logical and non-logical terms. (For relevant primary source materials see also Quine 1935, 1951b, 1963, Carnap 1950, 1955, 1963b, their correspondence and related previously unpublished lectures and writings in Creath 1990, the memoir Quine 1991, and Tarski 1936.)

The central role on the Vienna Circle’s side in this discussion falls to Carnap and the reorientation of philosophy he sought to effect in Logical Syntax (1934/37). It was the notion of the merely relative and therefore non-apodictic a priori that deeply conditioned his notion of analyticity and allowed him to sidestep Quine’s fallibilist argument in a most instructive fashion. In doing so Carnap built on an idea behind Reichenbach’s early attempt (1920) to comprehend the general theory of relativity by means of the notion of a merely constitutive a priori. Now Schlick had objected to the residual idealism of this proposal (see Oberdan 2009) and prefered talk of conventions instead and Reichenbach soon followed him in this (see Coffa 1991, Ch. 10). Carnap too did not speak of the relative a priori as such (in returning to this terminology present discussions follow Friedman 1994), but his pluralism of logico-linguistic frameworks furnishes precisely that.

First consider Schlick as a contrast class. Schlick (1934) appeared to show little awareness of the language-relativity of the analytic/synthetic distinction and spoke of analytic truths as conceptual necessities that can be conclusively surveyed. This would suggest that Schlick rejected Kant’s apodictic synthetic a priori but not the apodicity of analytic statements. Clearly, if that were so, Quine’s argument from universal fallibilism would find a target here. Matters are not quite so clear-cut, however. Schlick had long accepted the doctrine of semantic conventionalism that the same facts could be captured by different conceptual systems (1915): this would suggest that his analytic truths were conventions that were framework-relative and as such necessary only in the very frameworks they helped to constitute. Yet Schlick did not countenance the possibility of incommensurable conceptual frameworks: any fact was potentially expressible in any framework (1936b). As a result, Schlick did not accept the possibility that after the adoption of a new framework the analytic truths of the old one may be no longer assertable, that they could be discarded as no longer applicable even in translation, as it were. Herein lay a point that Quine’s argument could exploit: Schlick’s analytic truths remained unassailable despite their language-relativity.

Now Carnap, under the banner of the principle of logical tolerance (1934/37, §17), abandoned the idea of the one universal logic which had informed Frege, Russell and Wittgenstein before him. Instead, he recognized a plurality of logics and languages whose consistency was an objective matter even though axioms and logical rules were fixed entirely by convention. Already due to this logical pluralism, the framework-relativity of analytic statements went deeper for Carnap than it did for Schlick. But Carnap also accepted the possibility of incommensurability between seemingly similar descriptive terms and between entire conceptual systems (1936a). Accepting the analytic truths of the framework of our best physical theory may thus be incompatible with accepting those of an earlier one, even if the same logic is employed in both. Carnapian analyticities do not therefore express propositions that we hold to be true unconditionally, but only propositions true relative to their own framework: they are no longer held to be potentially translatable across all frameworks. Quine’s charge of universal revisability (which itself needs some modification; see Putnam 1978) thus misses its mark against them. (Quine, of course, also rejected Carnap’s ultimately intensionalist accommodation of radical fallibilism via the notion of language change.)

Concerning the criticism of the circular nature of the definition of analyticity, Carnap responded that it pertained primarily to the idea of analyticity in natural language whereas he was interested in “explications” as provided by the logic of science (or better, a logic of science, since there existed no unique logic of science for Carnap). Explications are reconstructions in a formal language of selected aspects of complex terms that should not be expected to model the original in all respects (1950b, Ch.1). Moreover, Carnap held that explication of the notion of analyticity in formal languages yielded the kind of precision that rendered the complaint of circularity irrelevant: vague intuitions of meaning were no longer relied upon. Those propositions of a given language were analytic that followed from its axioms and, once the syntactic limitations of the Logical Syntax period had been left behind, from its definitions and meaning postulates, by application of its rules: no ambiguity obtained.

So it may appear that the notion of analyticity is easily delimitable in Carnap’s explicational approach: analytic propositions would be those that constitute a logico-linguistic framework. But complications arose from the fact that, on Carnap’s understanding, not all propositions defining a logico-linguistic framework need be analytic ones (1934/37, §51). It was possible for a framework to consist not only of L-rules, whose entirety determines the notion of logical consequence, but also of P-rules, which represent presumed physical laws. So let analytic propositions be those framework propositions whose negations are self-contradictory. Here a problem arose once the syntactic constraints were dropped by Carnap after Logical Syntax so as to allow semantic reasoning and the introduction of so-called meaning postulates: now the class of analytic propositions was widened to include not only logical and mathematical truths but also those obtained by substitution of semantically equivalent expressions. How was one now to explicate the idea that there can be non-analytic framework propositions (whose negations are not self-contradictory)? Consider that for opponents like Quine, responding that the negations of non-analytic framework propositions do not contradict meaning postulates, was merely to dress up a presupposed notion of meaning in pseudo-formal garb: while it provided what looked like formal criteria, Carnap’s method did not leave the circle of intensional notions behind and so seemed to beg the question. Meaning postulates (Carnap 1952), after all, could only be identified by appearing on a list headed “meaning postulates” (as Quine added in reprints of 1951a).

Here one must note that in Logical Syntax, Carnap also modified the thesis of extensionality he had previously defended alongside Russell and Wittgenstein: now it merely claimed the possibility of purely extensional languages and no longer demanded that intensional languages be reduced to them (ibid., §67). Of course, the mere claim that the language of science can be extensional still proves troublesome enough, given that in such a language a distinction between laws and accidentally true universal propositions cannot be drawn (the notion of a counterfactual conditional, needed to distinguish the former, is an intensional one). Even so, this opening of Carnap’s towards intensionalism already at the height of his syntacticism—to say nothing of his explicit intensionalism in Meaning and Necessity (1947)—seems enough to thwart Quine’s second complaint in “Two Dogmas”. Carnap did not share Quine’s extensionalist agenda, so the need to break out of the circle of intensional notions once these were clearly defined in his formal languages did not apply. That theirs were in fact different empiricist research programmes was insufficiently stressed, it would appear, by Quine and Quinean critics of Carnap (as noted pointedly by Stein 1992; cf. Ricketts 1982, 2003, Creath 1991, 2004, Richardson 1997).

To sustain his critique, Quine had to revive his and Tarski’s early doubts about Carnap’s methodological apparatus and dig even deeper. (Tarski also shared Quine’s misgivings about analyticity when they discussed these issues with Carnap at Harvard; see Mancosu 2005, Frost-Arnold 2013.) Their scepticism found its target in Carnap’s ingenious measures in Logical Syntax taken to preserve the thesis that mathematics is analytic from the ravages of Gödel’s incompleteness theorems. Gödel proved that every formal system strong enough to represent number theory contains a formula that is true but neither itself or its negation is provable in that system; such formulae—known since as Gödel sentences—are provable in a still stronger system which, however, also contains a formula of its own that is true but not provable in it (and neither is its negation). Commonly, Gödel’s proof is taken to have undermined the thesis of the analyticity of arithmetic. (For discussions of this challenge to Carnap’s logical syntax project, see Friedman 1988, 1999a, 2009, Goldfarb and Ricketts 1992, Richardson 1994, Awodey and Carus 2003, 2004.) Carnap responded by stating that arithmetic demands an infinite sequence of ever richer languages and by declaring analytic statements to be provable by non-finite reasoning (1934/37, §60a-d). This looked like fitting the bill on purely technical grounds, but it is questionable whether such reasoning may still count as syntactic. Nowadays, it is computational effectiveness that is taken to distinguish purely formal from non-formal, material reasoning. (Carnap’s move highlights the tension within Logical Syntax between formal and crypto-semantic reasoning: that the rigid syntacticism officially advertised there was at the same time undermined as its failings were being compensated—illegitimately so by official standards, e.g., by considering translatability a syntactic notion—points ahead to his acceptance of semantics in 1935, only one year after the publication of Logical Syntax and contrary to his disparagement of the notion of synthetic truth there. For a discussion of Carnap’s moves, see Coffa 1978, Ricketts 1996, Goldfarb 1997, Creath 1996, 1999.) It is no criticism that Carnap’s reconstruction of arithmetic was not standard logicism, but that Carnap unduly stretched the idea of formal reasoning is. Was he saved by his shift to semantics?

Tarski (1936) granted the language-relativity of the reconstructed notion of analyticity in Logical Syntax. He also did not object that Carnap’s procedure of circumventing the problem which the Gödel sentences presented to the thesis of the analyticity of arithmetic was illegitimate. Tarski rather questioned whether there were “objective reasons” for the sharp distinction between logical and non-logical terms and he pointed out that Carnap’s distinction between the logical and the empirical was not a hard and fast one. Since noting that the distinction between logical and non-logical was not a sharp one and arguing that no principled distinction could be upheld between them are two quite different reactions, however, Tarski’s point on its own does not fully support the Quinean critique. Quine’s conclusion (1940, §60) that the notion of logical truth itself is “informal” rather reflects the moral that he drew from Tarski’s observation. It appears that what motivated him (after a nominalistic interlude in the 1940s) to develop his naturalistic alternative to Carnap’s conception of philosophy was his considered rejection of Carnap’s accommodation of the thesis that arithmetic is analytic to Gödel’s result.

Different strands of Quine’s criticism of the analytic/synthetic distinction must thus be distinguished. While Quine’s criticisms in “Two Dogmas” on their own clearly did not undermine all forms of the distinction that were defended in the Vienna Circle—Carnap’s reconstructions of the notion of analyticity did not express unconditionally necessary and unrevisable propositions—they do gain in plausibility even against Carnap’s once it is recognized that the deepest ground of contestation lies elsewhere: not in the notion of analyticity widely understood but in that of logical truth narrowly understood. Read in this way, Quine can be seen to argue that the notion of L-consequence as explication of analytic truth—as opposed to P-consequence as non-analytic, mere framework entailments—traded not only on the idea of non-finitary notions of proof but also on a distinction of logical from descriptive expressions that itself only proceeded on the basis of a finite enumeration of the former (compare Carnap 1934/37, §§51–52). (This deficit was not repaired in Carnap’s later work either; see Awodey 2007.) What Quine criticized was precisely the fact that Carnap could ground the distinction between logical and non-logical terms no deeper than by the enumeration of the former in a given framework: was the distinction therefore not quite arbitrary?

Quine’s direct arguments against the distinction between logical and empirical truth (1963) have been found to beg the question against Carnap and his way of conceiving of philosophy (Creath 2003). This way of responding to Quine’s objection requires us to specify still more precisely just what Carnap thought he was doing when he employed the distinction between analytic and synthetic propositions. To be sure, in (1955) he gave broadly behavioural criteria for when meaning ascriptions could be deemed accepted in linguistic practice, but he also noted that this was not a general requirement for the acceptability of explicatory discourse. To repeat, explications did not seek to model natural language concepts in their tension-filled vividness, but to make proposals for future use and to extract and systematize certain aspects for constructive purposes. Thus Carnap clarified (1963b, §32) that he regarded the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements—just like the distinction between descriptive or factual and prescriptive or evaluative statements—not as descriptive of natural language practices, but as a constructive tool for logico-linguistic analysis and theory construction. It is difficult to overstress the significance of this stance of Carnap’s for the evaluation of his version of the philosophical project of the Vienna Circle. Carnap’s understanding of philosophy has thus been aptly described as the “science of possibilities” (Mormann 2000).

As Carnap understood the analytic/synthetic distinction, it was a distinction drawn by a logician to enable greater theoretical systematicity in the reconstructive understanding of a given symbol system, typically a fragment of a historically developed one. That fully determinative objective criteria of what to regard as a logical and what as a non-logical term cannot be assumed to be pre-given does not then in and of itself invalidate the use of that distinction by Carnap. On the contrary, it has been convincingly argued that Carnap himself did not hold to a notion of what is a factual and what is a formal expression or statement that was independent of the specification of the language in question (Ricketts 1994). The ultimate ungroundedness of his basic semantic explicatory categories, this suggests instead, was a fact that his own theories fully recognized and consciously exploited. (Somewhat analogously, that we cannot define science independently of the practice of scientists of “our culture” was admitted by Neurath 1932a, Carnap 1932d and Hempel 1935, much to the exasperation of Zilsel 1932 and Schlick 1935a.)

It remained open for Carnap then to declare his notion of analyticity to be only operationally defined for constructed languages and to let that notion be judged entirely in terms of its utility for meta-theoretical reflection. Just on that account, however, a last hurdle remains: finding a suitable criterion of significance for theoretical terms that allows the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements to be drawn in the non-observational, theoretical languages of science. (This was a problem ever since the non-eliminative reducibility of disposition terms had been accepted and one that still held for Carnap’s 1956 criterion; see section 3.5 below). Only if that can be done, we must therefore add, can Carnap claim his formalist explicationist project to emerge unscathed from the criticisms of both Tarski and Quine.

An important related though independently pursued line of criticism may be noted here. It finds its origin in Saunders Mac Lane’s review (1937) of Carnap’s Logical Syntax and focusses less on the analytic/synthetic distinction than on Carnap’s failure to give a formally correct definition of logic. It challenges the ambition to have accounted for the formal sciences but declines to embrace a naturalistic alternative. Further research along these lines has suggested to some that by extending Carnap’s approach and framework it can be linked to attempts in category theory to provide the missing definition (see Awodey 2012, 2017), while a different response to Mac Lane’s as well as Quine’s criticisms defends Carnap’s inability, frankly admitted in (1942, 57) to define logical terms as such in full generality (Creath 2017).

None of the above considerations should lead one to deny, however, that one can find understandings of the term “analytic” by members of the Vienna Circle (like Schlick) that do fall victim to the criticisms of Quine more easily. Nor should one discount the fact that Carnap’s logic of science emerges as wilfully ill-equipped to deal with the problems that exercise the traditional metaphysics or epistemologies that deal in analyticities. (Of course, unlike his detractors, Carnap considered this to be a merit of his approach.) Lastly, it must be noted that Carnap’s intensionalist logic of science holds out the promise of practical utility only for the price of a pragmatic story that remains to be told. Of what nature are the practical considerations and decisions that, as Carnap so freely conceded (1950a), are called for when choosing logico-linguistic frameworks? (Such conventional choices do not respond to truth or falsity, but instead to whatever is taken to measure convenience.) That Carnap rightly may have considered such pragmatic questions beyond his own specific brief as a logician of science does not obviate the need for an answer to the question itself. (Carus 2007 argues that in this broadly pragmatic dimension lies the very point of Carnap’s explicationism.) On this issue, too, it would have been helpful if there had been more collaboration with Neurath and Frank, who were sympathetic to Carnap’s explication of analyticity but did not refer to it much in their own, more practice-oriented investigations (see section 3.6 below).

3.3 Reductionism and Foundationalism: Two Criticisms Partly Rebutted

As it happens, anti-verificationism has two aspects: opposition to meaning reductionism and opposition to the formalist project. Turning to the former, we must distinguish two forms of reductionism, phenomenalist and physicalist reductionism. Phenomenalism holds statements to be cognitively significant if they can be reduced to statements about one’s experience, be it outer (senses) or inner (introspection). Physicalism holds statements to be cognitively significant if they can be reduced or evidentially related to statements about physical states of affairs. Here it must be noted not only that the Vienna Circle is typically remembered in terms of the apparently phenomenalist ambitions of Carnap’s Aufbau of 1928, but also that already by the early 1930s some form of physicalism was favoured by some leading members including Carnap (1932b) and that already in the Aufbau the possibility of a different basis for a conceptual genealogy than the phenomenal one actually chosen had been indicated. Thus one must not only ask about the reductionism in the Aufbau but also consider just how reductivist in intent the physicalism was meant to be.

Considerations can begin with an early critique that has given rise in some quarters to a sharp distinction between Viennese logical positivism and German logical empiricism, with the former accused of reductionism and the latter praised for their anti-reductionism, a distinction which falsely discounts the changing nature and variety of Vienna Circle doctrines. Reichenbach’s defense of empiricism (1938) turned on the replacement of the criterion of strict verifiability with one demanding only that the degree of probability of meaningful statements be determinable. This involved opposition also to demands for the eliminative reduction of non-observational to observational statements: both phenomenalism and reductive physicalism were viewed as untenable and a correspondentist realism was advanced in their stead. Now it is true that of the members of the Vienna Circle only Feigl ever showed sympathies for scientific realism, but it is incorrect that all opposition to it in the Circle depended on the naive semantics of early verificationism. Again, of course, some Vienna Circle positions were liable to Reichenbach’s criticism.

Another misunderstanding to guard against is that the Vienna Circle’s ongoing concern with “foundational issues” and the “foundations of science” does in itself betoken foundationalism. (In the Vienna Circle’s days, foundationalism had it that the basic items of knowledge upon which all others depended were independent of each other, concerned phenomenal states of affairs and were infallible; nowadays, foundationalists drop phenomenalism and infallibility.) Already the manifesto sought to make clear the Circle’s opposition when it claimed that “the work of ‘philosophic’ or ‘foundational’ investigations remains important in accord with the scientific world conception. For the logical clarification of scientific concepts, statements and methods liberates one from inhibiting prejudices. Logical and epistemological analysis does not wish to set barriers to scientific enquiry; on the contrary, analysis provides science with as complete a range of formal possibilities as is possible, from which to select what best fits each empirical finding (example: non-Euclidean geometries and the theory of relativity).” (Carnap-Hahn-Neurath 1929 [1973, 316]) This passage can be read as an early articulation of the project of a critical-constructivist meta-theory of science that abjures a special authority of its own beyond that stemming from the application of the methods of the empirical and formal sciences to science itself, but instead remains open to what the actual practice of these sciences demands.

How then can Vienna Circle philosophy be absolved of foundationalism? As noted, it is the Aufbau (and echoes of it in the manifesto) that invites the charge of phenomenalist reductionism. To begin with, one must distinguish between the strategy of reductionism and the ambition of foundationalism. Concerning the Aufbau it has been argued that its strategy of reconstructing empirical knowledge from the position of methodological solipsism (phenomenalism without its ontological commitments and some of its epistemological ambitions) is owed not to foundationalist aims but to the ease by which this position seemed to allow the demonstration of the interlocking and structural nature of our system of empirical concepts, a system that exhibited unity and afforded objectivity, which was Carnap’s main concern. (See Friedman’s path-breaking 1987 and 1992, and Richardson 1990, 1998, Ryckman 1991, Pincock 2002, 2005. For the wide variety of influences on the Aufbau more generally, see Damböck 2016.) However, it is hard to deny categorically that Carnap ever harbored foundationalist ambitions. Not only did Carnap locate his Aufbau very close to foundationalism in retrospect (1963a), but a passage in his (1930) led Uebel (2007, Ch.6) to claim that around 1929/30 Carnap was motivated by foundationalist principles and reinterpreted his own Aufbau along these lines (around the same time that Wittgenstein entertained a psychologistic reinterpretation of his own Tractatus that was reported back to the Circle by Waismann). To correct this foundationalist aberration was the task of the Circle’s subsequent protocol-sentence debate about the content, form and status of the evidence statements of science.

This concession to the foundationalist misinterpretation of Vienna Circle philosophies generally must not, however, be taken to tell against the new reading of the Aufbau or the epistemologies developed from 1930 onwards on the physicalist wing of the Circle. In fact, the Aufbau itself fails when it is read as a foundationalist project, as it was by Quine (1951a) who pointed out that no eliminative definition of the relation ‘is at’ was provided (required for locating objects of consciousness in physical space). Yet other failures of reduction were detected by Richardson (1998, Ch.3), further questioning the Aufbau’s supposed foundationalist intent. Ultimately it was a still different failure of reduction that prompted Carnap to abandon as mistaken reconstructions of the scientific language on the basis of methodological solipsism (though not logical investigations of such languages for their own sake, as noted in his 1961a). Initially Carnap had not been prepared to draw this conclusion even though Neurath (1931b, 1932a) argued that such a type of rational reconstruction traded on objectionable counterfactual presuppositions (methodological solipsism did not provide a correct description of the reasoning involved in cognitive commerce with the world around us). At the time Carnap merely conceded that it was more “convenient” to reconstruct the language of science on a physicalistic basis (1932e). Only the failure of reducing dispositional predicates to observational ones convinced him to abandon the methodologically solipsist approach (1936–37, 464 and 10) and to adopt an exclusively physicalist basis for his reconstructions of the language of science from then on (a decision explicitly reaffirmed in 1963b). Carnap’s initial reluctance to draw this conclusion is best interpreted, not as hankering after epistemological foundations, but as indicating the growing conviction that philosophical methodology had to be built on logical reasons and should not be “entangled with psychological questions” (1934/37, §72). Moreover, already Carnap’s initial hope for a phenomenalist reduction in the Aufbau as well as his decision in (1932e) to loosen the methodologically solipsist claim on epistemology were motivated by logical considerations, the former by mistaken ideas in Untersuchungen zur allgemeinen Axiomatik (2000, unpublished at the time) and the latter partly as a consequence of Gödel’s advice on a faulty definition of analyticity in a draft of Logical Syntax (see Ricketts 2010 and Awodey and Carus 2007 respectively).

It could likewise be asked concerning physicalism whether it represented, on a different basis, the pursuit of a foundationalist agenda. But that Carnap later in (1936/37) called his non-eliminative definitions of disposition terms “reduction sentences” already indicates that it was enough for him to provide a basis for the applicability of these terms by merely sufficient but not necessary conditions. Likewise, Carnap’s proposal (1939) to conceive of theoretical terms as defined by implicit definition in a non-interpreted language, selected terms of which were, however, linked via non-eliminative reductive chain to the observational language, suggests that what concerned him primarily was the capture of indicator relations to sustain in principle testability of statements containing the terms in question. This is best understood as an attempt to preserve the empirical applicability of the formal languages constructed for high-level theory, but not as reductivism with regard to some foundational given.

By contrast, Neurath never advocated methodological solipsism. Consider that his complex conception of the form of protocol statements (1932b) explicated the concept of observational evidence in terms that expressly reflected debts to empirical assumptions which called for theoretical elaboration in turn. For unlike the logician of science Carnap, who left it to psychology and brain science to determine more precisely what the class observational predicates were that could feature in protocol statements (1936/37), the empirically oriented meta-theoretician of science Neurath was concerned to encompass and comprehend the practical complexities of reliance on scientific testimony: the different clauses (embeddings) of his proposed protocol statements stand for conditions on the acceptance of such testimony (see Uebel 2009). In addition, Neurath’s theory of protocol statements also makes clear that his understanding of physicalism did not entail the eliminative reduction of the phenomenon of intentionality but, like Carnap (1932c), merely sought its integration into empiricist discourse.

Given these different emphases of their respective physicalisms, mention must also be made of the significant differences between Carnap’s and Neurath’s conceptions of unified science: where the formalist Carnap once preferred a hierarchical ordering of finitely axiomatized theoretical languages that allowed at least partial cross-language definitions and derivations—these requirements were liberalized over the years (1936b), (1938), (1939)—the pragmatist Neurath opted from the start to demand only the interconnectability of predictions made in the different individual sciences (1935a), (1936c), (1944). (Metereology, botany and sociology must be combinable to predict the consequences of a forest fire, say, even though each may have its own autonomous theoretical vocabulary.) Here too it must be remembered that, unlike Carnap, Neurath only rarely addressed issues in the formal logic of science but mainly concerned himself with the partly contextually fixed pragmatics of science. (One exception is his 1935b, a coda to his previous contributions to the socialist calculation debate with Ludwig von Mises and others.) Not surprisingly, at times the priorities set by Neurath for the pragmatics of science seemed to conflict with those of Carnap’s logic of science. (These tensions often were palpable in the grand publication project undertaken by Carnap and Neurath in conjunction with Morris, the International Encyclopedia of the Unity of Science; see Reisch 2003.) That said, however, note that Carnap’s more hierarchical approach to the unity of science also does not support the attribution of foundationalist ambitions.

But for a brief lapse around 1929/30 and perhaps in some pre-Vienna years, then, Carnap fully represents the position of Vienna Circle anti-foundationalism. In this he joined Neurath whose long-standing anti-foundationalism is evident from his famous simile, first used in 1913, that likens scientists to sailors who have to repair their boat without ever being able to pull into dry dock (1932b). Their positions contrasted at least prima facie with that of Schlick (1934) who explicitly defended the idea of foundations in the Circle’s protocol-sentence debate. Even Schlick conceded, however, that all scientific statements were fallible ones, so his position on foundationalism was by no means the traditional one. The point of his “foundations” remained less than wholly clear and different interpretation of it have been put forward (e.g., Oberdan 1998, Uebel 1996, 2020). (On the protocol sentence debate as a whole, which included not only the debate between Carnap and Neurath but also debates between the physicalists and Schlick and other occasional participants, see, e.g., the differently centered accounts of Uebel 1992, 2007, Oberdan 1993, Cirera 1994.) While all in the Circle thus recognized as futile the attempt to restore certainty to scientific knowledge claims, not all members embraced positions that rejected foundationalism tout court. Clearly, however, attributing foundationalist ambitions to the Circle as a whole constitutes a total misunderstanding of its internal dynamics and historical development, if it does not bespeak wilfull ignorance. At most, a foundationalist faction around Schlick can be distinguished from the so-called left wing whose members pioneered anti-foundationalism with regard to both the empirical and formal sciences.

3.4 Scientific Theories, Theoretical Terms and the Problem of Realism

Yet even if it be conceded that the members of the Vienna Circle did not harbour undue reductionist-foundationalist ambitions, the question remains open whether they were able to deal with the complexities of scientific theory building.

Here the prominent role of Schlick must be mentioned, whose General Theory of Knowledge (1918, second edition 1925) was one of the first publications by (future) members of the Vienna Circle to introduce the so-called two-languages model of scientific theories. According to this model, scientific theories comprised an observational part formulated with observational predicates as customarily interpreted, in which observations and experiential laws were stated, and a theoretical part which consisted of theoretical laws the terms of which were merely implicitly defined, namely, in terms of the roles they played in the laws in which they figured. Both parts were connected in virtue of a correlation that could be established between selected terms of the theoretical part and observational terms. In the second half of the 1920s, however, Schlick’s model, involving separate conceptual systems, was put aside in favor of a more streamlined conception of scientific theories along lines as suggested by the Aufbau. Clearly, however, Schlick’s model represents an early form of the conception of scientific theories as uninterpreted calculi connected to observation by potentially complicated correspondence rules that Carnap reintroduced in (1939) and that became standard in the “received view”. (Another, albeit faint precursor was the idea contained in a 1910 remark of Frank’s pointing out the applicability of Hilbert’s method of implicit definition to the reconstruction empirical scientific theories as conceived, also along the lines of two distinct languages, by the French conventionalists Rey and Duhem; see Uebel 2003.)

Even granted the model in outline, questions arise both concerning its observational base as well as its theoretical superstructure. We already discussed one aspect of the former topic, the issue of protocols, in the previous section; let’s here turn to the latter topic. Talk of correspondence rules only masks the problem that is raised by theoretical terms. One of the pressing issues concerns their so-called surplus meaning over and above their observational consequences. This issue is closely related to the problem of scientific realism: are there truth-evaluatable matters of fact for scientific theories beyond their empirical, observational adequacy? Even though the moniker “neo-positivism” would seem to prescribe an easy answer as to what the Vienna Circle’s position was, it must be noted that just as there is no consensus discernible today there was none in the Circle beyond certain basics that left the matter undecided.

All in the Vienna Circle followed Carnap’s judgement in Pseudoproblems of Philosophy (1928b) and Schlick’s contention in his response to Planck’s renewal of anti-Machian polemics (1932) that questions like that of the reality of the external world were not well-formed ones but only constituted pseudo-questions. While this left the observables of empirical reality clearly in place, theoretical entities remained problematical: were they really only computational fictions introduced for the ease with which they they allowed complex predictive reasoning, as Frank (1932) held? This hardly seems to do justice to the surplus meaning of theoretical terms over and above their computational utility: theories employing them seem to tell us about non-observable features of the world. This indeed was Feigl’s complaint (1950) in what must count as the first of very few forays into “semantical realism” (scientific realism by another word) by a former member of the Vienna Circle—and one that was quickly opposed by Frank’s instrumentalist rejoinder (1950). Carnap sought to remain aloof on this as on other ontological questions. So while in the heyday of the Vienna Circle itself the issue had not yet come into clear focus, by mid-century one could distinguish amongst its surviving members both realists (Feigl) and anti-realists (Frank) as well as ontological deflationists (Carnap).

Carnap’s general recipe for avoiding undue commitments (while pursuing his investigations of various language forms, including the intensional ones Quine frowned upon) was given in terms of the distinction between so-called internal and external questions (1950a). Given the adoption of a logico-linguistic framework, we can state the facts in accordance with what that framework allows us to say. Given any of the languages of arithmetic, say, we can state as arithmetical fact whatever we can prove in them; to say that there are numbers, however, is at best to express the fact that numbers are a basic category of that framework (irrespective of whether they are logically derived from a still more basic category). As to whether certain special types of numbers exist (in the deflated sense), that depends on the expressive power of the framework at hand and on whether the relevant facts can be proven. Analogous considerations apply to the existence of physical things (the external world) given the logico-linguistic frameworks of everyday discourse and empirical science. (The near-tautologous nature of these categorical claims in Carnap’s hands echoes his earlier diagnosis of metaphysical claims as pseudo-statements; see also 1934/37, Part V.A.) Unlike such internal questions, however, external questions, questions whether numbers or electrons “really exist” irrespective of any framework, are ruled out as illegitimate and meaningless. The only way in which sense could be given to them was to read them as pragmatic questions concerned with the utility of talk about numbers or electrons, of adopting certain frameworks. Carnap clearly retained his basic position: existence claims remain the province of science and there must be seen as mediated by the available conceptual tools of inquiry. Logicians of science are in no position to double-guess the scientists in their own proper domain. (Needless to say, Quine 1951b opposed the internal/external distinction as much as his 1951a opposed the analytic/synthetic distinction.)

Matters came to a head with the discovery of a proof (see Craig 1956) that the theoretical terms of a scientific theory are dispensable in the sense of it being possible to devise a functionally equivalent theory that does not make use of them. Did this not rob theoretical terms of their distinctive role and so support instrumentalism? The negative answer was twofold. As regards defending their utility, Carnap (1963b, §24) agreed with Hempel (1958) that in practice theoretical terms were indispensable in facilitating inductive relations between observational data. As regards the defense of their cognitive legitimacy, Carnap held that this demanded determining what he called their “experiential import”, namely, determining what specifically their empirical significance consisted in. It was for this purpose that Carnap came to employ Ramsey’s method of regimenting theoretical terms. Nowadays this so-called ramseyfication is often discussed as a means for expressing a position of “structural realism”, a position midway between fully-blown scientific realism and anti-realism and so sometimes thought to be of interest to Carnap. Carnap’s own concern with ramseyfication throws into relief not only the question of the viability of one of the Vienna Circle’s most forward-looking stances in the debate about theoretical terms—intending to avoid both realism and anti-realism—but also several other issues that bear on the question of which, if any, forms of Vienna Circle philosophy remain viable.

3.5 Carnap’s Later Meaning Criterion and the Problem of Ramseyfication

Note that the issue of realism vis-à-vis theoretical terms is closely related to two other issues central to the development of Vienna Circle philosophy: Carnap’s further attempts to develop a criterion of empiricist significance for the terms of the theoretical languages of science and his attempts to defend the distinction between synthetic and analytic statements with regard to such theoretical languages.

In 1956 Carnap introduced a new criterion of significance specifically for theoretical terms (1956b). This criterion was explicitly theory-relative. Roughly, Carnap first defined the concept of the “relative significance” of a theoretical term. A term is relatively significant if and only if there exists a statement in the theoretical language that contains it as the only non-logical term and from which, in conjunction with another theoretical statement and the sets of theoretical postulates and correspondence rules, an observational statement is derivable that is not derivable from that other theoretical statement and the sets of theoretical postulates and correspondence rules alone. Then Carnap defined the “significance” of a theoretical term in terms of it belonging to a sequence of such terms such that each is relatively significant to the class of those terms that precede it in the sequence. Now those theoretical statements were legitimate and cognitively significant that were well-formed and whose descriptive constants were significant the sense just specified. It is clear that by the stepwise introduction of theoretical terms as specified, Carnap sought to avoid the deleterious situations that rendered Ayer’s criterion false (and his own of 1928). Nevertheless, this proposal too was subjected to criticism (e.g., Rozeboom 1960, Kaplan 1975a). A common impression amongst philosophers appears to be that this criterion failed as well, but this judgement is by no means universally shared (for the majority view see Glymour 1980, for a contrary assessment see Sarkar 2001). Thus it has been argued that subject to some further refinements, Carnap’s proposal can be made to work (see for discussion Creath 1976, Justus 2014, Lutz 2017)—as long as the sharp distinction between observational and theoretical terms can be sustained. (In light of the objections to the latter distinction one wants to add: or by a dichotomy of terms functionally equivalent to it.)

Carnap’s own position on his 1956 criterion appears somewhat ambiguous. While he is reported to have accepted one set of criticisms (Kaplan 1975b), he also asserted even after they had been put to him that he thought his 1956 criterion remained adequate (1963b, §24b). Yet Carnap there also advised investigation of whether still another, then entirely new approach to theoretical terms that he was developing would allow for an improved criterion of significance for them. So when Carnap offered “the Ramsey method” as a method of characterizing the “empirical meaning of theoretical terms” it was not their empirical significance as such but the specific empirical import of theoretical terms that he considered (1966, Ch. 26). What prompted him to undertake his investigations of ramseyfications was not dissatisfaction with his 1956 proposal as a criterion of significance for theoretical terms, but the fact that it still proved impossible with this model to draw the distinction between synthetic and analytic statements in the theoretical language. The reason for this was that the postulates for the theoretical language also specify factual relations between phenomena that fall under the concepts that are implicitly defined by them. (As noted, a similar problem already had plagued Carnap’s analyses of disposition terms ever since he allowed for non-eliminative reduction chains.)

Carnap’s attempt to address this problem by ramseyfication was published in several places from 1958 onwards. (See Carnap 1958, 1963, §24C-D and the popular exposition 1966, Chs. 26 and 28; compare Ramsey 1929 and see Psillos 1999, Ch.3. This proposal and a variant of it (1961b) were both presented in his 1959 Santa Barbara lecture (published in Psillos 2000a); as it happened, Kaplan presented his criticism (1975a) of Carnap’s 1956 criterion at the same conference.) With ramseyfication Carnap adverted again to entire theories as the unit of assessment. Ramseyfication consists in the replacement of the theoretical terms of a finitely axiomatized theory by bound higher-order variables. This involves combining all the theoretical postulates which define theoretical terms (call this conjunction T) and correspondence rules of a theory which link some of these theoretical terms with observational ones (call this C) in one long sentence (call this TC) and then replacing all the theoretical predicates that occur in it by bound higher-order variables (call this RTC). This is the so-called Ramsey-sentence of the entire theory; in it no theoretical terms appear, but it possesses the same explanatory and predictive power as the original theory: it has the same observational consequences. However, Carnap stressed that the Ramsey sentence cannot be said to be expressed in a “simple” but only an “extended” observational language, for due to its higher-order quantificational apparatus it includes “an advanced complicated logic embracing virtually the whole of mathematics” (1966, [1996, 253]).

To distinguish between analytic and synthetic statements in the theoretical language Carnap made the following proposal. Let the Ramsey sentence of the conjunction of all theoretical postulates and the conjunction of all correspondence rules of that theory be considered as expressing the entire factual, synthetic content of the scientific theory and its terms in their entirety. By contrast, the statement “RTCTC” expressed the purely analytic component of the theory, its “A-postulate” (or so-called Carnap sentence). This “A-postulate states that if entities exist (referred to by the existential quantifiers of the Ramsey sentence) that are of a kind bound together by all the relations expressed in the theoretical postulates of the theory and that are related to observational entities by all the relations specified by the correspondence postulates of the theory, then the theory itself is true.” Or differently put, the A-postulate “says only that if the world is this way, then the theoretical terms must be understood as satisfying the theory” (1966 [1996, 271]). With RTCTC expressing a meaning postulate Carnap claimed to have separated the analytic and synthetic components of a scientific theory.

Carnap’s adoption of the Ramsey method met mainly with criticism (Psillos 1999, ch.3, 2000b, Demopoulos 2003, 2017), even though ramseyfications continue to be discussed as a method of characterizing theoretical terms in a realist vein (albeit with conditions not yet introduced by Carnap, as in Lewis 1970, Papineau 1996). With Carnap’s ramseyfications, however, we do not get the answer that what exists is the structure that the ramseyfication at hand identifies. Given the absence of a clause requiring unique realizability, ramseyfications counseled modesty: the structure that is identified remains indeterminate to just that degree to which theoretical terms remain incompletely interpreted (Carnap 1961b). To this we must add that for Carnap ramseyfications of theoretical terms can support only internal existence claims: he explicitly reaffirmed his confidence in the distinction between internal and external question to defuse the realism/anti-realism issue (1966 [1996, 256]). This strongly suggests that with these proposals Carnap did not intend to deviate from his deflationist approach to ontology.

What must be considered, however, is that Carnap’s proposal to reconstruct the contribution of theoretical terms by ramseyfication falls foul of arguments deriving from M.H.A. Newman’s objection to Russell’s structuralism in Analysis of Matter (see Demopoulos and Friedman 1985). This objection says that once they are empirically adequate, ramseyfied theories are trivially true, given the nature of their reconstruction of original theories. Russell held that “nothing but the structure of the external world is known”. But if nothing is known about the generating relation that produces the structure, then the claim that there exists such a structure is vacuous, Newman claimed. “Any collection of things can be organised so as to have the structure W, provided there are the right number of them.” (Newman 1928, 144) To see how this so-called cardinality constraint applies to ramseyfications of theories, note that in Carnap’s hands, the non-observational part of reconstructed theories, their theoretical entities, were represented by “purely logico-mathematical entities, e.g. natural numbers, classes of such, classes of classes, etc.” For him the Ramsey sentence asserted that “observable events in the world are such that there are numbers, classes of such, etc., which are correlated with events in a prescribed way and which have among themselves certain relations”, this being “clearly a factual statement about the world” (Carnap 1963b, 963). Carnap here had mathematical physics in mind where space-time points are represented by quadruples of real numbers and physical properties like electrical charge-density or mass-density are represented as functions of such quadruples of real numbers.

The problem that arises from this for Carnap is not the failure to single out the intended interpretation of the theory: as noted, Carnap clearly thought it an advantage of the method that it remained suitably indeterminate. The problem for Carnap is rather that, subject to its empirical adequacy, the truth conditions of the Ramsey-sentences are fulfilled trivially on logico-mathematical grounds alone. As he stated, Ramsey-sentences demand that there be a structure of entities that is correlated with observable events in the way described. Yet given the amount of mathematics that went into the ramseyfied theory—“virtually the whole of mathematics”—some such structure as demanded by the Ramsey-sentence is bound to be found among those entities presupposed by its representational apparatus. (Here the cardinality constraint is no constraint at all.) That any theory is trivially true for purely formal reasons (as long as it is empirically adequate) therefore is held against Carnap’s proposal to use Ramsey sentences as reconstructions of the synthetic content of the theoretical part of empirical scientific theories. Given that with ramseyfications “the truth of physical theory reduces to the truth of its observational consequences” (Demopoulos and Friedman 1985, 635), this is a problem for Carnap’s project on its own terms: any surplus empirical meaning of theoretical terms that Carnap sought to capture simply evaporates (Demopoulos 2003).

This result casts its shadow over Carnap’s last treatment of theoretical terms in its entirety and threatens further consequences. If the reconstruction of empirical theories by ramseyfication in Carnap’s fashion is unacceptable, then all explications that build on this are called into question: explications of theoretical analyticity as much as explications of the experiential import of theories. If no justice has been done to the experiential import of theoretical terms, then one must ask whether the analytic components of a theoretical language have been correctly identified. If they have not, then the meta-theoretical utility of the synthetic/analytic distinction is once again be called into question.

One is lead to wonder whether Carnap would not be well advised to return to his 1956 position. This allowed for a criterion of empirical significance for theoretical terms but not for the analytic/synthetic distinction to be sustained with regard to the theoretical language. According to Carnap’s fall-back position before he hit upon ramseyfication, it was thought possible to distinguish narrow logical truth from factual truth in the theoretical language (1966, Ch. 28). Yet it is difficult to silence the suspicion that an analytic/synthetic distinction that applies only to observational languages—and admits inescapable semantical holism for theoretical languages—is not what the debate between Carnap and Quine was all about. Attempts have thus been undertaken to provide interpretations of Carnap’s ramseyfications that contain or mitigate the effects of the Newman objection (Friedman 2008, 2011, Uebel 2011b, Creath 2012). What has become clear, in any case, is that much is at stake for Carnap’s formal explicationism, indeed for the standard logical empiricist model of scientific theories (see below).

3.6 The Status of the Criterion of Significance and the Point of the Project of Explication

We are now in a position to return to a final criticism of the search for a criterion of empiricist significance. Much has been made of the very status of the criterion itself (however it may be put in the end): was it empirically testable? It is common to claim that it is not and therefore to consign it to insignificance in turn, following Putnam (1981a, 1981b). The question arises whether this is to overlook the fact that the criterion of significance was put forward not as an empirical claim but as a meta-theoretical proposal for how to delimit empiricist languages from non-empiricist ones. Again, pursuing this line of inquiry is not to deny that the meaning criterion may have been understood by some members of the Circle in such a way that it became liable to charges of self-refutation. Even if that were the case, the reason for this may be found not in the very idea of such a criterion, but in the contradictory status of the Tractarian “elucidations” to which the criterion was likened. (The legitimacy of these elucidations was at issue already in the debates that divided the Circle in the early 1930s; see, e.g., Neurath 1932a.) What will be considered here is primarily the view of Carnap, who from 1932 onwards put his philosophical theses in the form of “proposals” for alternative language forms, but how the pragmatist alternative fares will also be considered. Finally, we will consider where this does leave neopositivist anti-metaphysics.

For Carnap, the empiricist criterion of significance was an analytic principle, but in a very special sense. As a convention, the criterion had the standing of an analytic statement, but it was not a formally specifiable framework principle of the language Ln to which it pertained. Properly formulated, it was a semantic principle concerning Ln that was statable only in its meta-language Ln+1. To argue that the criterion itself is meaningless because it has no standing in Ln is to commit a category mistake, for meta-linguistic assertions need not have counterparts in their object languages (Goldfarb 1997, Creath 2004, Richardson 2004). Nor would it be correct to claim that the criterion hides circular reasoning, allegedly because its rejection of the meaningless depends on an unquestioned notion of experiential fact as self-explanatory (when such fact is still to be constituted). Importantly, Carnap’s language constructor does not start with fixed notions of what is empirical (rather than formal) or what is given (rather than assumed or inferred), but from the beginning allows a plurality of perspectives on these distinctions (Ricketts 1994). Carnap’s empiricist criterion of significance is precisely this: an explication, a proposal for how empiricists may wish to speak. It is not an explanation of how meaning arises from what is not meaningful in itself. Unlike theorists who wish to explain how meaning itself is constituted, explicationists can remain untroubled by the regress of formal semantics with Tarskian strictures. For them, the lack of formal closure (the incompleteness of arithmetic and the inapplicability of the truth predicate to its own language) only betokens the fact that our very own home languages cannot ever be fully explicated.

It may be wondered whether such considerations have not become pointless, given the troubles that attempts to provide a criterion of significance ran into. However, as we saw, Carnap’s 1956 criterion for constructed languages remains in play. Moreover, there also remains the informal, pragmatic approach that can be applied even more widely. Thus it is not without importance to see that pragmatic principles delineating empirical significance (like Mach’s or Quine’s Peircean insight) are not ruled out from the start either. The reason for this is different however. For pragmatists, the anti-metaphysical demarcation criterion is not strictly speaking a meaning criterion. The pragmatic criterion of significance is expressly epistemic, not semantic: it speaks of relevance with regard to an established cognitive practice, not in-principle truth-evaluability. This criterion is most easily expressed as a conditional norm, alongside other methodological maxims. (If you want your reasoning to be responsible to evidence, then avoid statements that experience can neither confirm or disconfirm, however indirectly.) So the suggestion that the criterion of empirical significance can be regarded as a proposal for how to treat the language of science cannot be brushed aside but for the persistent neglect of the philosophical projects of Carnap or the non-formalist left Vienna Circle.

Still, some readers may wonder whether in the course of responding to the various counter-criticisms, the Vienna Circle’s position has not shifted considerably. This indeed is true: the attempt to show metaphysics strictly meaningless once and for all did not succeed. For even if Carnap’s 1956 criterion and the pragmatic approach work, they do not achieve that: Carnap’s criterion only works for constructed languages and the pragmatic one does not address the semantic issue and only works case by case. But it can be argued that while this debilitates the Vienna Circle’s most notorious claim (if understood without qualifications), it does not debilitate their entire program. That was, we recall, to defend Enlightenment reason and to counter the abuse of possibly empty but certainly ill-understood deep-sounding language in science and in public life. Their program was, to put it somewhat anachronistically, to promote epistemic empowerment. This program would have been helped by an across-the-board criterion to show metaphysics meaningless, but it can also proceed in its absence.

But now the suspicion may be that if all that is meant to be excluded is speculative reason without due regard to empirical and logico-linguistic evidence, the program’s success appears too easy. Few contemporary philosophers would confess to such reckless practices. Still, even the rejection of speculative reason is by no means uncontroversial, as shown by the unresolved status of the appeal to intuitions that characterizes much of contemporary analytical metaphysics and epistemology. Moreover, much depends on what’s considered to be “due regard”: is merely bad science “metaphysics”? Or only appeals to the supernatural? And what about de re necessities? Or the seeming commitments of existential quantification? The promotion of anti-metaphysics may be applauded in principle as an exercise in intellectual hygiene, the objection goes, but in practice it excludes either too much or too little: it either cripples our understanding of theoretical science or normalizes away the Vienna Circle’s most notorious claim.

In response it is helpful to consider the conception of metaphysics that can be seen to be motivating much of the Circle’s ethical non-cognitivism. What did Carnap (1935) and Neurath (1932a) dismiss when they dismissed normative ethics as metaphysical and cognitively meaningless? One may concede that due to the brusque way in which they put their broadly Humean point, they opened themselves up to significant criticism, but it is very important to see also what they did not do. Most notably, they did not dismiss as meaningless all concern with how to live. Conditional prescriptions remained straight-forwardly truth-evaluable in instrumental terms and so cognitively meaningful. In addition, their own active engagement for Enlightenment values in public life showed that they took these matters very seriously themselves. (In fact, their engagement as public intellectuals compares strikingly with that of most contemporary philosophers of science.) But neither did they fall victim to the naturalistic fallacy nor were they simply inconsistent. In the determination of basic values they rather saw acts of personal self-definition, but, characteristically, Carnap showed a more individualistic and Neurath a more collectively oriented approach to the matter. What needs to be borne in mind, then, is the meaning that they attached to the epithet “metaphysical” in this and other areas: the arrogation of unique and fully determined objective insight into matters beyond scientific reason. It was in the ambition of providing such unconditional prescriptions that they saw philosophical ethics being the heir of theology. (Compare Carnap 1935 and 1963b, §32 and Neurath 1932a and 1944, §19.) Needless to say, it remains contentious to claim those types of philosophical ethics to be cognitively meaningless that seek to derive determinate sets of codes from some indisputable principle or other. But the ongoing discussion of non-cognitivism and its persistent defense in analytical ethics as “expressivism” suggest that, understood as outlined, the Circle’s non-cognitivism was by no means absurd or contradictory.

It may be noted here that a newly discovered fragment of Carnap’s writing (2017) has given fresh impetus to explorations of the model of ethical reasoning in terms of optatives that Carnap outlined (1963b, §32) in response to A. Kaplan’s criticism (1963) of his earlier position. What emerges is that Carnap was prepared to integrate ethical desiderata among non-ethical ones within the network of means and ends that decision theory as a normative theory of rational action seeks to systematize and regiment. Moral reasoning is assimilated to practical reasoning and no longer suffers from a deficit of significance—albeit at the cost of not being able to exclude appeals to certain types of intrinsic value on the ground their being beyond the pale (see Carus 2017). Carnap may reasonably respond here that as a theorist of science he is not required to account for normative ethics beyond providing a framework for understanding its undeniable role in a generic theory of human behavior. What was rightly objected against his earlier position was that it made such understanding impossible.

Whatever the details, their non-cognitivism supports the idea that the left wing’s anti-metaphysics was primarily deflationist. They opposed all claims to have a categorically deeper insight into reality than either empirical or formal science, such that philosophy would stand in judgement of these sciences as to their reality content or that mere science would stand in need of philosophical interpretations. (Concerned with practical problems, they likewise opposed philosophical claims to stand above the contestations of mere mortals.) Importantly, such deflationism need not remain general and vague, but can be given precise content. For instance, it has been argued (Carus 1999) that Carnap was correct to understand Tarski’s theory of truth not as a traditional correspondence theory such that truth consisted in some kind of agreement of statements or judgements and facts or the world where the latter make true the former. In Carnap’s unchanged opposition to the classical correspondence theory of truth in turn lies not only the continuity between his own syntactic and semantic phases, but also the key to his and the entire left Vienna Circle’s understanding of their anti-metaphysical campaign. (On various occasions in the early 30s, Hahn, Frank and Neurath opposed correspondence truth very explicitly, while, in later years, Neurath resisted Tarskian semantics precisely because he wrongly suspected it of resurrecting correspondentism and Frank continued to castigate correspondentism whenever required. On this tangled issue, see Mormann 1999, Uebel 2004, Mancosu 2008.)

This suggests that a hard core of Viennese anti-metaphysics survives the criticism and subsequent qualifications of early claims made for their criteria of empirical significance, yet retains sufficient philosophical teeth to remain of contemporary interest. The metaphysics which the left wing attacked, besides everyday supernaturalism and the supra-scientific essentialism of old, was the correspondence conception of truth and associated realist conceptions of knowledge. These notions were deemed attackable directly on epistemological grounds, without any diversion through the theory of meaning: how could such correspondences or likenesses ever be established? As Neurath liked to put it (1930), we cannot step outside of our thinking to see whether a correspondence obtains between what we think and how the world is. (Against defenses of the correspondence theory by arguments from analogy it would be argued that the analogy is overextended.) Against the counter that this is merely an epistemic argument that does not touch the ontological issue Neurath is likely to have argued that doing without an epistemic account is a recipe for uncontrollable metaphysics.

Importantly, the left wing’s deflationary anti-metaphysics was accompanied by a distinctively constructivist attitude. Here one must hasten to add, of course, that what was constructed were not the objects of first-order discourse (tables, chairs, electrons and black holes) but concepts, be they concepts associated with technical terms for observables, theoretical terms or terms needed for reflection about the cognitive enterprise of science (ideas like evidence and its degrees and presuppositions). As meta-theorists of science they developed explications: different types of explications were envisaged, ranging from analytic definitions giving necessary and sufficient conditions in formal languages all the way to pragmatic, exemplar-based criterial delimitations of the central applications of contested concepts or practices. Two branches of the Circle’s constructivist tendency can thus be distinguished: Carnap’s rational reconstructions and formalist explications and Neurath’s and Frank’s empirically informed and practice-oriented reconceptualizations. The difference between these two approaches can be understood as a division of labor between the tasks of exploring logico-linguistic possibilities of conceptual reconstruction and considering the efficacy of particular scientific practices. In principle, the constructivist tendency in Vienna Circle philosophy was able to embrace both (compare Carnap 1934/37, §72 and Neurath 1936b). However, in its own day, this two-track approach remained incompletely realized as philosophical relations between Carnap and Neurath soured over disputes stemming from mutual misunderstandings. Frank’s final paper (1963) was a terse reminder that the logic of science was not the sole successor or replacement of traditional philosophy and Carnap’s response (1963b, §3) again acknowledged the compatibility in principle of his logic of science and what Frank called the “pragmatics of science” (1957).

Considering the Vienna Circle as a whole in the light of this reading of its anti-metaphysical philosophy, we find the most striking division within it yet. Unlike Carnap and the left wing, Schlick had little problem with a correspondence theory of truth once it was cleansed of psychologistic and intuitive accretions and centered on the idea of unique coordination of statement and fact. In this lay the strongest sense of continuity between his pre-Vienna Circle General Theory of Knowledge (1918/25) and his post-Tractarian epistemology (1935a, 1935b). (Schlick also showed little enthusiasm for the constructivist tendencies which already the manifesto of 1929 had celebrated.) Allowing for some simplification, it must be noted that Schlick’s attack on metaphysics (which gradually weakened anyway) presupposed a non-constructivist reading of the criterion of significance. Whether his conception can escape the charge self-refutation must be left open here.

3.7 The Vienna Circle and History

Much confusion exists concerning the Vienna Circle and history, that is, both concerning the Vienna Circle’s attitude towards the history of philosophy and science and concerning its own place in that history. As more has been learnt about the history of the Vienna Circle itself—the development and variety of its doctrines as well as its own prehistory as a philosophical forum—this confusion can be addressed more adequately.

As the unnamed villain of the opening sentences of Kuhn’s influential Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962), logical empiricism is often accused of lacking historical consciousness and any sense of the embedding of philosophy and science in the wider culture of the day. Again it can hardly be denied that much logical empiricist philosophy, especially after World War II, was ahistorical in outlook and asocial in its orientation. Reichenbach’s distinction (1938) between the contexts of discovery and justification—which echoed distinctions made since Kant (Hoyningen-Huene 1987) and was already observed under a different name by Carnap in the Aufbau—was often employed to shield philosophy not only from contact with the sciences as practiced but also culture at large. But this was not the case for the Vienna Circle generally. On the one hand, unlike Reichenbach, who drew a sharp break between traditional philosophy and the new philosophy of logical empiricism in his popular The Rise of Scientific Philosophy (1951), Schlick was very much concerned to stress the remaining continuities with traditional philosophy and its cultural mission in his last paper (1938). On the other hand, on the left wing of the Circle scientific meta-theory was opened to the empirical sciences. To be sure, Carnap for his own part was happy to withdraw to the “icy slopes” of the logic of science and showed no research interest of his own in the history of science or philosophy, let alone its social history. By way of the division of labor he left it to Neurath and Frank to pursue the historical and practice-related sociological questions that the pure logic of science had to leave unaddressed. (See, e.g., Neurath’s studies of the history of optics (1915, 1916), Frank’s homage to Mach (1917), his pedagogical papers in (1949b) and his concern with the practice of theory acceptance and change in (1956); cf. Uebel 2000 and Nemeth 2007.) Moreover, it must be noted that Neurath himself all along had planned a volume on the history of science for the International Encyclopedia of Science, a volume that in the end became Kuhn’s Structure. Its publication in this series is often regarded as supremely ironical, given how Kuhn’s book is commonly read. But this is not only to overlook that the surviving editors of that series, Carnap and Morris were happy to accept the manuscript, but also that Carnap found himself in positive agreement with Kuhn (Reisch 1991, Irzik and Grunberg 1995; cf. Friedman 2001). Finally, one look at the 1929 manifesto shows that its authors were very aware of and promoted the links between their philosophy of science and the socio-political and cultural issues of the day.

Turning to the historical influences on the Vienna Circle itself, the scholarship of recent decades has unearthed a much greater variety than was previously recognized. Scientifically, the strongest influences belonged to the physicists Helmholtz, Mach and Boltzmann, the mathematicians Hilbert and Klein and the logicians Frege and Russell; amongst contemporaries, Einstein was revered above all others. The Circle’s philosophical influences extend far beyond that of the British empiricists (especially Hume), to include the French conventionalists Henri Poincaré, Pierre Duhem and Abel Rey, American pragmatists like James and, in German-language philosophy, the Neo-Kantianism of both the Heidelberg and the Marburg variety, even the early phenomenology of Husserl as well as the Austrian tradition of Bolzano’s logic and the Brentano school. (See Frank 1949a for the influence of the French conventionalists; for the importance of Neo-Kantianism for Carnap, see Friedman 1987, 1992, Sauer 1989, Richardson 1998, Mormann 2007; for Neo-Kantianism in Schlick, see Coffa 1991, Ch. 9 and Gower 2000; for the significance of Husserl for Carnap, see Sarkar 2004, Ryckman 2007, Carus 2016, Damböck 2018; for the influence of and sympathies for pragmatism see Frank 1949a and Uebel 2016; the Bolzano-Brentano connection is explored in Haller 1986.) It is against this very wide background of influences that the seminal force must be assessed that their contemporary Wittgenstein exerted. The literature on the relation between Wittgenstein and the Vienna Circle is vast but very often suffers from an over-simplified conception of the latter. (See Stern 2007 for an attempt by a Wittgenstein scholar to redress the balance.) Needless to say, different wings of the Circle show these influences to different degrees. German Neo-Kantianism was important for Schlick and particularly so for Carnap, whereas the Austrian naturalist-pragmatist influences were particularly strong on Hahn, Frank and Neurath. Frege was of great importance for Carnap, less so for Hahn who looked to Russell. Most importantly, by no means all members of the Vienna Circle sought to emulate Wittgenstein—thus the division between the faction around Schlick and the left wing (see Uebel 2017).

While these findings leave numerous questions open, they nevertheless refute the standard picture of Vienna Circle philosophy which confuses A.J. Ayer’s Language, Truth and Logic with the real thing. Ayer offered a version of British empiricism (Berkeley’s epistemic phenomenalism updated with Russellian logic) and paid no attention, for instance, to the Circle’s overarching concern with establishing the objectivity claim of science. Ayer’s remark in the preface to his later anthology Logical Positivism that his own Language, Truth and Logic “did something to popularize what may be called the classical position of the Vienna Circle” (1959b, 8) is highly misleading therefore. What he called “the classical position” was at best a partial characterisation of the starting position of some—by no means all—of its members, a position which by 1932 the left wing as a whole rejected and even Schlick had no reason to endorse any longer.

All that said by way of embedding the Vienna Circle’s philosophy in its time, one must also ask whether its members understood their own position correctly. Here one issue in particular has become increasingly prominent and raises questions that are of importance for philosophy of science still today. That is whether, after all, logical empiricism did have the resources to understand correctly the then paradigm modern science, the general theory of relativity. According to the standard logical empiricist story (Schlick 1915, 1917, 1921, 1922), their theory conclusively refuted the Kantian conception of the synthetic a priori: Euclidean geometry was not only one geometry amongst many, it also was not the one that characterized empirical reality. With one of its most prominent exemplars refuted, the synthetic a priori was deemed overthrown altogether. As noted, Schlick convinced the young Reichenbach to drop his residually Kantian talk of constitutive principles and speak of conventions instead. Likewise Schlick rejected efforts by Ernst Cassirer (see his 1921, developing themes from his 1910) to make do with a merely relative a priori in helping along scientific self-reflection. Even though much later, and on the independent grounds of quantum physics, Frank attested to the increased proximity of his and Cassirer’s understanding of scientific theories (1938), Schlick’s disregard of Cassirer’s efforts remains notable.

Most controversial is how the issue of general relativity as a touchstone for competing philosophies of science was framed: having dismissed Kant’s own synthetic a priori for its mistaken apodicity, no time was spared for discussion of its then contemporary development in Neo-Kantianism as a merely relative but still constitutive a priori. Now in the philosophy of physics, this omission—committed both by Schlick and Reichenbach—has recently come back to haunt logical empiricists with considerable vengeance. Thus it has been argued that the Schlick-Reichenbach reading of general relativity as embodying the standard logical empiricist model of scientific theories, with high theory linked to its observational strata by purely conventional coordinative definitions, is deeply mistaken in representing the local metric of space-time not to be empirically but conventionally determined as in special relativity (Ryckman 1992) and that it is instead only the tradition of transcendental idealism that possesses the resources to understand the achievements of mathematical physics (Ryckman 2005; cf. Friedman 2001). It is tempting to speak of the return of the repressed Neo-Kantian opposition. But it is tempting too to note that Schlick’s and Reichenbach’s mistake was already corrected quietly and without fanfare by Carnap (see the example in his 1934/37, §50). Clearly then, the mistake was not inevitable and inherent in logical empiricist theorizing about science as such. (For discussion of different criticism of the Circle’s reading of Einstein, especially his relation to Mach, see DiSalle 2006, Ch.4.)

The charge of a constitutive failing would rather seem to come from Demopoulos’s challenge to the two-languages model (nearly) universally adopted in logical empiricism (forthcoming). Importantly, this challenge does not proceed, as some previous ones have, from the impossibility of drawing a sharp distinction between the observational and the theoretical (Putnam 1962). Rather, the two-languages model falsely supposes that the process of testing scientific hypotheses must only advert to theoretically uncontaminated facts and so results in misunderstanding the empirical import of theoretical claims (as in the Newman problem). Instead, a conception of theory-mediated measurement and testing is suggested that extends responsiveness to observational data to theoretical claims by showing them to be essentially implicated in the production of observed experimental consequences. Hoping to advance beyond the stalemate between realism and instrumentalism without appealing to question-begging semantics, Demopoulos here breaks with a supposition upheld by Carnap throughout, namely that the theoretical language be regarded as an essentially uninterpreted, at best partially interpreted calculus. Whatever the outcome of this challenge, it is remarkable how on this far-reaching and fundamental issue contemporary philosophy of science intersects with the history of philosophy of science.

4. Concluding Remarks

In conclusion, the results of the discussions in section 3 can be briefly summarised. To start with, the dominant popular picture of the Vienna Circle as a monolithic group of simple-minded verificationists who pursued a blandly reductivist philosophy with foundationalist ambitions is widely off the mark. Instead, the Vienna Circle must be seen as a forum in which widely divergent ideas about how empiricism can cope with modern empirical and formal science were discussed. While by no means all of the philosophical initiatives started by members of the Vienna Circle have born fruit, it is neither the case that all of them have remained fruitless. Nor is it the case that everything once distinctive of Vienna Circle philosophy has to be discarded.

Consider verificationism. While the idea to show metaphysics once-and-for-all and across-the-board to be not false but meaningless—arguably the most distinctive thesis associated with the Vienna Circle—did indeed have to be abandoned, two elements of that program remain so far unrefuted. On the one hand, it remains an option to pursue the search for a criterion of empirical significance in terms of constructed, formal languages further along the lines opened by Carnap with his theory-relative proposal of 1956 (and its later defense against critics). On the other hand—albeit at the cost of merging with the pragmatist tradition and losing the apparent Viennese distinctiveness—the option to neglect as cognitively irrelevant, and in this sense metaphysical, all assertions whose truth or falsity would not make a difference remains as open as it always was. In addition it must be noted that, properly formulated, neither the formalist version of the criterion of empirical significance for constructed languages nor the pragmatist version of the criterion for natural languages are threatened by self-refutation.

Consider analyticity. Here again, the traditional idea—sometimes defended by some members—did show itself indefensible, but this leaves Carnap’s framework-relative interpretation of analyticity and the understanding of the a priori as equally relative to be explored. As noted, if Carnap’s ramseyfications can be defended, an analytic/synthetic distinction could be upheld also for the theoretical languages of science. In any case, however, the distinction between framework principles and content continues to be drawable on a case by case basis.

Consider reductionism and foundationalism. While it cannot be denied that various reductionist projects were at one time or another undertaken by members of the Vienna Circle and that not all of its members were epistemological anti-foundationalists either from the start or at the end, it is clearly false to paint all of them with reductivist and/or foundationalist brushes. This is particularly true of the members of the so-called left wing of the Circle, all of whom ended up with anti-foundationalist and anti-reductionist positions (even though this did involve instrumentalism for some).

Consider also, however, the challenges mentioned above to the fundamental tenets of logical empiricism that remain issues of intense discussion: challenges to its conception of the nature of empirical theory and of what is distinctive about the formal sciences. That to this day no agreement has been reached about how its proposals are to be replaced is not something that is unique to logical empiricism as a philosophical movement, but that they remain on the table, as it were, shows the ongoing relevance and centrality of its work for philosophy of science.

Whether the indicated qualifications and/or modifications count as defeats of the original project depends at least in part on what precisely is meant to be rejected when metaphysics is rejected and that in turn depends on what the positive vision for philosophy consists in. Here again one must differentiate. While some members ended with considerable more sympathy for traditional philosophy than they displayed in the Circle’s heyday—and may thus be charged with partial surrender—others stuck to their guns. For them, what remained of philosophy stayed squarely in the deflationist vein established by the linguistic turn. They offered explications of contested concepts or practices that, they hoped, would prove useful. Importantly, the explications given can be of two sorts: the formal explications of the logic of science by means of exemplary models of constructed languages, and the more informal explications of the empirical theory of science given by spelling out how certain theoretical desiderata can be attained more or less under practical constraints. This has been designated as the bipartite metatheory conception of scientific philosophy and ascribed to the left wing of the Circle as an ideal unifying its diverse methodologies (Uebel 2007, Ch. 12, 2015). Readers will note therefore that despite his enormous contribution to the development of Vienna Circle philosophy, it is not Schlick’s version of it that appears to this reviewer to be of continuing relevance to contemporary philosophy—unlike, in their very different but not incompatible ways, Carnap’s and Neurath’s and Frank’s. This may be taken as a partial endorsement of Hempel’s 1991 judgement (quoted in sect. 1 above), against which, however, Carnap has here been re-claimed for the Neurathian wing.

Needless to say, recent work on Vienna Circle philosophies continues to inspire a variety of approaches to the legacy they constitute (besides prompting continuing excavations of other members’ non-standard variants; e.g., on Feigl see Neuber 2011). There is Michael Friedman’s extremely wide-ranging project (2001, 2010, 2012) to use the shortcomings of Vienna Circle philosophies as a springboard for developing a renewed Kantian philosophy that also overcomes the failings of neo-Kantianism and provides a philosophy-cum-history fit for our post-Kuhnian times. Then there is Richardson’s proposal (2008) to turn the ambition to develop a scientific philosophy into a research programme for the history of science, so as to reveal more clearly the real world dynamics and limitations of philosophy as a scientific metatheory. And there is Carus’s suggestion (2007) that Carnap’s minimalist explicationism be placed in the service of a renewed Enlightenment agenda (continuing the task of the “scientific world conception”). This connects with the current metaphilosophical interest in conceptual engineering, the relevance of Carnap’s work to which becoming increasingly recognised (Justus 2012, Wagner 2012, Brun 2016, Reck and Dutilh Novaes 2017, Dutilh Novaes forthcoming, Lutz forthcoming). All along, of course, Vienna Circle philosophies also continue to serve as foils for alternative and self-consciously post-positivist programs, fruitfully so when informed by the results of recent scholarship (e.g. Ebbs 2017).

It would appear then that despite continued resistance to recent revisionist scholarship—a resistance that consists not so much in contesting but in ignoring its results—the fortune of Vienna Circle philosophy has turned again. Restored from the numerous distortions of its teachings that accrued over generations of acolytes and opponents, the Vienna Circle is being recognized again as a force of considerable philosophical sophistication. Not only is it the case that its members profoundly influenced the actual development of analytical philosophy of science with conceptual initiatives that, typically, were seen through to their bitter end. It is also the case that some of its members offered proposals and suggested approaches that were not taken up widely at the time (if at all), but that are relevant again today. Much like its precursors Frege, Russell and Wittgenstein, the conventionalists Poincaré and Duhem, the pragmatists Peirce and Dewey—and like its contemporaries from Reichenbach’s Berlin Group and the Warsaw-Lvov school of logic to the Neo-Kantian Cassirer—the Vienna Circle affords a valuable vantage point on contemporary philosophy of empirical and formal science.


Note: Bibliographies of the members of the Vienna Circle and selected associates are given, along with short biographies, in Stadler (1997 [2015, 397–592]).

  • Achinstein, Peter, and Steven F. Barker (eds.), 1969, The Legacy of Logical Positivism, Baltimore: Johns Hopkins Press.
  • Awodey, Steve, 2007, “Carnap’s Quest for Analyticity: the Studies in Semantics”, in Friedman and Creath 2007, pp. 226–247.
  • –––, 2012, “Explicating Analytic”, in Wagner 2012, pp. 131–143.
  • –––, 2017, “Carnap and the Invariance of Logical Truth”, Synthese 194: 67–78.
  • Awodey, Steve, and André Carus, 2003, “Carnap versus Gödel on Syntax and Tolerance”, in Parrini, Salmon and Salmon 2003, pp. 57–65.
  • –––, 2004, “How Carnap Could Have replied to Gödel”, in Awodey and Klein 2004, pp. 203–224.
  • –––, 2007, “The Turning Point and the Revolution. Philosophy of Mathematics in Logical Empiricism from Tractatus to Logical Syntax”, in Richardson and Uebel 2007, pp. 165–192.
  • Awodey, Steve, and Carsten Klein (eds.), 2004, Carnap Brought Home. The View from Jena, Chicago: Open Court.
  • Ayer, Alfred J., 1936, Language, Truth and Logic, 2nd ed., London: Gollancz, 1946.
  • ––– (ed.)., 1959a, Logical Positivism, New York: Free Press.
  • –––, 1959b, “Editor’s Introduction”, in Ayer 1959a, pp. 3–28.
  • Baker, Gordon (ed.), 2003, The Voices of Wittgenstein. Ludwig Wittgenstein and Friedrich Waismann, London: Routledge.
  • Bell, David, and Wilhelm Vossenkuhl (eds.), 1992, Science and Subjectivity, Berlin: Akademieverlag.
  • Benson, Arthur J., 1963, “Bibliography of Rudolf Carnap”, in Schilpp 1963, pp. 1015–1070.
  • Bergmann, Gustav, 1987, “Erinnerungen an den Wiener Kreis, Brief an Otto Neurath”, in Friedrich Stadler (ed.), Vertriebene Vernunft, Vienna, trans. “Memories of the Vienna Circle. Letter to Otto Neurath”, in Stadler 1993, pp. 193–208.
  • Bonk, Thomas (ed.), 2003, Language, Truth and Knowledge. Contributions to the Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Brun, Georg, 2016, “Explication as a Method of Conceptual Engineering”, Erkenntnis 81: 1211–1241.
  • Carnap, Rudolf, 1928a, Der logische Aufbau der Welt, Berlin: Bernary, transl. The Logical Structure of the World, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1967.
  • –––, 1928b, Scheinprobleme in der Philosophie, Berlin: Bernary, transl. Pseudoproblems in Philosophy, in transl. of Carnap 1928a, pp. 301–343.
  • –––, 1930, “Die alte und die neue Logik”, Erkenntnis 1:12–26, transl. “The Old and the New Logic”, In Ayer 1959a, pp. 60–81.
  • –––, 1932a, “Überwindung der Metaphysik durch logische Analyse der Sprache”, Erkenntnis, 2: 219–241; transl. “The Elimination of Metaphysics through Logical Analysis of Language”, in Ayer 1959a, pp. 60–81.
  • –––, 1932b, “Die physikalische Sprache als Universalsprache der Wissenschaft”, Erkenntnis, 2: 432–465; transl. with author’s introduction The Unity of Science, London: Kegan, Paul, Trench Teubner & Co., 1934.
  • –––, 1932c, “Psychologie in physikalischer Sprache”, Erkenntnis, 3: 107–142; transl. “Psychology in Physicalist Language” in Ayer 1959a, pp. 165–198.
  • –––, 1932d, “Erwiderung auf die vorstehenden Aufsätze von E. Zilsel und K. Duncker”, Erkenntnis, 3: 177–188.
  • –––, 1932e, “Über Protokollsätze”, Erkenntnis, 3: 215–228; transl. “On Protocol Sentences” in Nous 21 (1987), pp. 457–470.
  • –––, 1934a, “On the Character of Philosophical Problems”, Philosophy of Science, 1: 5–19.
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