Thomas Kuhn

First published Fri Aug 13, 2004; substantive revision Wed Oct 31, 2018

Thomas Samuel Kuhn (1922–1996) is one of the most influential philosophers of science of the twentieth century, perhaps the most influential. His 1962 book The Structure of Scientific Revolutions is one of the most cited academic books of all time. Kuhn’s contribution to the philosophy of science marked not only a break with several key positivist doctrines, but also inaugurated a new style of philosophy of science that brought it closer to the history of science. His account of the development of science held that science enjoys periods of stable growth punctuated by revisionary revolutions. To this thesis, Kuhn added the controversial ‘incommensurability thesis’, that theories from differing periods suffer from certain deep kinds of failure of comparability.

1. Life and Career

Thomas Kuhn’s academic life started in physics. He then switched to history of science, and as his career developed he moved over to philosophy of science, although retaining a strong interest in the history of physics. In 1943, he graduated from Harvard summa cum laude. Thereafter he spent the remainder of the war years in research related to radar at Harvard and then in Europe. He gained his master’s degree in physics in 1946, and his doctorate in 1949, also in physics (concerning an application of quantum mechanics to solid state physics). Kuhn was elected to the prestigious Society of Fellows at Harvard, another of whose members was W. V. Quine. At this time, and until 1956, Kuhn taught a class in science for undergraduates in the humanities, as part of the General Education in Science curriculum, developed by James B. Conant, the President of Harvard. This course was centred around historical case studies, and this was Kuhn’s first opportunity to study historical scientific texts in detail. His initial bewilderment on reading the scientific work of Aristotle was a formative experience, followed as it was by a more or less sudden ability to understand Aristotle properly, undistorted by knowledge of subsequent science.

This led Kuhn to concentrate on history of science and in due course he was appointed to an assistant professorship in general education and the history of science. During this period his work focussed on eighteenth century matter theory and the early history of thermodynamics. Kuhn then turned to the history of astronomy, and in 1957 he published his first book, The Copernican Revolution.

In 1961 Kuhn became a full professor at the University of California at Berkeley, having moved there in 1956 to take up a post in history of science, but in the philosophy department. This enabled him to develop his interest in the philosophy of science. At Berkeley Kuhn’s colleagues included Stanley Cavell, who introduced Kuhn to the works of Wittgenstein, and Paul Feyerabend. With Feyerabend Kuhn discussed a draft of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions which was published in 1962 in the series “International Encyclopedia of Unified Science”, edited by Otto Neurath and Rudolf Carnap. The central idea of this extraordinarily influential—and controversial—book is that the development of science is driven, in normal periods of science, by adherence to what Kuhn called a ‘paradigm’. The functions of a paradigm are to supply puzzles for scientists to solve and to provide the tools for their solution. A crisis in science arises when confidence is lost in the ability of the paradigm to solve particularly worrying puzzles called ‘anomalies’. Crisis is followed by a scientific revolution if the existing paradigm is superseded by a rival. Kuhn claimed that science guided by one paradigm would be ‘incommensurable’ with science developed under a different paradigm, by which is meant that there is no common measure for assessing the different scientific theories. This thesis of incommensurability, developed at the same time by Feyerabend, rules out certain kinds of comparison of the two theories and consequently rejects some traditional views of scientific development, such as the view that later science builds on the knowledge contained within earlier theories, or the view that later theories are closer approximations to the truth than earlier theories. Most of Kuhn’s subsequent work in philosophy was spent in articulating and developing the ideas in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, although some of these, such as the thesis of incommensurability, underwent transformation in the process.

According to Kuhn himself (2000, 307), The Structure of Scientific Revolutions first aroused interest among social scientists, although it did in due course create the interest among philosophers that Kuhn had intended (and also before long among a much wider academic and general audience). While acknowledging the importance of Kuhn’s ideas, the philosophical reception was nonetheless hostile. For example, Dudley Shapere’s review (1964) emphasized the relativist implications of Kuhn’s ideas, and this set the context for much subsequent philosophical discussion. Since the following of rules (of logic, of scientific method, etc.) was regarded as the sine qua non of rationality, Kuhn’s claim that scientists do not employ rules in reaching their decisions appeared tantamount to the claim that science is irrational. This was highlighted by his rejection of the distinction between discovery and justification (denying that we can distinguish between the psychological process of thinking up an idea and the logical process of justifying its claim to truth) and his emphasis on incommensurability (the claim that certain kinds of comparison between theories are impossible). The negative response among philosophers was exacerbated by an important naturalistic tendency in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions that was then unfamiliar. A particularly significant instance of this was Kuhn’s insistence on the importance of the history of science for philosophy of science. The opening sentence of the book reads: “History, if viewed as a repository for more than anecdote or chronology, could produce a decisive transformation in the image of science by which we are now possessed” (1962/1970, 1). Also significant and unfamiliar was Kuhn’s appeal to psychological literature and examples (such as linking theory-change with the changing appearance of a Gestalt image).

In 1964 Kuhn left Berkeley to take up the position of M. Taylor Pyne Professor of Philosophy and History of Science at Princeton University. In the following year an important event took place which helped promote Kuhn’s profile further among philosophers. An International Colloquium in the Philosophy of Science was held at Bedford College, London. One of the key events of the Colloquium was intended to be a debate between Kuhn and Feyerabend, with Feyerabend promoting the critical rationalism that he shared with Popper. As it was, Feyerabend was ill and unable to attend, and the papers delivered focussed on Kuhn’s work. John Watkins took Feyerabend’s place in a session chaired by Popper. The ensuing discussion, to which Popper and also Margaret Masterman and Stephen Toulmin contributed, compared and contrasted the viewpoints of Kuhn and Popper and thereby helped illuminate the significance of Kuhn’s approach. Papers from these discussants along with contributions from Feyerabend and Lakatos, were published several years later, in Criticism and the Growth of Knowledge, edited by Lakatos and Alan Musgrave (1970) (the fourth volume of proceedings from this Colloquium). In the same year the second edition of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions was published, including an important postscript in which Kuhn clarified his notion of paradigm. This was in part in response to Masterman’s (1970) criticism that Kuhn had used ‘paradigm’ in a wide variety of ways; in addition, Kuhn felt that critics had failed to appreciate the emphasis he placed upon the idea of a paradigm as an exemplar or model of puzzle-solving. Kuhn also, for the first time, explicitly gave his work an anti-realist element by denying the coherence of the idea that theories could be regarded as more or less close to the truth.

A collection of Kuhn’s essays in the philosophy and history of science was published in 1977, with the title The Essential Tension taken from one of Kuhn’s earliest essays in which he emphasizes the importance of tradition in science. The following year saw the publication of his second historical monograph Black-Body Theory and the Quantum Discontinuity, concerning the early history of quantum mechanics. In 1983 he was named Laurence S. Rockefeller Professor of Philosophy at MIT. Kuhn continued throughout the 1980s and 1990s to work on a variety of topics in both history and philosophy of science, including the development of the concept of incommensurability, and at the time of his death in 1996 he was working on a second philosophical monograph dealing with, among other matters, an evolutionary conception of scientific change and concept acquisition in developmental psychology.

2. The Development of Science

In The Structure of Scientific Revolutions Kuhn paints a picture of the development of science quite unlike any that had gone before. Indeed, before Kuhn, there was little by way of a carefully considered, theoretically explained account of scientific change. Instead, there was a conception of how science ought to develop that was a by-product of the prevailing philosophy of science, as well as a popular, heroic view of scientific progress. According to such opinions, science develops by the addition of new truths to the stock of old truths, or the increasing approximation of theories to the truth, and in the odd case, the correction of past errors. Such progress might accelerate in the hands of a particularly great scientist, but progress itself is guaranteed by the scientific method.

In the 1950s, when Kuhn began his historical studies of science, the history of science was a young academic discipline. Even so, it was becoming clear that scientific change was not always as straightforward as the standard, traditional view would have it. Kuhn was the first and most important author to articulate a developed alternative account. Since the standard view dovetailed with the dominant, positivist-influenced philosophy of science, a non-standard view would have important consequences for the philosophy of science. Kuhn had little formal philosophical training but was nonetheless fully conscious of the significance of his innovation for philosophy, and indeed he called his work ‘history for philosophical purposes’ (Kuhn 2000, 276).

According to Kuhn the development of a science is not uniform but has alternating ‘normal’ and ‘revolutionary’ (or ‘extraordinary’) phases. The revolutionary phases are not merely periods of accelerated progress, but differ qualitatively from normal science. Normal science does resemble the standard cumulative picture of scientific progress, on the surface at least. Kuhn describes normal science as ‘puzzle-solving’ (1962/1970a, 35–42). While this term suggests that normal science is not dramatic, its main purpose is to convey the idea that like someone doing a crossword puzzle or a chess problem or a jigsaw, the puzzle-solver expects to have a reasonable chance of solving the puzzle, that his doing so will depend mainly on his own ability, and that the puzzle itself and its methods of solution will have a high degree of familiarity. A puzzle-solver is not entering completely uncharted territory. Because its puzzles and their solutions are familiar and relatively straightforward, normal science can expect to accumulate a growing stock of puzzle-solutions. Revolutionary science, however, is not cumulative in that, according to Kuhn, scientific revolutions involve a revision to existing scientific belief or practice (1962/1970a, 92). Not all the achievements of the preceding period of normal science are preserved in a revolution, and indeed a later period of science may find itself without an explanation for a phenomenon that in an earlier period was held to be successfully explained. This feature of scientific revolutions has become known as ‘Kuhn-loss’ (1962/1970a, 99–100).

If, as in the standard picture, scientific revolutions are like normal science but better, then revolutionary science will at all times be regarded as something positive, to be sought, promoted, and welcomed. Revolutions are to be sought on Popper’s view also, but not because they add to positive knowledge of the truth of theories but because they add to the negative knowledge that the relevant theories are false. Kuhn rejected both the traditional and Popperian views in this regard. He claims that normal science can succeed in making progress only if there is a strong commitment by the relevant scientific community to their shared theoretical beliefs, values, instruments and techniques, and even metaphysics. This constellation of shared commitments Kuhn at one point calls a ‘disciplinary matrix’ (1970a, 182) although elsewhere he often uses the term ‘paradigm’. Because commitment to the disciplinary matrix is a pre-requisite for successful normal science, an inculcation of that commitment is a key element in scientific training and in the formation of the mind-set of a successful scientist. This tension between the desire for innovation and the necessary conservativeness of most scientists was the subject of one of Kuhn’s first essays in the theory of science, “The Essential Tension” (1959). The unusual emphasis on a conservative attitude distinguishes Kuhn not only from the heroic element of the standard picture but also from Popper and his depiction of the scientist forever attempting to refute her most important theories.

This conservative resistance to the attempted refutation of key theories means that revolutions are not sought except under extreme circumstances. Popper’s philosophy requires that a single reproducible, anomalous phenomenon be enough to result in the rejection of a theory (Popper 1959, 86–7). Kuhn’s view is that during normal science scientists neither test nor seek to confirm the guiding theories of their disciplinary matrix. Nor do they regard anomalous results as falsifying those theories. (It is only speculative puzzle-solutions that can be falsified in a Popperian fashion during normal science (1970b, 19).) Rather, anomalies are ignored or explained away if at all possible. It is only the accumulation of particularly troublesome anomalies that poses a serious problem for the existing disciplinary matrix. A particularly troublesome anomaly is one that undermines the practice of normal science. For example, an anomaly might reveal inadequacies in some commonly used piece of equipment, perhaps by casting doubt on the underlying theory. If much of normal science relies upon this piece of equipment, normal science will find it difficult to continue with confidence until this anomaly is addressed. A widespread failure in such confidence Kuhn calls a ‘crisis’ (1962/1970a, 66–76).

The most interesting response to crisis will be the search for a revised disciplinary matrix, a revision that will allow for the elimination of at least the most pressing anomalies and optimally the solution of many outstanding, unsolved puzzles. Such a revision will be a scientific revolution. According to Popper the revolutionary overthrow of a theory is one that is logically required by an anomaly. According to Kuhn however, there are no rules for deciding the significance of a puzzle and for weighing puzzles and their solutions against one another. The decision to opt for a revision of a disciplinary matrix is not one that is rationally compelled; nor is the particular choice of revision rationally compelled. For this reason the revolutionary phase is particularly open to competition among differing ideas and rational disagreement about their relative merits. Kuhn does briefly mention that extra-scientific factors might help decide the outcome of a scientific revolution—the nationalities and personalities of leading protagonists, for example (1962/1970a, 152–3). This suggestion grew in the hands of some sociologists and historians of science into the thesis that the outcome of a scientific revolution, indeed of any step in the development of science, is always determined by socio-political factors. Kuhn himself repudiated such ideas and his work makes it clear that the factors determining the outcome of a scientific dispute, particularly in modern science, are almost always to be found within science, specifically in connexion with the puzzle-solving power of the competing ideas.

Kuhn states that science does progress, even through revolutions (1962/1970a, 160ff). The phenomenon of Kuhn-loss does, in Kuhn’s view, rule out the traditional cumulative picture of progress. The revolutionary search for a replacement paradigm is driven by the failure of the existing paradigm to solve certain important anomalies. Any replacement paradigm had better solve the majority of those puzzles, or it will not be worth adopting in place of the existing paradigm. At the same time, even if there is some Kuhn-loss, a worthy replacement must also retain much of the problem-solving power of its predecessor (1962/1970a, 169). (Kuhn does clarify the point by asserting that the newer theory must retain pretty well all its predecessor’s power to solve quantitative problems. It may however lose some qualitative, explanatory power [1970b, 20].) Hence we can say that revolutions do bring with them an overall increase in puzzle-solving power, the number and significance of the puzzles and anomalies solved by the revised paradigm exceeding the number and significance of the puzzles-solutions that are no longer available as a result of Kuhn-loss. Kuhn is quick to deny that there is any inference from such increases to improved nearness to the truth ((1962/1970a, 170–1). Indeed he later denies that any sense can be made of the notion of nearness to the truth (1970a, 206).

Rejecting a teleological view of science progressing towards the truth, Kuhn favours an evolutionary view of scientific progress (1962/1970a, 170–3), discussed in detail by Wray (2011) (see also Bird 2000 and Renzi 2009). The evolutionary development of an organism might be seen as its response to a challenge set by its environment. But that does not imply that there is some ideal form of the organism that it is evolving towards. Analogously, science improves by allowing its theories to evolve in response to puzzles and progress is measured by its success in solving those puzzles; it is not measured by its progress towards to an ideal true theory. While evolution does not lead towards ideal organisms, it does lead to greater diversity of kinds of organism. As Wray explains, this is the basis of a Kuhnian account of specialization in science, an account that Kuhn was developing particularly in the latter part of his career. According to this account, the revolutionary new theory that succeeds in replacing another that is subject to crisis, may fail to satisfy all the needs of those working with the earlier theory. One response to this might be for the field to develop two theories, with domains restricted relative to the original theory (one might be the old theory or a version of it). This formation of new specialties will also bring with it new taxonomic structures and so leads to incommensurability.

3. The Concept of a Paradigm

A mature science, according to Kuhn, experiences alternating phases of normal science and revolutions. In normal science the key theories, instruments, values and metaphysical assumptions that comprise the disciplinary matrix are kept fixed, permitting the cumulative generation of puzzle-solutions, whereas in a scientific revolution the disciplinary matrix undergoes revision, in order to permit the solution of the more serious anomalous puzzles that disturbed the preceding period of normal science.

A particularly important part of Kuhn’s thesis in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions focuses upon one specific component of the disciplinary matrix. This is the consensus on exemplary instances of scientific research. These exemplars of good science are what Kuhn refers to when he uses the term ‘paradigm’ in a narrower sense. He cites Aristotle’s analysis of motion, Ptolemy’s computations of plantery positions, Lavoisier’s application of the balance, and Maxwell’s mathematization of the electromagnetic field as paradigms (1962/1970a, 23). Exemplary instances of science are typically to be found in books and papers, and so Kuhn often also describes great texts as paradigms—Ptolemy’s Almagest, Lavoisier’s Traité élémentaire de chimie, and Newton’s Principia Mathematica and Opticks (1962/1970a, 12). Such texts contain not only the key theories and laws, but also—and this is what makes them paradigms—the applications of those theories in the solution of important problems, along with the new experimental or mathematical techniques (such as the chemical balance in Traité élémentaire de chimie and the calculus in Principia Mathematica) employed in those applications.

In the postscript to the second edition of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions Kuhn says of paradigms in this sense that they are “the most novel and least understood aspect of this book” (1962/1970a, 187). The claim that the consensus of a disciplinary matrix is primarily agreement on paradigms-as-exemplars is intended to explain the nature of normal science and the process of crisis, revolution, and renewal of normal science. It also explains the birth of a mature science. Kuhn describes an immature science, in what he sometimes calls its ‘pre-paradigm’ period, as lacking consensus. Competing schools of thought possess differing procedures, theories, even metaphysical presuppositions. Consequently there is little opportunity for collective progress. Even localized progress by a particular school is made difficult, since much intellectual energy is put into arguing over the fundamentals with other schools instead of developing a research tradition. However, progress is not impossible, and one school may make a breakthrough whereby the shared problems of the competing schools are solved in a particularly impressive fashion. This success draws away adherents from the other schools, and a widespread consensus is formed around the new puzzle-solutions.

This widespread consensus now permits agreement on fundamentals. For a problem-solution will embody particular theories, procedures and instrumentation, scientific language, metaphysics, and so forth. Consensus on the puzzle-solution will thus bring consensus on these other aspects of a disciplinary matrix also. The successful puzzle-solution, now a paradigm puzzle-solution, will not solve all problems. Indeed, it will probably raise new puzzles. For example, the theories it employs may involve a constant whose value is not known with precision; the paradigm puzzle-solution may employ approximations that could be improved; it may suggest other puzzles of the same kind; it may suggest new areas for investigation. Generating new puzzles is one thing that the paradigm puzzle-solution does; helping solve them is another. In the most favourable scenario, the new puzzles raised by the paradigm puzzle-solution can be addressed and answered using precisely the techniques that the paradigm puzzle-solution employs. And since the paradigm puzzle-solution is accepted as a great achievement, these very similar puzzle-solutions will be accepted as successful solutions also. This is why Kuhn uses the terms ‘exemplar’ and ‘paradigm’. For the novel puzzle-solution which crystallizes consensus is regarded and used as a model of exemplary science. In the research tradition it inaugurates, a paradigm-as-exemplar fulfils three functions: (i) it suggests new puzzles; (ii) it suggests approaches to solving those puzzles; (iii) it is the standard by which the quality of a proposed puzzle-solution can be measured (1962/1970a, 38–9). In each case it is similarity to the exemplar that is the scientists’ guide.

That normal science proceeds on the basis of perceived similarity to exemplars is an important and distinctive feature of Kuhn’s new picture of scientific development. The standard view explained the cumulative addition of new knowledge in terms of the application of the scientific method. Allegedly, the scientific method encapsulates the rules of scientific rationality. It may be that those rules could not account for the creative side of science—the generation of new hypotheses. The latter was thus designated ‘the context of discovery’, leaving the rules of rationality to decide in the ‘context of justification’ whether a new hypothesis should, in the light of the evidence, be added to the stock of accepted theories.

Kuhn rejected the distinction between the context of discovery and the context of justification (1962/1970a, 8), and correspondingly rejected the standard account of each. As regards the context of discovery, the standard view held that the philosophy of science had nothing to say on the issue of the functioning of the creative imagination. But Kuhn’s paradigms do provide a partial explanation, since training with exemplars enables scientists to see new puzzle-situations in terms of familiar puzzles and hence enables them to see potential solutions to their new puzzles.

More important for Kuhn was the way his account of the context of justification diverged from the standard picture. The functioning of exemplars is intended explicitly to contrast with the operation of rules. The key determinant in the acceptability of a proposed puzzle-solution is its similarity to the paradigmatic puzzle-solutions. Perception of similarity cannot be reduced to rules, and a fortiori cannot be reduced to rules of rationality. This rejection of rules of rationality was one of the factors that led Kuhn’s critics to accuse him of irrationalism—regarding science as irrational. In this respect at least the accusation is wide of the mark. For to deny that some cognitive process is the outcome of applying rules of rationality is not to imply that it is an irrational process: the perception of similarity in appearance between two members of the same family also cannot be reduced to the application of rules of rationality. Kuhn’s innovation in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions was to suggest that a key element in cognition in science operates in the same fashion.

4. Incommensurability and World-Change

The standard empiricist conception of theory evaluation regards our judgment of the epistemic quality of a theory to be a matter of applying rules of method to the theory and the evidence. Kuhn’s contrasting view is that we judge the quality of a theory (and its treatment of the evidence) by comparing it to a paradigmatic theory. The standards of assessment therefore are not permanent, theory-independent rules. They are not rules, because they involve perceived relations of similarity (of puzzle-solution to a paradigm). They are not theory-independent, since they involve comparison to a (paradigm) theory. They are not permanent, since the paradigm may change in a scientific revolution. For example, to many in the seventeenth century, Newton’s account of gravitation, involving action at a distance with no underlying explanation, seemed a poor account, in that respect at least, when compared, for example, to Ptolemy’s explanation of the motion of the planets in terms of contiguous crystalline spheres or to Descartes’ explanation in terms of vortices. However, later, once Newton’s theory had become accepted and the paradigm by which later theories were judged, the lack of an underlying mechanism for a fundamental force was regarded as no objection, as, for example, in the case of Coulomb’s law of electrostatic attraction. Indeed, in the latter case the very similarity of Coulomb’s equation to Newton’s was taken to be in its favour.

Consequently, comparison between theories will not be as straightforward as the standard empiricist picture would have it, since the standards of evaluation are themselves subject to change. This sort of difficulty in theory comparison is an instance of what Kuhn and Feyerabend called ‘incommensurability’. Theories are incommensurable when they share no common measure. Thus, if paradigms are the measures of attempted puzzle-solutions, then puzzle-solutions developed in different eras of normal science will be judged by comparison to differing paradigms and so lack a common measure. The term ‘incommensurable’ derives from a mathematical use, according to which the side and diagonal of a square are incommensurable in virtue of there being no unit that can be used to measure both exactly. Kuhn stressed that incommensurability did not mean non-comparability (just as the side and diagonal of a square are comparable in many respects). Even so, it is clear that at the very least Kuhn’s incommensurability thesis would make theory comparison rather more difficult than had commonly been supposed, and in some cases impossible.

We can distinguish three types of incommensurability in Kuhn’s remarks: (1) methodological—there is no common measure because the methods of comparison and evaluation change; (2) perceptual/observational—observational evidence cannot provide a common basis for theory comparison, since perceptual experience is theory-dependent; (3) semantic—the fact that the languages of theories from different periods of normal science may not be inter-translatable presents an obstacle to the comparison of those theories. (See Sankey 1993 for a useful discussion of Kuhn’s changing accounts of incommensurability.)

4.1 Methodological Incommensurability

The incommensurability illustrated above whereby puzzle-solutions from different eras of normal science are evaluated by reference to different paradigms, is methodological incommensurability. Another source of methodological incommensurability is the fact that proponents of competing paradigms may not agree on which problems a candidate paradigm should solve (1962/1970a, 148). In general the factors that determine our choices of theory (whether puzzle-solutions or potential paradigm theories) are not fixed and neutral but vary and are dependent in particular on the disciplinary matrix within which the scientist is working. Indeed, since decision making is not rule-governed or algorithmic, there is no guarantee that those working within the same disciplinary matrix must agree on their evaluation of theory (1962/1970a, 200), although in such cases the room for divergence will be less than when the disputants operate within different disciplinary matrices. Despite the possibility of divergence, there is nonetheless widespread agreement on the desirable features of a new puzzle-solution or theory. Kuhn (1977, 321–2) identifies five characteristics that provide the shared basis for a choice of theory: 1. accuracy; 2. consistency (both internal and with other relevant currently accepted theories); 3. scope (its consequences should extend beyond the data it is required to explain); 4. simplicity (organizing otherwise confused and isolated phenomena); 5. fruitfulness (for further research). Even though these are, for Kuhn, constitutive of science (1977c, 331; 1993, 338) they cannot determine scientific choice. First, which features of a theory satisfy these criteria may be disputable (e.g. does simplicity concern the ontological commitments of a theory or its mathematical form?). Secondly, these criteria are imprecise, and so there is room for disagreement about the degree to which they hold. Thirdly, there can be disagreement about how they are to be weighted relative to one another, especially when they conflict.

4.2 Perception, Observational Incommensurability, and World-Change

An important focus of Kuhn’s interest in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions was on the nature of perception and how it may be that what a scientist observes can change as a result of scientific revolution. He developed what has become known as the thesis of the theory-dependence of observation, building on the work of N. R. Hanson (1958) while also referring to psychological studies carried out by his Harvard colleagues, Leo Postman and Jerome Bruner (Bruner and Postman 1949). The standard positivist view was that observation provides the neutral arbiter between competing theories. The thesis that Kuhn and Hanson promoted denied this, holding that the nature of observation may be influenced by prior beliefs and experiences. Consequently it cannot be expected that two scientists when observing the same scene will make the same theory-neutral observations. Kuhn asserts that Galileo and an Aristotelian when both looking at a pendulum will see different things (see quoted passage below).

The theory-dependence of observation, by rejecting the role of observation as a theory-neutral arbiter among theories, provides another source of incommensurability. Methodological incommensurability (§4.1 above) denies that there are universal methods for making inferences from the data. The theory-dependence of observation means that even if there were agreed methods of inference and interpretation, incommensurability could still arise since scientists might disagree on the nature of the observational data themselves.

Kuhn expresses or builds on the idea that participants in different disciplinary matrices will see the world differently by claiming that their worlds are different:

In a sense I am unable to explicate further, the proponents of competing paradigms practice their trades in different worlds. One contains constrained bodies that fall slowly, the other pendulums that repeat their motions again and again. In one, solutions are compounds, in the other mixtures. One is embedded in a flat, the other in a curved, matrix of space. Practicing in different worlds, the two groups of scientists see different things when they look from the same point in the same direction (1962/1970a, 150).

Remarks such as these gave some commentators the impression that Kuhn was a strong kind of constructivist, holding that the way the world literally is depends on which scientific theory is currently accepted. Kuhn, however, denied any constructivist import to his remarks on world-change. (The closest Kuhn came to constructivism was to acknowledge a parallel with Kantian idealism, which is discussed below in Section 6.4.)

Kuhn likened the change in the phenomenal world to the Gestalt-switch that occurs when one sees the duck-rabbit diagram first as (representing) a duck then as (representing) a rabbit, although he himself acknowledged that he was not sure whether the Gestalt case was just an analogy or whether it illustrated some more general truth about the way the mind works that encompasses the scientific case too.

4.3 Kuhn’s Early Semantic Incommensurability Thesis

Although the theory-dependence of observation plays a significant role in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, neither it nor methodological incommensurability could account for all the phenomena that Kuhn wanted to capture with the notion of incommensurability. Some of his own examples are rather stretched—for instance he says Lavoisier saw oxygen where Priestley saw dephlogisticated air, describing this as a ‘transformation of vision’ (1962/1970a, 118). Moreover observation—if conceived of as a form of perception—does not play a significant part in every science. Kuhn wanted to explain his own experience of reading Aristotle, which first left him with the impression that Aristotle was an inexplicably poor scientist (Kuhn 1987). But careful study led to a change in his understanding that allowed him to see that Aristotle was indeed an excellent scientist. This could not simply be a matter of literally perceiving things differently. Kuhn took the incommensurability that prevented him from properly understanding Aristotle to be at least partly a linguistic, semantic matter. Indeed, Kuhn spent much of his career after The Structure of Scientific Revolutions attempting to articulate a semantic conception of incommensurability.

In The Structure of Scientific Revolutions Kuhn asserts that there are important shifts in the meanings of key terms as a consequence of a scientific revolution. For example, Kuhn says:

… the physical referents of these Einsteinian concepts are by no means identical with those of the Newtonian concepts that bear the same name. (Newtonian mass is conserved; Einsteinian is convertible with energy. Only at low relative velocities may the two be measured in the same way, and even then they must not be conceived to be the same.) (1962/1970a, 102)

This is important, because a standard conception of the transition from classical to relativistic physics is that although Einstein’s theory of relativity supersedes Newton’s theory, what we have is an improvement or generalization whereby Newton’s theory is a special case of Einstein’s (to a close approximation). We can therefore say that the later theory is closer to the truth than the older theory. Kuhn’s view that ‘mass’ as used by Newton cannot be translated by ‘mass’ as used by Einstein allegedly renders this kind of comparison impossible. Hence incommensurability is supposed to rule out convergent realism, the view that science shows ever improving approximation to the truth. (Kuhn also thinks, for independent reasons, that the very ideas of matching the truth and similarity to the truth are incoherent (1970a, 206).)

Kuhn’s view as expressed in the passage quoted above depends upon meaning holism—the claim that the meanings of terms are interrelated in such a way that changing the meaning of one term results in changes in the meanings of related terms: “To make the transition to Einstein’s universe, the whole conceptual web whose strands are space, time, matter, force, and so on, had to be shifted and laid down again on nature whole.” (1962/1970a, 149). The assumption of meaning holism is a long standing one in Kuhn’s work. One source for this is the later philosophy of Wittgenstein. Another not unrelated source is the assumption of holism in the philosophy of science that is consequent upon the positivist conception of theoretical meaning. According to the latter, it is not the function of the theoretical part of scientific language to refer to and describe unobserved entities. Only observational sentences directly describe the world, and this accounts for them having the meaning that they do. Theories permit the deduction of observational sentences. This is what gives theoretical expressions their meaning. Theoretical statements cannot, however, be reduced to observational ones. This is because, first, theoretical propositions are collectively involved in the deduction of observational statements, rather than singly. Secondly, theories generate dispositional statements (e.g. about the solubility of a substance, about how they would appear if observed under certain circumstances, etc.), and dispositional statements, being modal, are not equivalent to any truth-function of (non-modal) observation statements. Consequently, the meaning of a theoretical sentence is not equivalent to the meaning of any observational sentence or combination of observational sentences. The meaning of a theoretical term is a product of two factors: the relationship of the theory or theories of which it is a part to its observational consequences and the role that particular term plays within those theories. This is the double-language model of the language of science and was the standard picture of the relationship of a scientific theory to the world when Kuhn wrote The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Kuhn’s challenge to it lay not in rejecting the anti-realism implicit in the view that theories do not refer to the world but rather in undermining the assumption that the relationship of observation sentence to the world is unproblematic. By insisting on the theory-dependence of observation, Kuhn in effect argued that the holism of theoretical meaning is shared by apparently observational terms also, and for this reason the problem of incommensurability cannot be solved by recourse to theory-neutral observation sentences.

(Although it is true that Kuhn uses the expression ‘physical referent’ in the passage quoted above, this should not be taken to mean an independently existing worldly entity. If that were the case, Kuhn would be committed to the worldly existence of both Newtonian mass and Einsteinian mass (which are nonetheless not the same). It is implausible that Kuhn intended to endorse such a view. A better interpretation is to understand Kuhn as taking reference, in this context, to be a relation between a term and a hypothetical rather than worldly entity. Reference of anything like the Fregean, worldly kind plays no part in Kuhn’s thinking. Again this may be seen as a reflection of the influence of one or other or both of the (later) Wittgensteinian downplaying of reference and of the positivist view that theories are not descriptions of the world but are in one way or another tools for the organization or prediction of observations.)

4.4 Kuhn’s Later Semantic Incommensurability Thesis

Although Kuhn asserted a semantic incommensurability thesis in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions he did not there articulate or argue for the thesis in detail. This he attempted in subsequent work, with the result that the nature of the thesis changed over time. The heart of the incommensurability thesis after The Structure of Scientific Revolutions is the idea that certain kinds of translation are impossible. Early on Kuhn drew a parallel with Quine’s thesis of the indeterminacy of translation (1970a, 202; 1970c, 268). According to the latter, if we are translating one language into another, there are inevitably a multitude of ways of providing a translation that is adequate to the behaviour of the speakers. None of the translations is the uniquely correct one, and in Quine’s view there is no such thing as the meaning of the words to be translated. It was nonetheless clear that Quine’s thesis was rather far from Kuhn’s thesis, indeed that they are incompatible. First, Kuhn thought that incommensurability was a matter of there being no fully adequate translation whereas Quine’s thesis involved the availability of multiple translations. Secondly, Kuhn does believe that the translated expressions do have a meaning, whereas Quine denies this. Thirdly, Kuhn later went on to say that unlike Quine he does not think that reference is inscrutable—it is just very difficult to recover (1976, 191).

Subsequently, Kuhn developed the view that incommensurability arises from differences in classificatory schemes. This is taxonomic incommensurability. A field of science is governed by a taxonomy, which divides its subject matter into kinds. Associated with a taxonomy is a lexical network—a network of related terms. A significant scientific change will bring with it an alteration in the lexical network which in turn will lead to a re-alignment of the taxonomy of the field. The terms of the new and old taxonomies will not be inter-translatable.

The problematic nature of translation arises from two assumptions. First, as we have seen, Kuhn assumes that meaning is (locally) holistic. A change in the meaning of one part of the lexical structure will result in a change to all its parts. This would rule out preservation of the translatability of taxonomies by redefining the changed part in terms of the unchanged part. Secondly, Kuhn adopts the ‘no-overlap’ principle which states that categories in a taxonomy must be hierarchically organised: if two categories have members in common then one must be fully included within the other; otherwise they are disjoint—they cannot simply overlap. This rules out the possibility of an all-encompassing taxonomy that incorporates both the original and the changed taxonomies. (Ian Hacking (1993) relates this to the world-change thesis: after a revolution the world of individuals remains as it was, but scientists now work in a world of new kinds.)

Kuhn continued to develop his conceptual approach to incommensurability. At the time of his death he had made considerable progress on a book in which he related incommensurability to issues in developmental psychology and concept acquisition.

5. History of Science

Kuhn’s historical work covered several topics in the history of physics and astronomy. During the 1950s his focus was primarily on the early theory of heat and the work of Sadi Carnot. However, his first book concerned the Copernican revolution in planetary astronomy (1957). This book grew out of the teaching he had done on James Conant’s General Education in Science curriculum at Harvard but also presaged some of the ideas of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. In detailing the problems with the Ptolemaic system and Copernicus’ solution to them, Kuhn showed two things. First, he demonstrated that Aristotelian science was genuine science and that those working within that tradition, in particular those working on Ptolemaic astronomy, were engaged in an entirely reasonable and recognizably scientific project. Secondly, Kuhn showed that Copernicus was himself far more indebted to that tradition than had typically been recognized. Thus the popular view that Copernicus was a modern scientist who overthrew an unscientific and long-outmoded viewpoint is mistaken both by exaggerating the difference between Copernicus and the Ptolemaic astronomers and in underestimating the scientific credentials of work carried out before Copernicus. This mistaken view—a product of the distortion caused by our current state of knowledge—can be rectified only by seeing the activities of Copernicus and his predecessors in the light of the puzzles presented to them by tradition that they inevitably had to work with. While Kuhn does acknowledge the influence of causes outside science (such as a resurgence in Sun worship (1962/70a, 152–3)), he nonetheless emphasizes the fact that astronomers were responding primarily to problems raised within science. What appealed to them in Copernicus’ model was its ability to do away with ad hoc devices in Ptolemy’s system (such as the equant), to explain key phenomena in a pleasing fashion (the observed retrograde motion of the planets), and to explain away otherwise inexplicable coincidences in Ptolemy’s system (such as the alignment of the Sun and the centres of the epicycles of the inferior planets).

In the 1960s Kuhn’s historical work turned toward the early history of quantum theory, culminating in his book Black-Body Theory and the Quantum Discontinuity. According to classical physics a particle could possess any energy in a continuous range and if it changes energy it does so in a continuous fashion, possessing at some point in time every energy between the initial and final energy states. Modern quantum theory denies both these classical principles. Energy is quantised—a particle may possess only one of a set of discrete energies. Consequently if it changes in energy from one value to the next permitted value it does so discontinuously, jumping straight from one energy to the other without taking any of the intermediate (‘forbidden’) values. In order to explain the distribution of energy within a cavity (black-body radiation), Planck used the device of dividing up the energy states into multiples of the unit or ‘quantum’ hν (where ν is the frequency of radiation and h is what subsequently became known as Planck’s constant). Planck did this in order to employ a statistical technique of Boltzmann’s whereby the range of possible continuous energies is divided into ‘cells’ of similar energies that could be treated together for mathematical purposes. Kuhn notes that Planck was puzzled that in carrying out his derivation, only by fixing the cell size at hν could he get the result he wanted—the technique should have worked for any way of dividing the cells, so long as they were small enough but not too small. This work of Planck’s was carried out in the period 1900–1, which is the date tradition has accorded to the invention of the quantum concept. However, argued Kuhn, Planck did not have in mind a genuine physical discontinuity of energies until 1908, which is after Albert Einstein and Paul Ehrenfest had themselves emphasized it in 1905–6.

Many readers were surprised not to find mention of paradigms or incommensurability. Kuhn later added an Afterword, “Revisiting Planck”, explaining that he had not repudiated or ignored those ideas but that they were implicit in the argument he gave. Indeed the whole essay may be seen as a demonstration of an incommensurability between the mature quantum theory and the early quantum theory of Planck which was still rooted in classical statistical physics. In particular the very term ‘quantum’ changed its meaning between its introduction by Planck and its later use. Kuhn argues that the modern quantum concept was introduced first not by Planck but by Einstein. Furthermore, this fact is hidden both by the continued use of the same term and by the same distortion of history that has affected our conception of Ptolemy and Copernicus. As in Copernicus’ case, Planck has been seen as more revolutionary than in fact he was. In Planck’s case, however, this misconception was also shared by Planck himself later in life.

6. Criticism and Influence

Kuhn’s work met with a largely critical reception among philosophers. Some of this criticism became muted as Kuhn’s work became better understood and as his own thinking underwent transformation. At the same time other developments in philosophy opened up new avenues for criticism. That criticism has largely focussed on two areas. First, it has been argued that Kuhn’s account of the development of science is not entirely accurate. Secondly, critics have attacked Kuhn’s notion of incommensurability, arguing that either it does not exist or, if it does exist, it is not a significant problem. Despite this criticism, Kuhn’s work has been hugely influential, both within philosophy and outside it. The Structure of Scientific Revolutions was an important stimulus to what has since become known as ‘Science Studies’, in particular the Sociology of Scientific Knowledge (SSK).

6.1 Scientific Change

In The Structure of Scientific Revolutions periods of normal science and revolutionary science are clearly distinguished. In particular paradigms and their theories are not questioned and not changed in normal science whereas they are questioned and are changed in revolutionary science. Thus a revolution is, by definition revisionary, and normal science is not (as regards paradigms). Furthermore, normal science does not suffer from the conceptual discontinuities that lead to incommensurability whereas revolutions do. This gives the impression, confirmed by Kuhn’s examples, that revolutions are particularly significant and reasonably rare episodes in the history of science.

This picture has been questioned for its accuracy. Stephen Toulmin (1970) argues that a more realistic picture shows that revisionary changes in science are far more common and correspondingly less dramatic than Kuhn supposes, and that perfectly ‘normal’ science experiences these changes also. Kuhn could reply that such revisions are not revisions to the paradigm but to the non-paradigm puzzle-solutions provided by normal science. But that in turn requires a clear distinction between paradigmatic and non-paradigmatic components of science, a distinction that, arguably, Kuhn has not supplied in any detail.

At the same time, by making revisionary change a necessary condition of revolutionary science, Kuhn ignores important discoveries and developments that are widely regarded as revolutionary, such as the discovery of the structure of DNA and the revolution in molecular biology. Kuhn’s view is that discoveries and revolutions come about only as a consequence of the appearance of anomalies. Yet it is also clear that a discovery might come about in the course of normal science and initiate a ‘revolution’ (in a non-Kuhnian sense) in a field because of the unexpected insight it provides and the way it opens up opportunities for new avenues of research. The double-helical structure of DNA was not expected but immediately suggested a mechanism for the duplication of genetic information (e.g. in mitosis), which had enormous consequences for subsequent biological research.

6.2 Incommensurability

Kuhn’s incommensurability thesis presented a challenge not only to positivist conceptions of scientific change but also to realist ones. For a realist conception of scientific progress also wishes to assert that, by and large, later science improves on earlier science, in particular by approaching closer to the truth. A standard realist response from the late 1960s was to reject the anti-realism and anti-referentialism shared by both Kuhn’s picture and the preceding double-language model. If we do take theories to be potential descriptions of the world, involving reference to worldly entities, kind, and properties, then the problems raised by incommensurability largely evaporate. As we have seen, Kuhn thinks that we cannot properly say that Einstein’s theory is an improvement on Newton’s in the sense that the latter as deals reasonably accurately (only) with a special case of the former. Whether or not the key terms (such as ‘mass’) in the two theories differ in meaning, a realist and referentialist approach to theories permits one to say that Einstein’s theory is closer to the truth than Newton’s. For truth and nearness to the truth depend only on reference and not on sense. Two terms can differ in sense yet share the same reference, and correspondingly two sentences may relate to one another as regards truth without their sharing terms with the same sense. And so even if we retain a holism about the sense of theoretical terms and allow that revolutions lead to shifts in sense, there is no direct inference from this to a shift in reference. Consequently, there is no inference to the inadmissibility of the comparison of theories with respect to their truth-nearness.

While this referentialist response to the incommensurability thesis was initially framed in Fregean terms (Scheffler 1967), it received further impetus from the work of Kripke (1980) and Putnam (1975b), which argued that reference could be achieved without anything akin to Fregean sense and that the natural kind terms of science exemplified this sense-free reference. In particular, causal theories of reference permit continuity of reference even through fairly radical theoretical change. (They do not guarantee continuity in reference, and changes in reference can occur on some causal theories, e.g. Gareth Evans’s (1973). Arguing that they do occur would require more, however, than merely pointing to a change in theory. Rather, it seems, cases of reference change must be identified and argued for on a case by case basis.) Therefore, if taken to encompass terms for quantities and properties (such as ‘mass’), the changes that Kuhn identified as changes in meaning (e.g. those involved in the shift from Newtonian to relativistic physics) would not necessarily be changes that bear on reference, nor, consequently, on comparison for nearness to the truth. The simple causal theory of reference does have its problems, such as explaining the referential mechanism of empty theoretical terms (e.g.caloric and phlogiston) (c.f. Enç 1976, Nola 1980). Causal-descriptive theories (which allow for a descriptive component) tackle such problems while retaining the key idea that referential continuity is possible despite radical theory change (Kroon 1985, Sankey 1994).

Of course, the referentialist response shows only that reference can be retained, not that it must be. Consequently it is only a partial defence of realism against semantic incommensurability. A further component of the defence of realism against incommensurability must be an epistemic one. For referentialism shows that a term can retain reference and hence that the relevant theories may be such that the later constitutes a better approximation to the truth than the earlier. Nonetheless it may not be possible for philosophers or others to know that there has been such progress. Methodological incommensurability in particular seems to threaten the possibility of this knowledge. Kuhn thinks that in order to be in a position to compare theories from older and more recent periods of normal science one needs a perspective external to each and indeed any era of science–what he calls an ‘Archimedean platform’ (1992, 14). However, we never are able to escape from our current perspective. A realist response to this kind of incommensurability may appeal to externalist or naturalized epistemology. These (related) approaches reject the idea that for a method to yield knowledge it must be independent of any particular theory, perspective, or historical/cognitive circumstance. So long as the method has an appropriate kind of reliability it can generate knowledge. Contrary to the internalist view characteristic of the positivists (and, it appears, shared by Kuhn) the reliability of a method does not need to be one that must be evaluable independently of any particular scientific perspective. It is not the case, for example, that the reliability of a method used in science must be justifiable by a priori means. Thus the methods developed in one era may indeed generate knowledge, including knowledge that some previous era got certain matters wrong, or right but only to a certain degree. A naturalized epistemology may add that science itself is in the business of investigating and developing methods. As science develops we would expect its methods to change and develop also.

6.3 Kuhn and Social Science

Kuhn’s influence outside of professional philosophy of science may have been even greater than it was within it. The social sciences in particular took up Kuhn with enthusiasm. There are primarily two reasons for this. First, Kuhn’s picture of science appeared to permit a more liberal conception of what science is than hitherto, one that could be taken to include disciplines such as sociology and psychoanalysis. Secondly, Kuhn’s rejection of rules as determining scientific outcomes appeared to permit appeal to other factors, external to science, in explaining why a scientific revolution took the course that it did.

The status as genuine sciences of what we now call the social and human sciences has widely been held in doubt. Such disciplines lack the remarkable track record of established natural sciences and seem to differ also in the methods they employ. More specifically they fail by pre-Kuhnian philosophical criteria of sciencehood. On the one hand, positivists required of a science that it should be verifiable by reference to its predictive successes. On the other, Popper’s criterion was that a science should be potentially falsifiable by a prediction of the theory. Yet psychoanalysis, sociology and even economics have difficulty in making precise predictions at all, let alone ones that provide for clear confirmation or unambiguous refutation. Kuhn’s picture of a mature science as being dominated by a paradigm that generated sui generis puzzles and criteria for assessing solutions to them could much more easily accommodate these disciplines. For example, Popper famously complained that psychoanalysis could not be scientific because it resists falsification. Kuhn’s account argues that resisting falsification is precisely what every disciplinary matrix in science does. Even disciplines that could not claim to be dominated by a settled paradigm but were beset by competing schools with different fundamental ideas could appeal to Kuhn’s description of the pre-paradigm state of a science in its infancy. Consequently Kuhn’s analysis was popular among those seeking legitimacy as science (and consequently kudos and funding) for their new disciplines. Kuhn himself did not especially promote such extensions of his views, and indeed cast doubt upon them. He denied that psychoanalysis is a science and argued that there are reasons why some fields within the social sciences could not sustain extended periods of puzzle-solving normal science (1991b). Although, he says, the natural sciences involve interpretation just as human and social sciences do, one difference is that hermeneutic re-interpretation, the search for new and deeper intepretations, is the essence of many social scientific enterprises. This contrasts with the natural sciences where an established and unchanging interpretation (e.g. of the heavens) is a pre-condition of normal science. Re-intepretation is the result of a scientific revolution and is typically resisted rather than actively sought. Another reason why regular reinterpretation is part of the human sciences and not the natural sciences is that social and political systems are themselves changing in ways that call for new interpretations, whereas the subject matter of the natural sciences is constant in the relevant respects, permitting a puzzle-solving tradition as well as a standing source of revolution-generating anomalies.

A rather different influence on social science was Kuhn’s influence on the development of social studies of science itself, in particular the ‘Sociology of Scientific Knowledge’. A central claim of Kuhn’s work is that scientists do not make their judgments as the result of consciously or unconsciously following rules. Their judgments are nonetheless tightly constrained during normal science by the example of the guiding paradigm. During a revolution they are released from these constraints (though not completely). Consequently there is a gap left for other factors to explain scientific judgments. Kuhn himself suggests in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions that Sun worship may have made Kepler a Copernican and that in other cases, facts about an individual’s life history, personality or even nationality and reputation may play a role (1962/70a, 152–3). Later Kuhn repeated the point, with the additional examples of German Romanticism, which disposed certain scientists to recognize and accept energy conservation, and British social thought which enabled acceptance of Darwinism (1977c, 325). Such suggestions were taken up as providing an opportunity for a new kind of study of science, showing how social and political factors external to science influence the outcome of scientific debates. In what has become known as social constructivism/constructionism (e.g. Pickering 1984) this influence is taken to be central, not marginal, and to extend to the very content of accepted theories. Kuhn’s claim and its exploitation can be seen as analogous to or even an instance of the exploitation of the (alleged) underdetermination of theory by evidence (c.f. Kuhn 1992, 7). Feminists and social theorists (e.g. Nelson 1993) have argued that the fact that the evidence, or, in Kuhn’s case, the shared values of science, do not fix a single choice of theory, allows external factors to determine the final outcome (see Martin 1991 and Schiebinger 1999 for feminist social constructivism). Furthermore, the fact that Kuhn identified values as what guide judgment opens up the possibility that scientists ought to employ different values, as has been argued by feminist and post-colonial writers (e.g. Longino 1994).

Kuhn himself, however, showed only limited sympathy for such developments. In his “The Trouble with the Historical Philosophy of Science” (1992) Kuhn derides those who take the view that in the ‘negotiations’ that determine the accepted outcome of an experiment or its theoretical significance, all that counts are the interests and power relations among the participants. Kuhn targeted the proponents of the Strong Programme in the Sociology of Scientific Knowledge with such comments; and even if this is not entirely fair to the Strong Programme, it reflects Kuhn’s own view that the primary determinants of the outcome of a scientific episode are to be found within science. External history of science seeks causes of scientific change in social, political, religious and other developments of science. Kuhn sees his work as “pretty straight internalist” (2000: 287). First, the five values Kuhn ascribes to all science are in his view constitutive of science. An enterprise could have different values but it would not be science (1977c, 331; 1993, 338). Secondly, when a scientist is influenced by individual or other factors in applying these values or in coming to a judgment when these values are not decisive, those influencing factors will typically themselves come from within science (especially in modern, professionalized science). Personality may play a role in the acceptance of a theory, because, for example, one scientist is more risk-averse than another (1977c, 325)—but that is still a relationship to the scientific evidence. Even when reputation plays a part, it is typically scientific reputation that encourages the community to back the opinion of an eminent scientist. Thirdly, in a large community such variable factors will tend to cancel out. Kuhn supposes that individual differences are normally distributed and that a judgment corresponding to the mean of the distribution will also correspond to the judgment that would, hypothetically, be demanded by the rules of scientific method, as traditionally conceived (1977c, 333). Moreover, the existence of differences of response within the leeway provided by shared values is crucial to science, since it permits “rational men to disagree” (1977c, 332) and thus to commit themselves to rival theories. Thus the looseness of values and the differences they permit “may . . . appear an indispensable means of spreading the risk which the introduction or support of novelty always entails” (Ibid.).

6.4 Recent Developments

Even if Kuhn’s work has not remained at the centre of the philosophy of science, a number of philosophers have continued to find it fruitful and have sought to develop it in a number of directions. Paul Hoyningen-Huene (1989/1993), as a result of working with Kuhn, developed an important neo-Kantian interpretation of his discussion of perception and world-change. We may distinguish between the world-in-itself and the ‘world’ of our perceptual and related experiences (the phenomenal world). This corresponds to the Kantian distinction between noumena and phenomena. The important difference between Kant and Kuhn is that Kuhn takes the general form of phenomena not to be fixed but changeable. A shift in paradigm can lead, via the theory-dependence of observation, to a difference in one’s experiences of things and thus to a change in one’s phenomenal world. This change in phenomenal world articulates the sense in which the world changes as a result of a scientific revolution while also capturing Kuhn’s claims about the theory-dependence of observation and consequent incommensurability (Hoyningen-Huene 1990).

A rather different direction in which Kuhn’s thought has been developed proposes that his ideas might be illuminated by advances in cognitive psychology. One the one hand work on conceptual structures can help understand what might be correct in the incommensurability thesis (Nersessian 1987, 2003). Several authors have sought in different ways to emphasize what they take to be the Wittgensteinian element in Kuhn’s thought (for example Kindi 1995, Sharrock and Read 2002). Andersen, Barker, and Chen (1996, 1998, 2006) draw in particular on Kuhn’s version of Wittgenstein’s notion of family resemblance. Kuhn articulates a view according to which the extension of a concept is determined by similarity to a set of exemplary cases rather than by an intension. Andersen, Barker, and Chen argue that Kuhn’s view is supported by the work of Rosch (1972; Rosch and Mervis 1975) on prototypes; furthermore, this approach can be developed in the context of dynamic frames (Barsalou 1992), which can then explain the phenomenon of (semantic) incommensurability.

On the other hand, the psychology of analogical thinking and cognitive habits may also inform our understanding of the concept of a paradigm. Kuhn himself tells us that “The paradigm as shared example is the central element of what I now take to be the most novel and least understood aspect of [The Structure of Scientific Revolutions]” (1970a, 187). Kuhn, however, failed to develop the paradigm concept in his later work beyond an early application of its semantic aspects to the explanation of incommensurability. Nonetheless, other philosophers, principally Howard Margolis (1987, 1993) have developed the idea that habits of mind formed by training with paradigms-as-exemplars are an important component in understanding the nature of scientific development. As explained by Nickles (2003b) and Bird (2005), this is borne out by recent work by psychologists on model-based and analogical thinking.

6.5 Assessment

Assessing Kuhn’s significance presents a conundrum. Unquestionably he was one of the most influential philosophers and historians of science of the twentieth century. His most obvious achievement was to have been a major force in bringing about the final demise of logical positivism. Nonetheless, there is no characteristically Kuhnian school that carries on his positive work. It is as if he himself brought about a revolution but did not supply the replacement paradigm. For a period in the 1960s and 1970s it looked as if there was a Kuhnian paradigm ‘historical philosophy of science’, flourishing especially in newly formed departments of history and philosophy of science. But as far as the history of science and science studies more generally are concerned, Kuhn repudiated at least the more radical developments made in his name. Indeed part of Kuhn’s fame must be due to the fact that both his supporters and his detractors took his work to be more revolutionary (anti-rationalist, relativist) than it really was.

Turning to the philosophy of science, it was clear by the end of the 1980s that the centreground was now occupied by a new realism, one that took on board lessons from general philosophy of language and epistemology, in particular referentialist semantics and a belief in the possibility of objective knowledge and justification. There is some irony therefore in the fact that it was the demise of logical positivism/empiricism that led to the rebirth of scientific realism along with causal and externalist semantics and epistemology, positions that Kuhn rejected.

One way of understanding this outcome is to see that Kuhn’s relationship on the one hand to positivism and on the other hand to realism places him in an interesting position. Kuhn’s thesis of the theory-dependence of observation parallels related claims by realists. In the hands of realists the thesis is taken to undermine the theory-observation dichotomy that permitted positivists to take an anti-realist attitude to theories. In the hands of Kuhn however, the thesis is taken, in effect, to extend anti-realism from theories to observation also. This in turn fuels the thesis of incommensurability. The fact that incommensurability is founded upon a response to positivism diametrically opposed to the realist response explains why much of Kuhn’s later philosophical work, which developed the incommensurability thesis, has had little impact on the majority of philosophers of science.

The explanation of scientific development in terms of paradigms was not only novel but radical too, insofar as it gives a naturalistic explanation of belief-change. Naturalism was not in the early 1960s the familiar part of philosophical landscape that it has subsequently become. Kuhn’s explanation contrasted with explanations in terms of rules of method (or confirmation, falsification etc.) that most philosophers of science took to be constitutive of rationality. Furthermore, the relevant disciplines (psychology, cognitive science, artificial intelligence) were not then advanced enough to to support Kuhn’s contentions concerning paradigms, or those disciplines were antithetical to Kuhn’s views (in the case of classical AI). Now that naturalism has become an accepted component of philosophy, there has recently been interest in reassessing Kuhn’s work in the light of developments in the relevant sciences, many of which provide corroboration for Kuhn’s claim that science is driven by relations of perceived similarity and analogy. It may yet be that a characteristically Kuhnian thesis will play a prominent part in our understanding of science.


Books by Thomas Kuhn

  • 1957, The Copernican Revolution: Planetary Astronomy in the Development of Western Thought, Cambridge Mass: Harvard University Press.
  • 1962/1970a, The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Chicago: University of Chicago Press (1970, 2nd edition, with postscript).
  • 1977a, The Essential Tension. Selected Studies in Scientific Tradition and Change, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • 1978, Black-Body Theory and the Quantum Discontinuity, Oxford: Clarendon Press (2nd edition, Chicago: University of Chicago Press).
  • 2000, The Road Since Structure, edited by James Conant and John Haugeland, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Selected papers of Thomas Kuhn

  • 1959, “The Essential Tension: Tradition and Innovation in Scientific Research”, in The Third (1959) University of Utah Research Conference on the Identification of Scientific Talent C. Taylor, Salt Lake City: University of Utah Press: 162–74.
  • 1963, “The Function of Dogma in Scientific Research”, in Scientific Change, A. Crombie (ed.), London: Heinemann: 347–69.
  • 1970b, “Logic of Discovery or Psychology of Research?”, in Criticism and the Growth of Knowledge, edited by I. Lakatos and A. Musgrave, London: Cambridge University Press: 1–23.
  • 1970c, “Reflections on my Critics”, in Criticism and the Growth of Knowledge, I. Lakatos and A. Musgrave (eds.), London: Cambridge University Press: 231–78.
  • 1974, “Second Thoughts on Paradigms”, in The Structure of Scientific Theories F. Suppe (ed.), Urbana IL: University of Illinois Press: 459–82.
  • 1976, “Theory-Change as Structure-Change: Comments on the Sneed Formalism” Erkenntnis 10: 179–99.
  • 1977b, “The Relations between the History and the Philosophy of Science”, in his The Essential Tension, Chicago: University of Chicago Press: 3–20.
  • 1977c, “Objectivity, Value Judgment, and Theory Choice”, in his The Essential Tension, Chicago: University of Chicago Press: 320–39.
  • 1979, “Metaphor in Science”, in Metaphor and Thought, edited by A. Ortony Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 409–19.
  • 1980, “The Halt and the Blind: Philosophy and History of Science”, (review of Howson Method and Appraisal in the Physical Sciences, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press) British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 31: 181–92.
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