Wang Yangming

First published Fri Jul 11, 2014; substantive revision Fri Sep 6, 2019

Wang Yangming (1472–1529) was a Chinese statesman, general, and Neo–Confucian philosopher. He was one of the leading critics of the orthodox Neo–Confucianism of Zhu Xi (1130–1200). Wang is perhaps best known for his doctrine of the “unity of knowing and acting,” which can be interpreted as a denial of the possibility of weakness of will.

1. Life

This philosopher’s family name was “Wang,” his personal name was “Shouren,” and his “courtesy name” was “Bo–an.”[1] However, he is normally known today as “Wang Yangming,” based on a nickname he adopted when he was living in the Yangming Grotto of Kuaiji Mountain. Born in 1472 near Hangzhou in what is now Zhejiang Province, Wang was the son of a successful official. As such, he would have received a fairly conventional education, with a focus on the Four Books of the Confucian tradition: the Analects (the sayings of Confucius and his immediate disciples), the Great Learning (believed to consist of an opening statement by Confucius with a commentary on it by his leading disciple, Zengzi), the Mean (attributed to Zisi, the grandson of Confucius, who was also a student of Zengzi), and the Mengzi (the sayings and dialogues of Mencius, a student of Zisi). The young Wang would have literally committed these classics to memory, along with the commentaries on them by the master of orthodox Confucianism, Zhu Xi (1130–1200). The study of these classics–cum–commentary was thought to be morally edifying; however, people also studied them in order to pass the civil service examinations, which were the primary route to government power, and with it wealth and prestige. At the age of seventeen (1489), Wang had a conversation with a Daoist priest that left him deeply intrigued with this alternative philosophical system and way of life. Wang was also attracted to Buddhism, and remained torn between Daoism, Buddhism and Confucianism for much of his early life. Whereas Confucianism emphasizes our ethical obligations to others, especially family members, and public service in government, the Daoism and Buddhism of Wang’s era encouraged people to overcome their attachment to the physical world. Wang continued the serious study of Zhu Xi’s interpretation of Confucianism, but was disillusioned by an experience in which he and a friend made a determined effort to apply what they took to be Zhu Xi’s method for achieving sagehood:

…my friend Qian and I discussed the idea that to become a sage or a worthy one must investigate all the things in the world. But how can a person have such tremendous energy? I therefore pointed to the bamboos in front of the pavilion and told him to investigate them and see. Day and night Qian went ahead trying to investigate to the utmost the Pattern of the bamboos. He exhausted his mind and thoughts, and on the third day he was tired out and took sick. At first I said that it was because his energy and strength were insufficient. Therefore I myself went to try to investigate to the utmost. From morning till night, I was unable to find the Pattern of the bamboos. On the seventh day I also became sick because I thought too hard. In consequence we sighed to each other and said that it was impossible to be a sage or a worthy, for we do not have the tremendous energy to investigate things that they have. (Translation modified from Chan 1963, 249)

As we shall see (Section 2, below), it is unclear whether Wang and his friend were correctly applying what Zhu Xi meant by “the investigation of things.” However, Wang’s experience of finding it impractical to seek for the Pattern of the universe in external things left a deep impression on him, and influenced the later course of his philosophy.

Wang continued to study Daoism as well as Buddhism, but also showed a keen interest in military techniques and the craft of writing elegant compositions. Meanwhile, he progressed through the various levels of the civil service examinations, finally passing the highest level in 1499. After this, Wang had a meteoric rise in the government, including distinguished service in offices overseeing public works, criminal prosecution, and the examination system. During this period, Wang began to express disdain for overly refined literary compositions like those he had produced in his earlier years. Wang would later criticize those who “waste their time competing with one another writing flowery compositions in order to win acclaim in their age, and…no longer comprehend conduct that honors what is fundamental, esteems what is real, reverts to simplicity, and returns to purity” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 275).

In addition, Wang started to turn his back on Daoism and Buddhism, which he came to regard as socially irresponsible: “…simply because they did not understand what it is to rest in the ultimate good and instead exerted their selfish minds toward the achievement of excessively lofty goals, [Buddhists and Daoists] were lost in vagaries, illusions, emptiness, and stillness and had nothing to do with the family, state or world” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 244, gloss mine). Nonetheless, Wang continued to show an intimate familiarity with Daoist and Buddhist literature and concepts throughout his career.

A life–changing event for Wang occurred in 1506. A eunuch who had assumed illegitimate influence at court had several able officials imprisoned for opposing him. Wang wrote a “memorial” to the emperor in protest. The eunuch responded by having Wang publicly beaten and exiled to an insignificant position in a semi–civilized part of what is now Guizhou Province. Wang had to face considerable physical and psychological hardship in this post, but through these challenges he achieved a deep philosophical awakening (1508), which he later expressed in a poem he wrote for his students:

Everyone has within an unerring compass;
The root and source of the myriad transformations lies in the mind.
I laugh when I think that, earlier, I saw things the other way around;
Following branches and leaves, I searched outside! (Ivanhoe 2009, 181)

In other words, looking outside oneself for moral truth, as he and his friend Qian had tried to do when studying the bamboos, was ignoring the root of moral insight, which is one’s own innate understanding.

Fortunately for Wang, in the year when his term of service in Guizhou was over (1510), the eunuch who had Wang beaten and banished was himself executed. Wang’s official career quickly returned to its stratospheric level of achievement, with high–ranking posts and exceptional achievements in both civil and military positions. This inevitably led to opposition from the faction–ridden court. Wang was even accused of conspiring with the leader of a rebellion that Wang had himself put down.

Wang had begun to attract devoted disciples even before his exile to Guizhou, and they gradually compiled the Record for Practice (the anthology of his sayings, correspondence, and dialogues that is one of our primary sources for Wang’s philosophy). It is reflective of Wang’s philosophy that the discussions recorded in this work occurred in the midst of his active life in public affairs. Near the end of his life, Wang was called upon to suppress yet another rebellion (1527). The night before he left, one of his disciples recorded the “Inquiry on the Great Learning,” which was intended as a primer of Wang’s philosophy for new disciples. Wang put down the rebellion, but his health had been declining for several years, and he died soon afterward (1529).

On his deathbed, Wang said, “ ‘This mind’ is luminous and bright. What more is there to say?”[2]

2. Intellectual Context

During Wang’s lifetime, the dominant intellectual movement was Neo–Confucianism (in Chinese, Dàoxué, or the Learning of the Way). Neo–Confucianism traces its origins to Han Yu and Li Ao in the late Tang dynasty (618–906), but it only came to intellectual maturity in the Song and Southern Song dynasties (960–1279), with the theorizing of Zhou Dunyi, Zhang Zai, Cheng Yi, his brother Cheng Hao, and Zhu Xi. Neo–Confucianism originally developed as a Confucian reaction against Buddhism. Ironically, though, the Neo–Confucians were deeply influenced by Buddhism and adopted many key Buddhists concepts, including the notions that the diverse phenomena of the universe are manifestations of some underlying unity, and that selfishness is the fundamental vice.

Zhu Xi synthesized the thought of earlier Neo–Confucians, and his interpretation of the Four Books became the basis of the civil service examinations (see Section 1, above). Zhu held that everything in existence has two aspects, Pattern and . Pattern (, also translated “principle”) is the underlying structure of the universe. Qi is the spatio–temporal stuff that constitutes concrete objects. The complete Pattern is fully present in each entity in the universe; however, entities are individuated by having distinct allotments of qi (variously translated as “ether,” “psychophysical stuff,” “vital fluid,” “material force,” and others). In addition to having spatio–temporal location, qi has qualitative distinctions, described metaphorically in terms of degrees of “clarity” and “turbidity.” The more “clear” the qi, the greater the extent to which the Pattern manifests. This explains how speciation is possible. For example, plants have more “clear” qi than do rocks, which is reflected in the more complex repertoire of interactions plants have with their environments.

Neo–Confucian metaphysics, ethics, and philosophical psychology are systematically connected. Humans have the most clear qi of any being. However, some humans have especially clear qi, and as a result manifest the virtues, while others have comparatively turbid qi, and therefore are prone to vice. The state of one’s qi is not fixed, though. Through ethical cultivation, any human can clarify his qi, and thereby become more virtuous. Similarly, through laxness, one can allow one’s qi to morally deteriorate. Because the Pattern is fully present in each human, everyone has complete innate ethical knowledge. However, due to the obscurations of qi, the manifestations of this knowledge are sporadic and inconsistent. Thus, a king who shows benevolence when he takes pity on an ox being led to slaughter and spares it may fail to show benevolence in his treatment of his own subjects (Mengzi 1A7). Similarly, a person might manifest righteousness when he disdains to even consider an illicit sexual relationship; however, the same person might see nothing shameful about flattering the worst traits and most foolish policies of a ruler whom he serves (Mengzi 3B3). Because humans all share the same Pattern, we are parts of a potentially harmonious whole. In some sense, we form “one body” with other humans and the rest of the universe. Consequently, the fundamental human virtue is benevolence, which involves recognition of our shared nature with others.[3] Correspondingly, the fundamental vice is selfishness. Cheng Hao uses a medical metaphor to explain the relationship between ethics and personal identity:

A medical text describes numbness of the hands and feet as being “unfeeling.” This expression describes it perfectly. Benevolent people regard Heaven, Earth, and the myriad things as one Substance. Nothing is not oneself. If you recognize something as yourself, there are no limits to how far [your compassion] will go. But if you do not identify something as part of yourself, you will have nothing to do with it. This is like how, when hands and feet are “unfeeling,” the qi does not flow and one does not identify them as part of oneself. (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 201)

Just as those whose hands and feet are “unfeeling” are not bothered by injuries to their own limbs, so do those who are ethically “unfeeling” fail to show concern for other humans. In both cases, one fails to act appropriately because one fails to recognize that something is a part of oneself.

Neo–Confucians regarded the ancient philosopher Mencius (4th century BCE) as having presented an especially incisive interpretation of Confucianism. They referred to him as the “Second Sage,” second in importance only to Confucius himself, and often appealed to his vocabulary, arguments, and examples.[4] In particular, Neo–Confucians adopted Mencius’s view that human nature is good, and that wrongdoing is the result of humans ignoring the promptings of their innate virtues. Physical desires are one of the primary causes for the failure to heed one’s innate moral sense. There is nothing intrinsically immoral about desires for fine food, sex, wealth, etc., but we will be led to wrongdoing if we pursue them without giving thought to the well–being of others (Mengzi 6A15). Neo–Confucians also adopted Mencius’s list of four cardinal virtues: benevolence, righteousness, wisdom, and propriety. Benevolence is manifested in the emotion of compassion, which involves sympathizing with the suffering of others and acting appropriately on that sympathy. For instance, a benevolent ruler could never be indifferent to the well–being of his subjects, and would work tirelessly to alleviate their suffering. Righteousness is manifested in the emotion of disdain or shame at the thought of doing what is dishonorable, especially in the face of temptations of wealth or physical desire. For example, a righteous person would not cheat at a game, or accept a bribe. Wisdom is manifested in approval or disapproval that reflects sound judgment about means–end deliberation and about the character of others. Thus, a wise official would know which policies to support and which to oppose, and would be inventive in devising solutions to complex problems. Propriety is manifested in respect or deference toward elders and legitimate authorities, particularly as expressed in ceremonies or etiquette. For instance, a person with propriety would willingly defer to elder family members most of the time, but would be motivated to serve a guest before his elder brother.

The preceding views are shared, in broad outline, by all Neo–Confucian philosophers. The primary issue they debated was the proper method of ethical cultivation. In other words, how is it possible for us to consistently and reliably access and act on our innate ethical knowledge? Other disagreements among them (on seemingly recondite issues of metaphysics and the interpretation of the Confucian classics) can often be traced to more fundamental disagreements over ethical cultivation. For Zhu Xi, almost all humans are born with qi that is so turbid that it is impossible for them to consistently know what is virtuous and act accordingly without external assistance. The remedy is carefully studying the classics written by the ancient sages, ideally under the guidance of a wise teacher. Although the classics were written in response to concrete historical situations, their words allow us to grasp the Pattern at a certain level of abstraction from its instantiations. However, Zhu Xi states that merely understanding the Pattern is insufficient for the exercise of virtue. One must achieve Sincerity (chéng), a continual awareness of moral knowledge in the face of temptations.[5]

In his own lifetime, Zhu Xi’s leading critic was Lu Xiangshan (1139–1193). Lu argued that, because the Pattern is fully present in the mind of each human, it is not necessary to engage in an intellectually demanding process of study in order to recover one’s moral knowledge:

Righteousness and Pattern are in the minds of human beings. As a matter of fact, these are what Heaven has endowed us with, and they can never be effaced or eliminated [from our minds]. If one becomes obsessed with [desires for] things and reaches the point where one violates Pattern and transgresses righteousness, usually this is simply because one fails to reflect upon these things [i.e., the righteousness and Pattern that lie within one]. If one truly is able to turn back and reflect upon these things, then what is right and wrong and what one should cleave to and what one should subtly reject will begin to stir, separate, become clear, and leave one resolute and without doubts. (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 251–52, glosses in original translation)

In emphasizing the innate human capacity for moral judgment, Lu adopted the phrase “pure knowing” from Mengzi 7A15. In its original context, Mencius writes that “Among babes in arms there are none that do not know to love their parents,” and describes this as an instance of “pure knowing,” which humans “know without pondering” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 218). Lu explains:

Pure knowing lies within human beings; although some people become mired in dissolution, pure knowing still remains undiminished and enduring [within them]. … Truly, if they can turn back and seek after it, then, without needing to make a concerted effort, what is right and wrong, what is fine and foul, will become exceedingly clear, and they will decide for themselves what to like and dislike, what to pursue and what to abandon. (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 252)

Although there were always Confucians like Lu who disagreed with Zhu Xi, the latter’s interpretation became dominant after the government sponsored it as the official interpretation for the civil service examinations. By the time of Wang Yangming, Zhu Xi’s approach had ossified into a stale orthodoxy that careerists mindlessly parroted in an effort to pass the examinations.

3. Unity of Knowing and Acting

Some aspects of Wang’s philosophy can be understood as refining or drawing out the full implications of Lu Xiangshan’s critique of Zhu Xi. Like Lu, Wang stressed that the Pattern is fully present in the mind of every person: “The mind is Pattern. Is there any affair outside the mind? Is there any Pattern outside the mind?” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 264)[6] As a result, the theoretical study of ethics is unnecessary. All a moral agent needs to do is exercise “pure knowing.” This view may seem naive at first glance. However, this is partially due to the different foci of Chinese and Western ethics. Metaethics and normative ethical theory are substantial parts of Western ethics, but less central to Chinese ethics. In addition, recent Western ethics manifests an interest in abstract ethical dilemmas that is perhaps disproportionate to the relevance of these quandaries in practice. In contrast, the focus of much Chinese ethics, particularly Confucianism, is applied ethical cultivation. Consequently, Lu and Wang were primarily interested in having a genuine positive effect on the ethical lives of their followers. There is some plausibility to the claim that (even in our own complex, multicultural intellectual context) most of us know what our basic ethical obligations are. For example, as a teacher, I have an obligation to grade assignments promptly and fairly. As a colleague, I have an obligation to take my turn serving as chair. As a parent, I have an obligation to make time to share my children’s interests. Due to selfish desires, it is tempting to procrastinate in grading essays, or try to evade departmental service, or ignore the emotional needs of one’s children. However, it is not as if it is genuinely difficult to figure out that these are our obligations.

Wang’s most distinctive and well-known doctrine is the unity of knowing and acting (zhī xíng hé yī). In order to grasp the significance of this doctrine, consider a student who is being questioned by a college honor code panel after being caught plagiarizing an essay. If the honor code panel asked the student whether he knew that plagiarism was wrong, it would not be surprising for the student to reply, “Yes, I knew it was wrong to plagiarize my essay, but I wanted so much to get an easy A that I gave in to temptation.” Western philosophers would describe this as a case of akrasia, or weakness of will. Zhu Xi, along with many Western philosophers like Aristotle, would acknowledge that the student had correctly described his psychological state. However, Wang Yangming would deny that the student actually knew that plagiarism was wrong: “There never have been people who know but do not act. Those who ‘know’ but do not act simply do not yet know” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 267). One of Wang’s primary claims is that merely verbal assent is inadequate to demonstrate actual knowledge: “One cannot say he knows filial piety or brotherly respect simply because he knows how to say something filial or brotherly. Knowing pain offers another good example. One must have experienced pain oneself in order to know pain.” Wang also adduces cold and hunger as things that one must experience in order to know. We might object that Wang’s example shows, at most, that someone must have had an experience of goodness or evil at some point in his life in order to know what it means for something to be good or evil. This falls short of the conclusion that Wang needs, though, for just as I can know what you mean when you say “I am hungry” even if I am not currently motivated to eat, so might I know that “plagiarism is wrong,” even if I am not motivated to avoid plagiarism myself in this circumstance.

A more promising line of argument for Wang is his appropriation of an example from the Great Learning (Commentary 6), which suggests that loving the good is “like loving a lovely sight,” while hating evil is “like hating a hateful odor” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 191). To recognize an odor as disgusting (a kind of knowing) is to be repulsed by it (a motivation), which leads to avoiding the odor or eliminating its source (actions). The Chinese phrase rendered “loving a lovely sight” (hào hǎo sè) has connotations of finding someone sexually attractive.[7] To regard someone as sexually attractive (a kind of cognition) is to be drawn toward them (a kind of motivation that can lead to action). To this, one might object that Wang’s examples show, at most, that knowing something is good or bad requires that one have some level of appropriate motivation. Even if we grant the relevance of Wang’s examples, it is possible to have an intrinsic motivation that does not result in action. Recognizing that someone is sexually attractive certainly does not always result in pursuing an assignation, for example.

Perhaps Wang’s most compelling line of argument is a pragmatic one about the aim or purpose behind discussing knowing and acting. He allows that it may be useful and legitimate to discuss knowing separately from acting or acting separately from knowing, but only in order to address the failings of specific kinds of individuals. On the one hand, “there is a type of person in the world who foolishly acts upon impulse without engaging in the slightest thought or reflection. Because they always act blindly and recklessly, it is necessary to talk to them about knowing…,” without emphasizing acting. On the other hand, “[t]here is also a type of person who is vague and irresolute; they engage in speculation while suspended in a vacuum and are unwilling to apply themselves to any concrete actions” (268). These latter people benefit from advice that emphasizes action, without necessarily discussing knowledge. However, those in Wang’s era who distinguish knowledge and action (and here he has in mind those who follow the orthodox philosophy of Zhu Xi) “separate knowing and acting into two distinct tasks to perform and think that one must first know and only then can one act.” As a result, they become nothing more than pedantic bookworms, who study ethics without ever living up to its ideals or trying to achieve positive change in the world around them. Wang concludes, “My current teaching regarding the unity of knowing and acting is a medicine directed precisely at this disease.”

4. Interpretation of the Great Learning

In the standard Confucian curriculum of Wang’s era, the Great Learning was the first of the Four Books that students were assigned, and Zhu Xi’s commentary on it often made a lasting impression on them. In the opening of the Great Learning, Confucius describes the steps in self–cultivation:

The ancients who desired to enlighten the enlightened Virtue of the world would first put their states in order. Those who desired to put their states in order would first regulate their families. Those who desired to regulate their families would first cultivate their selves. Those who desired to cultivate their selves would first correct their minds. Those who desired to correct their minds would first make their thoughts have Sincerity. Those who desired to make their thoughts have Sincerity would first extend their knowledge. Extending knowledge lies in gé wù. (Translation slightly modified from Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 188–189)

Ge wu is left unexplained in the Great Learning. However, Zhu Xi, following the interpretation of Cheng Yi, claims that

…what is meant by “extending knowledge lies in ge wu” is that desiring to extend my knowledge lies in encountering things and exhaustively investigating their Pattern. In general, the human mind is sentient and never fails to have knowledge, while the things of the world never fail to have the Pattern. It is only because the Pattern is not yet exhaustively investigated that knowledge is not fully fathomed. Consequently, at the beginning of education in the Great Learning, the learner must be made to encounter the things of the world, and never fail to follow the Pattern that one already knows and further exhaust it, seeking to arrive at the farthest points. When one has exerted effort for a long time, one day, like something suddenly cracking open, one will know in a manner that binds it all together. (Translation slightly modified from Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 191)

Following Zhu Xi’s interpretations, most translators today render ge wu as “investigating things.” Wang and his friend Qian were trying to “investigate things” in this manner when they stared attentively at the bamboos, struggling to grasp their underlying Pattern. It is questionable, though, whether this is what Zhu Xi had in mind. Zhu certainly thought the Pattern was present in everything, and could potentially be investigated in even the most mundane of objects. However, he emphasized that the best method to learn about the Pattern was through studying the classics texts of Confucianism, particularly the Four Books.

As important as learning was for Zhu Xi, he stressed that it was possible to know what is right and wrong yet not act on it: “Knowledge and action always need each other. It’s like how eyes cannot walk without feet, but feet cannot see without eyes. If we discuss them in terms of their sequence, knowledge comes first. But if we discuss them in terms of importance, action is what is important” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 180–81). What connects knowledge and action, on Zhu Xi’s account, is Sincerity. Sincerity (chéng) is a subtle and multifaceted notion in Neo–Confucian thought. However, the Great Learning focuses on one key aspect of it: “What is meant by ‘making thoughts have Sincerity’ is to let there be no self–deception. It is like hating a hateful odor, or loving a lovely sight. The is called not being conflicted” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 191). In other words, humans engage in wrongdoing through a sort of self–deception in which they allow themselves to ignore the promptings of their moral sense, and become motivated solely by their physical desires for sex, food, wealth, etc. Once one knows what is right and wrong, one must then make an effort to keep that knowledge present to one’s consciousness, so that it becomes motivationally efficacious. As Zhu Xi explains, “…those who desire to cultivate themselves, when they know to do good in order to avoid the bad, must then genuinely make an effort and forbid self–deception, making their hatred of the [ethically] hateful be like their hating a hateful odor, and their loving what is good like their loving a lovely sight” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 192).

Wang challenged almost every aspect of Zhu Xi’s interpretation of the Great Learning. He regarded Zhu Xi’s account as not just theoretically mistaken but dangerously misleading for those seeking to improve themselves ethically. However, Wang recognized that students who had memorized Zhu Xi’s interpretation to prepare for the civil service examinations would have difficulty understanding the text any other way. Consequently, when he accepted a new disciple, Wang often began by explaining his alternative interpretation of the Great Learning, and invited students to ask questions. Wang’s approach is preserved in a brief but densely argued work, “Questions on the Great Learning.” Let’s begin at the apparent foundation of the Great Learning’s program: ge wu. Whereas Zhu Xi argues that ge wu is literally “reaching things,” meaning to intellectually grasp the Pattern in things and situations, Wang argues that ge wu means “rectifying things,” including both one’s own thoughts and the objects of those thoughts. For Zhu Xi, ge wu is primarily about gaining knowledge, while for Wang it is about motivation and action.[8]

The fact that the Great Learning explicates ge wu in terms of “extending knowledge” might seem to support Zhu Xi’s interpretation. However, Wang offers a plausible alternative explanation: “To fully extend one’s knowledge is not like the so–called ‘filling out’ of what one knows that later scholars [like Zhu Xi] talk about. It is simply to extend fully the ‘pure knowing’ of my own mind. Pure knowing is what [Mencius] was talking about when he said that all humans have ‘the mind of approval and disapproval.’ The mind of approval and disapproval ‘knows without pondering’ and is ‘capable without learning’ ” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 248, glosses mine).[9] Wang is suggesting that “extending knowledge” refers simply to exercising our innate faculty of moral awareness, which Mencius refers to as “pure knowing.” As David S. Nivison explains, “We might say that Wang’s ‘extending’ of knowledge is more like extending one’s arm than, say, extending one’s vocabulary” (Nivison 1996a, 225).

According to Zhu Xi, the opening of the Great Learning lists a series of steps that are, at least to some extent, temporally distinct. Wang demurs:

While one can say that there is an ordering of first and last in this sequence of spiritual training, the training itself is a unified whole that cannot be divided into any ordering of first and last. While this sequence of spiritual training cannot be divided into any ordering of first and last, only when every aspect of its practice is highly refined can one be sure that it will not be deficient in the slightest degree. (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 250)

Wang’s argument here is similar to the one he made about the verbal distinction between knowing and acting (Section 3, above). He claimed that the ancient sages recognized that knowing and acting were ultimately one thing, but sometimes discussed them separately for pedagogic purposes, to help those who underemphasized one aspect of this unity. Similarly, Wang suggests, the Great Learning uses multiple terms to describe various aspects of the unified exercise of moral agency, but does not mean to suggest that these are actually distinct temporal stages:

…we can say that “self,” “mind,” “thoughts,” “knowledge,” and “things” describe the sequence of spiritual training. While each has its own place, in reality they are but a single thing. We can say that “ge wu,” “extending,” “making Sincere,” “correcting,” and “cultivating” describe the spiritual training used in the course of this sequence. While each has its own name, in reality they are but a single affair. What do we mean by “self”? It is the way we refer to the physical operations of the mind. What do we mean by “mind”? It is the way we refer to the luminous and intelligent master of the person. (Translation slightly modified from Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 247)

Wang even interprets the key metaphor of the Great Learning in a very different way from Zhu Xi. For Zhu Xi, hating evil “like hating a hateful odor,” and loving good “like loving a lovely sight” are goals that we must aspire to, but can only achieve after an arduous process of ethical cultivation. For Wang Yangming, these phrases describe what our attitudes toward good and evil can and should be at the very inception of ethical cultivation:

…the Great Learning gives us examples of true knowing and acting, saying it is “like loving a lovely sight” or “hating a hateful odor.” Seeing a lovely sight is a case of knowing, while loving a lovely sight is a case of acting. As soon as one sees that lovely sight, one naturally loves it. It is not as if you first see it and only then, intentionally, you decide to love it. Smelling a hateful odor is a case of knowing, while hating a hateful odor is a case of acting. As soon as one smells that hateful odor, one naturally hates it. It is not as if you first smell it and only then, intentionally, you decide to hate it. Consider the case of a person with a stuffed–up nose. Even if he sees a malodorous object right in front of him, the smell does not reach him, and so he does not hate it. This is simply not to know the hateful odor. (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 267)

In summary, Zhu Xi and Wang agree that the Great Learning is an authoritative statement on ethical cultivation, expressing the wisdom of the ancient sages. However, for Zhu Xi, it is analogous to a recipe, with distinct steps that must be performed in order. For Wang, the Great Learning is analogous to a description of a painting, in which shading, coloring, composition, perspective and other factors are aspects of a unified effect.

5. Metaphysics

Wang was not primarily interested in theoretical issues. However, some of his comments suggest a subtle metaphysical view that supports his conception of ethics. This metaphysics is phrased in terms of the Pattern/qi framework (see Section 2, above), and also makes use of the Substance/Function distinction. Substance (), literally body, is an entity in itself, while Function is its characteristic or appropriate activity or manifestation: a lamp is Substance, its light is function; an eye is Substance, seeing is its Function; water is Substance, waves are its Function. The Substance/Function distinction goes back to the Daoists of the Han dynasty (202 BCE–220 CE) and became central among Chinese Buddhists before being picked up by Neo–Confucians. Part of the attraction of this vocabulary is that it gives philosophers drawn to a sort of monism the ability to distinguish between two aspects of what they regard as ultimately a unity.

Wang argues that the human mind is identical with the Pattern of the universe, and as such it forms “one body” (yì tǐ, one Substance) with “Heaven, Earth, and the myriad creatures” of the world. The difference between the virtuous and the vicious is that the former recognize that their minds form one body with everything else, while the latter, “because of the space between their own physical form and those of others, regard themselves as separate” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 241). As evidence for the claim that the minds of all humans form one body with the rest of the universe, Wang appeals to a thought experiment first formulated by Mencius: “when they see a child [about to] fall into a well, [humans] cannot avoid having a mind of alarm and compassion for the child” (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 241–242; Mengzi 2A6). Wang then anticipates a series of objections, and offers further thought experiments to motivate the conclusion that only some underlying metaphysical identity between humans and other things can account for the broad range of our reactions to them:

Someone might object that this response is because the child belongs to the same species. But when they hear the anguished cries or see the frightened appearance of birds or beasts, they cannot avoid a sense of being unable to bear it. … Someone might object that this response is because birds and beasts are sentient creatures. But when they see grass or trees uprooted and torn apart, they cannot avoid feeling a sense of sympathy and distress. … Someone might object that this response is because grass and trees have life and vitality. But when they see tiles and stones broken and destroyed, they cannot avoid feeling a sense of concern and regret. … This shows that the benevolence that forms one body [with Heaven, Earth, and the myriad creatures] is something that even the minds of petty people possess. (Tiwald and Van Norden 2014, 242)

Wang’s first three thought experiments seem fairly compelling at first glance. Almost all humans would, at least as a first instinct, have “alarm and compassion” if suddenly confronted with the sight of a child about to fall into a well. In addition, humans often do show pity for the suffering of non–human animals. Finally, the fact that humans maintain public parks and personal gardens shows some kind of concern for plants.

It is not a decisive objection to Wang’s view that humans often fail to manifest benevolence to other humans, non–human animals, or plants. Wang is arguing that all humans manifest these responses sometimes (and that this is best explained by his favored metaphysics). Like all Neo–Confucians, Wang readily acknowledges that selfish desires frequently block the manifestation of our shared nature. However, there are three lines of objection to Wang’s view that are harder to dismiss. (1) There is considerable empirical evidence that some humans never manifest any compassion for the suffering of others. In the technical literature of psychology, these people are a subset of those identified as having “Antisocial Personality Disorder” as defined in DSM–V.[10] (2) Wang asserts that when humans “see tiles and stones broken and destroyed, they cannot avoid feeling a sense of concern and regret.” This claim is important for Wang’s argument, because he takes this reaction to be evidence for the conclusion that our minds are ultimately “one Substance” with everything in the universe, not merely with members of our species, or other sentient creatures, or other living things. We can perhaps motivate Wang’s intuition by considering how we might react if we saw that someone had spray painted graffiti on Half Dome in Yosemite National Park. The defacement of this scenic beauty would probably provoke sadness in those of us with an eye for natural beauty. However, it is certainly not obvious that everyone manifests even sporadic concern for “tiles and stones,” which is what he needs for his conclusion. (3) Even if we grant Wang his intuitions, it is not clear that the particular metaphysics he appeals to is the best explanation of those intuitions. As Darwin himself suggested, our compassion for other humans can be explained in evolutionary terms. In addition, the “biophilia hypothesis” (Wilson [1984]) provides an evolutionary explanation for the human fondness for other animals and plants. There is not an obvious evolutionary explanation for why humans seem engaged by non–living natural beauty, like mountain peaks, but as we have seen it seems questionable how common this trait is.

6. Influence

Wang is regarded, along with Lu Xiangshan, as one of the founders of the Lu–Wang School of Neo–Confucianism, or the School of Mind. This is one of the two major wings of Neo–Confucianism, along with the Cheng–Zhu School (named after Cheng Yi and Zhu Xi), or School of Pattern. He has frequently been an inspiration for critics of the orthodox Cheng–Zhu School, not just in China but also in Japan. In Japan, his philosophy is referred to as Ōyōmeigaku, and its major adherents included Nakae Tōju (1608–1648) and Kumazawa Banzan (1619–1691). Wang’s thought was also an inspiration for some of the leaders of the Meiji Restoration (1868), which began Japan’s rapid modernization.[11]

In China, Confucianism underwent a significant shift during the Qing dynasty (1644–1911) with the development of the Evidential Research movement. Evidential Research emphasized carefully documented and tightly argued work on concrete issues of philology, history, and even mathematics and civil engineering. Such scholars generally looked with disdain on “the Song–Ming Confucians” (including both Zhu Xi and Wang Yangming), whom they accused of producing “empty words” that could not be substantiated.[12] One of the few Evidential Research scholars with a serious interest in ethics was Dai Zhen (1724–1777). However, he too was critical of both the Cheng–Zhu and the Lu–Wang schools. The three major prongs of Dai’s critique of Neo–Confucians like Wang were that they (1) encouraged people to treat their subjective opinions as the deliverances of some infallible moral sense, (2) projected Buddhist–inspired concepts back onto the ancient Confucian classics, and (3) ignored the ethical value of ordinary physical desires.

One of the major trends in contemporary Chinese philosophy is “New Confucianism.” New Confucianism is a movement to adapt Confucianism to modern thought, showing how it is consistent with democracy and modern science. New Confucianism is distinct from what we in the West call Neo–Confucianism, but it adopts many Neo–Confucian concepts, in particular the view that humans share a trans–personal nature which is constituted by the universal Pattern. Many New Confucians agree with Mou Zongsan (1909–1995) that Wang had a deeper and more orthodox understanding of Confucianism than did Zhu Xi.[13]

Wang’s philosophy is of considerable intrinsic interest, because of the ingenuity of his arguments, the systematicity of his views, and the precision of his textual exegesis. Beyond that, Wang’s work has the potential to inform contemporary ethics. Although his particular metaphysics may not be appealing, many of his ideas can be naturalized. It may be hard to believe that everything is unified by a shared, underlying Pattern, but it does seem plausible that we are deeply dependent upon one another and upon our natural environment for our survival and our identities. I am a husband, a father, a teacher, and a researcher, but only because I have a wife, children, students, and colleagues. In some sense, we do form “one body” with others, and Wang provides provocative ideas about how we should respond to this insight. In addition, Wang’s fundamental criticism of Zhu Xi’s approach, that it produces pedants who only study and talk about ethics, rather than people who strive to actually be ethical, has considerable contemporary relevance, particularly given the empirical evidence that our current practices of ethical education have little positive effect on ethical behavior (Schwitzgebel and Rust 2014; and cf. Schwitzgebel 2013 (Other Internet Resources)).


Works by and about Wang Yangming

  • Angle, Stephen C. and Justin Tiwald, 2017, Neo-Confucianism: A Philosophical Introduction, Polity Press.
  • Chan, Wing–tsit, 1962, “How Buddhistic Is Wang Yang–ming?” Philosophy East and West, 12: 203–16.
  • Chan, Wing–tsit (trans.), 1963, Instructions for Practical Living and Other Neo–Confucian Writings by Wang Yang–ming, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Chang Yü–ch’üan, 1939, “Wang Shou–jen as a Statesman,” Chinese Social and Political Science Review, 23:1 (April–June): 473–517.
  • Chang, Carsun, 1955, “Wang Yang–ming’s Philosophy,” Philosophy East and West, 5: 3–18.
  • Ching, Julia (trans.), 1973, The Philosophical Letters of Wang Yang–ming, Columbia, SC: University of South Carolina Press.
  • Ching, Julia, 1976, To Acquire Wisdom: The Way of Wang Yang–ming, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Henke, Frederick Goodrich (trans.), 1964, The Philosophy of Wang Yang–ming, reprint, New York: Paragon Books.
  • Iki, Hiroyuki, 1961–62, “Wang Yang–ming’s Doctrine of Innate Knowledge,” Philosophy East and West, 11: 27–44.
  • Israel, George L., 2014, Doing Good and Ridding Evil in Ming China: The Political Career of Wang Yangming, Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J., 2002, Ethics in the Confucian Tradition: The Thought of Mengzi and Wang Yangming, rev. 2nd edition, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. (trans.), 2009, Readings from the Lu–Wang School of Neo–Confucianism, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Li Shenglong, 2004, Chuanxilu xinyi, Taibei: Sanmin Shuju.
  • Nivison, David S., 1967, “The Problem of ‘Knowledge’ and ‘Action’ in Chinese Thought since Wang Yang–ming,” in Arthur F. Wright, ed., Studies in Chinese Thought, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, pp. 112–45.
  • –––, 1996a, “The Philosophy of Wang Yangming,” in The Ways of Confucianism, Chicago: Open Court Press, pp. 217–231
  • –––, 1996b, “The Philosophy of Zhang Xuecheng,” in The Ways of Confucianism, Chicago: Open Court Press, pp. 249–60.
  • Sarkissian, Hagop, 2018, “Neo-Confucianism, Experimental Philosophy and the Trouble with Intuitive Methods,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 26(5): 812–828.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi, 2011, “Wang Yang-ming on Self-Cultivation in the Daxue,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 38 (Supplement): 96–113.
  • Stanchina, Gabriella, 2015, “Zhi 知 as Unceasing Dynamism and Practical Effort: The Common Root of Knowledge and Action in Wang Yangming and Peter Sloterdijk,” 学问:思勉青年学术期刊 1: 280–307.
  • T’ang Chun-i, 1988, “The Development of the Concept of Moral Mind from Wang Yang-ming to Wang Chi,” in idem, Essays on Chinese Philosophy and Culture, Taipei, Taiwan: Student Book Company, pp. 180–205.
  • Tiwald, Justin and Bryan W. Van Norden (eds.), 2014, Readings in Later Chinese Philosophy: Han to the Twentieth Century, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Tu, Wei–ming, 1976, Neo–Confucian Thought in Action: Wang Yang–ming’s Youth (1472–1509), Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Wang Yangming, 1572, Wang Wencheng Gong Quanshu, Xie Tingjie, ed., in the Sibu congkan.

Other Works Cited

  • American Psychiatric Association, 2013, Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders, 5th ed., Arlington, VA: American Psychiatric Publishing.
  • de Bary, William Theodore et al. (eds.), 2005, Sources of Japanese Tradition, vol. 2, 1600–2000, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Elman, Benjamin, 2001, From Philosophy to Philology: Intellectual and Social Aspects of Change in Late Imperial China, Los Angeles: UCLA Asian Pacific Monograph Series.
  • Fallon, James, 2013, The Psychopath Inside, New York: Current Publishing.
  • Gardner, Daniel K. (trans.), 1990, Chu Hsi: Learning to Be a Sage: Selections from the Conversations of Master Chu, Arranged Topically, Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • Kim, Yung Sik, 2000, The Natural Philosophy of Chu Hsi (1130–1200), Philadelphia: American Philosophical Society.
  • Makeham, John (ed.), 2003, New Confucianism: A Critical Examination, New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Schwitzgebel, Eric and Joshua Rust, 2014, “The Self-Reported Moral Behavior of Ethics Professors,” Philosophical Psychology 27: 293–327.
  • Shun, Kwong-loi, 2010, “Zhu Xi on the ‘Internal’ and the ‘External,’ ” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 37 (4): 639–54.
  • Slingerland, Edward (trans.), 2003, Confucius: Analects: With Selections from Traditional Commentaries, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W., 2004, “What Is Living and What Is Dead in the Confucianism of Zhu Xi?” in Robing R. Wang, ed., Chinese Philosophy in an Age of Globalization, Albany: State University of New York Press, pp. 99–120.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W. (trans.), 2008, Mengzi: With Selections from Traditional Commentaries, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Van Norden, Bryan W., 2013, “ ‘Few Are Able to Appreciate the Flavors’: Translating the Daxue and Zhongyong,” Journal of Chinese Studies, 56 (January): 295–314.
  • Wilson, Edward O., 1984, Biophilia, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Other Internet Resources

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