Notes to Action

1. O'Shaughnessy 1973, p. 67. In O'Shaughnessy 1980, the author significantly modifies his position on this and related matters. This latter work constitutes the best, most extended investigation of fundamental metaphysical questions about action. Cleveland 1997 provides an instructive critical discussion.

2. The phrase originates with Anscombe 1963, but it has been picked up by various authors, not always with clear agreement about its use. For a causalist interpretation, treating the content of intentions as self-referential, see, for example, Searle 1983.

3. It is more usual in the literature to evaluate, following a suggestion of Davidson's, the purported equivalence of ‘The agent intentionally G'd’ and ‘The agent G'd for some reason.’ Whatever differences there might be between this proposal and the one in the text do not affect the present discussion.

4. Davidson gives the most explicit endorsement of (7**), or some minor variant thereof, on p. 221 of his “Reply to Vermazen” in Vermazen and Hintikka 1985.

5. In his paper, “Mental Events” [1980, essay 11], his denial that there are reason to action laws framed in the psychological vocabulary of ordinary discourse takes on special emphasis, and it plays a key role in an original argument he constructs for the token/token identity of mental and physical states.

Copyright © 2012 by
George Wilson
Samuel Shpall

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