al-Farabi

First published Fri Jul 15, 2016; substantive revision Fri Jul 24, 2020

We know little that is really reliable about al-Fârâbî’s life. Abû Nasr al-Fârâbî was probably born in 870 CE (AH 257) in a place called Farab or Farayb. In his youth he moved to Iraq and Baghdad. In 943 CE (AH 331) he went to Syria and Damascus. He may have gone to Egypt but died in Damascus in December 950 CE or January 951 CE (AH 339). Scholars have disputed his ethnic origin. Some claimed he was Turkish but more recent research points to him being a Persian (Rudolph 2017: 536–45).

Al-Fârâbî had two main interests:

  1. Philosophy and logic in particular. Such interest explains why he is known as “the second master” (the first one, of course, being Aristotle) and
  2. Music. His huge Kitâb al-musiqâ al-kabîr or Great Book of Music is the most important medieval musical treatise in Islamic lands and also includes sophisticated philosophical sections.

Beginning in the 1980s, much has happened in Farabian scholarship. New and better editions of his works as well as new and better translations have led to deeper studies of his thought and to some interesting and lively controversies. More current bibliographies allow for more detailed research. We still lack critical editions, full English translations—and even, at times, translation in any language of several texts—as well as a solid introduction to al-Fârâbî’s philosophy. More research is also needed to better understand the relation between his philosophical and musical interests.

One can find the most recent and detailed listings of al-Fârâbî’s works and their translations in Ulrich Rudolph, “Abû Nasr al-Fârâbî” (2017: 526–594), and Philippe Vallat (2004: 379–87). Also, Jon McGinnis & David. C. Reisman translated a series of Farabian texts in their Classical Arabic Philosophy: An Anthology of Sources (2007: 54–120).

1. Enumeration of the Sciences

In what follows we will underline important scholarly developments of the last thirty years and add useful complements to these listings. In order to highlight these scholarly developments we will follow the traditional order of the Aristotelian sciences that al-Fârâbî himself offers in his Enumeration of the sciences, ‘Ihsâ’ al-‘ulûm, one of his most famous texts, as its Medieval Latin versions had much influence in the West. There is no full English translation of this text, but Amor Cherni (2015) published an edition with French translation and commentaries. Recently, a new critical edition with German translation of one of the two Medieval Latin versions have come out: Über die Wissenschaften (de scientiis) Dominicus Gundissalinus’ version (2006). Alain Galonnier published a critical edition, French translation and study of the other Medieval latin version: Le De scientiis Alfarabii de Gerard de Cremone (2016). Following this traditional theoretical order makes much sense since we know very little about the chronological order of al-Fârâbî’s works, even if there is some indication that The Opinions of the People of the Virtuous City, also known as The Perfect State, and The Political Regime, also known as The Principles of the Beings, may be among his latest works. The paucity of serious information about the chronological order of al-Fârâbî’s works makes it difficult to determine whether some inconsistencies and tensions between different works result from an evolution in his thought, as Damien Janos claims (2019, pp. 166–70), or hint at a distinction between exoteric and esoteric treatises or simply arise from limitations inherent to human nature that affect even the greatest philosophers. As al-Fârâbî understood philosophy as all-encompassing and attempted to present coherent views, some works straddle several philosophical disciplines and so we will indicate when such is the case. Al-Fârâbî’s knowledge of Aristotle’s works is extensive, and even includes some of his zoological treatises.

2. Language

In the Enumeration of the Sciences al-Fârâbî first focuses on language, grammar, metrics, etc. His Kitâb al-Hurûf (Book of Letters) or Particles, gives us much information on his views on language. Muhsin Mahdi, who published the first edition of this text in 1969a based on a single manuscript, later on found two other manuscripts but could not complete a new edition. Making use of the new material already gathered by Mahdi, Charles Butterworth has prepared a second edition with facing full English translation to be published by Cornell University Press. Muhammad Ali Khalidi gave a partial English translation covering the middle section (2005). Thérèse-Anne Druart (2010) began studying al-Fârâbî’s innovative views of language. In Freiburg-im-Brisgau Nadja Germann (2015-16) and her team have been working on language and logic in classical Arabic and are more and more impressed by the sophistication of al-Fârâbî’s positions. As for al-Fârâbî, music is at the service of speech, the last section of the Great Book of Music explains how technically to fit music to speech, i.e., poetry, in order to enhance the meaning of a text. Azza Abd al-Hamid Madian’s 1992 Ph. D. dissertation for Cornell University, Language-music relationships in al-Fârâbî’s “Grand Book of Music”, includes an English translation of this section.

3. Logic

Next to the study of language, al-Fârâbî considers logic. For a long time the possibility of a serious study of al-Fârâbî’s logic remained somewhat elusive. Editions and translations of his logical works, except for his [‘Long’] Commentary on Aristotle’s De Interpretatione (Zimmerman 1981), were scattered in various journals and collective works often difficult to access. Many of these texts were more critically edited and gathered in al-mantiq ‘inda al-Fârâbî, ed. by Rafîq al-‘Ajam and Majid Fakhry in 4 vol. (1985–87). In 1987–89 Muhammad Taqî Dânishpazuh published in Qumm a more complete collection of logical texts, including a newly discovered part of a long commentary on the Prior Analytics. Soon afterwards, two books on Farabian logic followed: Shukri B. Abed, Aristotelian Logic and the Arabic Language in Alfârâbî (1991) and Joep Lameer, Al-Fârâbî & Aristotelian Syllogistics: Greek Theory & Islamic Practice (1994). In 2006 Mauro Zonta published fragments of a long commentary on the Categories in Hebrew, Arabic, and English translation. John Watt (2008) assessed the influence of the Syriac organon on al-Fârâbî and Kamran Karimullah (2014) dedicated a lengthy article to al-Fârâbî’s views on conditionals. Translations now are coming out: Alfarabi’s Book of Dialectic (Kitab al-Jadal) (David M. Di Pasquale, 2019), and Al-Farabi, Syllogism (Wilfird Hodges & Saloua Chatti, forthcoming), as well as further studies of al-Farabi’s logic by Saloua Chatti (2019) and papers by Terrence J. Kleven (2013) and Riccardo Strobino (2019).

Some issues dealt with in logic are also relevant to ethics and metaphysics. Al-Farabi sees logic as the path to happiness (Germann, 2015). He also discusses the issue of future contingents. If the truth value of statements on future contingents is immediately determined, i.e., before the event happens, then everything is predetermined and freewill is an illusion. Aristotle treats of this issue in On Interpretation, 9. Al-Fârâbî discusses more complex aspects of this issue as he adds a consideration of God’s foreknowledge and defends human freewill against some theologians (see Peter Adamson (2006), “The Arabic Sea Battle: al-Fârâbî on the Problem of future Contingents”).

As Deborah L. Black (1990) showed, following the Alexandrian tradition, philosophers in Islamic lands consider Rhetoric and Poetics as integral to logic proper and so parts of Aristotle’s Organon. Lahcen E. Ezzaher (2008: 347–91) translated the short commentary on the Rhetoric. Frédérique Woerther (2018) & Maroun Aouad are preparing a new edition of some of al-Fârâbî’s texts on rhetoric. Stéphane Diebler in Philosopher à Bagdad au Xe siècle (2007) [in fact a very useful collection of translations of short Farabian works] gave a French translation of the three very brief treatises al-Fârâbî dedicated to Poetics. Geert Jan van Gelder & Marlé Hammond (2008: 15–23) translated one of these treatises, The Book of Poetics, into English, as well as a brief relevant passage in the first part of The Great Book of Music. Terrence J. Kleven (2019) studies The Canons of Poetry. Scholars interested in political philosophy have highlighted the distinctions al-Fârâbî makes between (1) demonstrative discourse, reflecting Aristotle’s positions in the Posterior Analytics (in Arabic this text is known as The Book of Demonstration), and which alone is philosophical stricto sensu, (2) dialectical discourse, typical of the “mutakallimûn” or theologians and linked to Aristotle’s Topics, and (3) rhetorical and poetical discourse, used in the Qur’ân or Jewish and Christian Scriptures in order to address ordinary people.

Great respect for Aristotle’s theory of demonstration led al-Fârâbî to attempt to fit any theoretical discipline in its framework, though some of them, such as music, do not exclusively rest on necessary and universal primary principles, as they also include principles derived from empirical observations (Miriam Galston, 2019). As music is dear to al-Fârâbî, it is in the first part of his Great Book on Music that we find the most extensive consideration of primary empirical principles and their derivation from careful examination of practice, i.e., in this case of musical performances.

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4. Mathematics and Music

After logic comes mathematics. For al-Fârâbî mathematical sciences include arithmetic, geometry, optics, astronomy, music, the science of weights and mechanics. Only recently has more attention be paid to this aspect of Farabian thought. Gad Freudenthal (1988) focused on al-Fârâbî’s views on geometry. Except for pointing to al-Fârâbî’s rejection, in contradistinction to al-Kindî, of the validity of what we now call astrology, scholars had neglected his views on astronomy and cosmology. Damien Janos’s Method, Structure, and Development in al-Fârâbî’s Cosmology (2012) has filled this gap. His book throws new light on various aspects of al-Fârâbî’s astronomy, cosmology, and philosophy of nature. It also highlights the link between cosmology and metaphysics. Johannes Thomann (2010–11) pointed to a newly discovered commentary on the Almagest attributed to al-Fârâbî (Ms. Tehran Maglis 6531).

In the Enumeration al-Fârâbî follows the traditional classification of music under mathematics. In The Great Book of Music he certainly indicates that music derives some of its principles from mathematics but he also insists, as we said above, on the importance of performance for determining its empirical principles. On some points the ear, rather than theoretical reflections, is the ultimate judge, even if at times the ear contradicts some mathematical principle. For instance, he is well aware that a semitone is not exactly the half of a tone. Of The Great book of Music there exists only one full translation, that of Rodolphe d’Erlanger into French (originally published in 1930–35 before the Arabic text was edited; reprint 2001). Only partial English translations exist. I referred to two of them: one in the section on language and one in the logic section under poetics. George Dimitri Sawa (2009) translated the two chapters on rhythm. Alison Laywine (McGill University), both a philosopher with excellent knowledge of Greek musical theories and a ‘Oud player, is preparing a full English translation of this complex and lengthy text. Yet, The Great Book is not the only text al-Fârâbî dedicated to music. After having written it, dissatisfied with his explanation of rhythms, he subsequently wrote two shorter texts on rhythms (English translation of both by Sawa 2009). Apparently al-Fârâbî invented a system of notation for rhythms. In his Philosophies of Music in Medieval Islam Fadlou Shehadi (1995) dedicates his third chapter to al-Fârâbî. Thérèse-Anne Druart (2020) shows how al-Farabi links music to language, logic and even politics.

5. Physics

After mathematics comes physics. We have only a few Farabian texts dealing with physics taken in the broadest sense and covering the whole of natural philosophy. Paul Lettinck addresses some of al-Fârâbî’s views on physics in his Aristotle’s Physics and its Reception in the Arabic World (1994) and Janos (2012) also does so. Marwan Rashed (2008) attempted a reconstruction of a lost treatise on changing beings.

Al-Fârâbî wrote a little treatise rejecting the existence of the vacuum by means of an experiment. Necati Lugal & Aydin Sayili (1951) published the Arabic with an English translation.

The substantive Refutation of Galen’s Critique of Aristotle’s Views on Human Organs merits serious studies. ‘Abdurrahman Badawi edited it in his Traités philosophiques (1983: 38–107). It shows al-Fârâbî’s interest in Aristotle’s zoological works and develops interesting parallels between the hierarchical structure of the organs of the human body, that of cosmology, that of emanation, and that of the ideal state. Badr El-Fakkak (2017) explains these parallels and Jawdath Jadour (2018) studies the structure of this text, which remains untranslated, and presents a new edition of al-Farabi’s Epistle on medicine.

Physics includes Aristotle’s On the soul and scholars have paid much attention to al-Fârâbî’s little treatise On intellect (ed. by M. Bouyges, 1983). A full English translation of this important treatise, of which there exist two Medieval Latin versions, was finally given by McGinnis & Reisman in their Classical Arabic Philosophy (2007: 68–78). Philippe Vallat published an extensive study of al-Farabi’s views on the intellect (2019a). The issue of the soul and the intellect is linked to logic, ethics, cosmology, and metaphysics. It also gives rise to a debate. Earlier scholars considered that for al-Fârâbî universals are acquired by emanation from the Agent Intellect, which for him is the tenth and last Intelligence, even if in many passages the second master uses the language of abstraction. Recently, Richard Taylor (2006 & 2010) argued that, on the contrary, there is genuine abstraction in al-Fârâbî, even if in some ways it involves the emanative power of the Agent Intellect.

6. Metaphysics

Metaphysics follows physics. It is not easy to assess al-Fârâbî’s understanding of metaphysics. The very brief treatise, The Aims of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, insists that, contrary to what most people assume, metaphysics is not a theological science but rather investigates whatever is common to all existing beings, such as being and unity. McGinnis and Reisman provide a full English translation in their Classical Arabic Philosophy (2007: 78–81). In 1989 Muhsin Mahdi published the Arabic text of a short treatise On One and Unity. It is still untranslated but Damien Janos (2017) explained its structure and contents and Philippe Vallat (2019b) studied it. Many passages of The Book of Letters are of great metaphysical import as Stephen Menn (2008) showed. These texts raise the question of the exact relation between logic and metaphysics, as, for instance, both disciplines treat of the categories (see Thérèse-Anne Druart (2007) & Kristell Trego (2018)). Such texts present an Aristotelian outlook focusing on ontology that sharply distinguishes metaphysics from Kalâm and seem to leave limited space for philosophical theology and Neo-Platonic descent in particular.

On the other hand, both The Opinions of the People of the Perfect City and The Political Regime or The Principles of Beings begin with a metaphysical part presented as a Neo-Platonic descent followed by a second part dealing with the organization of the city or state and do not treat of being and unity as the most universal notions. The hierarchical structure of the ideal state mirrors the hierarchical emanationist structure presented in the first part. Walzer edited the former with an English translation under the title The Perfect State (1985) and Fauzi M. Najjar edited the latter (1964). Charles Butterworth (2015) provided the first full English translation of The Political Regime in The Political Writings, vol. II, pp. 27–94. The question of how exactly the ontology relates to the Neo-Platonic descent or emanation has not yet been fully clarified, though The Enumeration of the Sciences addresses both aspects. Furthermore, whether the Neo-Platonic descent grounds the political philosophy or metaphysics is simply a rhetorical appeal to make al-Fârâbî’s controversial political and philosophical views palatable to religious authorities and ordinary people is a hotly debated issue. Disciples of Leo Strauss and of Muhsin Mahdi divide al-Fârâbî’s views into exoteric ones for a broad audience and esoteric ones written for an intellectual elite. The exoteric are more compatible with the religious views and speak, for instance, of an immortality of the human soul, whereas such views are deliberately muted in esoteric writings (below we will see that a lost treatise of al-Fârâbî may have denied the immortality of the soul). Among the most recent “Straussian” positions on this debate one can find two papers by Charles E. Butterworth: (1) “How to Read Alafarabi” (2013), and (2) “Alfarabi’s Goal: Political Philosophy, Not Political Theology” (2011). Recently, Philippe Vallat (2019c) attempted to clarify what al-Farabi means by “esoterism,” Some other scholars such as Dimitri Gutas, S. Menn and Th.-A. Druart take Farabian metaphysics, including the Neo-Platonic descent as at the core of al-Fârâbî’s works, even if in his Philosophy of Aristotle, al-Fârâbî treats little of metaphysics. We will say more on this controversy in presenting ethics and politics, which in the Farabian classification of sciences, follow metaphysics.

7. Ethics and Politics

Al-Fârâbî dealt little with ethics, but part of the controversy stems from what we may know of his lost Commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics, his main foray in Ethics. Despite the existence of an Arabic translation of Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (ed. by A. A. Akasoy & A. Fidora with an English translation by D.M. Dunlop, 2005), we see few signs of its influence in al-Fârâbî’s extant writings. Yet, al-Fârâbî wrote on it a lost commentary, to which three Andalusian philosophers, Ibn Bâjja, Ibn Tufayl and Averroes, refer. According to them, therein al-Fârâbî denied the immortality of the human soul as well as the possibility of any conjunction with the active or Agent Intellect, considering them tall tales. Yet, in many other works, such as the Treatise on the Intellect, the Opinions, and the Political Regime, he claims that this conjunction is possible and constitutes ultimate happiness. If what the Andalusian philosophers report, presents an accurate reading of this lost text, then the disciples of Leo Strauss may have some justification in reading al-Fârâbî’s works as divided between exoteric and esoteric ones since the content of this work would contradict views in more popular texts, such as the Opinions in which the Neo-Platonic influence is the strongest. Neo-Platonic metaphysics, construed mainly as the descent and emanation, would provide an exoteric view good for a more general public, but denied in the esoteric works reserved for an intellectual elite. Chaim Meir Neria (2013) published two quotations from this commentary (in Hebrew translation and with English translation) that have been newly discovered and gave a summary of the issue.

Though we do not have any ethical text from al-Fârâbî relying mainly on the Nicomachean Ethics, Marwan Rashed (2019) discussed his ethical outlook in relying on the Attainment of Happiness. We do have a brief ethical treatise in the tradition of Hellenistic ethics, Directing Attention to the Way of Happiness or Tanbîh (not to be confused with the Attainment of Happiness or Tahsîl), which is propaedeutic to the study of philosophy proper and of logic in particular (English translation in McGinnis & Reisman’s Classical Arabic Philosophy (2007: 104–20)). This treatise (1) incites the student to curb his passions in order to be able to focus on his studies and (2) encourages him to begin the study of philosophy and of logic in particular. It is obviously pre-philosophical and serves as introduction to a Farabian elementary introduction to logic The Utterances Employed in Logic (Mahdi’s edition, 1968; no English translation). Al-Fârâbî’s conception of truly philosophical ethics remains unclear as we have so little extended textual basis to establish it. Janne Mattila (2017) compared the philosopher’s ethical progression in al-Farabi and in al-Razi. Ethics, when treating of our relations with other people, implies intersubjectivity, but al-Farabi, though not treating it much in what concerns this life, offers an interesting picture of it in the afterlife (Druart, 2017).

Al-Fârâbi’s political philosophy fared much better and has attracted much attention from many scholars. According to The Enumeration, it also includes kalâm, i.e., non-philosophical theology, and fiqh or Islamic law. Many Farabian political works have been translated into English. Muhsin Mahdi translated three of them in Philosophy of Plato and Aristotle (1969b; reprint 2001), which contains The Attainment of Happiness, The Philosophy of Plato, and The Philosophy of Aristotle. These three texts form a trilogy. Charles E. Butterworth in, The Political Writings, vol. I (2001), translated Selected Aphorisms, part V of The Enumeration of the Sciences, Book of Religion, and The Harmonization of the Two Opinions of the Two Sages: Plato the Divine and Aristotle and in vol. II (2015), Political Regime and Summary of Plato’s Laws.

Al-Fârâbî does not take inspiration from Aristotle’s Politics (a text which does not seem to have been translated or summarized into Arabic) but rather takes some inspiration from Plato’s Republic and Laws, even if his access to these two texts may have been rather limited, as there is some doubt that a full Arabic translation of them ever existed. Though Averroes wrote a commentary of sort on the Republic, its brevity and content do not testify to an in-depth knowledge of the whole text. Yet, David C. Reisman (2004) discovered an Arabic translation of a single passage from the Republic (VI, 506d3–509b10). As for the Laws, we certainly have al-Fârâbî’s Summary of Plato’s Laws, but this text (Arabic ed. by Th.-A. Druart (1998) and English translation by Butterworth, in The Political Writings, II, (2015: 129–73)) is very brief and covers only the first eight books. Whether this summary relies on a full or partial Arabic translation of the Laws or on a translation of a Greek summary, possibly that of Galen (lost in Greek), at this stage cannot be determined. For the latest status quaestionis about Arabic translations of Plato’s works and their paucity, see Dimitri Gutas (2012). Al-Fârâbî’s own brief Philosophy of Plato does not exhibit detailed knowledge of Plato’s works.

Though al-Fârâbî’s political philosophy takes some inspiration from Plato, it much transforms it in important and interesting ways to reflect a very different world and adapt it to it. Instead of a monolingual and monoethnic city state, al-Fârâbî envisions a vast multicultural, multilingual, and multireligious empire (Alexander Orwin, 2017). He also sees the necessity to make of the philosopher king a philosopher prophet ruler.

Al-Fârâbî’s Summary of Plato’s Laws caused much controversy, which Butterworth narrates in the introduction to his translation (2015: 97–127). In 1995 Joshua Parens, making use of a draft of Druart’s edition, published Metaphysics as Rhetoric: Alfarabi’s Summary of Plato’s “Laws”. He argued that al-Fârâbî takes metaphysics, or maybe more exactly special metaphysics or the Neo-Platonic descent, i.e., what treats of immaterial beings rather than ontology, as a form of rhetoric, and that such was already the case for Plato. Whether or not we should read Plato as Parens and other Straussians claim al-Fârâbî understood him is a hotly debated question.

Marwan Rashed (2009) introduced a new element in the controversy by putting into serious doubt the authenticity of al-Fârâbî’s Harmonization of the Opinions of the Two Sages. Following an Alexandrian tradition, this treatise (for Butterworth’s 2001 English translation, see above) argues that, despite a series of issues on which Aristotle and Plato seem to contradict each other, there is remarkable harmony between these two sages, as one can easily resolve such contradictions. This text also refers 1. to the so-called Aristotle’s Theology, which in fact Aristotle never wrote, as it derives from Plotinus, and 2. to Proclus Arabus, as Peter Adamson (forthcoming) shows. On the other hand, Cecilia Martini Bonadeo, in her 2008 critical edition and Italian translation of this text (al-Fârâbî, L’armonia delle opinioni dei due sapienti, il divino Platone e Aristotele), argued for the Farabian authenticity of this text. Whether one accepts the Farabian authorship of this text affects one’s understanding of the whole controversy of how to read al-Fârâbî, as well as one’s understanding of the relationship between his Aristotelianism and his Neo-Platonism. It also makes the whole issue of the relationship between his metaphysics and his political philosophy still more complex and convoluted.

Among the most recent developments, expressed in various articles, on the Straussian side, let us point to Butterworth’s “How to Read Alfarabi” (2013) and “Alfarabi’s Goal: Political Philosophy, Not Political Theology” (2011) to which I referred earlier. On the other side, we can point to Charles Genequand’s “Théologie et philosophie. La providence chez al-Fârâbî et l’authenticité de l’Harmonie des opinions des deux sages” (2012), which objects to M. Rashed’s declaring the Harmonization inauthentic, and his (2013) “Le Platon d’al-Fârâbî”. Amor Cherni (2015), on the other hand, published a book on the relation between politics and metaphysics in al-Fârâbî (La cité et ses opinions: Politique et métaphysique ches Abû Nasr al-Fârâbî), which includes an appendix rejecting the authenticity of The Harmonization.

8. Conclusion

Though we now have more decent editions of al-Fârâbî’s texts and more complete translations, in English and in French in particular, many such editions and translations are scattered in various books and journals. Gathering all of al-Fârâbî’s available texts is no mean accomplishment. If Oxford University Press would publish The Philosophical Works of al-Fârâbî, as it did for al-Kindî in 2012 (one volume, ed. by P. Adamson & P.E. Pormann), beginning with those still untranslated or not fully translated into English, as well as those whose English translation is hidden in rare books or unusual journals, we would be eternally grateful, but we are well aware that it would require several volumes and much time.

Some texts still need to be better edited. Some texts are not translated at all into any European language or not yet into English. Scholars do not always seem fully aware of what is available and what other scholars have said. Much more work still needs to be done, but a clearer and more complex picture of al-Fârâbî’s works is emerging. It highlights their breadth and sophistication, even if we still have trouble piecing together all the parts.

Bibliography

Research Tools

Bibliographies

  • Al-Mawrid (Special Issue on Al-Farabi), 4(3), 1975.
  • Chavooshi, Jafar Aghayani, Al-Fârâbî: An Annotated Bibliography, Tehran, 1976.
  • Cunbur, Müjgan, Ismet Ninark & Nejat Sefercioglu, Fârâbî Bibliyografyasi, Ankara: Bashakanhk Basimevi, 1973.
  • Daiber, Hans, Bibliography of Islamic Philosophy (from the 15th Century to 1999) 2 vol., Leiden: Brill, 1999 and its Supplement, Leiden: Brill, 2007, much complete and update these pioneers works.
  • Druart, Thérèse-Anne, Brief Bibliographical Guide in Medieval and Post-Classical Islamic Philosophy and Theology, available online in yearly installments and includes a section on al-Fârâbî.
  • Rescher, Nicholas, Al-Fârâbî: An Annotated Bibliography, Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1962.

Dictionary

  • Alon, Ilai and Shukri B. Abed, Al-Fârâbî’s Philosophical Lexicon, 2 volumes (volume I: Arabic Text; volume II: English translation). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002 (provides al-Fârâbî’s own definitions of technical philosophical terms).

Primary Literature

Works by al-Fârâbî

The following are listed by editors/translators:

  • al-‘Ajam, Rafîq & Majid Fakhry (eds.), 1985–87, al-Fârâbî, al-mantiq ‘inda al-Fârâbî, in 4 volumes, Beirut: Dar al-Mashriq.
  • Badawi, ‘Abdurrahman, 1983, Traites philosophiques par al-Kindi, al-Farabi, Ibn Bajjah & Ibn ‘Adyy, 3rd edition, Beirut: Dar Al-Andaloss.
  • Bonadeo, Cecilia Martini (ed.), 2008, al-Fârâbî, L’armonia delle opinioni dei due sapienti, il divino Platone e Aristotele, Pisa: Plus.
  • Bouyges, Maurice (trans. and ed.), 1983, Alfarabi, Risalat fi’l-‘Aql, 2nd edition, Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique.
  • Butterworth, Charles E. (ed. and trans.), 2001, Alfarabi, The Political Writings: “Selected Aphorisms” and Other Texts (Volume I), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • ––– (ed. and trans.), 2015, Alfarabi, The Political Writings: “Political Regime” and “Summary of Plato’s Laws” (Volume II), Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • ––– (ed. and trans.), forthcoming, Alfarabi, Book of Letters, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Chatti, Saloua & Hodges, Wilfrid (trans.), forthcoming, Al-Farabi, Syllogism: An Abdrigement of Aristotle’s Prior Analytics, London: Bloomsbury.
  • Cherni, Amor (trans. and ed.), 2015, al-Fârâbî, Le recensement des sciences, Paris: Al Bouraq.
  • Dânishpazuh, Muhammad Taqî (ed.), 1987–89, al-Fârâbî, al-mantiqiyyât lilfârâbî, 3 volumes, Qumm: Matba‘at Bahman.
  • Diebler, Stéphane (trans), 2007, al-Fârâbî, Philosopher à Bagdad au Xe siècle, introduction by Ali Benmakhlouf, glossary by Pauline Koetschet, Paris: Seuil.
  • DiPasquale, David M. (trans.), 2019, Alfarabi’s Book of Dialectic (Kitab al-Jadal): On the Starting Point of Islamic Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Druart, Thérèse-Anne (ed.), 1998, “Le Sommaire du livre des ‘Lois’ de Platon”, Bulletin d’Études Orientales, 50: 109–55;
  • d’Erlanger, Rodolphe (trans.), 1930–35, La musique arabe: Al-Fârâbî, Grand Traité de la Musique, vol. I–II, Paris: Geuthner, reprint (Paris: 2001).
  • Ezzaher, Lahcen E. (ed.), 2008, “Alfarabi’s Book of Rhetoric: An Arabic-English translation of Alfarabi’s Commentary on Aristotle’s Rhetoric”, Rhetorica, 26(4): 347–91.
  • ––– (transl.), 2015, Three Arabic Treatises on Aristotle’s “Rhetoric” (translation, introduction, & notes), Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press , pp. 12–49.
  • Galonnier, A. (ed. and trans.), 2016, Le ‘De scientiis Alfarabii’ de Gérarde de Crémone: Contributions aux problèmes de l’acculturation au XIIe siècle. Étude introductive et édition critique, traduite et annotée, Turnhout: Brepols.
  • van Gelder, Geert Jan & Marlé Hammond (trans. and eds), 2008, Takhyîl: The Imaginary in Classical Arabic Poetics, Exeter: Gibb Memorial Trust, pp. 15–23.
  • Gundissalinus, Dominicus [ca. 1150] (transl.), 2006, al-Fârâbî, Über die Wissenschaften (de scientiis), Jakob Hans Josef Schneider (ed.), Freiburg: Herder .
  • Khalidi, Muhammad Ali (ed. and trans.), 2005, al-Fârâbî, “The Book of Letters”, in his Medieval Islamic Philosophical Writings, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 1–26.
  • Lugal, Necati & Aydin Sayili, 1951, “Maqâla fî l-Khalâ”, Belleten (Türk Tarih Kurumu), 15: 1–16 & 21–36.
  • Mahdi, Muhsin (ed.), 1968, al-Fârâbi, Utterances Employed in Logic, introduction and notes, Beirut: Dar el-Mashreq.
  • ––– (ed.), 1969a, Alfarabi’s Book of Letters (Kitab al-Huruf), Arabic text, introduction and notes, Beirut: Dar el-Mashreq.
  • ––– (ed.), 1969b, Alfarabi’s Philosophy of Plato and Aristotle, translated with an introduction, 2nd edition, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press; reprinted 2002.
  • ––– (ed.), 1989, Alfarabi’s On One and Unity, Casablanca: Toubkal .
  • McGinnis, Jon & David C. Reisman (eds.), 2007, Classical Arabic Philosophy: An Anthology of Sources, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing, pp. 54–120.
  • Najjar, Fauzi M. (ed.), 1964, Al-Fârâbî’s The Political Regime, with introduction & notes, Beirut: Imprimerie Catholique .
  • Neria, Cahim Meir, 2013, “Al-Fârâbî’s Lost Commentary on the Ethics: New Textual Evidence”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 23(1): 69–99.
  • Rashed, Marwan, 2008, “Al-Fârâbî’s lost treatise On changing beings and the possibility of a demonstration of the eternity of the world”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 18(1): 19–58.
  • Sawa, George Dimitri, 2009, Rhythmic Theories and Practices in Arabic Writings to 339 AH/950 CE : Annotated translations and commentaries, Ottawa: The Institute of Mediaeval Music.
  • Sayili, Aydin, 1951, “Al-Farabi’s Article on Vacuum”, Belleten (Turk Tarih Kurumu), 15: 151–74.
  • Walzer, Richard (ed. and trans.), 1985, Al-Faradi on the Perfect State, with introduction and commentary, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Zimmerman, F.W., 1981, Al-Farabi’s Commentary and Short Treatise on Aristotle’s “De interpretatione” (translation, introduction & notes), London: British Academy.

Works by other authors

  • [Aristotle] Akasoy, A.A. & A. Fidora (eds.), 2005, The Arabic Version of the “Nicomachean Ethics”, with an English translation by D.M. Dunlop, Leiden: Brill.
  • [al-Kindî] Adamson, Peter and Peter E. Pormann (ed.), 2012, The Philosophical Works of al-Kindi (Studies in Islamic Philosophy), Karachi: Oxford University Press.

Secondary Literature

  • Abed, Shukri B., 1991, Aristotelian Logic and the Arabic Language in Alfârâbî, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Adamson, Peter, 2006, “The Arabic Sea Battle: al-Fârâbî on the Problem of future Contingents”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 88: 163–88.
  • –––, forthcoming, “Plotinus Arabus and Proclus Arabus in the Harmony of the Two Philosophers Attributed to al-Farabi,” in Reading Proclus and the Book of Causes (Volume II: Translations and Acculturations), Dragos Calma (ed.), Leiden: Brill.
  • Black, Deborah L., 1990, Logic and Aristotle’s “Rhetoric” and “Poetics” in Medieval Arabic Philosophy, Leiden: Brill.
  • Butterworth, Charles E., 2011, “Alfarabi’s Goal: Political Philosophy, Not Political Theology”, in Islam, the State, and Political Authority: Medieval Issues and Modern Concerns, Asma Afsaruddin (ed.), New York, NY: Palgrave McMillan US, pp. 53–74.
  • –––, 2013, “How to Read Alafarabi”, in More Modoque: Festschrift for Miklós Maróth, edited by P. Fodor et alii, Budapest: Research Centre for the Humanities of the Hungarian Academy of Sciences, pp. 33–41.
  • Chatti, Saloua, 2019, Arabic Logic from al-Farabi to Averroes: A Study of the Early Arabic Categorical, Modal and Hypothetical Syllogistics, Basel: Birkhhauser.
  • Cherni, Amor, 2015, La cité et ses opinions: Politique et métaphysique chez Abû Nasr al-Fârâbî, Paris: Albouraq.
  • Daiber, Hans, 1983, “Fârâbîs Abhandlung über das Vakuum: Quellen und Stellung in der islamischen Wissenschaftsgeschichte”, Der Islam, 60(1): 37–47.
  • Druart, Thérèse-Anne, 2007, “Al-Fârâbî, the categories, metaphysics, and The Book of Letters”, Medioevo, 32: 15–37.
  • –––, 2010, “Al-Fârâbî: An Arabic Account of the Origin of Language and of Philosophical Vocabulary”, Proceedings of the American Catholic Philosophical Association, 84: 1–17.
  • –––, 2017, “Al-Farabi on Intersubjectivity in This Life and Thereafter,” in Promisa nec aspera currans, Georgio Rahal & Heinz-Otto Luthe (eds.), Toulouse: Les Presses Universitaires, pp. 341–54.
  • –––, 2020, “What Does Music Have to Do with Language, Logic, and Rulership? Al-Farabi’s Answer,” in The Origin and Nature of Language and Logic: Perspectives in Medieval Islamic, Jewish, and Christian Thought, Nadja Germann & Steven Harvey (eds.), Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 193–210.
  • El-Fekkak, Badr, 2017, “Cosmic, Corporeal and Civil Regencies: al-Farabi’s anti-Galenic Defence of Hierarchical Cardiocentrism,” in Philosophy and Medicine in the Formative Period of Islam, Peter Adamson & Peter E. Pormann (eds.), London: The Warburg Institute, pp. 255–68.
  • Freudenthal, Gad, 1988, “La philosophie de la géométrie d’al-Fârâbî. Son commentaire sur le début du Ier et le début du Ve livre des Éléments d’Euclide”, Jerusalem Studies in Arabic and Islam, 11: 104–219.
  • Galston, Miriam, 2019, “The Origin of the Primary Principles: The Role of Nature and Experience,” in The Pilgrimage of Philosophy, Rene M. Paddags, Waseem El-Rayes & Gregory A. McGrayer (eds.), South Bend, IN: St. Augustine’s Press, pp. 114–35.
  • Genequand, Charles, 2012, “Théologie et philosophie. La providence chez al-Fârâbî et l’authenticité de l’Harmonie des opinions des deux sages”, Mélanges de l’Université Saint-Joseph, 64: 195–211.
  • –––, 2013, “Le Platon d’al-Fârâbî”, in Lire les dialogues, mais lesquels et dans quel ordre? Définitions du corpus et interprétations de Platon, A. Balansard & I. Koch (eds.), Sankt Augustin: Academia Verlag, pp. 105–15.
  • Germann, Nadja, 2015–16, “Imitation–Ambiguity–Discourse: Some Remarks on al–Farabi’s Philosophy of Language,” Melanges de l’Universite Saint–Joseph, 66: 135–66.
  • –––, 2015, “Logic as the Path to Happiness: Al-Farabi and the Divisions of the Sciences,” Quaestio, 15: 15–30.
  • Gutas, Dimitri, 2012 “Platon: Tradition arabe”, in Dictionnaire des philosophes antiques, vol. V-b, Richard Goulet (ed.), Paris: CNRS, pp. 854–63.
  • Jabbour, Jawdath, 2018, “La structure du Contre Galien de Farabi et son epitre sur la medicine,” Documenti e Studi, 29: 89–123.
  • Janos, Damien, 2012, Method, Structure, and Development in al-Fârâbî’s Cosmology, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2017, “Al-Farabi’s (d. 950) On the One and Oneness: Some Preliminary Remarks on Its Structure, Contents, and Theological Implications,” in The Oxford Handbook of Islamic Philosophy, Khaled El-Rouayheb & Sabine Schmidtke (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 101–28.
  • –––, 2019, “The Role of Developmentalism in the Study of Arabic Philosophy: Overview and Some Methodological Insights,” in La Philosophie arabe a l’etude. Sens, limites et defis d’une discipline modern (Studying Arabic Philosophy: Meaning, Limits, and Challenges of a Modern Discipline), Jean-Baptiste Brenet & Olga Lizzini (eds.), Paris: Vrin, pp. 113–78.
  • Karimullah, Kamran, 2014, “Alfarabi on Conditionals”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 24(2): 211–67.
  • Kleven, Terrence F., 2013, “Alfarabi’s Commentary on Porphyry’s Isagoge (Kitab Isaguji),” Schede Medievali, 51: 41–52.
  • –––, 2019, “Alfarabi’s Account of Poetry as a Logical Art in A Treatise on the Cannons of the Art of Poetry,” in The Pilgrimage of Philosophy, Rene M. Paddags, Waseem El-Rayes & Gregory A. McGrayer (eds.), South Bend, IN: St. Augustine’s Press, pp. 136–52.
  • Lameer, Joep, 1994, Al-Fârâbî & Aristotelian Syllogistics: Greek Theory & Islamic Practice, Leiden: Brill.
  • Lettinck, Paul, 1994, Aristotle’s Physics and its Reception in the Arabic World, Leiden: Brill.
  • Madian, Azza Abd al-Hamid, 1992, Language-music relationships in al-Fârâbî’s “Grand Book of Music”, Ph.D. dissertation for Cornell University.
  • Mattila, Janne, 2017, “The Ethical Progression of the Philosopher in al-Razi and al-Farabi,” Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 27(1): 115–37.
  • Menn, Stephen, 2008, “Al-Fârâbî’s Kitâb al-Hurûf and his analysis of the Senses of Being”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 18(1): 59–97.
  • Orwin, Alexander, 2017, Redifining the Muslim Community: Ethnicoity, Religion, and Politics in the Thought of Alfarabi, Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Parens, Joshua, 1995, Metaphysics as Rhetoric: Alfarabi’s “Summary of Plato’s ‘Laws’”, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Rashed, Marwan, 2009, “On the Authorship of the Treatise On the Harmonization of the Opinions of the Two Sages Attributed to al-Fârâbî”, Arabic Sciences & Philosophy, 19(1): 43–82.
  • –––, 2019, “Al-Farabi et le parachevement de l’Ethique a Nicomaque,” in Ethike Theoria, F. Masi, St. Maso & C. Viano (eds.), Rome: Edizioni di storia e letteratura, pp. 301–38.
  • Reisman, David C., 2004, “Plato’s Republic in Arabic: A Newly Discovered Passage”, Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 14(2): 263–300.
  • Rudolph, Ulrich, 2017, “Abû Nasr al-Fârâbî”, in Philosophy in the Islamic World, (Volume 1: 8th-–10th Centuries), Ulrich Rudolph, Rotraud Hansberger & Peter Adamson (eds.), Leiden: Brill, pp. 526–654.
  • Shehadi, Fadlou, 1995, Philosophies of Music in Medieval Islam, Leiden: Brill.
  • Taylor, Richard C., 2006, “Abstraction in al-Fârâbî”, Proceedings of the American Catholic Association, 80: 151–68
  • –––, 2010, “The Agent Intellect as ”Form for Us“ and Averroes’s Critique of al-Fârâbî”, in Universal Representation and the Ontology of Individuation, Gyula Klima & Alexander W. Hall (eds.), Newcastle upon Tyne: Cambridge Scholars Publishing , pp. 25–44.
  • Strobino, Riccardo, 2019, “Varieties of Demonstration in Alfarabi,” History & Philosophy of Logic, 40(1): 22–41.
  • Thomann, Johannes, 2010–11, “Ein al-Fârâbî zugeschriebener Kommentar zum Almagest (Ms. Tehran Maglis 6531)”, Zeitschrift für Geschichte der arabisch-islamischen Wissenschaften, 19: 35–76.
  • Vallat, Philippe, 2004: Farabi et l’École d’Alexandrie. Des prémisses de la connaissance à la philosophie politique, Paris: Vrin.
  • –––, 2019a, “L’intellect selon Farabi. La transformation du connaitre en etre,” in Noetique et theorie de la connaissance dans la philosophie arabe du IXe au XIIe siècle, Meryem Sebti & Daniel De Smet (eds.), Paris: Vrin, pp. 211–41.
  • –––, 2019b, “Le Livre del’Un et de l’Unite de Farabi: l’invention persane de la doctrine des transcendantaux,” in Commenter au Moyen Age, Pascale Bermon & Isabelle Moulin, Paris: Vrin, pp. 211–41.
  • –––, 2019c, “L’esoterisme de Farabi explique par lui-meme: nature et fonctions,” in La philosophie arabe a l’etude, J.-B. Brent & O. Lizzini (eds.), Paris: Vrin, pp. 545–611.
  • Watt, John, 2008, “Al-Farabi and the History of the Syriac Organon”, in Malphono w-Rabo d-Malphone (Gorgias Eastern Christian Studies), George Anton Kiraz (ed.), Piscataway, NJ: Gorgias Press, pp. 751–78. Reprinted separately in 2009, (Analecta Gorgiana 129), Piscataway, NJ: Gorgias Press.
  • Woerther, Frederique, 2018, “Al-Farabi commentateur d’Aristote dans les Didascalia in Rethoricam Aristotelis ex glosa Alpharabii,” in Commenting on Aristotle’s Rhetoric from Antiquity to the Present, F. Woerther (ed.), Leiden: Brill, pp. 41–63.
  • Zonta, Mauro, 2006, “Al-Fârâbî’s Long Commentary on Aristotle’s Categories in Hebrew and Arabic. A Critical Edition and English Translation of the Newly-found Fragments”, in Studies in Arabic and Islamic Culture, II, B. Abrahamov (ed.), Ramat-Gan: Bar-Ilan University Press , pp. 185–254.

Other Internet Resources

  • Al-Farabi, webpage on Al-Farabi at muslimphilosophy.com. (This page has links to a few complete texts of al-Farabi, some in Arabic and some in English translation.) Al-Farabi, webpage on Al-Farabi at thegreatthinkers.org.

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Therese-Anne Druart <druart@cua.edu>

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