Notes to Empirical Approaches to Altruism

1. A note on terminology. In this entry the terms “egoism” and “altruism” are used for descriptive views about the nature of human motivation. Other authors prefer to call these views “psychological egoism” and “psychological altruism” to distinguish them from “ethical egoism” and “ethical altruism,” which are prescriptive views about how people should behave.

2. Interpretation of historical texts is, of course, often less than straightforward. While there are passages in the works of each of these philosophers that can be interpreted as advocating psychological egoism, scholars might debate whether these passages reflect the author's considered option.

3. For example, Mill suggests instilling “hope of favor and the fear of displeasure from our fellow creatures or from the Ruler of the Universe” (Mill 1861 [2001: ch 3]). Another proposal was to instill a feeling of conscience:

a pain, more or less intense, attendant on violation of duty …. This feeling [is] all encrusted over with collateral associations …derived from…fear; from all the forms of religious feeling; from self-esteem…and occasionally even self-abasement. (ibid)

4. For more on the history and philosophical implications of the debate, see Broad (1930), MacIntyre (1967), Nagel (1970), Batson (1991: Chs. 1–3), Sober and Wilson (1998: Ch. 9), and Dixon (2008).

5. At first blush, the complex definitions of altruism offered by Kitcher (2010, 2011) seem rather different from the standard account. But those differences diminish when one focuses on the commentary and conditions Kitcher provides.

6. For a classic statement of this account of practical reasoning, see Goldman (1970).

7. For further discussion, see Cialdini et al. (1997), Sober and Wilson (1998: ch. 7), Stich et al. (2010), May (2011a,b,c) and Slote (2013).

8. Similar concerns are discussed by Sober & Wilson (1998: ch. 7) and by May (2011c).

9. Whether the desire that someone else be harmed is ever an ultimate desire is another, harder, question. For discussion, see Clavien and Klein (2010).

10. The authors are grateful to Prof. Schramme for some very helpful correspondence on non-standard accounts of altruism.

11. Giving a more precise account of fitness would raise some of the deepest issues in the philosophy of biology (see, for example, Beatty (1992), and Ramsey (2006)). Fortunately, for our purposes no more precise account is needed. The evolutionary notion of altruism can be made more precise in a number of different ways (see, for example, Kerr et al. (2004), and Ramsey & Brandon (2011)).

12. Though most arguments in this area try to show that evolutionary considerations make psychological altruism unlikely, Sober and Wilson (1998: Ch. 10) have offered an evolutionary argument in favor of psychological altruism. For a critique, see Stich (2007); for a response, see Schulz (2011).

13. For useful reviews of the literature see Batson (1991, 1998, 2011, 2012), Feigin et al. (2014), Piliavin and Charng (1990), and D. Schroeder et al. (1995). Broadly speaking, this literature is cognitivist in its orientation. There is also some consideration given to the egoism vs. altruism debate in the behaviorist tradition. For an insightful discussion of the relevance of literature in that tradition to the philosophical debate, see Slote (1964).

14. In more recent work, Batson (2011: 11–20) distinguishes his conception of empathy from a number of related psychological states which other authors have labeled “empathy.”

15. Stotland’s instruction to imagine how the target feels, and a variety of similar requests, are often described as “perspective taking” instructions. In one way or another, they direct subjects to take the perspective of the target. Until recently, it was widely accepted that perspective taking instructions increase empathy. But McAuliffe et al. (2018) present evidence that perspective taking instructions may do little or nothing to increase empathy. Rather, it is the other instruction that participants in these experiments often receive—the instruction to “remain objective” or to watch the target’s movements—that lowers the level of empathy that subjects experience.

16. For overviews of Batson's research, see Batson (1991, 2011, 2015); for a detailed critique, see Stich et al. (2010).

17. This idea, which has been widely discussed in the social sciences, has venerable philosophical roots. In Brief Lives, written between 1650 and 1695, John Aubrey (1949) describes an occasion on which Thomas Hobbes gave alms to a beggar. Asked why, Hobbes replied that by giving alms to the beggar, he not only relieved the man’s distress, but he also relieved his own distress at seeing the beggar’s distress.

18. Batson (1991), Part III provides a detailed account of Batson’s early work on the empathy-altruism hypothesis. Batson (2011), Part II is a valuable update that responds to numerous objections.

19. The importance of this distinction in debates about altruism is noted by Slote (2013); the theme is developed further by May (2011b).

20. For further discussion of the Demjanuk case and of the moral and practical importance of numerical identity, see Stich & Donaldson 2019: Ch. 11.

21. Batson offers a very similar conclusion, including the Sherlock Holmes quote, in Batson 1991: 174.

22. For some experimental evidence of the impact of religious beliefs, and thoughts about God, on prosocial behavior see Shariff & Norenzayan (2007), Shariff et al. (2016), Purzycki, Apicella, et al. (2016) and Purzycki, Henrich, et al. (2018). Fear of divine punishment may be more potent than hope for divine reward (Yilmaz & Bahçekapili 2016).

23. Recall that a parallel assumption, that people think social sanctions for not helping are more likely when the target engenders empathy, was made for the social punishment hypothesis.

24. It is surprising that the God’s punishment hypothesis, or something in that vicinity, has not been explored by Batson and his collaborators, since they have done quite a lot of work aimed at determining whether religious orientations of various sorts foster altruism. See for example Batson, Oleson, et al. (1989) and Batson, Schoenrade, et al. (1993). An intriguing conclusion of that work was that, among Christian participants, two common religious orientations are associated with increased helping behavior, but “the underlying motivation is egoistic.” The helping behavior associated with a third common religious orientation was consistent with altruistic motivation, though alternative explanations could not be ruled out (Batson, Oleson, et al. 1989: 882–883).

25. The context suggests that by “upholding justice” Batson means acting in accordance with a principle of justice.

26. The term “action guiding principle” is borrowed from Frankena (1967).

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John Doris <>
Stephen Stich <>
Lachlan Walmsley <>

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