Aristotelianism in the Renaissance

First published Fri Apr 5, 2024

[Editor’s Note: The following new entry by David Lines replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

To paraphrase Alfred North Whitehead’s famous pronouncement about Plato, Renaissance philosophy consisted, broadly speaking, of a series of footnotes to Aristotle. Thanks to the “rediscovery” of Aristotle’s works in the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, philosophers had available to them a much larger corpus of his writings than for any other thinker of antiquity except Galen. In the famous Aldus Greek edition of 1495–1498, these writings (both genuine and spurious, in addition to works by Galen, Philo, Theophrastus, and Alexander of Aphrodisias) filled five volumes. Latin and vernacular translations had made nearly all of these works accessible for centuries. In addition, Renaissance thinkers could count on an extraordinarily rich commentary tradition from the Greek, Arab, Hebrew, and medieval Latin worlds. Individual commentators such as Averroes, Albert the Great, and Thomas Aquinas wrote prolifically on Aristotle. Aristotle’s methodological procedure for arriving at the truth and the stunning breadth of his philosophical explorations meant that “the Philosopher” was literally everywhere, undergirding intellectual endeavors and teaching not only in philosophy, but also in medicine, law, theology, and literary theory. Up to the seventeenth century, he remained the indispensable reference point (although hardly the definitive answer) for any philosophical exploration.

The importance of Aristotle notwithstanding, Renaissance philosophy was not the same as Aristotelianism, if one takes this label to denote a strain of thought representing an exclusive commitment to Aristotelian notions and/or methods. This entry will show that it would be exceedingly hard to find examples of such a “pure” dedication to Aristotle in the period c. 1350–1650. As a result, it is better to interpret Aristotelianism as the study of the writings then attributed (whether rightly or wrongly) to Aristotle.

As scholars in the period already began to recognize, these writings do not form a coherent whole. Yet, despite their variable form (lecture notes by students or original treatises), the different audiences to which they were addressed (Aristotle’s students or the broader public), the presence of pseudographs such as the Problems, the evolution within Aristotle’s own thinking, faults of transmission and translation, and the variety of perspectives adopted by Aristotle’s commentators, this large and diversified corpus proved highly useful for the teaching and practice of philosophy. This was in part because “Aristotle’s” writings cover a remarkably wide scope: they address every branch of philosophy (logic, natural philosophy, moral philosophy, metaphysics) as well as topics more closely related to literary theory (rhetoric, poetics). The spurious works also deal with many other topics, including natural theology and medicine.

This entry outlines the historical and historiographical dimensions of Renaissance Aristotelianism before the rise of early modern philosophy. It illustrates the variety of literary, linguistic, and institutional contexts through which Aristotle was approached. Additionally, it provides examples of some problems discussed in treatments of Aristotle and the complicated relationship that interpreters saw between Aristotelianism, other philosophical currents, and the Christian religion. Given the vastness of a phenomenon that stretched from Constantinople through Western Europe and from there to its worldwide colonies, the topics and interpreters mentioned are meant to be illustrative rather than comprehensive. There is currently no exhaustive account of the features and development of Renaissance Aristotelianism, although Schmitt 1983a and Martin 2014 are excellent starting points.

1. Historiography

Traditional (and now largely outdated) accounts of Renaissance philosophy used to depict Aristotelianism as a unified, static, and sterile current of thought that was based in the universities and was beaten into retreat by the rise of Platonism, academies, and a more human-centered philosophical approach (sometimes confusingly identified with “humanism”). This perspective, often derived from implicit anti-religious and anti-scholastic biases, began to lose credibility in the 1950s and 1960s (and then, more rapidly, in the 1970s and 1980s) thanks to the studies by Paul Oskar Kristeller, Bruno Nardi, Antonino Poppi, F. Edward Cranz, Charles B. Schmitt, Charles H. Lohr, and other scholars. Building on the magnificent achievements of historians of science such as Pierre Duhem and Lynn Thorndike, these scholars’ explorations of the commentary tradition highlighted the longevity and diversity of Aristotle’s influence. Lohr’s repertories of Aristotle commentators showed that, far from disappearing, Aristotelian works were the subject of renewed interest in the Renaissance, such that

the number of Latin commentaries on Aristotle composed within this brief period [1500–1650] exceeds that of the entire millennium from Boethius to Pomponazzi. (Lohr 1974: 228)

Cranz and Schmitt (1984) documented, through a repertory of printed editions, how influential Aristotle continued to be (see §5). Schmitt also strongly underscored the variety of Aristotelian interpretations and approaches, suggesting that we should speak about “Renaissance Aristotelianisms” in the plural rather than as a single movement (Schmitt 1983a: 10–33). No serious scholar now ignores the importance of Renaissance Aristotelianism(s), even while emphasizing other currents such as Platonism or Stoicism. (Epicureanism, by contrast, gained few followers in the period.) The Aristotelian tradition is now being examined from numerous perspectives, including the history of education, literature, art, translation, and religion.

2. Historical Development(s)

Aristotle’s thought had a somewhat delayed influence on the ancient world and enjoyed its flowering only much later. Roman thinkers such as Cicero, as well as the early Church Fathers, knew (of) him, but it was Plato who clearly had the upper hand, even as late as St Augustine of Hippo (354–430)—despite the work of Greek commentators such as Aspasius (second century A.D.), Alexander of Aphrodisias (late second to early third century), Plotinus (204/5–270), Porphyry (234?–305?), Iamblichus (242?–325), and Themistius (fl. c. 350) in intervening years. (Another important commentator was Johannes Philoponus [490–570], who however came a bit later.) Late antiquity saw Boethius’ (c. 475–526) influential translation of Aristotle’s logic into Latin, but Aristotle’s more substantial fortuna in the Latin West had to wait until the twelfth and thirteenth centuries, with the rise of the universities. This may have been due to the need to find a suitable foundation for the study of philosophy. In any case, the efforts to translate and comment on Aristotle’s works extended to earlier commentaries produced in the Byzantine and Arab worlds: thus, interpreters such as Eustratius of Nicaea (c. 1050–c. 1120) and Averroes (Ibn Rushd, 1126–1198) soon became highly influential in Latin translation. By around 1270 nearly all of Aristotle’s works—and several spurious ones besides—had become available for study. (The notable exception was the Poetics, which—despite a commentary by Averroes—only became better known in the late fifteenth century.) These works were usually taught in philosophy courses, where they were grouped under the headings of logic, natural and moral philosophy, and metaphysics. Starting in the fifteenth century, professors of humanities or rhetoric might teach, in addition to Latin writers such as Cicero and Virgil, Aristotle’s Rhetoric and Poetics, as well as the spurious Rhetoric to Alexander.

Early Italian humanists—defined here as literary scholars—had an ambivalent attitude toward Aristotle and Aristotelianism. In his famous work On His Own Ignorance and That of Many Others (De sui ipsius et multorum ignorantia), Petrarch (Francesco Petrarca, 1304–1374) attacked some contemporary scholars for following Aristotle “blindly”, but also objected to Aristotle’s discussion of useless and possibly false matters such as the crocodile’s ability to move its upper jaw or the number of hairs on a lion’s head. He also criticized Aristotle’s treatment of virtue in the Nicomachean Ethics, claiming that “his lesson lacks the words that sting and set afire and urge toward love of virtue and hatred of vice” (Petrarch [CKR: 103]). Although professional rivalry may have played a role, this attitude seems to have stemmed especially from a clash of subjects and methodologies: Petrarch and his literarily inclined colleagues prized eloquence and saw it as key to the production of virtue. Some of them (including Petrarch) were especially taken by Plato, although few at the time (Petrarch was no exception) could read him in the original. This is not, however, to say that they turned their backs on Aristotle: the humanist chancellor of Florence, Leonardo Bruni (1370–1444), not only wrote a Life of Aristotle (Vita Aristotelis), but he retranslated his moral philosophy (ethics, politics, and economics) into Ciceronian Latin, claiming that his works in Greek were “filled with elegance, delight, and a certain fathomless beauty” (Bruni, The Correct Way to Translate [1987: 217]). Other scholars studied (and sometimes retranslated) his logic and works of natural philosophy. By the 1490s, Florence’s most famous humanist, the young Angelo Poliziano (1454–1494), was teaching the whole range of Aristotle’s works at the University of Florence. His justification was that, as a grammaticus (a philologist), he was competent in all fields of study. In the second half of the fifteenth century, Bologna boasted at least two humanists who taught, in addition to more literary and rhetorical works, Aristotle’s Physics (the Hellenist Andronicus Callistus, dates uncertain) and his De interpretatione (Antonio Urceo Cortesi, or Codro, 1446–1500) (Lines 2023: 186–191). The renowned Venetian printer Aldus Manutius issued a Greek edition of Aristotle’s complete works in five volumes (1495–1498). Likewise, Desiderius Erasmus (†1536) of Rotterdam had an interest in Aristotle and superintended a new Greek edition of his works (1516), although most of the donkey work was done by Simon Grynaeus (Kraye 1990 and 1995).

In Central and Northern Europe, Aristotle’s works had exercised a decisive influence on philosophy at least since the thirteenth-century contributions of Robert Grosseteste (†1253)—a key translator of Aristotle’s works and of various Greek commentaries—as well as Albert the Great (c. 1200–1280) and Thomas Aquinas (c. 1225–1274), both of whom commented on a wide range of his writings. The influence of Italian humanism and of Martin Luther’s Reformation redirected (but did not diminish) this earlier interest in Aristotle. The Wittenberg professor Philipp Melanchthon (1497–1560) tempered Luther’s deep suspicions about the Stagirite’s views, and the Protestant universities continued, as elsewhere, to have Aristotelian philosophy at the core of their arts curriculum. Universities such as Paris, Oxford, and Salamanca remained significant centers for the interpretation of Aristotle. Likewise, the colleges of the Society of Jesus (established in 1540) and of orders such as the Dominicans relied on the Aristotelian corpus for their own philosophical curriculum in their programs worldwide. Despite the rise of anti-Aristotelianism (see §4.3.4), students and scholars across Europe (and beyond, especially in the English, Spanish, and Portuguese colonies) continued to engage with Aristotle’s thought.

The same was true of universities, whose teaching of “Aristotle” endured long after the “new philosophy” of Francis Bacon (1561–1626) and René Descartes (1596–1650) had made its mark. This does not mean, however, that either masters or students were necessarily in agreement with Aristotelian doctrines. Indeed, records of philosophical lectures indicate that professors presented students with the ideas of Aristotle and expected them to know them (teaching perforce involves transmitting established views), but then also incorporated in their courses insights from recent or contemporary figures (Brockliss 1987; Lines 2023). Likewise, the schools of the religious orders were less conservative than one might expect.

3. Contexts, Languages, and Genres

The universities and schools of the religious orders, however, were by no means the only contexts in which discussions of Aristotle took place. Several learned circles and more formal academies (including the Accademia degli Infiammati in Padua and the Accademia Fiorentina) explored Aristotle’s challenging philosophical works. Princely courts might stage readings and discussions of his writings. (A famous case is the court of the king of France, Henri III; see Yates 1947 and, more broadly, Lines 2013). Popular works such as Leon Battista Alberti’s Books on the Family (I libri della famiglia) were based on (possibly fictitious) conversations among friends about Aristotelian moral philosophy—specifically the Oeconomics, a work about household management then attributed to Aristotle—and Xenophon’s Oeconomicus (Cabrini 2007). Shakespeare’s plays at times deal with aspects of Aristotelian thought (e.g., ethics, poetics) that contemporaries would have recognized.

This broad range of contexts was facilitated by a remarkably intense effort to make Aristotle’s ideas and writings accessible in the vernacular. Previous centuries had already seen translations or adaptations of Aristotle’s works in languages such as French and Italian (see, for instance, Brunetto Latini’s Les livres du trésor, subsequently translated into Italian). In the Renaissance, this phenomenon blossomed: in addition to multiple new Latin translations (penned by figures such as the Greek émigrés Johannes Argyropoulos and Theodore Gaza), translations into French, Italian, Spanish, English, German, and other languages greatly expanded the potential readership of these works (for the Italian case, see Lines & Refini 2014 and Bianchi, Gilson, & Kraye 2016; more broadly, Lines & Puliafito 2019). But one should be wary of interpreting this phenomenon in terms of a process of “democratization of knowledge” (Sgarbi 2022): at the end of the day, only people who could read, had already received some training in philosophy, were highly interested and motivated, and had some leisure and economic means were likely to approach Aristotle’s works. Still, it is remarkable that people trained in manual crafts like Benedetto Varchi (1503–1565) and women like Camilla Erculiani (d. after 1584) not only did so, but also went on to write on Aristotle (Andreoni 2012; Erculiani Letters [2021]).

This expansion in languages and publics also found a parallel in a growing number of genres that treated Aristotle’s writings. Again, the phenomenon was not unknown in previous centuries, where literal commentaries, question commentaries, and compendia (but also visual representations) provided multiple avenues of access to the Philosopher. But the Renaissance saw an explosion of additional forms: letters, dialogues, orations, paraphrases, treatises, essays, student disputations, printed editions (also in Greek), and even literary works such as the tales of Marguerite de Navarre (Langer 1994) were all added to the previous mix, as part of a widespread effort to reinterpret and, quite often, save Aristotelian ideas from the attacks they were coming under. New discoveries or theories about the universe, physics, and the human body; geographical explorations; theological controversies (such as the meritoriousness of unaided virtue or the nature of the Eucharist); philological advances, including the recovery of several works from antiquity; the rise of the new philosophy—all of these in various ways questioned significant aspects of the received Aristotelian framework, producing an almost frenzied activity aimed at re-evaluating the Philosopher and seeing how much of his system could be retained in the light of new trends and criticisms (Bianchi 2003; see below, §4.3.4).

4. Selected Fields, Topics, and Competitors

4.1 Fields

It is worthwhile outlining the most important fields and works of the Renaissance Aristotle, before discussing some important topics of debate.

Logic was the cornerstone of medieval and Renaissance Aristotelianism, both in providing principles that were foundational and in common with other disciplines (such as law, theology, medicine) and in being considered a preliminary and basic subject. Of all the branches of Aristotelian thought, logic had the longest pedigree in Latin, since the Categories and On Interpretation (along with Porphyry’s Isagoge) had been translated by Boethius in the early sixth century (logica vetus); works that became known in the twelfth century—Topics, Sophistical Refutations, Prior and Posterior Analytics—were known as the logica nova (Ashworth 1988). Together, the old and new logic provided the essentials of a field that nearly everyone studied at school and/or university or in the schools/colleges of the religious orders. Or, at least, that was the idea. In practice, logic was often approached through handbooks, such as the wildly popular Summaries of Logic (Summulae logicales, c. 1240) by Peter of Spain (the work continued to be widely used in the sixteenth century) and Paul of Venice’s Small Logic (Logica parva, c. 1396–1399). Furthermore, under the influence of the Dutch humanist Rudolph Agricola (1443/4–1485), the Renaissance saw a change in the teaching of logic, which often moved into a closer relationship with rhetoric (Mack 1993; Lagerlund 2017; Knuuttila 2017).

After logic, students across Europe tackled the higher aspects of Aristotle’s philosophy. In Italy, the Physics, On the Heavens, and On the Soul would typically start off each year of study of natural philosophy, with gaps being filled in by many of the “minor” works such as On Generation and Corruption, the Meteorology, and the works on animals, or even pseudographs such as The Secret of Secrets or Problems. Also of interest was Aristotle’s Metaphysics, studied either on its own (especially in Northern Europe) or as a complement to problems in natural philosophy (often the case in Italian universities). Moral philosophy (usually on the basis of Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, and sometimes extending—especially in Central and Northern Europe—also to the Oeconomics and the Politics) might be taught in parallel with natural philosophy or immediately after it. This was a field that initially struggled to be recognized as an official and required subject in the Italian universities and was taught more regularly elsewhere, particularly in universities founded on the Parisian model, including the Jesuit Collegio Romano (Lines 2002).

The study of works such as the Rhetoric, the Rhetoric to Alexander, and the Poetics almost always took place in courses or discussions of rhetoric and humanities rather than philosophy. It was a study that developed especially in sixteenth-century Italy and had to find creative ways to complement the long-established role of Cicero (and the Rhetorica ad Herennium attributed to him) as a foundation for the teaching of rhetoric in schools and universities (Mack 2011: 24–26, 169–71).

All of these areas were approached both through the relevant works of Aristotle (initially only in medieval translations; from the fifteenth century also through fresh translations and occasionally through the original Greek) and through a rich commentary tradition, in which Averroes (and later, to some extent, the Greek commentators) played a considerable role, together with giants of the thirteenth-century Latin tradition such as Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas and later influential interpreters such as Walter Burley (c. 1275–1344/5) and John Buridan (c. 1300–post 1358). Classroom teaching could vary significantly depending on the specific branch of philosophy, the geographical area, the chronological moment, and the preferences of master and/or students, but usually consisted of a combined explanation of (and the solution of questions on) Aristotle’s text and his commentators. The presence within the Greek and Arabic commentary traditions of Platonic, Neoplatonic, and fundamentally non-Christian ideas (e.g., in the works of Averroes) meant that students of Aristotle in the Latin West faced the conundrum of reconciling these multiple points of view both with each other and with Christian assumptions (§i;4.2). Furthermore, as anticipated above, new discoveries or theories (such as Copernicanism or the rise of the “new science”) led to questioning important aspects of the commonly accepted worldview, including the cosmological model that rested on the viewpoints of Aristotle and Ptolemy (§4.2.1).

The availability of important new works such as the Poetics gave rise to significant debates and cultural changes, including on the theory of playwriting. In other cases, figures critiqued and tried to replace wholesale Aristotle’s influence in specific fields. Mario Nizolio argued, in his On the True Principles and True Method of Philosophizing against the Pseudo-Philosophers (De veris principiis et vera ratione philosophandi contra pseudophilosophos, 1553), against Aristotelian dialectic and metaphysics. Petrus Ramus (†1572), a professor in Paris, spent much of his career trying to find ways to replace Aristotle’s rhetoric and logic (Gilbert 1960; Couzinet 2015).

4.2 Reconciling Aristotelianism with Christianity

Ever since Thomas Aquinas’ synthesis of Christianity, Aristotelianism, and elements of Platonism, Western thinkers had thought of Christian and Aristotelian doctrines as largely (although not necessarily wholly) compatible. At the same time, they were quite aware that Aristotle was not an infallible authority. They knew that there were areas, such as psychology (see below, §4.2.2), in which Aristotle’s teachings were at least potentially problematic. Such fissures became increasingly evident as readers of Aristotle in the Latin West became more familiar with other interpretive traditions and with the writings of philosophers such as Plato (who in the Middle Ages had a significant indirect influence but was known directly through only a handful of dialogues). Platonism had a particular resonance with Christianity because of Plato’s teachings about the immortality of the soul and his acceptance by Church Fathers such as Augustine. With the fifteenth-century influx of many Greek scholars to Italy (Plato was more highly prized than Aristotle in the Byzantine schools) and the subsequent Latin translation of Plato’s complete works by the Florentine philosopher Marsilio Ficino (1433–1499), some began to see Aristotle as less useful than his teacher for the development of a Christian philosophy. A significant uptick in the activity of scientific publishing and Aristotelian commentary also highlighted various areas in which Christian and Aristotelian viewpoints seemed more divergent than they had previously appeared. Such an awareness led to moves to contain and correct Aristotle’s impious or potentially dangerous teachings. These included the famous 1513 papal bull Apostolici regiminis (issued during the Fifth Lateran Council), which clarified Christian dogma on the soul and instructed professors of philosophy to rebut arguments that were contrary to Christian doctrine.

4.2.1 Cosmology

The traditional geocentric picture of the universe (elaborated by Ptolemy, second century A.D., but largely indebted to Aristotle) saw an immobile earth at the center, above which were the perfect and unchangeable heavenly spheres, governed by an unmoved Mover. This viewpoint had been fully accepted by Christian thinkers and popularized through writings such as Dante Alighieri’s Divina commedia (Divine Comedy). Although there was no specific scriptural endorsement of it, there seemed to be no reason not to accept it, and it made sense of language in the Bible such as the sun “standing still” when Joshua needed more time to defeat his enemies (Joshua 10:12–14). A significant challenge to this system was the 1543 work De revolutionibus orbium caelestium (The Revolutions of the Heavenly Spheres) by the Polish astronomer Nicolaus Copernicus (1473–1543), who argued instead for a heliocentric model on the basis of multiple observations and mathematical calculations, as well as this model’s congruity with certain religious and philosophical assumptions. Famously, Copernicus’ theory was taken up and defended by scientists and mathematicians such as Johannes Kepler, Tycho Brahe, and Galileo Galilei, whose observations seemed to prove the existence of comets as new celestial phenomena (thus questioning Aristotle’s cosmology, according to which the heavens were unchanging) and the rotation of the earth around the sun and its own axis. The Catholic Church saw Copernicanism as contrary to church teaching (1616) and prohibited Galileo and others from publicly supporting it (1633). Nonetheless, the Church was not able to contain the growing consensus around heliocentrism, particularly in Protestant lands. Nor was it able quickly enough to silence the speculations about the infinity and multiplicity of the universe put forward by eccentric but vocal figures like Giordano Bruno (burned at the stake in Rome in 1600).

In some other areas closely related to cosmology such as the issue of the age of the world, opinion was set against Aristotle from an early date. Aristotle had argued in Physics, VIII.1–10 that the world must be eternal, i.e., without a beginning. But this notion contrasted so evidently with the biblical account of creation (and with the interpretation of eminent Church Fathers such as Augustine) that it found few takers among orthodox Christians. The Fourth Lateran Council (1215) elevated Augustine’s doctrine of creation ex nihilo to dogma. Yet Aristotle’s (and Averroes’) espousal of eternalism did find some support. Biagio Pelacani da Parma (†1416), a professor at the universities of Pavia, Bologna, and Padua, was forced to recant his espousal of this position at the bishop’s court of Pavia in 1396. Nicoletto Vernia (1420–1499), a Paduan professor, likewise assumed the eternity of the world (Martin 2022). For other fifteenth-century thinkers, such as Marsilio Ficino, Giovanni Pico della Mirandola, and the Greek émigrés Gemistus Pletho, George of Trebizond, and Cardinal Bessarion, the eternity of the world was an important concern, not least because late ancient Platonists accepted this notion. Since Plato, instead, had given an account of creation in his Timaeus, there was an evident discordance among ancient authorities. For the sixteenth century, the problem of the eternity of the world has not been well studied (Connell 2011, Dal Prete 2022). Nonetheless, we know that Niccolò Machiavelli was one of those strongly arguing for the eternity of the world (see his Discorsi II, 5; Sasso 1987), as was Giordano Bruno (e.g., in De l’infinito, universo e mondi). Jesuits such as Jacobus Ledesma took issue with this doctrine (Martin 2014: 88–90), as did several Franciscans and Dominicans (both in and outside of Italy), taking aim also at what was, in their view, a more general inclination toward Averroism among sixteenth-century Italians. Similar criticisms were voiced in the Protestant camp. The Lutheran professor Nicolaus Taurellus (1547–1606) proposed a metaphysical approach to the problem of the eternity of the world; the Calvinist Otto Casmann (1562–1607) also insisted that it could not be a problem that had two different solutions (a philosophical and a theological one). An outlier was Julius Caesar Scaliger (1484–1558), who was convinced of the congruence between Aristotle and Christianity and argued that Aristotle believed in God’s creation of the world (Martin 2014: 83, 96–99).

Another important problem arose from Aristotle’s view that there is no heavenly interference in the sublunary world. This notion had consequences for how the role of divine providence was interpreted; so, thinkers as varied as Melanchthon, Ramus, Francesco Patrizi da Cherso (1529–1597), and the sixteenth-century Englishman Richard Bostocke explored the topic in some detail—usually concluding that Aristotle’s teaching in this area was not in accordance with Christian faith (Martin 2014, ad indicem).

Renaissance Aristotelianism was therefore constantly engaging with the ancient and medieval commentary tradition, and with Averroes in particular.

4.2.2 The Soul

The overlaps between Aristotelianism and Averroism are again relevant in questions about the soul. Two long-standing problems in medieval and Renaissance discussions concerned the individuality and immortality of a human’s rational intellect. Does each human have an individual soul, in which case how do we explain our common thinking patterns and perceptions? And to what extent is an individual’s soul tied to the body? On these matters, Christian doctrine is quite clear: the soul is individual, and there is an individual afterlife in store for every human being. (At death, the body releases its soul; at the resurrection, the soul and body are again joined together.) These teachings have much in common with Plato’s views (although the Christian position accorded the body a more positive valence), but not with those of Aristotle and Averroes. Aristotle’s doctrine of hylomorphism (the union of form and matter) points to a close relationship between the intellective soul and the functions of sensation, which require a body. Indeed, he claims:

It’s clear that the soul is not separable from the body—or that certain parts of it, if it has parts, are not separable from the body. (De anima II.1, 413a3–5)

It seems therefore that the soul (including, presumably, its highest part, the rational intellect) cannot survive the death of the body. Since forms in Aristotle are not universal as in Plato, the soul is individual but not immortal. (It is worth noting, however, that Aristotle’s position was by no means clear, so that it could be interpreted in several divergent ways; the materialist interpretation was strongly held by his ancient commentator Alexander of Aphrodisias.) Averroes’ mature comments on Aristotle point to an agent intellect and a material intellect, each of which is a single, separate, and eternal substance. This position emphasizes the soul’s immortality, but denies its individuality, since the intellective soul is not unique to each individual and, upon death, returns to the larger universal intellect of which it is a part. It thus makes nonsense of the Christian belief in individual immortality.

Historians of philosophy have classed the supporters of these two positions as Alexandrists and Averroists respectively and have noted the occasional voicing of these interpretations already in the Middle Ages: examples are the works of Siger of Brabant (c. 1240–1284) and various ecclesiastical condemnations (such as those of 1270 and 1277 in Paris; Bianchi 1997). Yet it is in the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries that these positions came to the fore most strongly, as indicated by the activity of professors at Padua and Bologna. Teachers such as Biagio Pelacani da Parma and Nicoletto Vernia in Padua (§4.2.1) and Alessandro Achillini (1463–1512) in Bologna promoted Averroes’ interpretations of the soul. But they had to contend with rebuttals, not only from supporters of the orthodox Christian position, but from followers of Alexander of Aphrodisias (Martin 2014: ch. 3).

The most famous Alexandrist was Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525), a professor at Padua and Bologna. Pomponazzi’s treatise On the Immortality of the Soul (De immortalitate animae, 1516) caused an uproar. It stated that, from a philosophical perspective, there were no conclusive arguments for the soul’s immortality. This position was not altogether new, since—as Pomponazzi himself noted—John Duns Scotus (c. 1265–1308) had expressed a similar view. Coming on the heels of the Apostolici regiminis bull of 1513, however, Pomponazzi’s treatise should have offered a convincing refutation of positions contrary to Christianity. Instead, it only offered a brief, half-hearted conclusion supporting the Christian position simply as a matter of faith. Furthermore, the treatise seemed to imply that a Christian view of the soul, informed by Thomas Aquinas’ emphasis on its immortality and separability, was not necessary for a virtuous life, but had been introduced so as to preserve order in society. These and other aspects of the work led to intense debate and widespread criticism; Pomponazzi himself came under pressure to retract some of his statements, but the protection of powerful patrons allowed him to continue his teaching largely undisturbed until his death in 1525. Unlike his On Fate (De fato) and On Incantations (De incantationibus), published some decades after his death, On the Immortality of the Soul was never placed on the Index of Prohibited Books. It is notable, however, that the work’s only official sixteenth-century reprint came in 1525; there it was accompanied by other works and by the critical arguments of the Dominican friar Giovanni Crisostomo Javelli (Pomponazzi 1525; Spruit 2017). (An edition of Pomponazzi’s treatise also appeared in 1534, but without indication of printer and without Javelli’s response.)

Debates about the soul did not cease with Pomponazzi. The topic continued to be a bone of contention both for followers of Pomponazzi such as the Neapolitan Simone Porzio (1496–1544; Del Soldato 2010) and the Paduan professor Giacomo Zabarella (1533–1589) and also for several thinkers who sided against him. As we will see, some of these scholars were strongly influenced in their arguments by the doctrines of ancient philosophers such as Plato (§4.3).

4.2.3 Moral philosophy

The challenge of bringing Aristotle in line with Christian assumptions extended also to the sphere of moral philosophy (Kraye 1988, 1998). This was typically understood to consist of ethics, economics or household management, and politics, branches that were approached through the Nicomachean Ethics, the Oeconomics, and the Politics respectively. (The authenticity of the Oeconomics is doubtful; other works of ethics by “Aristotle” include the Eudemian Ethics and the Magna Moralia, but the latter is again probably spurious.) From a Christian perspective, there were several problems with Aristotle’s ethical theory. Chief among them was his view of happiness or flourishing (eudaimonia), which both assumes that habituation can produce moral virtue without the intervention of divine grace and operates entirely in an earthly perspective, without consideration of the afterlife or of God. The latter viewpoint is evident from the very opening of the Nicomachean Ethics, which claims that

Every art and every inquiry, and similarly every action and choice, is thought to aim at some good; and for this reason, the good (tagathon) has rightly been declared to be that at which all things aim…. If then, there is some end of the things we do, which we desire for its own sake … , clearly this must be the good and chief good. (I.1–2, 1094a)

Aristotle goes on, in the first book of the Ethics, to explore the best definition of this human good or eudaimonia, which “turns out to be the activity of the soul in conformity with [the best and most complete] excellence”, accompanied by pleasure and external goods, and during the course of a complete lifetime (I.7, 1098a16–18).

For Christians, identifying the ultimate good with an earthly activity or state amounts to idolatry, since only God can be our ultimate and highest good. Thus, thirteenth-century thinkers such as Thomas Aquinas already took issue with Aristotle on this point, claiming that, on the contrary, “the last beatitude or happiness of any intelligent substance is to know God” (Summa contra Gentiles, III, 25). (Other Christian interpreters who laid a stronger stress on the will emphasized instead the goal of loving God.) This did not, however, mean that Aristotle’s considerations on ethics were worthless—indeed, Thomas wrote a detailed literal commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics. It did, however, mean that Christian interpreters noted Aristotle’s concern with only one aspect of the human experience. Nonetheless, unease about Aristotle’s position continued and led Leonardo Bruni to offer an alternate rendering of tagathon in his translation of the work (1416/1417): instead of bonum (or “the good”, as the medieval translation had it), this became summum bonum (“the highest good”), in an evident reference not to a human good but to God. (This rendering came in for some severe criticism and was rectified by other translations, such as that of Johannes Argyropoulos [c. 1415–1487], which instead translates tagathon as “bonum quoddam” or “a certain good”.) Other interpreters tied the theme of happiness more closely to Christian concerns by highlighting its religious and otherworldly dimensions. Such an operation sometimes involved a Christianization of other pagan currents. A good example is Lorenzo Valla’s (1407–1457) dialogue On Pleasure (in its final version, De vero falsoque bono), which identifies Epicurean happiness with the enjoyment of God, both in this life and in the hereafter (Nauta 2006: 152–90). He was followed by Bartolomeo Facio (before 1410–1457), whose On the Happiness of Life (De vitae felicitate) and On Human Excellence (De hominis excellentia) emphasized the bliss of contemplating of God (Trinkaus 1970: I, 200–29), while Marsilio Ficino highlighted the other-worldly dimension of felicity in his letter “On Happiness”. These writers drew on philosophical traditions outside of Aristotelianism in order to reinterpret and correct Aristotle’s concept of eudaimonia (Lines 2019a).

Another cause for concern was both the framing and the content of Aristotle’s account of the moral virtues. As a pagan, he gives no space to the workings of divine grace, assuming that education and habituation will, given enough motivation, produce the desired qualities and help people achieve the golden mean, say between avarice and prodigality or fear and reckless courage (Nicomachean Ethics, Book II). This created a difficulty especially for Protestant interpreters, who placed more emphasis than Catholic ones on the utter inability of unaided human effort to achieve the good. Love (the greatest of the Christian virtues) is missing in Aristotle, as is faith. Nor is there any place for other important virtues such as humility. A description of the fruit of the Holy Spirit given by the Apostle Paul is telling for its contrast with the pagan virtues: “The fruit of the Spirit is love, joy, peace, patience, kindness, goodness, faithfulness, gentleness, self-control” (Galatians 5:22–23 ESV). Christian commentators might therefore concede the usefulness of the discussion of the virtues that Aristotle does consider in Books III–V (the last one, justice, is especially important in a political setting), while maintaining that Aristotle’s partial account needs to be supplemented by the Christian message. This was the case for Melanchthon. He and others found it problematic that the constellation of Aristotelian virtues does not altogether map onto Christian ones. Nonetheless, the larger problem was that Aristotle’s discussion was clearly incomplete and lacked the power of the gospel message to produce virtue in human beings. In this area, only the work of the Holy Spirit is sufficient. Despite all of this, Melanchthon holds that the civic dimension of Aristotle’s virtues is important and deserves to be studied (Melanchthon 1532: sigs. Aiir–Biv).

The link Aristotle established between ethics and politics was also important from the perspective of the Christian Commonwealth. In Aristotle’s understanding of ethics, virtuous lawgivers were essential to help the young habituate themselves to the exercise of virtue. They would, in turn, be expected to continue to be virtuous upon taking office and promote virtue in others. Furthermore, Aristotle saw a continuity between the principles enunciated in the Ethics and those discussed in the Politics: it was simply a matter of broadening the scope from the individual to the community. All of this sat well with medieval assumptions (reliant in part on the Old Testament: see Proverbs and Sirach, also known as Ecclesiasticus) that saw rulers as paragons of both human virtue (justice, mercy, etc.) and godliness. On the Rule of Princes (De regimine principum) of Giles of Rome (†1316) is just one of numerous mirrors-for-princes reminding monarchs of the standards of behavior required. Writings by Italian humanists did not so much challenge this tie between virtue and princely office as extend the principle to republican constitutions, arguing for instance that the popolo itself needed to be virtuous in order to govern successfully and flourish. (This was an echo of biblical considerations: see Deuteronomy 5:1–11.) Yet some of these humanist writers saw matters, not so much in the perspective of Greek thought, where moral virtues enabled political self-mastery and the preservation of constitutions, but in the Roman one, which regarded them as conduits to military power and glory. A particularly telling example is Leonardo Bruni’s History of the Florentine People (Historiarum Florentinarum libri XII, finished in 1442). In various ways, this work anticipates the Roman emphasis of Niccolò Machiavelli’s (1469–1527) main political works (The Prince or Il principe and the Discourses on Livy or Discorsi sopra la prima deca di Tito Livio), with their concentration on political success (Hankins 2019: chs. 10 and 18–20). For Machiavelli, such success might be secured by respecting the agreed personal and communal virtues, but could also, if necessary, be pursued without them.

4.3 Aristotelianism and Other Philosophical Currents

In several cases, the questions explored in §4.2 about the compatibility of Aristotelianism with Christianity were closely joined together with the fluctuating fortunes of other philosophical currents from antiquity. One way of thinking about fifteenth- and sixteenth-century Aristotelianism is as an attempt to provide an alternative synthesis of Aristotelianism and Christianity to that supplied by Thomas Aquinas. There were, however, notable differences and challenges. First of all, philosophers such as Pomponazzi argued that philosophy and theology should both operate in autonomous spheres rather than mutually influence each other, as Thomas thought. Secondly, the number of sources to integrate was both far greater and more differentiated than that at Thomas’ disposal. This section focuses on the second phenomenon and offers a brief outline of the interplays between Aristotelianism and Renaissance Platonism, Stoicism, Epicureanism, and Skepticism. It also comments on the rise of anti-Aristotelianism.

Initially Renaissance thinkers thought of antiquity as subscribing to a common set of ideas with only minor variations, so that differences were only superficial and in verbis (a matter of words). As they became better acquainted with the multiple traditions of thought from antiquity, however, they came to realize that differences ran much deeper. This posed a number of challenges to the enterprise of baptizing pagan philosophy, but in some cases, it also revealed that effort to be largely futile. One positive outcome was, at times, a more critical attitude toward all ancient philosophical currents.

4.3.1 Platonism

The direct influence of Plato’s writings had been limited in the Middle Ages to just a few dialogues: the Meno, the Phaedo, and the initial part of the Timaeus. During the fifteenth century, many more of his writings appeared in Latin translation, greatly expanding his direct influence (Kraye 1988: 349–59). Scholars debated—often vehemently—the relative superiority of Aristotle or Plato (see, for example, the controversy between George of Trebizond and Bessarion after 1458; Monfasani 2021: 339–60). The full scope of Plato’s thought emerged from Marsilio Ficino’s watershed Latin edition of his works in 1484. (Translations of the Greek commentaries would follow.) As mentioned in §4.2.2, it seemed straightforward to integrate Plato’s teachings on the soul with Christian views, an operation encouraged by the example of influential Church Fathers such as Augustine. (Christians found some of Plato’s other views, such as the community of wives and property, rather harder to swallow; see Hankins 1990.) Ficino himself, though trained as a scholastic philosopher, was a major architect of the operation of bringing Aristotelianism, Platonism, and Christianity in line with each other, as testified by his important work Platonic Theology (Theologia Platonica). His approach was aided by his view of a perennial philosophy of which both the pagan and Mosaic traditions took part (Schmitt 1966). His example enjoyed many followers. In Paris, Jacques Lefèvre d’Étaples (c. 1460–1536) produced a large number of commentaries on Aristotle that offered a pious reading of the philosopher, often by resorting to a reframing of his ideas by turning to the more palatable Plato. In Italy, the kinsmen Alessandro and Francesco Piccolomini were likewise keen to see the two philosophers as complementary, rather than opposites. When Alessandro (1508–1579) published his second, retitled version of his vernacular treatment of Aristotle’s Ethics (Della institutione morale libri XII, 1560), he added to Aristotle’s books one on love and followed it immediately with a treatment of marriage and family. He was thus supplementing Aristotle’s ethical writings with a modified and Christianized version of Plato’s theory of love. Francesco (1523–1607), for his part, was extremely aware of (and reported on) the contemporary debate about what to do with Plato in his A Comprehensive Philosophy of Morals (Universa philosophia de moribus, 1583: 274–275). In contrast to those who thought they needed to exalt one ancient philosopher over the other (Mario Nizolio [1498–1566], for instance, or Francesco Patrizi da Cherso, and their preference for Plato), he described each philosopher as providing an indispensable eye and, therefore, ensuring correct vision. In his own treatise, in which God and a Christian afterlife take center stage, he modeled how ancient and Christian sources could be combined effectively (Lines 2002: 281–285). A similar inclination toward reconciling Plato and Aristotle can be seen in the Spanish humanist Sebastián Fox Morcillo (c. 1526–1560) and the Oxford professor John Case (1540/41?–1600). Case’s Mirror of Moral Questions on all the Ethics of Aristotle (Speculum moralium quaestionum in universam ethicen Aristotelis, 1585) treats Plato respectfully even when Aristotle does otherwise. This sympathy may be due in part to Case’s desire to show that Aristotle’s teaching on the soul accords with Christianity (Schmitt 1983b). Likewise, in the seventeenth century the so-called Cambridge Platonists—including prominent personalities such as Henry More (1614–1687) and Ralph Cudworth (1617–1688)—drew on several philosophical traditions, such as Aristotelianism and Stoicism, in addition to Platonism, while also giving careful consideration to issues bordering on theology, such as the existence of God and the immortality of the soul (Kraye 1998: 1290–93).

Although from a Christian perspective it seemed possible to combine Aristotelianism and Platonism (as seen above, the operation was not uncommon), it was harder to make Aristotelianism agree with other philosophical schools. Such currents therefore functioned more as alternatives than as possible complementary systems.

4.3.2 Stoicism

Stoic ideas circulated in the Renaissance both indirectly (through the influential works of Cicero) and, more directly, through the genuine and spurious writings of Seneca and through the Enchiridion of Epictetus. The latter work, first translated into Latin in the fifteenth century, became especially popular in the often-printed rendering of Angelo Poliziano. The Spanish humanist Juan Luis Vives (1493–1540) was a severe critic of Aristotelian ethics, preferring the tenets of Plato and, especially, the Stoics. He claimed in his Origins, Schools, and Merits of Philosophy (De initiis, sectis et laudibus philosophiae, 1518) that he did not think that there was any truer Christian than the Stoic sage. Nonetheless, Stoicism tended to have a hard time being accepted by thinkers (such as Erasmus and Michel de Montaigne [1533–1592]) who noted its austerity, focus on virtue alone, and problematic attitude toward suicide (which the sect condoned). Such points made it difficult to consider it compatible with Christianity (Kraye 1988: 367–70; Kraye 1998: 1286–90). The key figure in making Stoic philosophy more acceptable was the Flemish humanist Justus Lipsius (1547–1606). Lipsius provided a new edition of Seneca (1605), preceded by his Guide to Stoic Philosophy (Manuductio ad Stoicam philosophiam, 1604) and his Stoic Physiology (Physiologia Stoicorum, 1604). He went to great lengths to show how close Stoicism was to Christianity (Papy 2001) and had a significant influence on contemporaries such as the Spaniard Francisco de Quevedo (1580–1645), who went even further down the same path, but praised later Stoics above Seneca (Lines & Kraye 2013: 43–47).

4.3.3 Epicureanism and Skepticism

Quevedo, however, also had a strong interest in Epicureanism. Indeed, he thought of the two philosophies as broadly similar (and compatible with Christianity). He was one of the few in the Renaissance not to misrepresent the philosophy of Epicurus as a beast-like dedication to the senses and therefore something to be abhorred. In the process, however, he made Epicurus into a believer in the afterlife (largely because he was, again, keen to accommodate pagan philosophy with the Christian message). In his Defense of Epicurus against Commonly Held Opinions (Defensa de Epicuro, 1635), Quevedo was drawing on sources that had become newly available in the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries: Book X of the Lives of Philosophers by Diogenes Laertius, Lucretius’ poem De rerum natura, and Sextus Empiricus. The absence of both Aristotle and Plato might be viewed as an attempt to create an independent space for philosophical discussion: in other words, one free from the two dominant classical traditions but still loyal to Christian doctrine. Quevedo’s work was not yet an explicit critique of Aristotle such as that of his near-contemporary Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655). Gassendi’s Paradoxical Exercises against the Aristotelians (Exercitationes paradoxicae adversus Aristoteleos, 1624) shows him rejecting Aristotle’s essences and universals, as well as other aspects of his philosophy; since everything we know comes to us through the senses, but the senses are not reliable, it follows that our knowledge is uncertain as well. Thus, Aristotle’s method turns out to be faulty. Gassendi’s marriage of Epicureanism and skepticism contributed much to making Epicurean physics and ethics acceptable and even fashionable. Epicureanism became a direct threat to Aristotelianism (Kraye 1998: 1293–98). Another earlier and important attack on Aristotelianism from a skeptic viewpoint was that of Francisco Sanches (1551–1623), whose That Nothing is Known (Quod nihil scitur, 1581) strongly targets the methods and conclusions of Aristotle and his followers (Popkin 2003).

4.3.4 Late Anti-Aristotelianism

Some of the strongest attacks on Aristotle and Aristotelianism came toward the end of the sixteenth century in Italy (see Martin 2014: 113–120). Francesco Patrizi’s Peripatetic Discussions (Discussiones peripateticae, 1571 and 1581) strongly questions the authenticity of the received Aristotelian corpus, outlines the rise of numerous sects of divergent interpretations, and by contrast endorses the accuracy of Averroes’ interpretations. His New Philosophy of the Universe (Nova de universis philosophia, 1591) outlined the ways in which Aristotle’s philosophy was inconsistent with Christian principles and pointed to the usefulness of Plato instead. Girolamo Cardano (1501–1576), Bernardino Telesio (1509–1588), Giordano Bruno (1548–1600), and Tommaso Campanella (1568–1639) promoted a brand of empiricist naturalism that often relied on Epicurean, Hermetic, or astrological influences and could stray into theologically questionable areas of pantheism and pansensism (Copenhaver & Schmitt 1992: 285–328). The experimental and mathematical approach of Galileo Galilei (1564–1642), along with his scientific discoveries, implicitly challenged both Aristotelian physics and cosmology, while trying not to appear to disrupt traditional interpretations of Scripture. The Paduan professor Cesare Cremonini (1550–1631) indicated numerous areas in which Aristotle’s philosophy disagreed with Christianity, although he insisted on his obligation to teach Aristotle’s text, even in areas in which it was contrary to Christian dogma. The Italian innovators (novatores), together with others like Francisco Sanches, are known to have influenced French thinkers such as Marin Mersenne (1588–1648) and René Descartes (1596–1650), whose parting of ways with Aristotle was perhaps less radical and momentous than they themselves claimed.

In England (unlike in Protestant Germany), several scholars were prejudiced against Aristotelianism because of its historical ties with Catholicism and leveled what might seem to be unjust criticisms against it. Furthermore, several English writers, drawing on the writings of the Dutch thinker Gerardus Johannes Vossius (1577–1649), contended that Aristotle had improperly identified nature with God. Francis Bacon, in his De dignitate et augmentis scientiarum (1623, a Latin reworking of The Advancement of Learning of 1605), noted that this perspective both unduly looked for final causes in physics rather than in metaphysics and ignored the greatest final cause of all (i.e., God). The outcome, he thought, was detrimental to science. Here the distinctive position of English thinkers needs to be kept in mind, with the double threat they perceived from both Catholicism and anti-Trinitarianism (Martin 2014: ch. 8).

Challenges to Aristotelianism also came from other modern developments such as international law theory. This is particularly evident with regard to Aristotle’s views on slavery. His Politics was written in a context in which owning slaves was widespread, and he justified the practice through the concept of “natural slavery” (Book I). During the Middle Ages and the Renaissance, this conception went largely unchallenged: slaves (especially from the Mediterranean and northern Africa) continued to be a common sight in cities. It was only with the Spanish activities of conquest and enslavement in the New World that the practice was called into question. At the famous debate of Valladolid (1550–1551), Juan Ginés de Sepúlveda (1490–1573) and the Dominican Bartolomé de Las Casas (1484–1566) argued for and against the doctrine of natural slavery respectively. Domingo de Soto supported the doctrine, applying the ius gentium to the context of the colonies. The point was not an academic one, since it concerned the right of the Spanish crown to deprive Amerindians in their colonies of their independence and property. However, as is well known, arguments for emancipation led to abolitionism only in the nineteenth century.

5. Sources, Reference Works, and Desiderata

Our current understanding of Renaissance Aristotelianism has been greatly aided by several valiant (but nonetheless incomplete) bibliographical enterprises, which have provided the foundation for many modern studies of Aristotelianism. Lohr 1988– (still missing volume 4) is an attempt to register most medieval and Renaissance commentaries on Aristotle in Latin, including both manuscripts and printed editions. Arranged alphabetically by author, the entries give the incipits and explicits of manuscript works and provide helpful biographical and bibliographical information, including secondary literature. Note that volume 2 (Renaissance Authors, 1500–1650) in many cases does not reproduce the full secondary literature that was included in Lohr’s original articles from the 1970s and 1980s (see Bibliography). It also does not include anonymous titles, and in a few rare cases entirely misses out a significant author (such as Ulisse Aldrovandi). Given the focus on Latin, works in the vernacular are not considered.

At the other extreme of comprehensiveness is Risse 1998, which does not focus on Aristotelian works alone, but in principle includes all printed philosophical works (not only commentaries) up to 1800. Risse divides these into categories, so that all works of logic, for instance, sit in the same volume. In each volume the entries are arranged chronologically and are accompanied by a minimum of bibliographical information. Works of all kinds and languages jostle side by side. The result can be illuminating, but it is very hard to judge from just a title whether a particular item, for example, is a commentary, a translation, or something else. A significant drawback is that no manuscript information is given; moreover, given the evolution of digital bibliographical tools in recent decades, it is likely that many items have been overlooked.

There are also more specialized inventories. Cranz and Schmitt 1984 gives a chronologically ordered list of editions of Aristotle in the sixteenth century. Again, the bibliographical details provided are scant, but can be useful to help trace, say, the multiple editions of a particular work. It thus has several of the drawbacks and virtues of Risse’s repertory. The most recent contender, Lohr 2023, follows the standard order of the Aristotelian canon and then lists Latin editions by first year of printing and translator. This repertory, published posthumously, gives the reader a handy overview of the number of printed translations of each “Aristotelian” work. It rightly includes incipits and explicits for all items. Scholars may, however, find disappointing the lack of an index of such incipits and, especially, the decision by the editors to limit the number of pseudographs originally included by Lohr. Nonetheless, this volume may serve as a useful basis for further research, not least because its chronological span is quite broad (1450 to 1650).

Finally, some scholars have published more targeted repertories. In 2006 Lawrence Green published a much-updated listing of printed Renaissance works on rhetoric (Green & Murphy 2006). This is another mammoth and useful enterprise. Although it runs the risk of being overtaken by newer cataloguing tools, it nevertheless allows the user to compare, say, Cicero editions and commentaries with those of Aristotle. Green also tackled the problem of “ghosts” by physically inspecting as many items as possible. Others have studied the reception of a particular Aristotelian work in a more restricted geographical context, such as the commentaries and other works on the Nicomachean Ethics in the Italian peninsula (Lines 2002: 472–539). Even here, though, there are limitations, such as a focus on Latin works only. That deficiency has now been addressed through an online, freely accessible database on Vernacular Aristotelianism in Renaissance Italy, c. 1400–c. 1650 (Other Internet Resources). This project, now in need of updating, has offered a different perspective on some of the various linguistic engagements with Aristotle during the period.

Although these tools can provide substantial advances for the study of Renaissance Aristotelianism, many of its facets continue to be poorly understood. Several other aspects require further research, including the following:

  • the extent to which Aristotle’s thought was really followed in teaching contexts
  • the effectiveness of both Catholic and Protestant ecclesiastical authorities in containing “heretical” interpretations of Aristotle’s writings
  • the proportion between Latin and vernacular works on Aristotle
  • the development and significance of anti-Aristotelianism
  • humanism and Aristotelianism
  • women writers on Aristotle
  • the role played by Greek scholars such as Johannes Argyropoulos and Theodore Gaza
  • the influence of the ancient and medieval (Byzantine) Greek commentaries
  • the changes to Aristotelianism brought about by print
  • the distinctive features of medieval and Renaissance Aristotelianism
  • the language(s) and form(s) in which Aristotelianism was expressed

In addition to confronting some of these issues, future research ought to edit or translate the most significant works on Aristotle produced in the Renaissance. Kraye 1997 already provides a helpful series of translated extracts of philosophical works, including from commentaries and other works on ethics and politics. More recently, Emidio Campi and Joseph McLelland supplied an English translation of the Ethics commentary of Pier Martire Vermigli (Vermigli 1563 [2006]) and Luca Baschera and Christian Moser reedited the Latin text (Vermigli 2011), while Vittoria Perrone Compagni has produced a number of commented Italian translations of Pomponazzi’s works. This kind of difficult (but indispensable) work will need to be complemented by continuing attention to other features of Aristotle’s reception, including the cultural and institutional contexts in which it took place.


A. Primary Literature

  • Aristotle, The Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, 2 volumes, Jonathan Barnes (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Bruni, Leonardo, “On the Correct Way to Translate” (“De interpretatione recta” [1424/1426]), in Gordon Griffiths, James Hankins, and David Thompson (eds.), The Humanism of Leonardo Bruni: Selected Texts, Binghamton, NY: Medieval and Renaissance Texts and Studies, 1987, pp. 217–229.
  • Erculiani, Camilla, Letters on Natural Philosophy: The Scientific Correspondence of a Sixteenth-Century Pharmacist, with Related Texts, Eleonora Carinci (ed.), Hannah Marcus (trans.), Toronto: Iter Press, 2021.
  • Melanchthon, Philipp, 1532, In Primum, secundum, tercium et quintum Ethicorum commentarii, Wittenberg: Iosephus Clug.
  • Petrarch, Francis, De sui ipsius et multorum ignorantia, translated as On His Own Ignorance and That of Many Others, in CKR: 47–133.
  • Piccolomini, Francesco, Universa philosophia de moribus … in decem gradus redacta et explicata, Venice: Francesco Franceschi Senese, 1583.
  • Pomponazzi, Pietro, 1525, Tractatus acutissimi, utillimi et mere peripatetici, Venice: heirs of Ottaviano Scoto. Reprinted in his Tutti i trattati peripatetici, J. M. García Valverde (ed.), Milan: Bompiani, 2013.
  • Vermigli, Peter Martyr, 1563, In primum, secundum et tertii libri Ethicorum Aristotelis ad Nicomachum, Zurich. Translated as Commentary on Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethicc (The Peter Martyr Library, ser. I, v. 9), Emidio Campi and Joseph C. McLelland (eds.), Kirksville, MO: Truman State University Press, 2006.
  • –––, 2011. Kommentar zur Nikomachischen Ethik des Aristoteles (Studies in Medieval and Reformation Traditions: Texts & Sources), Luca Baschera and Christian Moser (eds.), Leiden: Brill.


  • [CKR] Cassirer, Ernst, Paul Oskar Kristeller, and John Herman Randall, Jr. (eds.), 1948, The Renaissance Philosophy of Man: Petrarca, Valla, Ficino, Pico, Pomponazzi, Vives, Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Kraye, Jill (ed.), 1997, Cambridge Translations of Renaissance Philosophical Texts, 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511803048


  • Cranz, F. Edward and Charles B. Schmitt, 1984, A Bibliography of Aristotle Editions, 1501–1600, 2nd edition, Baden-Baden: V. Koerner.
  • Lohr, Charles H., 1974, “Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries: Authors A-B”, Studies in the Renaissance, 21: 228–289. doi:10.2307/2857156
  • –––, 1975, “Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries: Authors C”, Renaissance Quarterly, 28(4): 689–741.
  • –––, 1976, “Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries: Authors D–F”, Renaissance Quarterly, 29(4): 717–745.
  • –––, 1977, “Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries: Authors G–K”, Renaissance Quarterly, 30(4): 681–741.
  • –––, 1978, “Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries: Authors L–M”, Renaissance Quarterly, 31(4): 532–603.
  • –––, 1979, “Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries: Authors N–Ph”, Renaissance Quarterly, 32(4): 529–580.
  • –––, 1980, “Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries: Authors Pi–Sm”, Renaissance Quarterly, 33(4): 623–734.
  • –––, 1982, “Renaissance Latin Aristotle Commentaries: Authors So–Z”, Renaissance Quarterly, 35(2): 164–256.
  • –––, 1988–, Latin Aristotle Commentaries, 5 volumes planned, Florence: Olschki and Florence: SISMEL.
    • Volume 1, Medieval Authors, 2 books, 1988.
    • Volume 2, Renaissance Authors, 1988.
    • Volume 3, Index initiorum, Index finium, 1995
    • Volume 5, Bibliography of Secondary Literature, 2005.
  • –––, 2023, The Aristotelian Tradition (1200–1650): Translations, Themes and Editions, Chrisoph Lüthy and Andrea Aldo Robiglio (eds.), 2 volumes, Florence: SISMEL,
    • volume II, Latin Aristotle Editions (1450–1650).
  • Green, Lawrence D. and James J. Murphy, 2006, Renaissance Rhetoric Short-Title Catalogue 1460–1700, revised and expanded edition, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Risse, Wilhelm, 1998, Bibliographia philosophica vetus: Repertorium generale systematicum operum philosophicorum usque ad annum MDCCC typis impressorum, 9 volumes, Hildesheim: G. Olms.

B. Secondary Literature

  • Akopyan, Ovanes (ed.), 2019, “Francesco Patrizi Da Cherso (1529–1597): New Perspectives on a Renaissance Philosopher”, special issue of Intellectual History Review, 29(4): 541–617.
  • Andreoni, Annalisa, 2012, “La via della dottrina”: le lezioni accademiche di Benedetto Varchi (Alla giornata 9), Pisa: ETS.
  • Ashworth, E. Jennifer, 1974, Language and Logic in the Post-Medieval Period (Synthese Historical Library 12), Dordrecht/Boston: Reidel. doi:10.1007/978–94–010–2226–2
  • –––, 1988, “Logic and Language: Traditional Logic”, in Schmitt et al. 1988: 143–172 (ch. 6).
  • Bianchi, Luca (ed.), 1997, La filosofia nelle università, secoli XIII–XIV, Scandicci: La Nuova Italia.
  • –––, 2003, “Una caduta senza declino? Considerazioni sulla crisi dell’aristotelismo fra Rinascimento ed Età moderna”, in her Studi sull’aristotelismo del Rinascimento, Padua: Il Poligrafo, pp. 133–183.
  • ––– (ed.), 2011, Christian Readings of Aristotle from the Middle Ages to the Renaissance, Turnhout: Brepols.
  • Bianchi, Luca and Eugenio Randi, 1990, Le verità dissonanti: Aristotele alla fine del Medioevo, Rome: Laterza.
  • Bianchi, Luca, Simon Gilson, and Jill Kraye (eds.), 2016, Vernacular Aristotelianism in Italy from the Fourteenth to the Seventeenth Century, London: The Warburg Institute.
  • Biard, Joël and Fosca Mariani Zini (eds.), 2010, Les lieux de l’argumentation. Histoire du syllogisme topique d’Aristote à Leibniz, Turnhout: Brepols (Studia Artistarum).
  • Blackwell, Constance and Sachiko Kusukawa (eds.), 1999, Philosophy in the Sixteenth and Seventeenth Centuries: Conversations with Aristotle, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Blum, Paul Richard, 1990, Aristoteles bei Giordano Bruno: Studien zur philosophische Rezeption, Munich: W. Fink.
  • –––, 2012, Studies on Early Modern Aristotelianism, Leiden: E.J. Brill.
  • Blum, Paul Richard, with Constance Blackwell and Charles Lohr (eds.), 1999, Sapientiam Amemus: Humanismus und Aristotelismus in der Renaissance, Munich: Wilhelm Fink.
  • Brazeau, Bryan (ed.), 2020, The Reception of Aristotle’s Poetics in the Italian Renaissance and Beyond: New Directions in Criticism, London: Bloomsbury Academic (Bloomsbury Studies in the Aristotelian Tradition).
  • Brockliss, Laurence W. B., 1987, French Higher Education in the Seventeenth and Eighteenth Centuries: A Cultural History, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Cabrini, Aanna Maria, 2007, “Alberti e Senofonte”, in Alberti e la tradizione: per lo “smontaggio” dei “mosaici” albertiani, Roberto Cardini and Mariangela Regoliosi, Florence: Polistampa, pp. 21–46.
  • Connell, William J., 2011, “The Eternity of the World and Renaissance Historical Thought”, California Italian Studies, 2(1): 23 pages. doi:10.5070/C321008977
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