First published Tue May 7, 2019; substantive revision Wed Jun 19, 2019

Cancer is a worldwide epidemic. It is the first or second leading cause of death before age 70 in ninety-one countries, as of 2015. According to the International Agency for Research on Cancer, “there will be an estimated 18.1 million new cancer cases and 9.6 million cancer deaths in 2018,” and cancer is expected to be the “leading cause of death in every country of the world in the 21st century” (Bray, et al. 2018). While overall cancer mortality has declined in the U.S. annually since 2005, progress has been slow in some cases, and mortality is rising in others. In particular, “death rates rose from 2010 to 2014 by almost 3% per year for liver cancer and by about 2% per year for uterine cancer,” and, “pancreatic cancer death rates continued to increase slightly (by 0.3% per year) in men” (Siegel, et al. 2017). Perhaps not surprisingly, then, cancer is a central topic of biomedical research, drawing millions of federal dollars annually. In 2019, the U.S. National Cancer Institute (NCI) will allocate $5.74 billion in federal dollars, a $79 million increase over 2018 (NCI, 2019—see the Other Internet Resources). A search for the term “cancer” in PubMed returns over three million hits.

Despite this, cancer—and scientific research on cancer—has received relatively little attention from philosophers of science. However, this is starting to change, as cancer, and scientific research on cancer, raises a variety of compelling philosophical questions. This entry will focus on four topics, which philosophers of science have begun to explore and debate.

First, scientific classifications of cancer have as yet failed to yield a unified taxonomy. There is a diversity of classificatory schemes for cancer, and while some are hierarchical, others appear to be “cross-cutting,” or non-nested. Initially, researchers investigating cancer genomics seemed to think such issues might be resolved by molecular “subtyping”. However, genomic sequencing and its sequelae—transcriptomics, proteomics, epigenomics, etc.—have, if anything, complicated cancer classification. This literature thus raises a variety of questions about the nature of the disease and disease classification: Are there some classifications that are more useful, or better than others? What makes a classification a good one? What does it mean to track more or less “natural” distinctions in the context of disease? Is such talk of the “naturalness” of disease categories simply confused? The problem of cancer classification is complicated by the fact that cancer progression is a process with a complex natural history. Thus, cancer serves as a challenging case for disease classification, and also for demarcating disease from health, raising intriguing questions about the potential role(s) of precautionary values in cancer diagnosis.

Second, philosophers of science have historically taken the aim of science to be arriving at true theories. However, scientists studying cancer come from a variety of disciplines, with different scientific as well as practical aims. Perhaps it is not surprising, then, that historians and philosophers of science do not seem to agree on how best to characterize the aim and structure of cancer research; it is far from clear whether the appropriate characterization of the aim is arriving at true theories, or even whether the proper units of analysis are “theories”, or instead, “models”, “explanatory frameworks”, “research programs”, “paradigms”, or perhaps, “experimental traditions”. With the rise of “big data” science—such as the Cancer Genome Atlas Project (or TCGA)—and “systems” approaches to the study of disease, both philosophers and historians of science are rethinking how best to describe and explain these distinctive kinds of scientific inquiry.

Third, cancer is in part a byproduct of our developmental and life history, as well as our evolutionary history. Cancer progression can be compared to a reversion of development, or, to the evolution of multicellularity. Thus, cancer raises intriguing questions about how we conceive of “functions”, “development”, and the role of our evolutionary history and particularly, selective trade-offs, in vulnerability to disease.

Last but not least, cancer research provides a case study for consideration of the roles of values at the science-policy interface. Epidemiological and toxicological research on cancer’s causes informs toxics law and regulatory policy, which raises a variety of questions about the nature of evidence and inductive risk in such contexts. Cancer research also provides a test case for debates about the challenges facing translational medicine and precision medicine. Moreover, the complexity of cancer causation provides an opportunity and a challenge for those who take data and theoretical integration to be an ideal for science. With so many, and such diverse types of cancer research, integration presents many challenges. Indeed, this is one of the many reasons why translating “basic” science into the clinic can be enormously difficult.

1. Defining and Classifying Cancer

What is cancer? Is cancer one disease, or many? If many, how many cancers are there? One might think that such questions are merely empirical. However, it turns out that defining and classifying cancer is contested, for at least two reasons. First, there is little agreement on how to classify disease, more generally. Second, cancer itself poses a variety of challenges—both in terms of its intrinsic heterogeneity, and in light of its variable natural history. In section 1.1, we will consider challenges facing cancer classification in light of cancer’s intrinsic heterogeneity, and in section 1.2, we will consider challenges facing cancer classification in light of its variable natural history.

Prima facie, what distinguishes diseases are typical symptoms, disease course, and a common cause. The last criterion—common cause—is inherited from a model of disease classifications that grew in part out of the successes of the germ theory of disease (Carter 2003). Following Koch’s postulates (1884), what enables one to distinguish diseases is the ability to isolate a causal agent as present in each and every case of characteristic symptoms. Unfortunately, such a model of disease is not terribly helpful for cancer. Cancer can be present without clinically detectable symptoms, has variable disease course, and is a “multifactorial” disease—there are many causes of cancer. It is rather difficult to pick out a “causal bottleneck” uniquely necessary for cancer, let alone each cancer type and subtype. While cancers are typically classified by their cell-of-origin—or the tissue, or organ, and cell-type where they originated (e.g., squamous cell carcinoma of the skin or ovaries), it turns out that cancers can contain mixes of different cells of origin, and cancers arising in the same cells or tissues can have very different features. Moreover, cancers with many of the same features (at least initially), may evolve in different ways, and have different vulnerability to treatment (Marusyk, et al. 2012). How, then, are we to classify such poorly behaving kinds?

Classifications of cancer have largely been in service of diagnosis, prognosis, and treatment decisions. Oncologists, surgeons and pathologists typically classify cancer types and subtypes, in light of organ and tissue type of origin (such as leukemia, or glioma), broadly shared signs and symptoms, disease course, gross histopathology (size, shape and rate of division of cells), and “biomarkers” (e.g., estrogen sensitivity, genetic profile). Solid tumors (of the lung, for instance) may be classified as either “benign,” or “malignant,” and malignant cancers can present at different “stages” and have different “grades.” Pathologists use various measures (e.g., size, extent of lymphatic involvement, number of metastases, number of lymphocytes (white blood cells)) to estimate stage of progression of the disease. “Grade” is a term used to classify solid tumors in light of other measures (e.g., degree of “dedifferentiation” of cells in a tumor—or loss of characteristics typical of a breast, prostate, or colon cells and tissue) and is taken to indicate likely disease course. Decisions about staging criteria are conventionally agreed upon by specialists in oncology and pathology, though informed by the best available evidence. Early stage disease can be very difficult to classify, and thus also to know whether (or how) treat. And, some cancers seem particularly recalcitrant to treatment. This led researchers to ask: Are there distinctive genetic or molecular “signatures” of each cancer that can help us estimate risk of progression, or chances of recurrence, as well as predict responses to treatment? Perhaps these molecular signatures are the key to a natural taxonomy of cancer types and subtypes?

1.1 Cancer’s Intrinsic Heterogeneity

The Cancer Genome Atlas (TCGA) project, a federally funded U.S. research program, supported jointly by the National Cancer Institute (NCI) and National Human Genome Research Institute (NHGRI), sought to characterize the genomic features of each cancer type and subtype, resulting in thirty-three “marker” papers, laying out molecular features of each cancer type, often yielding novel subclassifications of each type. For example, in 2016, a working group affiliated with TCGA published “Comprehensive Pan-Genomic Characterization of Adrenocortical Carcinoma,” which identified three subtypes of adrenocortical carcinoma, and in 2015, another working group published “Comprehensive Genomic Characterization of Head and Neck Squamous Cell Carcinomas,” which identified specific mutations associated with human-papillomavirus-associated versus smoking-related head and neck cancers. While TCGA did result in a more comprehensive understanding of cancer biology, it also raised many questions. One particular challenge has been determining which mutations to which genes are the “drivers” of cancer, or which ones enable cancer cells to “succeed” in an environment that would (ordinarily) prevent their growth. Cancer genomes have many mutations, so a central puzzle has been determining which among the many changes to cancer genomes are causally relevant to cancer progression. Solving this puzzle has been difficult, because cancers are far more heterogeneous than they initially anticipated. Or, perhaps it is better to say: sorting the “signal” from the noise has proven more difficult than anticipated, as Meyerson, et al. (2010) explains, paraphrasing Tolstoi:

… normal human genomes are all alike, but every cancer genome is abnormal in its own way. Specifically, cancer genomes vary considerably in their mutation frequency,… in global copy number or ploidy, and in genome structure… (Meyerson, et al. 2010)

In other words, there are very different rates, numbers and types of mutations across and within different cancer types and subtypes. Which ones matter, how, and how much, in different cancer types and subtypes, and indeed, over the course of cancer progression, is a difficult puzzle to solve. Complicating this further, a cancer may contain several subpopulations of cells (or, multiple evolving lineages), with different numbers and types of mutations within each lineage. That is, cancers have varying types and degrees of “intratumor heterogeneity.” So, samples of a tumor taken when cancer is first diagnosed may be representative of only one subpopulation of an early stage of a dynamic process. Such samples may not be representative of the genomic changes of greatest relevance to treatment-resistant late stage disease. Yet, it is late-stage disease that we need better tools to more effectively intervene upon; most cancers—if caught early—can be treated relatively effectively.

All this would be challenging enough as it is, but there is a yet further challenge to cancer classification. Cancers arising in the same tissue or organ can be more genetically dissimilar than cancers arising in different tissues or organs. Or, “cell-of-origin influences, but does not fully determine, tumor classification” (Hoadley, et al. 2014, 2018). Genomic information, far from providing a way to sort all cancers into a Linnean hierarchy, instead yields what philosophers have called cross-cutting classifications (Khalidi, 1998). One might think genetic profile should trump tissue or cell of origin for purposes of classification. But it turns out that where a cancer arises in the body is rather important to know. Characteristics of the tissues and organs in which a cancer arises shape the course of disease in a complex fashion (Öhlund, et al. 2017; Fessler, et al. 2016). Moreover, the rise of epigenomics, proteomics, and transcriptomics, and “regulomics” generates further challenges with classification, suggesting genomic information needs to be supplemented. For instance, it turns out changes in microRNA in cancer cells—non-coding RNA, which affects the expression of genes—can affect cancer initiation, progression, and responses to drugs (Hrovatin, et al. 2018). This is just one of several “extra-genomic” factors that play an important role in cancer causation and thus, presumably, ought to play at least a partial role in informing cancer taxonomy.

This does not exhaust all factors of causal relevance to cancer onset, and thus also (at least potentially) classification. Family history and inherited (as opposed to somatic) mutations, life history (e.g. parity, or number of children, and age at first birth), environmental exposures, and histories of infection, inflammation, and immune response, contribute differentially to cancer’s age of onset, rate of progression, histopathology, and response to treatment. For instance, infectious agents (e.g., HPV- or HCV-) are associated with cervical and liver cancers, and some proportion of esophageal cancers (Cancer Genome Atlas, 2015). Cancers of the prostate and breast are associated with hormonal environments, which are in turn affected by parity (number of pregnancies). “Pregnancy-associated” breast cancers are cancers that arise during or shortly after pregnancy (see, e.g., Schedin 2006). The “same” cancer in the same tissue or organ can be classified as either “somatic,” or “familial”—due in part to whether the patient possesses inherited mutations, such as those with Li Fraumeni syndrome. Smoking associated lung cancers and non-smoking associated lung cancers are distinct genetically, epigenetically, and phenotypically (i.e., in terms of both gross pathology, and course of progression, as well as response to treatment). Which of these several causal factors ought to figure centrally in classification? Depending upon how fine-grained a characterization of the causal basis of cancer one adopts, there could be hundreds or thousands of cancer types and subtypes. It’s far from clear whether there is one obvious choice of causal basis that best reflects anything like a “natural” division of type and subtypes. Indeed, this case raises the larger question of whether one can or should expect a univocal classification of multifactorial disease, or indeed, of disease more generally. Are diseases, such as cancer, “natural” kinds? Or, are they simply ways of carving up the world that we happen to find useful? Is the ‘naturalness’ of a classification in science a matter of degree?

Several philosophers have weighed in on the matter of the nature of disease and disease classification (see, e.g., Ereshefsky, et al. 2015; Lange 2007; Broadbent 2009 and 2015; Williams 2011; Khalidi 2013; Sorenson 2011). The questions these authors are addressing are both epistemic—what warrants choice of criteria of classification of disease—and metaphysical—given diseases like cancer lack “essential” properties, is it correct to think of disease “kinds” as “natural”?

Lange (2007) for instance, argues that, “a disease is a natural kind of incapacity that features in interesting function-analytic explanations of other unhealthful incapacities”(Lange, 2007, 266). Cancer is not a “natural kind,” in his view, because the “typical patterns of disruption of cell birth and death” characteristic of cancer are multiply realized. Categories like “breast cancer” or “lung cancer” seem to be increasingly replaced in modern medicine by appeal to molecular subtypes. Molecular subtypes of cancer are not, however, “natural kinds of incapacity,” on Lange’s view, and so are not distinct diseases. Indeed, many “disease kinds” lack unifying “function-analytic” explanations. Thus, modern medicine has, in a sense, led to the “end of diseases” as natural kinds. In a similar vein, but for very different reasons, Sorenson (2011) argues that diseases are “para-natural” kinds. Insofar as diseases are “deficiencies,” or “departures from the norm,” they lack the “integrity” or “internal nature” characteristic of natural kinds. Diseases are “reflections” of natural kinds of process. They “inherit the lawfulness and projectability of the natural kinds that shape them.” In other words, both Lange and Sorenson seem similarly skeptical that diseases are natural kinds.

In contrast, while Broadbent (2009, 2015), Williams (2011), and Khalidi (2013) agree that diseases lack essential properties, they claim that disease classifications in light of distinctive causes, or types of cause, either pick out distinctive “deviations from normal functional ability,” or (in Khalidi's case) homeostatic property cluster kinds. For instance, Broadbent’s (2009, 2015) “contrastive” model of disease classification roughly takes diseases to be distinct in light of distinctive causes. Where there is a difference in at least one of a set of causes shared by “controls” and “cases” (where cases are identified in light of “parts and processes deviating (negatively) from normal functional ability”), we have a distinct disease. Broadbent takes this account to explain why, for instance, “cervical cancer is a disease, but HPV-itis is not.” Though, it’s not clear that HPV-itis is not properly regarded as a legitimate disease category; or, at least, this case raises an interesting question as to whether potential, rather than overt, dysfunction is more central to disease designation. In public health contexts, whether a strain of HPV causes cancer or not is not as important as deploying interventions that limit the spread of HPV more generally. Strains of HPV that do not currently cause cancer could well evolve the capacity to do so. So, perhaps from a public health perspective, “HPV-itis” is a perfectly legitimate disease category. That is, from a preventive medicine perspective, what matters is that a disease category is a good one for predicting and intervening, even where functional disruption does not always (or even most of the time) eventuate. Which choice of classification we ought to make in demarcating disease types, in other words, might depend on not only on which contrast we are interested in explaining retrospectively, but also which kind of intervention we wish to promote prospectively.

Khalidi (2013) argues that cancer might be a homeostatic property cluster kind. Khalidi argues that cancer is driven by “homeostatic” mechanisms—namely, mutations to “caretaker” genes, or genes that play a “gatekeeping” role in preventing or permitting the emergence of a tumor. Acquisition of mutations to specific “caretaker” genes, on this view, serve a function akin to Boyd’s (1999) “homeostatic mechanisms,” in that they permit the further acquisition of “hallmark” properties of cancer cells. Khalidi is drawing upon a very common view of cancer, articulated by two famous cancer researchers, Hanahan and Weinberg (2000, 2011). They identify what they take to be the “hallmarks” of cancer: “a small number of molecular, biochemical, and cellular traits—acquired capabilities—shared by most and perhaps all types of human cancer.” They identified these “six essential alterations in cell physiology that collectively dictate malignant growth” as: self-sufficiency in growth signals, insensitivity to antigrowth signals, evasion of apoptosis (cell death), sustained angiogenesis (the ability to develop a blood supply), tissue invasion and metastasis (Hanahan, et al. 2000, 57). By way of example of a caretaker, TP53 is called a tumor suppressor, because it carries the function of sensing and responding to signals associated with cell damage, typically inducing apoptosis, or cell death. It is one of the only genes mutated in a majority of cancers sequenced (Bailey, et al. 2018), and Weinberg (2013) characterizes it as “master guardian and executioner,” in that it prevents further mutations by inducing cell death where there are signs of trouble. On Khalidi’s view, one ought to understand disruption of these very specific capacities as a “homeostatic mechanism” for cancer.

At first blush, this seems a vivid case of a homeostatic property cluster kind. However, demarcating mechanisms is far from straightforward. Where we take a mechanism to begin and end is in large part a pragmatic matter (Craver 2009); so, depending upon how we carve up the “homeostatic mechanisms for” cancer, we can yield many or few cancer subtypes. As perhaps may have been expected, Hanahan and Weinberg’s initial picture has been complicated since 2001. In 2011, Hanahan and Weinberg updated their hallmarks to include four more: “genome instability, which generates the genetic diversity that expedites their acquisition, and inflammation, which fosters multiple hallmark functions… reprogramming of energy metabolism, and evading immune destruction.” And, “In addition to cancer cells, tumors exhibit another dimension of complexity: they contain a repertoire of recruited, ostensibly normal cells that contribute to the acquisition of hallmark traits by creating the tumor microenvironment” (2011, 646). In other words, hallmarks of cancer appear to no longer involve all and only intrinsic properties of cancer cells, but also dynamic interactions between cancer cells and the immune system and extra-tumor environment. This may not be such a serious challenge to Khalidi’s view that caretaker mutation are mechanisms for cancer; one could, arguably, just expand the mechanisms for homeostasis to the tumor microenvironment. However, such a strategy is complicated by the context-sensitivity of mechanism activation. Many cells on the surface of the skin as we age possess as many mutations to “caretaker” genes as those in a breast tumor, but most such skin cells are shed (Martincorena, et al. 2015). The “same” mechanisms may well lead to harm in one context, and be entirely harmless in another.

The larger concern cases like this raise is whether there is one way to privilege choice of causal basis for classifying diseases like cancer. Different choice of temporal or spatial scale, or more or less fine-grained characterization of causal processes, might yield multiple, overlapping disease classifications. While some may be willing to bite this bullet, and indeed, endorse pluralism and non-hierarchical classifications (see, e.g., Khalidi 1998, 2013), others might be concerned that this would yield too permissive an array of disease types. More generally, whether and how scientific researchers and clinicians are likely to to converge on a common classification for cancer raises some interesting puzzles about the aims and methods of classification in the biomedical sciences more generally. That genomic features of cancer are unlikely to unproblematically yield a natural taxonomy suggests that a reductive picture of disease classification is more generally implausible. It seems that classifications of disease like cancer form a kind of ‘hybrid’—they are intended to capture natural regularities and their causes, but also to be of use for a wide array of agents with different purposes. It’s unclear whether all these purposes can be served by one univocal method or set of classificatory criteria.

1.2 Cancer’s Variable Natural History

One further complication surrounding classification in the case of cancer, is that cancers have variable disease course (Foulds 1958; Cairns 1975; Lynch 2007; Bertolaso & Dupré 2018). Not all cancers progress uniformly to metastasis and death; some growths progress slowly or not at all. Some very common cancers (in the prostate and thyroid) are either slow growing, or tend to remain “indolent” (Esserman, et al. 2013; Siegel, et al. 2017). There is some disagreement in the medical community about how to characterize such cases; it’s unclear in many cases whether they are best viewed as very slow growing precancerous lesions, or perhaps ought not be characterized as “cancer” at all. Such cases raise a host of practical questions about the merits of screening, and the risk of overdiagnosis—the diagnosis of disease that might never have progressed in the lifetime of the patient (see, e.g., Walker & Rogers 2016; Hofman 2017; Esserman, et al. 2013; Welch & Black 2010), but they also raise interesting philosophical questions about the nature of disease.

Some philosophers (Schwartz 2014), drawing upon the biostatistical theory of disease as departure from age and sex-typical function (Boorse 1977), argue that we ought to classify such early stage cancers as risk factors, rather than disease. Such growths are not disease, on this view, because they are not atypical and do not as yet impair function—in fact as many as one half of men over 60 have some lesions the prostate (Welch & Black 2010). Reclassification of such cancers as mere risk factors, it’s hoped, will prevent overdiagnosis and overtreatment. Other philosophers less sympathetic to the biostatistical approach (e.g., Reid 2016) argue that this approach fails to acknowledge how the practice of diagnosis is itself a sort of risk-benefit calculation, informed in part by our knowledge of the prevalence of early stage growths like DCIS (ductal carcinoma in situ), or indolent prostate disease, and in part by more or less precautionary values. As we’ve learned how common such indolent diseases are, with the growing realization that many such growths do not progress, it seems that they fall into some further (and less well-defined) category. It seems this debate is not only a scientific or empirical one, but also a normative one; much like debates about PTSD or obesity, there are normative dimensions to how we define and classify disease. Labeling can have both positive and negative consequences for patients, clinicians, insurers, not to mention developers and producers of screening, medical device, and pharmaceuticals (Ereshefsky 2009). Overdiagnosis of early stage disease can lead to serious harms; not least, treating a “cancer” that may or may not progress in the lifetime of a patient is costly and harmful to quality of life.

One hope driving the precision medicine research program is that the identification of biomarkers of aggressive disease will resolve these ambiguities with respect to early stage disease, as well as identify targets of effective treatment (see, e.g., Collins, et al. 2005). However, as we have seen, interpreting genomic data has been far from straightforward, and classifying cancer types and subtypes by appeal to genomic information alone can lead to a loss of important information. While genomic and molecular data is no doubt useful, it is not necessarily decisive.

In sum, much like genes and species, diseases like cancer lack essences, are heterogeneous, blur together at the edges, are caused in many different ways, and have variable dynamics. Perhaps inconsistent classifications are simply to be expected in such cases. That this is so does not (necessarily) show that we ought to give up on realism about disease kinds; indeed, perhaps we ought to endorse “promiscuous realism” (Dupré 1996). As knowledge has grown, and practical interests shift, on this view, classifications can multiply and even cross-classify the same kinds. This is nothing to fear, so long as the kinds we countenance do the predictive or explanatory work intended for them, in the context intended. Others have a somewhat less permissive view, however, arguing that there need to be some empirical constraints or other on classification of “scientific kinds,” whether or not these categories count as examples of “natural” kinds (Slater 2014; Ereshefsky, et al. 2015). For instance, Ereshefsky, et al. (2015) argue that all and only categories that serve the needs of “progressive” research programs are legitimate.

Given the complex causal pathways and heterogeneity of cancer, perhaps it is not surprising that, as Bertolaso (2016) argues, the history of attempts to identify defining features of cancer, let alone arrive at a unified theory, have floundered. Either cancer is defined so vaguely as to include non-pathological states, or focused so narrowly on a specific class of causes as to rule out cases that might otherwise be included. Among the many definitions she canvases are: “abnormal proliferation,” “unregulated growth,” “a disease of cell differentiation rather than multiplication,” “the result of destruction of tissue architecture,” “a systems biology disease,” “blocked ontogeny,” a disease of “suppressed (sic) immune function,” a “metabolic” and of course, a “genomic” disease. Such a variety of definitions is, Bertolaso argued, due to the fact that cancer has many causes, and many effects; moreover, it involves many different types of dysregulation, at a variety of temporal and spatial scales. Suffice it to say, it is no small challenge to identify defining features of cancer, let alone arriving at a unified “theory” of disease etiology.

One might well ask, however, whether the lack of a unified theory of cancer is a cause for concern? Is this a sign of immature science? Kincaid has argued to the contrary (2008), “biomedical science can make significant progress without precise definitions of disease, without full-fledged theories of disease and of normal biological functioning, and without disease entities being natural kinds” (p. 368). Pointing out how tumor microenvironment shapes how cancer cells behave as they do, Kincaid argues that “There is no clear definition of what constitutes a cancerous cell in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. However, no one thinks that cancer research should stop until we get this definition settled, or that creating linguistic uniformity is important for understanding the science. The science certainly makes progress nonetheless… Likewise, there is no parsimonious theory of the disease and the normal functioning from which it is a deviation. Instead, we have piecemeal causal explanations” (p. 373). Kincaid is correct. Much of cancer research is piecemeal in character, offering partial and locally constrained characterizations of the loss or promotion of some particular activity of a cell associated with this or that mutation typical of cancer cells. Whether we require a unified theory of cancer remains an open question. Or, at least, the question of what function such a unified theory might serve is a matter of some debate. This is reflected in the fact that the research program seeking to identify genetic mechanisms associated with cell birth and death has received so many different names: the “oncogene paradigm,” (Bishop 1995; Morange 1997) “vision,” (Morange 1997), “theory,” (Sonnenschein & Soto 2008), “model” (Temin 1974; Vogelstein & Kinzler 1993), “theory-method package” (Fujimura 1988, 1992), and recently, “framework” (Blassime, et al. 2013).

One suggestion that seems plausible is that a better way of framing the project of cancer research involves commitment to an “explanatory framework.” For instance, Blassimie, et al. (2013) characterize the search for oncogenes as an “explanatory framework”: “causal patterns, schemata (in the sense of Darden 2002), intuitions, hypotheses, evidential standards and various bits of evidence and data coming from different experimental settings and instrumental devices,” which “establish selective and local criteria of causal relevance that drive the search for, characterization and use of biological mechanisms.” Rather than consisting of sets of laws or general principles, such frameworks help generate strategies in the search for causes, and narrow the field of inquiry. Blassime, et al. argue that “explanatory frameworks allow for changes of scientific perspective on the causal relevance of mechanisms without necessarily fully replacing previous explanatory frameworks” (p. 375). Explanatory frameworks, in other words, can “coexist” or be “gradually displaced,” rather than stand in mutually exclusive relations with one another. As new questions arose, and new information was discovered, this explanatory framework became elaborated; depending upon how permissive or restrictive our characterization of this framework, it need not be viewed as at odds with, for instance, attention to the tissue microenvironment in cancer. This sort of multifaceted approach is perhaps what one ought to expect for such a heterogeneous disease, where causes and effects can be described at very different temporal and spatial scales. Much like other complex, multifactorial diseases, cancer is not a single phenomenon, but a heterogeneous class of disease processes, with few definitive properties or unique causes. This makes not only classification, but also explanation, enormously difficult, as we will see below.

2. Explaining Cancer: Theories, Models and Mechanisms

What does it mean to explain cancer? The question is ambiguous, and fraught. For, by “cancer” one could have several targets of explanation in mind: the transformation of a cell into a “cancer cell,” the (general) process of carcinogenesis, the process of invasion and metastasis in solid tumors, the emergence and roles of intratumor heterogeneity, differential rates of incidence of different cancer types, patterns of cancer incidence or mortality in different environments, socioeconomic groups, races, ages, or sexes. Each of these explanatory targets arguably calls for quite different kinds of explanation and not only different explanatory information. Cancer scientists make appeals to generalizations of wide scope, for instance, and will also offer detailed, specific mechanistic explanations of specific outcomes. The fact that these explanations are different in kind may (in part) explain why there appears to be such a variety of views amongst philosophers concerning the aim and character of explanation and progress in cancer research. There is, of course, a long history of debate among philosophers of biology concerning norms of explanation. It’s still hotly debated whether, for instance, all explanations in the biological sciences must identify causes, or mechanisms, or whether “mathematical” or “equilibrium” explanations are distinct in kind, and how “network” models or “systems theoretical” explanations are distinct from other kinds of explanation, are all live debates (See the entries on scientific explanation and philosophy of systems and synthetic biology). However, there is also a history of dispute amongst cancer scientists about both competing research agendas and explanatory strategies.

2.1 The Mechanistic Picture of Cancer

As mentioned above, for most of the last twenty or so years of the 20th Century and the first decades of the 21st, the central concern of the majority of cancer researchers seems to have been identification of mechanisms at the cell and molecular level that regulate cell birth and death. Two characteristic features of cancer cells are their uncontrolled growth, and failure to undergo cell death. This is often accomplished via changes to the “cellular machinery,” or mutations and associated disruption of pathways associated with regulation of cell division or cell death (Hanahan & Weinberg 2001). So, it is natural to assume that explaining cancer requires identifying the chromosomal alterations, mutations, and epigenetic changes to cells that give them distinctive capacities of a cancer cell, as well as describe the ways in which these mutations systematically yield these effects. This framework for explaining cancer has been characterized as “somatic mutation theory,” insofar as cancer is viewed as a product of a series of mutations to cells during somatic cell division. Onset of cancer, on this view, may be accelerated either by inheritance of “oncogenes” or “tumor suppressors,” or by damage to DNA, for instance, due to smoking or UV radiation.

This picture of cancer was pieced together over decades from various sources of evidence—from Virchow’s observations of chromosomal abnormalities in cancer cells, to epidemiological patterns of incidence in cancer, to the discovery of the “src” gene—one of the first mutations found to be associated with cancer. This vision of cancer as the product of oncogenes replaced a “regulatory” view of cancer, according to which cancer was a “breakdown in normal constraints on growth” (for a history, see, e.g., Morange 1993, 1997, 2003). Not coincidentally, the “oncogene paradigm” arose at the same time that some of the first bioengineering technologies, which enabled early cancer researchers to use the techniques of molecular biology to study identify genes associated with cancer progression (Fujimura 1987). While this is a reductionist research program, in the sense that the aim is to decompose the system of interest and understand the parts in operation, not all early advocates of the multistage theory were cell and molecular biologists. Two of the first advocates of a multi-stage theory of carcinogenesis—Armitage and Doll—found that curves of average lifetime incidence of lung cancer in smokers appeared to have the same shape as that of nonsmokers, simply shifted to earlier ages. This suggested that cancer could arise from a rate-limited series of insults acquired over the life course. Since the 1980s, hundreds of genes have been identified, mutations to which are associated with the hallmarks of cancer. Carcinogenesis, on this view, results from damage to DNA, or errors in the process of cell division, as well as either endogenous factors (various hormonal or other factors that promote cell growth), or exogenous factors (infection, and inflammation), which over time can lead to dysregulated cell growth.

In one paradigmatic example, Vogelstein and his group collected tissue samples (premalignant polyps) from patients with a familial or inherited form of bowel cancer (FAP, or familial adenomatous polyposis). They discovered that mutations to genes associated with various cancers accumulated in series of steps, what has been called the “Vogelstein cascade.” The study of familial or strongly inherited forms of cancer (cancers that appear at relatively young ages, and occur in families) has enabled the identification of several genes, mutations to which (whether inherited or acquired during somatic cell division) play a role in cancer: APC, RB, and p53 (associated with familial adenomatous polyposis, retinoblastoma, and Li Fraumeni syndrome, respectively).

This picture of explaining cancer might be expected to resonate quite well with the picture of scientific explanation advocated by what has been called the “new mechanists.” According to this view, one of the central aims of biological scientists is the identification of mechanisms. The biological sciences, on this view, are unique in their focus on mechanisms, rather than laws or general principles, of the sort (typically imagined) to be central to the physical sciences. A mechanistic explanation identifies parts and processes that typically yield specific outcomes of interest (Machamer, et al. 2000). If we wish to understand regulation of apoptosis (cell death), for instance, we might identify particular genes and proteins that play an important role in cell senescence, and determine how their activity and organization yield (or fail to yield) a given outcome. This mechanistic picture of the aims and character of explanation in the biological sciences seems prima facie to characterize current cancer research quite well, or at least the past 25 years of this research.

However, several philosophers have argued that this picture fails to capture the diverse explanatory strategies carried out by cancer scientists, at least currently. For instance, some have argued that this fails to take into consideration more “organicist” or “holistic” views of cancer causation, which they contrast with a “reductionist” approach in cancer research (Bertolaso 2009). Some also argue that apparently competing perspectives can be fruitfully integrated (Bertolaso 2011; Marcum 2005; Malaterre 2007).

Even advocates of the mechanistic perspective have argued that it needs to be amended to accommodate the complex causal processes involved in cancer’s etiology. For instance, according to Bechtel (forthcoming), a linear picture of mechanisms for cancer leaves out an important dimension. He characterizes the mechanisms associated with apoptosis, for instance, as made up of two types: “primary” and “control” mechanisms. Failure to respond to signals promoting apoptosis in cancer may be a result of disruption in either one (or both) such mechanisms. Advocates of the mechanistic perspective have failed, Bechtel argues, to attend to the complex negative feedback processes of control and constraint affecting primary mechanisms. As evidence of the significance of such control mechanisms, he points out how cancer researchers utilize novel methods, such as network analysis to identify regulatory networks or feedback loops, associated with specific functions. Bechtel’s distinction between “primary” and “control” mechanism raises some interesting questions about the organization of causal pathways in cancer. Whether such pathways are, for instance, relatively fixed or static in organization, is an open question. Moreover, the category of “controller” versus “primary” mechanism itself may be relatively fluid, or context dependent. The “same” mechanism in a different environment might exert different controls, and, control mechanisms may themselves be viewed as primary, given one’s characterization of the function that is the subject of inquiry.

2.2 Complicating the Mechanistic Picture: Tissue Organization, Stem Cells and Systems Theory

Some critics of the somatic mutation theory and its associated search for mechanisms of cancer at the cell and molecular level are far more radical in their ambitions. In the late 1990s, and early 2000s, two researchers proposed what they took to be an alternative theory or “paradigm” to the “somatic mutation theory” (SMT), namely, the Tissue Organization Field Theory (or, TOFT) (Soto & Sonnenschein 2000). Soto and Sonnenschein object not only to reductionist methodology, but reductionist assumptions about the causes of cancer. That is, their concern is not only with experimental approaches that focus on dysregulated growth of cancer cells in cell culture, but also with the claims regarding the role of mutations in cancer. In their view, cancers are not the result of mutations, but instead “alterations in the communication among cells and tissues that affect tissue architecture” (2013, p. 90). On this view, mutations do not lead the way—or, directly affect these signaling pathways—but follow upon disruptions to tissue organization. It is these alterations of patterns of interaction between cells that leads to “downward causation effects” on cells and cellular components, inducing aneuploidy and mutations (Soto & Sonnenschein 2006; Sonnenschein & Soto 2008). Arguments such as this one raise several interesting philosophical questions. First, Soto and Sonnenschein are skeptical of the scientific methodology supporting SMT. They bring attention to some interesting broader questions as to when are we warranted in inferring from cell culture or model organism work to general claims about cancer etiology.

Given that the development of cancer is an immensely complex causal process that cannot be observed directly, many scientific claims about cancer’s causes are based on indirect inference, using model organisms or cells in culture. For instance, tumors are grown in nude mice using xenotransplantation, or, tumors are observed to grow in mice in which “driver genes” are “knocked out.” Soto and Sonnenschein have argued that the artificial experimental circumstances that have enabled or promoted the study of cancer “genes” render judgments about their causal efficacy suspect; in principle, they claim, it’s consistent with these experiments to suggest that these mutations are mere effects of the true causes of carcinogenesis. Whether or not one agrees with their conclusions about TOFT v. SMT, they do raise methodological questions worth exploring about the scope and limitations of model organism work. Germain (2013) points out that cancer in these xenotransplantation experiments are “highly artificial” contexts, and echoes concerns of researchers that the use of immunodeficient mice to study cancer stem cells, for instance, may or may not warrant the conclusions they claim to establish. Xenotransplantation, for instance, has been used to articulate and test hypotheses about “intrinsic tumorigenicity” of some cells, particularly cells expressing a particular antigen, ABCB5+, which were then designated “cancer stem cells” in light of their capacity to form tumors in nude mice (Germain, 2013, p. 9). The problem with using these tools, however, is that the matter of when and whether a cell is “tumorigenic” varies across different backgrounds—in immune deficient mice, lacking a particular receptor (interleukin-2 gamma receptor, or Il2rg), tumors will grow, but not in mice with such a receptor. Which experimental context is relevant to understanding how and why cancer is caused by “stem cells,” thus depends upon which causes we wish to isolate, and how. As Germain points out,

On the one hand, human tumors do not develop “in the void”: cancer patients are seldom so immunodeficient, and immune response is an important part of cancer development and of variability in outcomes. A notion of tumorigenicity independent of this pressure seems to be an idealization that lacks practical relevance. On the other hand, it seems scientifically worthwhile to isolate the different components influencing the malignancy of cancer cells, so that we might exclude the effects of the immune system; tumorigenicity is one thing, evasion of immune surveillance is another. (Ibid, p. 10)

A second question that Soto and Sonnenschein's work raises is whether “downward causation” is at work in cancer. Several philosophers have weighed in on this question (Malaterre 2011; Bertolaso 2016; Green 2019). Malaterre (2011) argues that advocates of TOFT need not commit to non-reductive physicalism, or emergent properties. Instead, he argues, Soto and Sonnenschein are drawing attention to dynamic relationships between variables that supervene over molecular and cellular activities, and a “higher level,” or less granular explanation of cancer etiology may be preferred in some contexts, both for pragmatic and epistemic reasons. Malaterre makes appeal to Woodward’s (2010) argument that choice of causal variables often involves appeal to something like a notion of “proportionality,” such that, depending on the target of inquiry, we may be “led to the incorporation of more fine-grained detail in the specification of causes […] or toward specifications that abstract away from such detail” (2010, 299).

Soto and Sonnenschein would likely reject this analysis, insofar as their argument was not simply that tissue organization is deserving of our attention, for pragmatic reasons, but “that carcinogenesis resulted from the disruption of the reciprocal interactions between stroma and epithelium.” Or more precisely, “the cancer phenotype is an emergent phenomenon occurring at the tissue level of organization” (2006, p. 371). What evidence is offered up for this kind of causal relationship? There are three sources of evidence that Soto and Sonnenschein have emphasized as of relevance to their defense of “organicism” and TOFT:

  • Embryonal cells can produce neoplasms when misplaced in adult tissues, and revert to normalcy when placed in an early embryo (Stewart & Mintz, 1981). In other words, the neoplastic phenotype can be both induced or normalized or reversed, without any change in the cell itself. According to critics of the somatic mutation theory, such outcomes cannot be explained on the somatic mutation theory, since there is no intrinsic mutational change in such cells.
  • Some neoplasms tend to arise in areas of contact between two types of epithelium. During development and adult life, there can be changes of tissue organization at just such points of interaction, which may well be responsible for the induction of tumors in these cases.
  • Proteins in the extracellular matrix affect self-organization of mammary epithelial cells in culture (Bissell 1981; Weaver, et al. 2002; Nelson, et al. 2006). That is, tissue organization can suppress or promote the neoplastic behavior of malignant cells (Weaver, et al. 1997, 2002). For instance, Paczek (2005) shows that the malignant phenotype can be altered by stiffness of the extracellular matrix, in colonies of mammary epithelial cells (MECs).

All of these phenomena are taken as evidence that there are features of the tissue microenvironment that affect either the induction of or progression of cancer, and such features are not reducible to, or explainable in terms of properties or processes at or below the cell and molecular level. Further, Soto and Sonnenschein claim that the somatic mutation theory cannot account for these observations, and that they can only be accommodated on a view that takes that tissue architecture itself as causally relevant to the progression of disease, which is described in this case as downward causation.

Do such cases genuinely count as downward causation in, for instance, Kim’s (1999) sense? After all, strictly speaking, the idea that causation is synchronic across the whole and part of the same entity seems contradictory. Soto and Sonnenschein accept this criticism, and propose that the kind of causation they are invoking is not synchronic, but “diachronic emergence”: “cellular and tissue events occurring before the expression of a particular set of genes takes place may act downwardly modifying the expression of these genes at a later time” (Soto, et al. 2008, 271).

This, however, seems to be not as radical a metaphysical thesis as talk of downward causation may initially suggest. Indeed, Soto and Sonnenschein seem to simply refer to a form of constraint. Green (2019) takes “downward causation” to mean just this: “the role of solid-state tissue properties in tumor progression can be interpreted as a form of downward causation, understood as constraining relations between tissue-scale and micro-scale variables” (p. 1). She notes that while this suggestion is “a ‘weaker’ form of downwards causation than the one Kim (2000) and others oppose,” and so departs from standard use of the expression (at least among philosophers of mind), the advantage of this weaker notion that it better captures what scientists have in mind when arguing for the “necessity of higher-scale features for the realization and understanding of biological phenomena.” Similarly, Bertolaso (2016) argues that:

The biology of cancer shows that the stability of constitutive elements depends on the organization, and that there is a source of regulation in the biological context. Cells change their behavior depending on their functional integration in the tissue. Alteration in cell communication alters gene expression, and the loss of integration of cells within a functional tissue leads to genetic instability and apoptosis. The collapse of levels, as characterized in cancer, results from the loss of general functional integration of a biological entity. This means that the structure itself, once constituted, determines the relationships among the parts and the stability of the parts… The dynamic structure has… causal relevance. (2016, p. 87)

She characterizes this as an instance of synchronic reflexive emergence—“a different mode of causation. In such a mode, effects are not expressed in terms of a progression of events, but of maintenance of states at different levels of biological organization” (Bertolaso 2016, p. 95).

It seems that each of these authors is pointing to an important role for structural organization in the maintenance of homeostasis as playing an important role in carcinogenesis. Indeed, evidence provided by Bissell’s lab (Weaver, et al. 1997, 2002) seems to indicate that structural features of the extracellular matrix somehow either prevent the emergence of disease, or can accelerate it. It seems such examples do not point to “downward causation,” but instead suggest that we need to expand our understanding of the causes of cancer to include maintenance of tissue integrity. That is, the case of cancer seems to require a richer, more integrative and interdisciplinary approach to investigating cancer.

Another major research program that in some ways challenges a mechanistic picture of cancer (or at least some (Laplane, 2016) see as opposed to the “classical view” of cancer) is the “cancer stem cell” theory (CSC). However, the idea of cancer stem cells has been somewhat controversial, in part due to the experimental models used to establish and identify cancer stem cells. Fagan (2016) characterizes the notion of a cancer stem cell, as well as the current state of the field, succinctly as follows.

Cancer stem cells (CSCs) are thought to be a small subpopulation of self-renewing stem cells within a tumor or blood-borne cancer, which are responsible for maintaining and growing the malignancy. This idea has significant clinical implications. If the CSC model is correct, the current clinical strategy of seeking to eradicate all cancer cells should be revised, to specifically target CSC.

The cancer stem cell theory in part is descended from the view that cancers are in several ways akin to ordinary tissue (though distorted), containing a mixture of proliferating stem cells and their more differentiated products. This view played an important role in cancer research in the 1960s and 1970s, and is sometimes called the “developmental” theory of cancer, in light of the fact that it takes cancer to be a disease of “development,” or cellular differentiation in particular (Pierce & Speers 1988, Morange 2015, Laplane 2016). This model of cancer etiology was revived in the 90s, when Lapidot, Bonnet, and Dick identified “leukemic stem cells” (Lapidot, et al. 1994, Bonnet and Dick 1997), and was expanded upon in the early 2000s with the identification of an analogous cell population in breast cancer, suggesting that CSCs are a general feature of all cancers (Al-Hajj, et al. 2003).

The notion that there are subpopulations of cells within a tumor that play a distinctive role—either in initiating a cancer, or in seeding new cancers, has been influential in current research, suggesting new avenues for both treatment and prevention. Historically the cancer stem cell theory (CSC) was framed in opposition to the somatic mutation theory (e.g. Reya, et al. 2001; Wicha, et al. 2006; Shipitsin, et al. 2007). Laplane (2016) has argued that the cancer stem cell theory (CSC) has various advantages over the alternative, which she calls the “classical” theory. Laplane takes the following to be the four fundamental theses of CSC theory:

  1. CSCs are capable of self-renewal, thus producing new CSCs.
  2. CSCs are capable of differentiation, thus producing cells of different phenotypes.
  3. CSCs represent a tiny subpopulation of cells, distinct from other cancer cell populations and are, in theory, isolatable.
  4. CSCs initiate cancers.

The first two claims concern the concept of a stem cell; the latter two claims concern carcinogenesis itself: how cancer arises. It’s the latter two theses that Laplane takes to be in tension with the “classical” theory. Laplane argues that CSC theory is more “parsimonious”, because it “explains cancer development, propagation and relapse” from a “limited number of hypotheses” (Laplane 2016, 28). In contrast, the classical view neither predicts nor explains cancer heterogeneity, or relapse, but must invoke special (“additional” or “ad hoc” theories) to explain them, in particular, evolutionary processes. Moreover, the CSC theory has the advantage that it “connects basic research and intervention by suggesting new therapeutic strategy” (Laplane 2016, 28)

Fagan (2016) argues, to the contrary, that on a “model-based” approach, it’s not clear that these two theories are inconsistent. Indeed, Laplane (2017) has more recently pointed out how the CSC can serve to supplement the evolutionary perspective. The presence and number of cancer stem cells can, it has been suggested, affect the rate and nature of evolutionary change in a population of cancer cells. Essentially, if all cells in a tumor are descended from one or a few cancer stem cells, this restricts population size, and thus suggests that to a large extent cancer progression is driven by drift, rather than selection. Rather than see the two theories as mutually exclusive, in other words, we might see the two as complementary, in the process of integration, or overlapping models.

All this discussion of the role and nature of cancer stem cells, however, is complicated by the fact that there is a great deal of dispute around what counts as a cancer stem cell. Both Laplane and Fagan draw attention to the fact that the concept of cancer stem cell is multiply ambiguous, in at least the following ways:

  • First, when we speak of cancer stem cells, we may be referring to their capacities or properties, or to their historical role or genealogy, i.e., to the fact that they were the cells from which other cancer cells originate. That is, some take cancer stem cells to be defined in terms of their distinctive capacities and some in terms of their relationship to other cells—in particular, to their ancestor-descendent relationships in a population of cells in a tumor. The “cancer stem cell model” is sometimes simply taken to refer to any model of a tumor that treats the population of cells as having a hierarchical relationship, where one or a few cells propagate the tumor, whether or not those cells have distinctive properties that cause them to stand in that relationship.
  • Second, there are several different kinds of historical role that CSCs might play: They may be all and only those cells that initiate a cancer under natural conditions, they may be those cells which propagate a cancer in situ, or they may be those cells that are capable of propagating a cancer in an experimental animal.
  • Third, some take the concept of CSC to be restricted to normal stem cells, which some believe are the most likely precursors to cancer. Others hold that cells that originate a tumor have stem-like properties but may or may not derive from normal stem cells.

What’s clear is that some populations of cells in a tumor appear to have “stemness” properties—the ability to renew oneself. What is less clear is whether these capacities are context sensitive, and how and by which cells they may be acquired. The plasticity of many types of cancer cells suggests that they may acquire a stemness phenotype, and even shift back to non-stem phenotype. Given this, it appears that the CSC is just one of a continuum of general views, some of which take only specific types of cells to be precursors to cancer and others which grant that many different types of cells have the potential to develop such properties. That is, the real question at issue is whether the cells that initiate a tumor are in some way distinctive or require distinctive precursors, and how properties of stemness are acquired. Whether stemness is intrinsic or acquirable, niche-dependent or independent, moreover, will drastically change the therapeutic strategy. The CSC model (the idea that CSC are at the origin of cancer development, resistance to treatment, and relapse) might be true and yet CSC-targeting strategy might fail. Indeed, what kind of property “stemness” is may vary across cancers, and even over time within a cancer (Laplane and Solary 2019).

In sum, there appear to remain several open questions about the nature of cancer stem cells, and more generally, how to best intervene upon cancer to successfully eradicate the disease. According to the model of the disease inherited from the latter third of the 20th Century, somatic mutations, acquired over a lifetime, to the acquisition of cancer’s “hallmarks.” So, the best strategy for intervention may be targeting specific pathways associated with these hallmarks. In contrast, according to the Tissue Organization Field Theory (TOFT), changes in tissue organization yield carcinogenesis. Thus, the best strategy for intervention might be finding ways to intervene in the tissue microenvironment, so as to create an environment less hospitable to the growth of cancer cells. According to the cancer stem cell theory, cancer arises in cells that have distinctive properties: continuous renewal, and indefinite growth, permitting the emergence of new disease. On this view, eradicating these stem cells seems essential to cancer treatment. Philosophical work on cancer causation and explanation can better illuminate the competing presuppositions of different approaches, clarify their commitments, and offer insights into fruitful integration of new data. It is already clear that philosophical discussions of ambiguities in how we define and measure stemness is essential to understanding how best to prevent recurrence and treat the disease (Clevers 2016).

Philosophical discussions of how and why TOFT and CSC challenge a simple reductionist picture of cancer etiology are only two of several examples. Other philosophers have described (or critiqued) evolutionary explanations of cancer (especially models of multilevel selection) (Germain 2012a; Lean and Plutynski 2016; Germain and Laplane 2017; Plutynski, 2018). Still others emphasize systems biology-based approaches to cancer (Bertolaso 2016; Plutynski & Bertolaso 2018), or the important role of a developmental perspective (Laplane 2016, 2018; Fagan 2017). Others still emphasize how one might model cancer as an infectious disease (Liu, et al. 2017), and or an evolutionary-developmental process (Liu 2018). What all these philosophers seem to emphasize is that the study of mechanisms associated with cancer at the cell and molecular level requires supplementation to better predict and explain the origin of the disease, and design effective therapies. In addition, Pradeu (forthcoming) has recently pointed out how the immune system plays an apparently “paradoxical” dual role in cancer, both acting to prevent and promote cancer. This raises interesting questions about the function of the immune system, as well as the appropriate way of understanding “organism,” “self” and “non-self” in biological contexts. There remain interesting questions about how to integrate various perspectives on this complex disease.

3. Cancer as a Byproduct: Evolution, Development, and Aging

Dobzhansky (1973) wrote that “nothing in biology makes sense except in light of evolution.” Can evolutionary thinking shed light on cancer? After all, cancer is ordinarily understood to be a case of failure of otherwise functional controls on cell birth and death. At first pass, this view seems fundamentally at odds with taking an evolutionary perspective on cancer. For, how can something that is an exemplary case of “dysfunction” count as an evolutionary process or product of adaptive evolution? Moreover, how ought we to square this picture of cancer with the fact that cancer cells seem to co-opt developmental processes—i.e., the process of “de-differentiation” typical of early embryonic cells? Is cancer a byproduct of development? Finally, cancer seems to increase in incidence as we age. Is cancer simply a byproduct of aging? Relatedly, if—as some argue—aging itself is selected for (a contested question!), is cancer in some sense “adaptive”? All these perspectives on cancer require us to perhaps rethink the nature of function and dysfunction, or at least better understand how there are trade-offs in fitness at different temporal and spatial scales over the course of our life and evolutionary history. The best perspective to take on this may be a “multilevel” evolutionary perspective—i.e., thinking of evolution by natural selection as operating at different temporal and spatial scales, both sequentially, and in some cases, simultaneously, sometimes yielding unfortunate “cross-level byproducts” of selection at one temporal and spatial scale, for entities or processes at other temporal or spatial scales (cf. Okasha 2007).

First, it is relatively uncontroversial that understanding a species’ evolutionary history, and the selective trade-offs they face over the course of their life history, can inform our understanding of how and why they are more or less vulnerable to disease. For instance, some species are more vulnerable to cancer than others. Why? Comparative biology—the comparison of different species—may help us identify mechanisms associated with disease vulnerability, onset and progression, when they arose, where and why they are shared, as well as how they have diverged (Aktipis, et al. 2015). Comparing and contrasting how development, immunity, and other mechanisms of suppression of cancer across species can help cancer researchers identify targets of opportunity for either treatment or prevention of cancer. In addition, we can look to unique features of our own evolutionary history in order to explain patterns of disease incidence, suggesting selective “mismatches” with our ancestral environment, a kind of “byproduct” explanations of our vulnerability to diseases. This enterprise is broadly characterized as “evolutionary medicine” (Crespi, et al. 2005; Gluckman, et al. 2009; Stearns & Koella 2008; Sun, et al. 2014).

While the broad principles behind evolutionary medicine are relatively uncontroversial—we all are evolved organisms after all—philosophers of biology have been skeptical of particular claims about how our evolutionary history has shaped our vulnerability to disease. Some such claims have been particularly contentious, either because the nature of the disease itself is not well characterized (especially mental illness, for instance), or evidence in support of evolutionary “mismatch” with our ancestral environment is both scant and disputed. Particularly where alternative explanations may well involve attributing responsibility to, e.g., pollutants, or choices in lifestyle that are politically or socially sensitive, philosophers of science have been particularly skeptical. Some have argued that many arguments in evolutionary medicine make “adaptationist” assumptions, i.e., assumptions that a given trait is adaptive, or selectively advantageous, founded on at best “just so” stories (Valles 2011; see also Murphy 2006).

Of course, there are better and worse such arguments; the best arguments consider not only the widest array of evidence, but also trade offs in fitness, as well as the role of constraints arising out of development and life history. For instance, traits adaptive early in life may yield fitness costs later in life. A vivid example of a trade-off in fitness is androgenic hormones; such hormones predispose men to higher prostate cancer risk, but they may also yield an advantage early in life, in terms of increasing sperm production, relative growth and size at sexual maturity, and thus (potentially) access to mates and resources. Some defenders of evolutionary perspectives on medicine claim that high prostate cancer risk in taller men may thus be a case of a “mismatch” between our ancestral and current contexts (see, e.g., Summers, et al. 2008 for discussion). Presumably, philosophers are likely to contest such arguments on a variety of grounds—either speculative assumptions about the adaptive advantage of size or early age of sexual maturity in our evolutionary past, or concerns about how or how much variability in hormones contributes either to body size or cancer risk. Though, this provides an interesting case study for considering how hypotheses about the role of sex and age in disease risk are tested, an area of growing interest.

“Mismatch” hypotheses suggest that traits that may have been adaptive in the past leave us vulnerable to disease in our current environment. For instance, many advocates of evolutionary medicine have argued that the high correlation between nulliparity and cancer risk might be explained by our evolutionary history. The argument is that women in the evolutionary past were pregnant for much of their lives, starting at an earlier age; breast development and differentiation was thus adapted to a lifetime of frequent pregnancy and nursing. Delaying or avoiding pregnancy changes the developmental processes typical for our species, and might expose women to more cycles of estrogen, which could increase breast cancer risk. Of course, such hypotheses are contentious; there is always the potential for confounding causes (in this case, of increased cancer risk due to a variety of risk factors at work in modern society) (Greaves 2000). Nonetheless, it has been known for centuries that nulliparity (not having children) raises breast cancer risk, and since at least the 1970s, it’s been widely known (at least in the cancer research community) that the more children one has, starting at a younger age, the lower the risk of breast cancer. In a 1970 case-control study conducted at eight different locations around the globe, a WHO group led by McMahon et al., estimated that “breast cancer risk for women having their first birth under the age of 20 years is about half that for nulliparous women,” and that “women having their first child when aged under 18 years have only about one-third the breast cancer risk of those whose first birth is delayed until the age of 35 years or more.” Evolutionary “byproduct” explanations appeal to our evolutionary history to explain this observation.

Another type of “byproduct” explanation of cancer—though one that appeals to a much more distant event in our evolutionary history—is that cancer is a product of the emergence of multicellularity. At one point in the very distant past, single celled organisms formed collectives that cooperate; these collectives eventually became multicellular organisms. Any collective of cells, especially collectives whose survival and reproductive success depends on functional organization, are potentially vulnerable to breakdown in cooperative organization. On this view, then, cancer is a product of breakdown in mechanisms that permitted the emergence of multicellularity—the mechanisms that protect us from “revolt from within” are not error-free, and over time will fail. According to Greaves and others (Greaves, et al. 2012; Merlo, et al. 2006) the evolutionary picture of cancer dovetails nicely with the somatic mutation theory; somatic cells divide and acquire mutations during our lifetimes; some of these mutations involve failures in regulatory pathways that ordinarily “enforce” functional organization, and thus cooperation. In this way, an evolutionary perspective—understanding how evolution of multicellularity required the emergence of cooperative organization—is essential to understanding cancer. Moreover, on this view, cancer itself may be viewed as an evolutionary process—the emergence of adaptive features of cancer cells, where these “adaptations” enable short term “fitness,” or relative success at survival and reproduction. Several scientists have developed theoretical models of this process, linking it to empirical data, e.g., on the emergence of chemotherapy resistance (Frank 2007; Wodarz & Komarova 2015).

On this view, cancer is a both a process and byproduct of multi-level selection, where selection may be understood as operating at several levels of biological organization simultaneously, or sequentially (Damuth, et al. 1988; Lean, et al. 2016). That is, cancer cells may bear adaptations, and, they are also evolutionary byproducts of selective processes at other level of organization. It appears that cancer cells co-opt or hijack otherwise adaptive features of organisms. Signaling pathways that are ordinarily in service of adaptive functions in early stages of development or wound healing are reactivated in (some) cancer cells, in service of the transition to metastasis. This is a classic example of a cross-level selective byproduct (Okasha 2005, 2006). Traits advantageous at one level in the organization of multicellular organisms may be coopted by component parts. Some of the capacities that invasive cancer cells acquire (the capacity to invade and metastasize) are in fact due to a change in phenotype from epithelial to mesenchymal type cells, and losing adhesive properties enables such cells to invade the lymph and blood system. Lean and Plutynski (2016) have argued that cancer may in some ways parallel the patterns of emergence of multicellularity as characterized by Damuth and Heisler (1988), shifting over the course of emergence of disease from a simple selective process between individual cells to several kinds of multilevel selective process (MLS1 to MLS2). Critics contest that the process of metastasis only weakly mimics MLS2, however (Germain, et al. 2017).

To be sure, there are both analogies and disanalogies between evolution in whole organisms, and the evolving population of cancer cells in a tumor (Germain 2012). However, thinking of cancer as a dynamic, evolutionary process, has great potential for applications in cancer treatment, and perhaps also, in prevention. For instance, some have suggested that we might give young girls drugs or nutritional supplements that remodel the breast in ways akin to pregnancy, as a way to prevent the emergence of breast cancer (Katz, et al. 2015). Others suggest that modeling the evolution of multi-drug resistance may help prevent one of the major causes of cancer mortality. Drugs can be more or less effective in different patients, and lose their effectiveness over time. An evolutionary perspective on cancer may shed light on how drug resistance comes about, in patients with more or less intratumor heterogeneity (Greaves 2000, 2007; Frank & Nowak 2004; Merlo, et al. 2006; Greaves and Maley, 2010).

A third type of byproduct explanation for cancer is the view that cancer is a disease of aging—that is, cancer incidence by and large increases as we age, perhaps in part as a byproduct of breakdowns in mechanisms associated with immune response and tissue integrity. This claim raises some broader questions about how we assess function and dysfunction, or how we assess function at different temporal and spatial scales of analysis, as well as how we understand the role of the immune system and the integrity of the organism as an individual. Indeed, all evolutionary and byproduct explanations of cancer raise similar philosophical questions about hypothesis testing, as well as definitions of “function” and “individuality,” both at the individual and group level, and over the course of one’s life history. On the evolutionary view of cancer, for instance, cancer cells are in some sense highly adaptive (Hausman 2011; Germain 2012; Godfrey-Smith 2009). One relatively controversial view of aging, first proposed by August Weisman, is that aging has the evolutionary advantage—effectively clearing the way for the young. If indeed cancer is a necessary byproduct of aging, and aging is selected for, then on one view, cancer may be thought of as adaptive. Such a view raises a variety of questions about evidence and adaptationist explanations (see SEP entry on “Adaptation”). They also raise questions about the merits of group versus individual level selection hypotheses. Moreover, the dual role of the immune system in both preventing—and paradoxically, in some cases, promoting cancer—raises interesting questions about the nature of biological individuality, as well as how we define “immunity” an the role of the immune system in setting out the boundaries of the organism. (For a vivid discussion, see, e.g., (Okasha 2006; Godfrey-Smith 2009; Bouchard & Huneman 2013; Clarke 2011, 2013; Love & Brigandt 2017; Bueno, et al. 2019; Pradeu 2012, 2013, 2016, 2019).

4. The Science-Value Interface and Aims of Cancer Research

There are several ways in which biomedical and public health research on cancer intersects with debates about the proper role of values in science. First, epidemiological and toxicological research is used in support of regulatory policy and toxic tort law. Decisions about when and what is “carcinogenic” have significant public health import, and thus raise a variety of philosophical questions about evidence, values risk, and precaution (Mayo, et al. 1994; Cranor 1993, 2006, 2011, 2018).

Evidence for such claims is often indirect, and underdetermination is rife. In tests of carcinogenicity, there is a choice of levels of significance, and even optimally done epidemiological studies, or toxicological studies, for instance, at best lend high probability to claims about health risk. In such contexts, there is “inductive risk”, or the risk of error either in over- or under-estimation of actual risk of cancer, and thus, room for values to play a role. Several philosophers of science have weighed in on this matter of when and whether values ought to play a role in such contexts, as well as which values, in particular precautionary judgments that may have import for policy or law (see, e.g., Mayo 1988; Douglas 2000, 2009; Brown 2013; Steel 2007, 2010, 2015; Elliott 2011; Shrader-Frechette 1993, 1994, 2002, 2004; and Mitchell 2009). As one might imagine, there is also a substantive history of debate among epidemiologists, public health scientists, scholars of the law, around when we have good reason to claim that X or Y is carcinogenic, or what counts as good or “good enough” evidence, going back to the dispute between Doll and Hill and their detractors, regarding the causal link between smoking and lung cancer (Hill, 1965). For a compelling history of this literature, see, e.g., Proctor (1995), or more recently, Oreskes, et al. (2011). Problems of underdetermination are no less rife in the context of assessments of “effectiveness” of cancer screening and prevention (see, e.g., Solomon 2015; Stegenga 2017; Plutynski 2017. (For a discussion, see the entry on philosophy of medicine.)

Second, much of basic cancer research—e.g., research on the cell and molecular bases of the disease—is supported by federal funds, which often are allocated in the hopes that such research will (eventually) yield better health outcomes. Yet, the relationship between “bench and bedside” is, by all accounts, extremely indirect, and shaped by many factors outside of the merits of the science itself. So, it’s unclear whether and how “basic” cancer science ought to be evaluated in light of whether or how it leads to better health outcomes. However, this is hard to avoid, particularly when so many lives depend upon a research program’s promised outcomes.

This whole matter is complicated by the fact that the study of cancer is itself big business. Indeed, some compare cancer research and medicine to a “medical industrial complex.” Cancer pharmaceuticals, medical devices, and cancer research more generally, are major drivers of the economy. On the one hand, given the loss of life due to cancer, one could argue that the time and energy devoted to cancer care and research is proportional to the threat. Löwy (1996) in her Between Bench and Bedside characterizes this as the “white” (optimistic) reading of the situation. Arguably, however, many other diseases, often those more prevalent in “developing” parts of the world, cause far more extensive loss of life. As Reiss and Kitcher (2009) and Reiss (2009) have argued, from a “Millian” perspective, we ought to be expending our resources on those diseases that proportionally cause the greatest loss of life, and so, at least from a strictly maximizing utilitarian perspective, these diseases have a greater claim on our investments. The vast funds invested in cancer research—at least during the past 25 years or so—have done very little to shift mortality rates. This leads to what Löwy might call the pessimistic answer to this question. According to one line of thinking, the centrality of cancer in biomedical research is a product of several historical, economic, institutional, and social forces in combination, some of which are self-perpetuating (Proctor 1995; Fujimura 1996; Clarke & Fujimura 2014). Ever since Nixon’s 1971 call for a “war” on cancer, advertised implications for cancer treatment or prevention have been used to bolster much of basic research into genetics, genomics, and cell and molecular biology, fostering investment in biotechnology. Some have argued that this has led to an unduly excessive, or disproportionate fear of cancer as a disease, an excess of anxiety, and perhaps also unnecessary or unwarranted use of medical screening and testing (Aronowitz 2007, 2009, 2015).

On the other hand, cancer research has led to important innovations in science and medicine with impacts much wider than cancer itself. Moreover, particularly in the U.S., regulations on research by, e.g., the FDA on the design and conduct of clinical trials for approval of drugs, for instance, may in part be slowing research and leading to excessive costs. Some argue that we ought to lift restrictions on such tests for novel and more “precise” (or targeted) drugs that might benefit very few. Such matters are of course intertwined with larger debates among both clinician-researchers and philosophers of medicine around when and whether we have sufficient evidence to claim that, e.g., this or that mode of intervention is effective. In part, such debates are shaped by the economic costs of large clinical trials, and in part, by epistemic issues around what and how we can and should measure, in making claims to “effective” intervention (Ashcroft 2002; Cartwright 2011; Howick 2011; Stegenga 2015; Teira 2011; Teira, et al. 2015; González-Moreno, et al. 2015; Deaton, et al. 2018).

One area where such questions are particularly fraught is “precision” medicine; Obama’s Reinvestment act budgeted a significant component toward cancer genomics, with the idea that a more fine grained analysis of the molecular and genomic features of cancer would promote more effective prediction and control of cancer risk, enable detection of cancers at much earlier stages, and less debilitating, more targeted treatments. With better technologies and more fine-tuned risk information, the practice of medicine has been shifting from diagnosis (and treatment) of disease, to constant surveillance and intervention on disease risk, as well as higher rates of overdiagnosis and overtreatment (diagnosis and treatment for a proto-disease state that may never have progressed in the lifetime of a patient) (Welch, et al. 2011; Esserman, et al. 2014). Moreover, one concern some have raised about precision oncology is that it has been less successful than hoped or advertised (Prasad & Gale 2016, Prasad, et al. 2016). Such skepticism should raise genuine concerns—especially given the hopes of patients and families hanging upon the promises of such treatments, and the overall costs of both cancer care, and precision medicine research. In sum, current practices of cancer research, screening and treatment raise a number of questions: How ought we to allocate research funds in cancer research? How is investment in precision medicine likely to yield the benefits promised? When is medical intervention on disease risk (rather than disease itself) unduly excessive? What exactly does it mean to speak of effective medical intervention? Is overdiagnosis and overtreatment a serious harm, or is it simply an inevitable byproduct of an otherwise effective strategy—treating disease risk? How ought clinicians to communicate about risk and benefit of novel targeted interventions to patients, especially where there are gray areas of benefit and harm? Are the (frequently) excessive costs of, and inequitable access to, cancer care, matters of justice?

Cancer research—and especially the hope and hype surrounding precision medicine—provides a focused lens through which to consider problems central to critical examination of the concepts and methods of the biomedical sciences. That is, cancer and the scientific study of cancer illustrate challenges facing disease classification, fuzzy borders between disease versus health, the problems with genetic essentialism, the ever-present reference class problem and ever promised solutions, as well as specific ways in which underdetermination of evidence in biomedicine shapes matters of justice in public health. Moreover, it provides a case study in how matters of evidence, disease status, and questions of values and justice are deeply intertwined.


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