First published Wed Aug 11, 2004; substantive revision Wed Jul 8, 2020

Carneades (214–129/8 BCE) was a member and eventually scholarch or head of the Academy, the philosophical school founded by Plato, for part of its skeptical phase. He is credited by ancient tradition with founding the New or Third Academy and defended a form of probabilism in epistemology.

1. Life and work

Born in Cyrene, then a Greek-speaking city on the Mediteranean coast of North Africa, Carneades pursued his philosophical studies in Athens, which was then as it had been and was to be for some time the philosophical center of the ancient world. There he studied not only at the Academy, the school founded by Plato of which he was to become the leader or scholarch, but also with with Diogenes of Babylon, the fifth scholarch of the Stoic school and a pupil of Chrysippus (c. 208–206 BCE). Chrysippus was the principal architect of the Stoic system and the most important philosophical stimulus to Carneades, who is reported to have said, ‘If Chrysippus had not been, I would not have been’ (D.L. 4.62) (which echoes the saying, ‘If Chrysippus had not been, there would have been no Stoa’). Carneades became scholarch of the Academy sometime before 155 BCE, when, together with Diogenes and Critolaus, the head of Aristotle’s school, the Peripatos, he was sent to Rome to represent Athens in a petition before the senate (see Powell, 2013).

According to tradition, Carneades also delivered a pair of lectures while in Rome, speaking in defense of justice on one day and, in rebuttal of his own arguments of the previous day, against it on the following day. This celebrated episode is recounted or alluded to in a number of ancient sources, all of them much later, and doubts about every part of the story including the reality of the lectures themselves have been raised (see Drecoll, 2004; Powell, 2013). The speech of Philus in the only partially extant third book of Cicero’s De Republica may preserve traces of Carneades’ speech against justice, though it is a matter of controversy if and to what extent it does, or failing that it may draw on arguments that Carneades made on other occasions (see Ferrary, 1977; Glucker, 2001).

Like Arcesilaus (316/15–241/40 BCE), the head of the Academy who was responsible for the school’s so-called ‘skeptical turn’, and Socrates before him, Carneades wrote nothing, but made his mark through face to face teaching and argument (D.L. 4.65). The influence he exerted in this way was immense. From the time of his scholarchate until the dissolution of the Academy under its probably last leader, Philo of Larissa (159/8–84/3 BCE), philosophical activity in the Academy and among the philosophers in its orbit consisted in good part in the further development of ideas and lines of argument pioneered or substantially reshaped by Carneades. Indeed these philosophers often put forward their own views in the guise of interpretations of Carneades. We are ultimately indebted for what we know about him to works by those with firsthand experience of him, especially Clitomachus, his student and eventual successor as scholarch. Although none of the latter’s many books has survived, they were used by authors like Cicero (106-43 BCE) and Sextus Empiricus (probably 2nd or 3rd century CE), whose works have come down to us. (Greek and Latin testimonies are collected in Mette, 1985; many important passages with an English translation and notes can be found in Long and Sedley, 1987.)

2. Epistemology and Academic Skepticism

2.1 Academic Skepticism

Histories of philosophy typically speak, as I did above, of a ‘skeptical turn’ in the Academy or of the ‘skeptical Academy’. Ancient authors called the school of Arcesilaus and his successors the ‘New Academy’ to distinguish it from the ‘Old Academy’ of his predecessors. Some cautions and qualifications are in order, however. The term ‘skeptic’ was not used by the Academics, but was the most prominent of several descriptions bestowed on themselves by the members of the Pyrrhonian school. It was applied only later to the Academics on the basis of a long-recognized affinity between the two schools. In the original meaning of the term, a skeptic is an inquirer or investigator, but it came to be associated in particular with theses calling into question the possibility of knowledge and recommending suspension of judgment together with the arguments put forward in support of them. The sense of ‘skeptic’ and ‘skeptical’ most familiar to us has its origin in this use of the term. There is a corresponding tension in accounts of the Academy, and in the philosophical activity they seek to describe.

This activity took the form of argument on both sides of the question (in utramque partem). The speeches for and against justice that Carneades delivered during the philosophers’ embassy to Rome was an instance. Most often, however, Academics in this period left the defense of a theory to its proponents and argued against it, creating an opposition in this way. The Academy’s method of argument was, in the first instance, dialectical, like that of Socrates in Plato’s Socratic dialogues. An argument is dialectical in the relevant sense when one party, the questioner, puts questions to another, questions that when affirmed by the answerer become premises in an argument to a conclusion that contradicts a thesis of the answerer’s. This conclusion, deduced as it is from premises chosen by the questioner because the answerer is committed to them or will otherwise find them hard to resist, is not one to which the questioner need be committed in propria persona. In drawing them out, he remains detached, uncovering difficulties internal to his interlocutor’s position without committing himself to a position of his own. The side usually taken by the Academics in epistemological debates was that of the skeptic, in the sense of one who challenges the possibility of knowledge.

There are numerous testimonies to the effect that the Academics regarded argument on both sides of the question as a method of inquiry, and argued as they did the better to discover the truth, i.e., to further skeptical ends in the original acceptance of the term (cf. Cicero, Acad. 2.7. 60, 76; N.D.1.11; Plutarch, Stoic. Repugnan. 1037C). But opposing arguments to each other can be also be used to lend support to skepticism in the sense of a skeptical position by calling the possibility of knowledge into question and commending the suspension of judgment. And sometimes the Academics are said to have created such oppositions with this end in view, i.e., it seems, to support a skeptical position to which they were committed (Cicero Acad. 1.46). And a set of arguments directly to the–in our sense–skeptical conclusions that nothing can be known and that one should suspend judgment occupied a place of central importance in the Academy’s practice of argument. The Academics seemed to their opponents to be attached to the skeptical conclusions of these arguments. And this seems to have been true of at least some Academics. Nonetheless these arguments seem at least at first and in the hands of some New Academics to have been put forward in a dialectical spirit.

The principal target of the arguments was the epistemology of the Stoics, and it was out of their engagement on that front that the form of the skeptical position defended by the Academics first emerged. The Stoics maintained that it is possible for human beings to achieve a condition of wisdom entirely free of opinion, i.e., false or insecure belief. According to them, all of a wise human being’s judgments are instances of knowledge, based on an unshakable grasp of the truth. Knowledge of this kind was possible according to them because there exist so-called cognitive impressions (katalêptikai phantasiai), which function as the criterion of truth (cf. Frede, 1999; Sedley, 2002). A cognitive impression they define as an impression from what is, stamped and impressed in exact accordance with what is, and such as could not be from what is not. This seems to mean, in the paradigm case of a perceptual impression, that it is an impression that arises in conditions which:

  1. Ensure that, by capturing its object with perfect accuracy, it is true, and
  1. At the same time impart to it a clarity and distinctness that belong only to impressions that arise in these conditions.

According to the Stoics, by restricting one’s assent in the perceptual sphere to impressions of this kind, one can avoid ever assenting to a false perceptual impression, a key necessary condition if one is to attain knowledge. As the criterion of truth, cognitive impressions are the ultimate basis of all knowledge, by confining one’s assent to which, and meeting certain further conditions, the Stoics maintained, one can avoid error and opinion entirely.

The Academics appealed to the skeptic’s stock in trade, dreams, madness, optical illusions and divinely inspired visions, in order to argue that the special character allegedly proper to cognitive impressions was not in fact peculiar to impressions produced in the required truth-guaranteeing way, but could also be found in false impressions (Cicero, Acad. 2.49–54, 79–82, 88–90; Sextus Empiricus, Adversus mathematicos [henceforwad S.E. M] 7.402–8 = Long and Sedley [henceforward L&S] 40H). If so, impressions that arise in the specified conditions, though true, will be indistinguishable from false impressions—so far as any intrinsic, discriminable character is concerned. Therefore they will not be cognitive, and not being cognitive, they will not be able to serve as a criterion. That there are no cognitive impressions is the first of the two propositions most closely associated with ancient skepticism. And since it then follows, on Stoic assumptions, that nothing can be known, this was often taken to be equivalent to the claim that nothing can be known. The second skeptical proposition, that one ought to suspend judgment, the Academics deduced from the first together with the Stoic doctrine that the wise do not hold (mere) opinions (S.E. M 7.155–7 = L&S 41C). On Stoic assumptions, assent to an impression that is not cognitive (either in the strict sense or in a broader sense which covers impressions that, though not perceptual, nonetheless afford an equally secure grasp of their contents), is sufficient to make the resulting judgment an opinion. Therefore, in the absence of cognitive impressions, one can avoid opinion only by suspending judgment entirely.

On a strictly dialectical interpretation, the skeptical propositions for which the Academics argued need not tell us anything about what philosophical views, if any, they accepted themselves. The skeptical position that comprises these two claims—that knowledge is not possible and that one ought to suspend judgement about everything—is an unwelcome consequence of Stoic views and presents the Stoics with a problem that it is their responsibility to solve, not the Academy’s.

To be sure, Arcesilaus and other Academics, Carneades above all, defended the possibility of a life without knowledge and without assent (Plutarch, Adversus Colotem 1122A–F = L&S] 69A). But that need not show that they somehow held a skeptical position. Instead their aim may have been to counter the Stoic charge that the Academic arguments for the skeptical propositions must be faulty because they render rational action impossible. And Arcesilaus’ account of how one can act in the absence of knowledge and without assent is so heavily dependent on Stoic doctrines that it looks very much like an effort to show the Stoics that their system already contained the resources necessary to explain how action was possible for the skeptic as envisaged in the Academy’s arguments.

Nevertheless, there is evidence that at some stage in the school’s history, even if they did not use the term ‘skeptic’, some Academics were skeptics in the sense that they adopted one or both of the two skeptical propositions as the correct philosophical position in propria persona. Whether Carneades endorsed a positions of his own and, if so, which ones is unclear and was already a matter of dispute in the Academy. He is known to have championed different positions on the same question in different contexts. It is plain nonetheless that he prepared the way for his successors to take this step (see below).

Later ancient writers sometimes speak of Carneades founding the third or New Academy (giving ‘New Academy’ which elsewhere covers the whole of the Academy from Arcesilaus’ time a narrower meaning) which followed the second or Middle Academy of Arcesilaus and the first or Old Academy of Plato and his earliest successors. (The distinction between Academies was meant to signal changes in philosophical doctrine or approach, not changes in the school as an institution.) The New Academy in this narrower sense seemed, to both ancient philosophers and modern historians, to differ from the Middle chiefly in two respects. Carneades appeared to favor a mitigated form of skepticism, which admitted the possibility of well-founded opinions if not of certain knowledge. And he tackled issues in, and sometimes defended positions about, logic, ethics, natural philosophy and theology as well as epistemology, which had been the focus of Arcesilaus’ attention.

It is likely that Carneades refined and added to the stock of skeptical arguments employed in the Academy. They come in two groups. The first focus on the allegedly peculiar character, a kind of clarity, and strikingness, that belongs only to impressions that arise in the way specified by the definition of the cognitive impression, while the second tackle the requirement that cognitive impressions be distinct (Acad. 2.54–8, 84–6; S.E. M 7.408–11 = L&S 40H). Arguments of the second type are based on the idea, denied by the Stoa, that two object might be exactly alike. If this were true, then even if impressions that captured their objects with complete accuracy by arising in the specified ideal conditions did possess a clarity that it was possible to acquire in no other way, it would not be possible to avoid errors of identification by confining one’s assent to impressions with the required clarity. One could, for instance, mistake someone for his identical twin. The only sure way to avoid error would then be to suspend judgment.

2.2 Probabilism

The contribution for which Carneades is best known, however, came in reply to the Stoics’ counter-argument in defense of the cognitive impression. In response to their contention that, without cognitive impressions, human beings would lack any basis for action or inquiry Carneades argued that such a basis could be found in so-called probable impressions (from probabilis, that which lends itself to or invites approval, Cicero’s Latin for Greek “pithanos,” persuasive) (see Allen, 1994; Obdrzalek, 2006; Reinhardt, 2018). The theory of probable impressions went far beyond anything Arcesilaus had said and had an independent appeal which Arcesilaus’ response to the same challenge lacked. Carneades’ defense of this theory is a main reason why he was thought to have departed from or moderated the stricter skepticism thought to have been espoused by Arcesilaus and the Middle Academy (S.E. Pyrrhoneae hypotyposes [henceforward PH] 1.227–30; M 7.166–89 = L&S 69DE). It seemed to be complemented by the line he sometimes defended on opinion, and that some of his successors took for his considered opinion, according to which assent to non-cognitive impressions and the opinions to which it gives rise are compatible with wisdom (Acad. 2.59, 67, 78). But the interpretation of Carneades championed by Clitomachus, according to which the wise will refrain from assent and so avoid opinion, also relied on probability as the basis for an alternative form of approval (Acad. 2.99-100, 104-3).

Carneades’ defense of probabilism can also be viewed, at least in the first instance, as a natural extension of the Academy’s tradition of dialectical argument, however. The epistemological debate between the Stoa and the Academy extended over many years and was conducted with a great deal of energy and ingenuity on both sides. It tended toward impasse. If the burden of argument fell entirely upon the Academy and the its members were restricted to premises that were strictly implied by Stoic theory, the Academic case was not proven. The Stoics were not required on pain of self-contradiction to accept all the premises the Academics needed. Nonetheless, by rejecting these premises, the Stoics often committed themselves to highly disputable contentions. This mattered to them, because their aim was not simply to vindicate the internal consistency of their system. They claimed that their views were true and uniquely consistent with common conceptions held by all human beings.

In effect, the Stoics claimed that no position apart from theirs could do justice to a set of considerations that were not peculiar to their school but were accepted by everyone. It should, then, be possible for them to convince open-minded and intelligent auditors of the truth of Stoicism. The challenge that Carneades accepted was to show that there were alternatives which could do justice to the agreed upon considerations as well as or better than did the Stoic position, while dispensing with its most distinctive and contentious features. Though it does not restrict itself to premises that are already Stoic doctrines, this form of argument is broadly dialectical. By aiming to do justice to the considerations which the Stoics agree are relevant to the area in question, and directing his arguments to intelligent and open-minded auditors whom they are committed to taking seriously, Carneades, perhaps among other things, was trying to show the Stoics that their position did not satisfy the standards they set for themselves. Because the theories he put forward and defended to this end are not based solely on Stoic doctrines, they sometimes have a wider appeal, and it is easier to attribute them to their author. Nonetheless, though they are Carneades’ in the sense of being his creations, they need not have expressed his convictions.

In keeping with this style of argument, Carneades prepared the way for his theory of probability by setting out an epistemological framework which, though obviously indebted to Stoic views, was intended to capture intuitions that were more widely shared. In this broadly foundationalist framework it is natural to look for a criterion of truth where the Stoics and other Hellenistic philosophers do, viz. among self-evident impressions of sense (S.E. M 7.159–65 = L&S 70A). Yet the Academy’s arguments against cognitive impressions seem to have shown that no such impressions are to be found. With the aid of his account of probability, Carneades undertook to show that, after all, they are not needed. Rational action and inquiry are possible without the foundation that cognitive impressions promised to provide because probable impressions can serve in their place. And if this is right, or if it is sufficiently plausible, the Stoics’ attempt to provide indirect support for their contentions about the cognitive impression by showing that there are no satisfactory alternatives will fail.

The account of probability explains how one can discriminate among impressions by investigating whether an initially persuasive impression agrees with one’s other impressions or if there is something about the conditions in which it arose that undermines confidence in it. The more such checks it survives, the more confidence one will have in it. Depending on the amount of time available and the importance of the matter in question, it is possible to perform more or fewer of them. Although no amount of checking is sufficient to eliminate any chance of error, it is possible to achieve the degrees of confidence required in different circumstances to make rational action and theoretical inquiry possible (Acad. 2.32, 110). Carneades’ theory is thus an early instance of fallibilism. And he seems to have used it not only to counter the Stoics’ argument that there are no alternatives to their theory, but also to suggest that that theory’s reliance on self-evident perceptual impressions is misplaced, even when viewed as an epistemological ideal. According to Carneades’ theory, the improvement of which our faculties are capable is not a matter of approaching the condition of perfect discrimination of self-evident impressions ever more closely; it consists instead in refining one’s appreciation for the complicated relations between impressions in virtue of which they add to or detract from each other’s value as evidence, which in some cases may lead us to reject apparently self-evident, true impressions.

Drawing on his account of probable impressions, Carneades defended two views about assent. He sometimes argued that the wise person will always withhold assent, but will be able to act and inquire by following or using probable impressions in a way that does not amount to assent, and so does not involve holding opinions about anything (Acad. 2.59, 99, 108). On other occasions, he maintained that the wise person will assent to what is probable and so form opinions, but with the proviso that he may be wrong (Acad. 2.59, 67, 78, 112). In this way he gave his interlocutors a choice between two alternatives to Stoic orthodoxy, each of which describes a way of life without the certainty furnished by cognitive impressions. Either one lives entirely without opinions, while following probable impressions without assenting to them or one lives with opinions, but opinions that are held in a self-consciously tentative spirit and subject to revision in the light of new evidence.

The view according to which the wise person assents and forms opinions appealed to those convinced by the Academy’s arguments that, though certainty is unobtainable, well founded probabilities are within our grasp, among which is this view itself. Someone who thinks this is likely to see little point in keeping a special kind of approval, assent, in reserve for a kind of certainty which he thinks is neither needed nor possible, though he cannot be certain of this any more than he can be certain of anything else. This view was, it seems, favored by Philo of Larissa among others (cf. Brittain, 2001), and it gave rise to a form of probabilism, as a positively endorsed theory of knowledge, which is one of the New Academy’s legacies. The other view, which favors withholding assent while still relying on probability, appealed to those who were attracted, as Zeno and Arcesilaus had been, to the ideal of certain knowledge, for which it preserves assent while permitting a weaker form of approval. This is the classical skeptical stance that was the New Academy’s other legacy, which was defended by Clitomachus, and it also influenced the other main ancient school of skepticism, the Pyrrhonists. It is noteworthy that the more radical forms of skepticism defended by Clitomachus and the Pyrhonists were less firmly attached to the skeptical proposition that nothing can be known than moderate skeptics, who assented vehemently to it (Acad. 2. 148).

3. Ethics

Tackling ethics, Carneades proceeded as he had in epistemology and constructed a framework intended to capture and do justice to the motives behind ethical theory. His framework classified not only all the views about the goal or end of life that had been held, but also all those that could be held (Cicero, Fin. 5.16–21 = L&S 64EG; cf. Algra, 1997). He sets out from the assumption that practical wisdom, the knowledge we need to conduct our lives successfully, must have an object. That is, it must be knowledge of something other than itself. This immediately rules out of contention views that identify human good with knowledge without having anything to say about what it might be knowledge of apart from human good (the threat of circularity had already been noted by Plato, Republic 505bc). He further supposes that this object must be one towards which human beings have a natural impulse. There were, he maintained, three possible such objects: pleasure, freedom from pain, and the natural advantages such as health and strength. The principle of virtue corresponds to this initial choice: to be virtuous is to act with a view to obtaining one of them. There are six simple views about the goal of life, three of which identify the goal with virtue, that is, acting with a view to obtaining either pleasure, freedom from pain, or the natural advantages; and three of which identify it with actually obtaining one of these objects. Three combined views take the goal to be a combination of virtue and actually obtaining the corresponding object. There are thus nine views altogether. The Stoic position, that virtue is the only good, is the third view mentioned, namely that the goal is acting with a view to obtaining the natural advantages whether or not one obtains them.

On different occasions, we are informed, Carneades defended the simple view that the goal is actually to obtain the natural advantages or the combined view that it is virtue together with pleasure (Fin. 2.35; 5.20; Acad. 2.132, 139). His aim seems to have been to challenge the Stoics by showing that the considerations captured by the framework do not all point to the Stoic view. By defending the view that the goal is the actual enjoyment of the natural advantages, Carneades probably intended to suggest that the considerations which support taking the natural advantages as the object of our first natural impulse, as the Stoics did, also count in favor of taking them to be goods and therefore components of the end. The point of arguing in support of the view that the goal is a combination of virtue and pleasure, on the other hand, was probably to show that taking pleasure as the ultimate object of impulse would require a recognizably virtuous life, a view for which there were Socratic antecedents in Plato’s Protagoras. Neither of these positions had the kind of independent appeal that Carneades’ probabilism and his views about assent did—our sources always describe them as put forward for the sake of argument—but Carneades’ division of ethical views was extremely influential, and through Cicero it shaped the modern understanding of Hellenistic ethical theory (cf. Striker, 1991 sect. 5; Allen, 2014).

Carneades also raised problems for the Stoic attempts to define of the end of life in terms drawn from the arts or technai (cf. Striker, 1991 sect. 3).

4. Other interests

We are well informed about Carneades’ contributions to two other important philosophical debates. The first concerns the cluster of issues surrounding fate, voluntary action and freedom; the second regards the nature and number of the gods.

4.1 Fate and Voluntary Action

Our principal source for the Hellenistic phase of the first debate and Carneades’ contributions to it is Cicero’s De fato, which has survived only in an incomplete form. (A Latin text with an English translation and helpful notes is found in Sharples, 1991; older but still useful is Bayer, 1963 with a German translation and notes. On the debate as a whole, see Bobzien, 1998). It is clear from the De fato that Carneades took on both the Stoics and the Epicureans. Cicero’s presentation suggests that he may have defended a consistent position distinct from theirs. If he did, here as elsewhere we do not need to decide whether he endorsed it in propria persona or put it forward as an alternative to challenge to the positions on offer. It was at least the latter, serving to show the Epicureans and the Stoics that there was another, arguably better, way to tackle the issues, one that avoided the most troubling and implausible choices to which they had been led in the construction of their own theories.

The Stoics held that all things come about by fate. Fate they define as ‘the ordered series of causes, when cause joined to cause brings about each thing, ceaselessly flowing for eternity’ (Cicero De divinatione I 125; Gellius Noctes Atticae 7.2.1-3 = L&S 55 K). To maintain that all things are fated in this context is to hold that every event is the effect of antecedent causes sufficient to bring it about. In other words, the Stoics were determinists. And they accepted some of the familiar implications of determinism, e.g, that a sufficiently powerful intellect with a complete grasp of the state of the world would be able to predict every future event (De divinatione I 127 = LS 55 O). They also confronted the familiar problems that determinism seems to present. If human beings are parts of a deterministic universe and their every action is the pre-determined effect of causes antecedent to their existence, there is a plausible argument that all our actions are involuntary, that as it was often put in the ancient debate, nothing is up to us or in our power. In no case could we have done other than what we did. And from this it would seem to follow that we are not responsible for our actions and, with this, that there is no scope for blame or punishment, which presuppose that we can be held morally responsible for at least some of what we do. They solved this problem to their own satisfaction by defending the first properly articulated compatibilist theory, according to which voluntary action is compatible with determinism.

Epicurus and his followers, by contrast, accepted that if all things are fated, then all our actions are involuntary, from which it follows that we are responsible for none of them. They preserved the voluntary and moral responsibility by rejecting fate, notoriously postulating the swerve, occasional random uncaused atomic motions (De fato 21-2; cf. Lucretius DRN 2.251-93 = LS 20 F).

Like the Stoics, the Epicureans were also occupied with we may call logical determinism. According to the principle of bivalence, every proposition P is either true or false. If there is a future tense proposition predicting every future occurrence before it happens–it doesn’t matter whether it has ever been expressed–true at all times before the event, it would seem that the future is fixed or settled. Aristotle tackled this problem in De Interpretatione 9, though it is unclear whether the parties to the Hellenistic debate were familiar with his contribution. Though an argument for the pre-determination of the future from bivalence alone is possible (there may be hints at De fato 21, 29), in Cicero’s presentation of the issues, the role of the principle of bivalence is to lend support to causal determinism. The idea seems to be that the truth of a proposition at a given time depends on the state of the world at that time and that the facts about the world that bear on the truth of a future tense prediction must be about causes then operative sufficient to bring about the predicted event.

Carneades’ most noteworthy contribution to the debate was to reject the connection, accepted by both schools, between the principle of bivalence and causal determinism. These, he argued, were separate issues. To affirm that a suitably formulated statement about the future that is true cannot become false implies nothing about fate, but is merely an explanation of the meaning of the words employed (De fato 20; cf. 27-8). The Stoics were not obliged to embrace determinism by accepting bivalence and were not entitled to cite bivalence as a ground for their commitment to determinism; the Epicureans were not under an obligation to repudiate bivalence because they rejected fate (De fato 20; cf. 32-3).

Even though his proposal would have freed the Epicureans to defend the swerve without the need to reject a fundamental principle of logic, Carneades was strongly critical of the swerve. The position that he put forward as an alternative was supposed to show how the Epicureans could uphold their cause without the swerve (De fato 23; cf. 47-8). It raises interpretive problems that reflect both the intrinsic difficulty of the issues and the imperfect state of our sources. The cause of the Epicureans to which Carneades promises to lend support is the rejection of fate, i.e., the view that every event is the effect of antecedent causes sufficient to bring it about. But the error from which he would save them is the postulation of uncaused motion, which is entailed by the swerve. According to Carneades, there is a way in which it can be truly said that there is motion without cause and a way in which it is false (De fato 24).

He offers an analogy designed to appeal to the Epicureans. In Epicurean physics atoms move downwards in straight lines unless disturbed by collisions with other atoms (collisions that are set in train by atomic swerves). The downward motion of the atoms is without a cause if we mean action exerted on them from outside, but their motion is not unqualifiedly uncaused, for it is their nature to move as they do (De fato 25). The voluntary motions of our mind–our volitions–are like this, not the effect of external causes (though there will be external occasions, or as we might say precipitating causes, for them).

His thought seems to be that the mind possesses a certain autonomy. Explanations of an agent’s actions are always available after the fact. ‘The outcome reveals its causes’ (De fato 37). Explanations for voluntary action do not terminate, as they arguably would if the Epicureans were right about the swerve, in uncaused motions, and we are not, as it might then seem, playthings of chance. Rather it is the nature of the mind, and the characteristics of the minds of the agents who act, which are the causes of their voluntary actions. But it is not because our actions are predetermined, not because they are fated, that we act as we do.

How effective Carneades’ version of autonomous mental causation was at disarming the determinist intuitions of his opponents–then and now–is another matter, of course.

4.2 Theology

Two accounts of Carneades’ sorites arguments against the existence of the gods have come down to us, one in Sextus Empiricus (M 9.182–90), one in Cicero’s dialogue, the De natura deorum (3.43–50).

Sorites arguments are fashioned by assembling as premises a sequence of conditionals the antecedent of each of which after the first is the consequent of the preceding member of the series. According to each premise, if a property belongs to an item or items specified in the antecedent, then it belongs to the item or items specified in the consequent. The argument using the property heap (Greek sôros), from which the genus takes its name, is a good example. If one grain of sand is not a heap, then the result of adding one more grain is not a heap; if two grains are not a heap, then the result of adding one more is not a heap. But it is plain that if one repeats the operation by which these premises are generated often enough, the result will be a sequence of conditionals the consequent of whose last member (n grains of sand are not a heap) is clearly false. Anyone who agrees that it is false, but who has accepted each of the conditionals in the sequence, is obliged to reject the antecedent of the first, that one grain of sand is not a heap, which seems just as plainly true as the consequent of the last premise is plainly false. Those who would avoid this face the difficult task of drawing a line somewhere in the sequence by rejecting one of the premises and explaining why this conditional and not one preceding it is to be rejected.

Carneades’ theological sorites arguments set out from apparently unobjectionable ideas about divinity and little by little, on the basis resemblances and implied grounds for bestowing divine status on the generally acknowledged gods, enlarge the extension of the divine until a conclusion that will be received as absurd is reached (cf. Burnyeat, 1982). The first argument in Sextus’ account, for example, proceeds as follows (M 9.182): If Zeus is a god, then Poseidon is a god, but if Poseidon is a god, then Achelous (a river) is a god; Achelous is a god, then so too is the Nile; if the Nile, then every river, then every stream. This, it is implied, is absurd. Therefore Zeus is not a god, and we are invited to draw the conclusion that there are no gods because if any being were a god, Zeus would be a god and it has apparently just been shown that he is not.

In Cicero’s account, Carneades’ purpose in so arguing is said to have been ‘not to abolish the gods–what could become a philosopher less–but to convict the Stoics of having explained nothing clearly about the gods’ (N.D 44). Scholars who follow the lead of this remark take Carneades’ intentions to have been narrowly dialectical–to draw unwelcome consequences from the commitments of his specifically Stoic opponents, consequences that for all the argument tells us follow only Stoic assumptions (see Couissin, 1941). But though the Stoics may be vulnerable to Carneades’ sorites arguments, the understanding of the divine on which the arguments depend is hardly peculiar to them. In Cicero the arguments are presented by the character Cotta, a priest in the Roman religion, who speaks the words describing Carneades’ intentions just cited. Cicero’s decision to make Cotta the spokesperson for Academic skepticism in his dialogue tells us something important about it, that it was possible to combine Academic skepticism with religious conviction. But the attitude, which resembles fideism, that Cotta attributes to Carneades may not have been Carneades’. There is no special reference to the Stoics in Sextus’ presentation. Carneades’ arguments, like those in the broader context, may have been intended to raise doubts about the existence of the gods that did not depend on Stoic philosophy and had implications that were not for the Stoics alone. Carneades would have been arguing not as a committed atheist of course, for he would have been sensible of the force of the argument in support of the gods’ existence, but perhaps as a pioneering agnostic (see Sedley, 2020).

Carneades also had a hand in the arguments raising problems in logic described in Cicero’s Academica (Acad. 2.91–8; cf. Barnes, 1997) and in the case against divination presented in his De divinatione.



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