Causation in Physics

First published Mon Aug 24, 2020

What role, if any, do causal notions play in physics? On the one hand, it might appear intuitively obvious that physics aims to provide us with causal knowledge of the world and that causal claims are an integral part of physics. On the other hand, there is an influential philosophical tradition, dating back to Ernst Mach and to Bertrand Russell’s extremely influential article “On the Notion of Cause” (1912), denying the applicability or at least the usefulness of causal notions in physics. While this tradition is perhaps not as dominant today than it once was, there continues to be a lively and active philosophical debate on whether causal notions can play a legitimate role in physics and, if yes, what role that might be. This entry surveys the main arguments in this debate focusing in particular on arguments appealing to putatively distinguishing characteristics of theorizing in physics.

1. Different Philosophical Projects

1.1 Metaphysical, Descriptive, and Functional Projects

In discussing the role of causation in physics or in our conception of the world more generally we may be engaged in several different philosophical projects (Woodward 2014): a metaphysical project, a descriptive project, and what Woodward calls a “functional project”. While there are obvious points of contact among these projects and a philosophical account may contribute to more than one project simultaneously, the three projects have distinctly different core aims and are characterized by different methodologies.

The aim of the metaphysical project is to uncover the metaphysical grounds or truth-makers for causal claims. The main division in the metaphysics of causation is between broadly Humean and non-Humean accounts of causation. Humean accounts deny the existence of fundamental modalities and maintain that fundamentally the universe is composed of a distribution of categorical properties and relations instantiated by localized entities—what David Lewis called the “Humean mosaic” (Lewis 1973; Loewer 2012). On the Humean view, all true modal claims, including causal claims, are grounded in non-modal features of the mosaic. Even though Humeans deny that modal properties, including causal properties, are part of the world’s fundamental ontology, they may allow for the existence of non-fundamental causal facts that are reducible to fundamental physical properties. Thus, Humeans can be—and many of them are—non-fundamentalists rather than eliminativists about causation.[1]

Non-Humeans, by contrast, take fundamental properties to include modal properties, such as nomic necessitation relations, dispositional essences, or causal properties. For non-Humeans causal features can be among the fundamental building blocks of the world. Some non-Humeans hold that the dynamical laws of physics are fundamentally causal laws in virtue of which earlier states of a system or of the world produce later states (Maudlin 2007). Others maintain that objects possess fundamental dispositions, capacities, or essences that are causal in nature (Cartwright 1989; Bird 2007).

In contrast with the metaphysical project, the descriptive project aims to describe our causal reasoning practices. Traditionally philosophers have tended to conceive of this project as having as its core aim to provide conceptual analyses of our everyday concept or concepts of cause. A conceptual analysis offers necessary and sufficient conditions for claims of the form “c causes e”. Regularity accounts, Mackie’s INUS condition account, or David Lewis’s counterfactual analysis are all examples of the descriptive project. In principle, the project could appeal to a broad range of data, including empirical work by psychologists and cognitive scientists. Generally, however, the descriptive project has focused almost exclusively on probing what philosophers upon reflection take to be commonsense intuitions concerning causal judgements (often involving Billy and Suzy throwing rocks or assassins pouring poison in drinks). Those developing conceptual analyses tend to focus their analyses on commonsense causal claims rather than on the use of causal notions in physics or in the sciences more generally.

A third project, the functional project, which Woodward outlines and defends in (Woodward 2014), asks what kind of functional role causal concepts play in our cognitive architecture and what purposes and goals causal cognition can serve. An influential argument for the indispensability of causal concepts is Nancy Cartwright’s argument that causal notions play a crucial role in distinguishing effective from ineffective strategies (Cartwright 1979).

The functional project has close affinities to what in recent years has been discussed under the term conceptual engineering (Cappelen 2018). Conceptual engineering aims to develop precise philosophical concepts that fulfil certain cognitive goals, often taking an existing concept as its starting point, offering a philosophical precissification of this concept and then engaging in an assessment of the precissified concept’s usefulness. In taking existing concepts of causation as its starting point the functional project concerning causation engages primarily in what David Chalmers calls “re-engineering” rather than “de novo engineering” (Chalmers 2018, see Other Internet Resources). Unlike the descriptive project, the functional project possesses a methodological or normative dimension, evaluating the usefulness of causal concepts and of types of causal reasoning.

1.2 The Fit with Physics

Woodward (2014) distinguishes “how does causation fit with physics” as a separate philosophical project on a par with the metaphysical, descriptive, and functional projects. Yet the question concerning the fit with physics is best thought of as a question to be addressed within each of the three projects. Indeed, philosophical discussions examining the fit of causal notions with physics can benefit from distinguishing carefully—and perhaps more carefully than it is often done—among the different projects within which the discussions take place.[2]

The fit with physics question seems unavoidable for the metaphysical project more generally: if a certain metaphysical account could be shown to be incompatible with the fundamental physical theories we accept, then this would constitute a reason for rejecting the account, since compatibility with physics arguably is a condition of adequacy for any metaphysical account of causation.

For any metaphysical account compatible with physics the question arises, what the truth-makers of causal claims are or what grounds these claims. There are three options: (i) either the truth-makers of causal claims are physical features of the world, (ii) or they supervene on physical features of the world, (iii) or they are non-physical features of the world that do not supervene on physical features of the world. If the truth-makers of causal claims are either physical features or supervene on such features, then the metaphysical account is compatible with the thesis of the completeness of the physical. On the third option, however, the account is incompatible with the completeness of the physical.

Causal eliminativists argue that there is no metaphysical account of causation compatible with physics or compatible with the completeness of physics and, hence, that causal notions should, as Bertrand Russell (1912) urged, be expunged from the philosophical vocabulary. Causal non-eliminativists who are also causal non-fundamentalists can come in various stripes. Some non-fundamentalists allow that non-fundamental causal concepts can be a legitimate part of at least some domains of physics. Other non-fundamentalists deny the latter claim and reject that causal notions and causal judgements can play a legitimate role within physics. John Norton is a non-fundamentalist who appears to be endorsing the former view, arguing that while causal fundamentalism is false “in appropriately restricted circumstances our science entails that nature will conform to one or other form of our causal expectations” (Norton 2003: 13). Yet Norton also seems to have some sympathies for causal eliminativism, since he likens causal concepts to the concept of caloric—a concept that no longer is accepted as playing a legitimate role in science.

Within the descriptive project we can distinguish two different ways of engaging with the fit-with-physics question. Most obviously (and what is more prominent in the philosophical literature) we can propose a conceptual analysis of our intuitive, commonsense notion of cause and then ask whether and to what extent the analysans also plays a legitimate role in physics. For example, we might ask to what extent Lewis’s notion of causal dependence analyzed in terms of time-asymmetric counterfactual dependence plays a role in reasoning in physics. As we will see below, prominent arguments denying that causal notions fit with physics are most plausibly understood as engaging in this version of a descriptive project.

Alternatively, a descriptive project may take physicists’ own widespread use of causal notions, both in research articles and in physics textbooks, as its starting point and proposes an analysis of the underlying causal concepts. Fritz Rohrlich’s proposal that causality has three different meanings in classical physics arguably is an example of this project. According to Rohrlich the three meanings are:

(a) predictability or Newtonian causality, (b) restriction of signal velocities to those not exceeding the velocity of light, and (c) the absence of “advanced” effects of fields with finite propagation velocity. (2007: 50)

the last of which concerns the temporal asymmetry of causation. To some extent Yemima Ben-Menahem (2018) also engages in this project, when she argues that the concepts of determinism, stability, locality, symmetry and conservation law are all causal concepts.

Similarly, we can distinguish two approaches to the fit-with-physics question within the functional project. For one, we may examine whether certain causal concepts that play useful cognitive roles in everyday contexts or in the special sciences also afford a legitimate role to causal reasoning in physics. Woodward (2007) takes this approach to the functional project and explores to what extent interventionist causal concepts that play an essential role in how we navigate the world fit with theorizing in physics. Alternatively, we can take the practices of physical theorizing and model-building as starting points and examine whether we can “engineer” causal concepts that fulfil certain cognitive functions within these contexts. Ben-Menahem (2018) is one of very few philosophers who take this approach to the functional project.

2. (Neo)-Russellian Challenges

Several of the most widely-discussed arguments aimed at establishing that there is no legitimate place for causal notions in physics can be traced to the writings of Ernst Mach (1900, 1905) and to Bertrand Russell’s extremely influential article “On the Notion of Cause” (1912). Russell’s target is the notion of cause in general, even though some of his arguments appeal to purported features of physical theorizing. Mach’s arguments focus more directly on physics, arguing that there is something distinct about physics that makes it especially inhospitable to causal notions. Contemporary defenders of neo-Machian and neo-Russellian arguments include Huw Price (1997; Price & Weslake 2009), Hartry Field (2003), John Earman (2011), and, to some extent, John Norton (2003; 2007; 2009).[3]

Neo-Machian and neo-Russellian arguments have a common structure. They point to some putative conceptual feature of causal relations and then argue that suitably fundamental theories of physics are incapable of grounding or incorporating these features (Ney 2016). The following five arguments have been particularly influential:

  1. The notions of cause and effect are inherently vague in contradistinction to the mathematical precision characteristic of theories in physics. This is the vagueness challenge.
  2. Causal notions can, if at all, only be legitimately employed in contexts in which we can isolate a small set of factors of interest as those responsible for the occurrence of an event—the dominant cause or causes—by drawing a distinction between causes and background conditions. Yet such a distinction, it is argued, cannot be drawn in physics. Call this the dominant cause challenge.
  3. Causes necessitate their effects, but the fundamental laws of physics are non-deterministic. This is the determinism challenge.
  4. Causal relations are relations among spatio-temporally localized events, yet fundamental physical laws relate entire global time-slices. Call this the locality challenge.
  5. The notion of cause is generally taken to be temporally asymmetric: effects never precede their causes. Yet, it is often argued that the dynamical laws of the fundamental or established theories of physics are time-symmetric and have the same character in both temporal directions. This is the time-asymmetry challenge.

2.1 The Vagueness Challenge

The nineteenth-century physicists Kirchhoff and Mach objected that causal notions are “infected by vagueness” (Kirchhoff 1876: v, my translation) and “lack the precision” (Mach 1905: 278, my translation) of the mathematical functional dependencies associated with physical theories. This criticism is echoed in the twenty-first century by John Norton (2003) and John Earman (2011), among others.

Within the descriptive project the vagueness challenge can be understood as arguing that our intuitive, commonsense notion or notions of cause are too vague to be given philosophical analyses precise enough to be able to play a legitimate role in the mathematized sciences. To the extent that physicists themselves engage in causal talk, this has to be understood as part of an informal framework within which physicists talk about theories but not as part of the formally rigorous and precise content of physical theories themselves (Earman 2011). One could imagine an analogous challenge as part of the functional project, even though here the criticism, if successful, would point to limits of the project of conceptually re-engineering causal notions and would show that causal concepts are so vague as to resist sufficient philosophical precissification.

Within the metaphysical project the vagueness challenge arguably looms especially large for defenders of metaphysically “rich” causal notions, such as notions of causal production. Here the challenge may be part of more general empiricist scruples about rich causal notions of production or “bringing about” along the lines of what has traditionally been taken to be Hume’s criticism of causation. Yet the vagueness challenge can also be presented as a challenge to broadly Humean accounts of causation, such as David Lewis’s account (Lewis 1973).

On most accounts of causation causal claims closely track counterfactual claims. But counterfactual claims are notoriously vague and appear to be highly context-dependent. Consider the following example of how the vagueness challenge for counterfactual claims may arise in combination with the time-asymmetry challenge: imagine a fully elastic collision between two billiard balls on a frictionless plane. What, if anything, can single out putatively causal counterfactuals of the form “If the balls’ initial state prior to the collision had been different, their final state after the collision would be different” from putatively anti-causal backtracking counterfactuals of the form “If the balls’ final state were different, their initial state would have to have been different”? Newton’s laws underwrite both kinds of counterfactual equally: just as different initial states are associated with different final states, differences in the system’s final state have to be correlated with differences in the initial state. Within the context of an initial value problem, in which the initial state of the balls is given and Newton’s laws are used to calculate the subsequent motion of the balls, the former type of counterfactual is the appropriate one, while the context of a final value problem (which asks us to calculate the balls’ prior motion given their final state) suggests the latter type of counterfactual.

Similarly, we might ask if hitting one of the balls with a hammer exactly as they collide will result in changes to the balls’ motion after they collide or before they collide. Intuitively it seems that the force exerted by the hammer will causally influence the ball’s subsequent motion. But it is not obvious how this verdict is borne out purely by considering Newton’s equations: singling out the forward-looking counterfactual as the correct one seems arbitrary. As John Earman argues,

the exercise of trying to divine the truth value of such counterfactual assertions, even when it is agreed at the outset what the basic laws are, is an invitation to a contest of conflicting intuitions about cotenability of conditions and the closeness of possible worlds. (Earman 2011: 494)

David Lewis proposes an answer to this concern, arguing that the time-asymmetry of counterfactuals is secured by an asymmetric overdetermination of the present by the future (Lewis 1979), but Lewis’s overdetermination thesis is false in the context of the deterministic theories he considers (Frisch 2005: ch. 8; Loewer 2007).

A successful response to the vagueness challenge would have to show that there exist causal notions that can be reconstructed in a manner sufficiently precise to allow these notions to play a role in mathematized sciences such as physics. Bayes-net or structural accounts of causation (Pearl 2000; Spirtes, Glymour, and Scheines 1993 [2000]) take up this challenge (see section 3 below).

2.2 The Dominant Cause Challenge

Many paradigmatically causal claims relate one cause (or at most a very small set of causal factors) to an effect. Often discussed examples in the literature include “the short circuit caused the fire” or “Suzy’s throwing the rock caused the window to break”. If one takes it to be an essential characteristic of causal claims that they involve only a small set of fairly localized causally relevant factors—what Norton calls “the dominant causes” (Norton 2003: 17)—acting along clearly distinguishable causal routes, then this gives rise to the following argument against the applicability of causal notions in physics (Field 2003).

If we assume that a system is governed by deterministic physical laws, then the laws allow us to derive the occurrence of some event E from appropriate initial and boundary conditions. What combination of initial and boundary conditions are required depends on the type of mathematical equation that express the laws. In the case of hyperbolic equations, such as the wave equation, we can formulate a pure initial value problem. In this case, the event E occurring at spatial location x and time \(t_1\) is derivable from an earlier state S specified on a complete initial value surface in a region surrounding x at time \(t_0.\) What is important is that nothing less than a complete specification of the state on the initial value surface will allow E to be derived from the laws—the laws are silent on how a system with incompletely specified initial conditions may evolve. That is, (a) we need to specify the initial state in the relevant region completely and in whatever detail the laws at issue require; and (b) the relevant region comprising the initial value surface may be quite large. In the case of relativistic theories initial value surfaces consist of entire cross sections of the backward lightcone of E. (The backward lightcone consists of those events from which a signal traveling at most at the speed of light could reach E.) In the case of classical Newtonian theories, which allow for signals propagating at arbitrarily high speeds, S would have to amount to the state of the entire universe at some time \(t_0\) prior to E.

In his seminal article (1912), Russell uses similar considerations to argue that the causal law “same cause, same effect” is either trivial or false: if the cause of an event E is taken to include less than a complete specification of all the putatively causal factors relevant to the E’s occurrence, then the law is false, since then the occurrence of E could then still be disrupted by some external influence not captured within the specification of the set of E’s causes. But once the state S on an initial value surface is fully specified in sufficient detail including the entire environment of E, this state will generally be so complex that it is highly likely that a state of exactly this kind will never again occur in the history of the universe. That is, true causal regularities of the form “whenever S is instantiated E will occur” will be instantiated at most once.

What, then, is the cause of an event E? It is not enough for defenders of causation simply to give up the principle “same cause, same effect”. The challenge, according to the dominant cause argument, is to find a criterion that somehow allows us to distill a small set of causes from the complete goings-on on an initial value surface S. And causal skeptics argue that physical theories themselves cannot provide such a criterion. If causes determine their effects, nothing short of the complete state on S will classify as the cause or the set of causes of E. This leaves three options, all of which may seem unpalatable for a defender of causation in physics.

Either we take the entire state on S to be the single cause of E. But then causes will in general be highly non-localized events. Or we allow for a very large and potentially infinite set of causes of E at all times t prior to E. But then we have given up on the idea that it is part of the concept of cause to single out a small set of factors as being responsible for an event. Or, finally, we concede that whatever considerations allow us to single out a small set of factors come from outside of physics. But then, it seems, we have to concede that causal notions do not play a role within physics proper. Isolating a small set of factors as the causes or the dominant causes of an event presupposes a distinction between causes and background conditions. For example, we might take the short-circuit to be a cause of the fire, relegating the presence of oxygen and of flammable materials and the prevailing meteorological conditions to the background conditions. Yet, the argument claims, such a distinction cannot be drawn on purely physical grounds. Any reason for singling out the short circuit goes beyond a purely physical description of the situation and must be driven by adding context-dependent or pragmatic considerations.

The dominant cause challenge can be raised both as part of the descriptive project and as part of the functional project. Within the descriptive project the claim is that it is part of our commonsense notion of causation that events only have a small number of causes. Within the functional project the claim becomes that singling out a small set of events as an event’s causes serves important purposes in our cognitive architecture that would not be fulfilled by any notion of cause allowing for an event to have an arbitrarily large set of causes. This claim might be supported by pointing out that causal claims are used to assign responsibility or blame, to single out factors that are particularly amenable to interventions into a system and for control, or to single out factors that we may find particularly salient in a given context—functions that all appear to require zeroing in on only a small number of dominant factors as an event’s causes.

In response to the dominant cause challenge one can argue that (either descriptively or functionally) we ought to distinguish between more strongly pragmatic causal notions and an objective—or at least less context-dependent—core concept of causation. The fact that a small set of particularly salient or explanatorily relevant causal factors, in a given context, are often singled out as the causes of an event points to a pragmatic dimension of causal talk. Yet this is compatible with allowing for much more complex and fine-grained underlying structures, which are causal in a non-pragmatic (or at least less pragmatic) sense of “cause”. Our physical theories, according to this view, describe an arbitrarily complex and appropriately objective causal web, yet in any given explanatory context only an extremely small subset of the web’s nodes is singled out as pragmatically salient causes.

Within the descriptive project the reply would have to argue that our commonsense concept of cause is multidimensional in this sense. Within the functional project, the reply could concede that focusing on a small set of causal factors fulfills certain pragmatic and context dependent roles yet maintain that these are not the only functions of causal concepts and causal judgements and that there are other functions that are compatible with—or even require—a broader notion of what counts as an event’s causes.

2.3 The Determinism Challenge

Causes are often taken to act deterministically in accord with the principle “same cause—same effect”. Indeed, that causes determine their effects is built into many philosophical accounts of causation, such as Hume’s regularity account. We have already seen that the demand that causes determine their effects puts pressure on the idea that paradigmatic causal claims relate a small number of localized events to one another. But even considered on its own the association between determinism and causation can be marshalled in support of an anti-causal argument.

One version of the determinism challenge proceeds from the following two premises. First, according to the most promising accounts of causation, causes act deterministically: a complete set of causes determines its effects. Second, mature theories of physics are not deterministic. From these premises the argument concludes that cause-effect relations cannot be part of our mature theories of physics.

Norton presents the determinism challenge as part of a more general challenge that any defender of causal notions in physics faces, which he puts in terms of the following dilemma:

EITHER conforming a science to cause and effect places a restriction on the factual content of a science; OR it does not. […] In the first horn, we must find some restriction on factual content that can be properly applied to all sciences; but no appropriate restriction is forthcoming. In the second horn, since the imposition of the causal framework makes no difference to the factual content of the sciences, it is revealed as an empty honorific. (2003: 3–4)

For causal notions to play a legitimate role in physics, Norton claims they must do so as part of an acceptable “principle of causality” that provides a universal constraint on all physical theories. What form might such a principle take? The physicist Erwin Schrödinger proposed a causal principle that combines some of the options canvased by Norton—determinism, locality, and temporal asymmetry:

the exact situation at any point P at a given moment is unambiguously determined by the exact physical situation within a certain surrounding of P at any previous time, say \(t - \tau.\) (Schrödinger 1951: 28).

It follows from the existence of successful physical theories that violate the principle either that we have yet to find the correct principle of causality or that there is no such principle that constitutes a universal causal constraint. This, Norton argues, entails that “the notion of cause is dispensable” (Norton 2003: 8).

That a principle of determinism is violated in physics receives support from quantum mechanics—or at least from any interpretation according to which the theory is indeterministic. Yet if quantum mechanics were cited as reason for the failure of a principle of causality, one can try to rescue the principle by introducing a notion of probabilistic causation: causes do not determine their effects but determine the probabilities of an effect’s occurrence. Here, too, Schrödinger can serve as example, who later maintained that

what do change [in the evolution of a quantum state and as a result of quantum measurements are] the probabilities; these, moreover, causally. (Schrödinger 1935: 809; quoted in Ben-Menahem 2018: 92)

Partly motivated by the probabilistic nature of quantum mechanics, philosophers have developed probabilistic accounts of causation (Suppes 1970), according to which the presence of a causes raises (or at least changes) the probabilities of its effects.

Norton (2003) argues that this defense is unsuccessful, since determinism comes under pressure even in what is often taken to be the paradigm of a deterministic theory, Newtonian physics. Norton’s example of an non-deterministic Newtonian system is that of a mass, subject only to gravitational force, initially at rest sitting at the apex of a dome whose height h depends on the its radius r according to \(h=(2/3g)r^{3/2}.\) Norton shows that this system has an infinity of solutions, each corresponding to the mass sliding down the dome in some arbitrary radial direction \(\cdot\) at some arbitrary time T. Hence the system is indeterministic and for each particular solution there is nothing to which we can point as the cause of the mass’s beginning to slide down the dome in direction \(\cdot\) at time T.

It is unclear, however, whether examples such as this do indeed show that Newtonian mechanics is indeterministic. The force acting on the mass, which is given by \(F=r^{1/2},\) does not satisfy a continuity condition for \(r=0\)—the so-called Lipschitz condition. According to the Cauchy-Lipschitz theorem, the Lipschitz continuity condition (which, intuitively, restricts how fast a function can change) is a sufficient condition for the initial value problem to have a unique solution—that is, for the system at issue to behave deterministically (“Cauchy-Lipschitz theorem” in Other Internet References). And one can argue that conditions constraining the allowable force functions in Newton’s law, such as the Lipschitz condition, are an integral part of the content of Newtonian physics. Thus, whether we take Newtonian physics to be deterministic depends on what we take the content of the theory to be. If what counts as a Newtonian system is not given by Newton’s laws alone but depends on additional conditions, including the Lipschitz condition, then the theory is deterministic after all (Fletcher 2012). If the content of the theory is given merely by the conjunction of Newton’s laws without additional constraints on allowable force functions, then Norton’s example shows that the theory is not deterministic.

The determinism challenge can be raised as part of each of the three philosophical projects we distinguished: one might argue that our intuitive concept of cause is deterministic or that only a deterministic concept of cause could serve fulfil certain useful cognitive functions. But Norton’s dilemma that a causal constraint either has to place a constraint on all sciences—that is, is a universal constraint—or would amount to a mere honorific is perhaps most easily resisted within the functional project. As Woodward (2014) emphasizes, it is compatible with causal judgments playing an important cognitive role in some domains that there are limits to the scope of causal thinking and that causal concepts are not universally applicable. Thus, the usefulness of deterministic causal reasoning might be restricted to some contexts—contexts that may include some theoretical contexts in physics—while there may also be domains in physics in which deterministic causal notions are not applicable. Norton assumes that a constraint that is not universal is no constraint at all, but this assumption can be denied.

Norton’s demand that any causal principle needs to be a universal principle may be on a stronger footing within the metaphysical project and in fact Norton himself calls his argument “the fundamentalist’s dilemma”: If a metaphysical account of causation is committed to the principle “same cause–same effect” or even just to a probabilistic version of this principle, then the existence of genuine indeterminism in physics of the kind discussed by Norton would pose a serious threat to that account.

2.4 The Locality Challenge

According to many conceptions of causation, causes are local in various senses: First, causes are synchronically local: they are “smallish,” spatially localized events—or at least their size is proportionate to the size of the effect under consideration. If we demand locality in this sense, then this puts into sharper focus one of the horns of the trilemma posed by the dominant cause: we cannot identify the state on an entire time-slice S as the cause of an event in the future of S on pains of violating the locality constraint that causes be spatio-temporally localized.

Causal relations are also often assumed to satisfy diachronic locality constraints. Broadly such constraints come in two types: according to the first type of constraint causes do not act where they are not. That is, causes do not act across spatial or temporal gaps. According to the second type of constraint causal influences do not propagate infinitely fast. The two types of constraint are logically independent. Newtonian gravitational theory violates both types of constraint, but rigid body mechanics violates only the finite-speed constraint while action-at-a-distance versions of classical electrodynamics (that posit particles but not fields) satisfy the finite speed constraint but posit propagation of electromagnetic influences across spatio-temporal gaps. Classical electrodynamics as classical particle-field theory is the paradigm of a local theory: interactions among charged particles propagate at a finite speed—the speed of light—and are mediated by the electromagnetic field (Frisch 2002).

Locality constraints come under pressure in quantum mechanics (see section 7 below). One can use this fact as a premise in an anti-causal argument paralleling the argument appealing to failures of determinism.

  1. If causal notions play a legitimate role in physics, they must do so as part of an acceptable “principle of causality”.
  2. A locality condition is part of any plausible candidate for such a principle.
  3. To be acceptable any such principle must provide a universal constraint on all physical theories.
  4. There exist successful physical theories that violate the locality condition.
  5. Therefore, causal notions do not play a legitimate role in physics.

In analogy to the case of the determinism challenge, one can resist the conclusion of the argument by denying premise 1 and maintain that causal constraints can play a legitimate and useful role in physical theorizing even if they are not part of a universal principle of causality. Thus, one could maintain that the relativistic constraint that influences do not propagate faster than the speed of light is a genuinely causal constraint, which functions as a desideratum on physical theories but does not lose its legitimacy and importance should it not be satisfied by all successful theories of physics.

Again, the challenge may be raised within each of the three philosophical projects, with subtle but important different in each case. Within the descriptive project the argument would aim to show that a certain feature of our common-sense notion of cause does not allow this notion to at least some theoretical frameworks in physics.

Within the functional project one could argue in defense of premises 2 and 3 that local causal relations satisfy certain crucial desiderata not satisfied by non-local, putatively causal relations. Some well-known remarks by Albert Einstein concerning the role of locality suggest one route such an argument could take. According to Einstein, in a world that is not synchronically and diachronically local “physical thought” and “the establishment of empirically testable laws in the sense familiar to us” would be impossible (1948: 322; quoted in Howard 1985: 187–8). Einstein’s remarks suggest an argument according to which only causal relations satisfying various locality principles can fulfil cognitively useful functions such as allowing for testable predictions and guiding interventions. Yet this line of argument comes under pressure to the extent that quantum systems violate certain locality principles yet allow for testable predictions and experimental interventions (see section 7).

2.5 The Time Asymmetry Challenge

2.5.1 The general argument

Perhaps the most influential argument for the claim that causal notions cannot play a legitimate role in physics appeals to the fact that the causal relation is generally understood to be asymmetric. This asymmetry is often assumed to coincide with a temporal asymmetry according to which effects do not precede their causes.[4] This gives rise to the time asymmetry challenge that contrasts the time-asymmetry of causal relations with the purported fact that physical laws make no distinction between the past and future direction. This contrast is offered as a reason for why causal relations cannot be a part of physical theorizing. The time-asymmetry challenge can be represented in premise-conclusion form as follows:

  1. Causal relations are temporally asymmetric.
  2. The physical laws of our well-established theories have the same character in both the future and the past direction.
  3. Physical laws that have the same character in both temporal directions cannot ground time-asymmetric properties or relations.
  4. Therefore, causal relations cannot be grounded in features of physical laws.
  5. Properties or relations that cannot be grounded in features of physical laws cannot play a legitimate role in physics.
  6. Therefore, causal relations cannot play a legitimate role in physics.

Some authors respond to this argument by rejecting premise 1, positing a symmetric notion of causal dependence, which for non-simultaneous cause-effect pairs is also time-symmetric (Ney 2009). A potential problem for this response is that it appears to collapse the distinction between the notions of dependence and causation and may have difficulties explaining how a symmetric notion of causal dependence (as opposed to an asymmetric notion of causation) can play a role in elucidating the apparently asymmetric notions of intervention, responsibility, or explanation. These problems appear especially pressing from the perspective of the functional project. Thus, Ney’s proposal is most promisingly considered as part of a metaphysical project of uncovering the metaphysical grounds of causal claims.

What is it for laws to have the same character in the future and past directions? Farr and Reutlinger (2013) point out that this can be made precise in two logically independent ways and that we have to distinguish the claim (i) that the laws are both future and past deterministic from the claim (ii) that the laws are time-reversal invariant. Russell is often interpreted as appealing to (ii), when he says that

in the motion of mutually gravitating bodies, there is nothing that can be called a cause and nothing that can be called an effect; there is merely a formula. (Russell 1927 [2012: 141])

Maudlin (2007) points out that on reading (ii) premise 2 is false, since not all the fundamental laws of physics are in fact time-reversal invariant. According to the CPT-Theorem, any plausible quantum theory will be invariant under the combination of parity transformation plus charge conjugation plus time reversal. Since there is experimental evidence for CP-violations, we should conclude that quantum theories violate time-reversal invariance.

It has also been argued that even when considering time-reversal invariance the argument applies only to deterministic theories, since theories with non-trivial probabilistic state-transition laws are inherently time-asymmetric. As Satosi Watanabe (1965) shows, there can be no genuinely probabilistic theory with both non-trivial forward and backward transition probabilities (see also Healey 1983; Callender 2000). Thus, if quantum mechanics is understood as a fundamentally probabilistic theory, the argument’s scope is limited to what by the argument defenders’ own lights are the less fundamental deterministic theories of classical physics.

2.5.2 Causal (and anti-causal) Green’s functions

The time-asymmetry challenge is sometimes raised in the context of discussing the interpretation of a theory’s so-called “Green’s function”, which specifies how a system responds to a localized point-like disturbance. For example, the Green’s function associated with the wave equation describes the circular ripples on a pond’s surface after a small pebble was dropped in. When a theory’s equations are linear, the overall response of a system to multiple point-like disturbances can be calculated by summing or integrating over all disturbances. The important mathematical result is that any solution to the theory’s equations can be represented as a sum of two components: a sum or integral over the Green’s function for all the point-like disturbances plus a solution to the source-free equations. That is, the most general solution to the wave equation applied to our pond will consist of sums of ripples associated with any pebbles being dropped into the pond plus source-free waves on the pond not associated with any pebble as their “source”.

Putting the same point somewhat more formally, any linear differential operator L associated with an inhomogeneous differential equation \(\mathrm{L}y=f(x)\) and with constant coefficients possesses a fundamental solution or Green’s function G, which is a solution to the inhomogeneous differential equation \(\mathrm{LG}=\delta (x),\) where \(\delta(x)\) is the delta function, a generalized function that is zero everywhere except at \(x=0.\) The Green’s function tells us what the contribution of introducing a point-disturbance or perturbation into a system at \((x', t')\) is to the state of the system at some other point \((x, t).\) The overall response of a system at \((x, t)\) to multiple perturbations is calculated by summing or integrating over all point-like disturbances. The most general solution to a theory is given by adding to this response to disturbances a solution to the homogenous equation \(\mathrm{L}y=0.\)

Green’s functions, which are broadly applicable in physics, are quite naturally interpreted in causal terms, allowing us to represent the state at \((x, t)\) as sum of different disturbances as its causes. In fact, Green’s functions provide “a primary locus for causal claims within physics texts” (Smith 2013: 667). The causal significance of the Green function formalism has been challenged, however, by invoking a version of the time-asymmetry challenge. In the case of systems governed by the time-reversal invariant hyperbolic equations (such as the wave equation which can be derived from the Maxwell-Lorentz equations in classical electrodynamics) any state of a system can be represented either as a sum of “causal” or so-called retarded Green’s functions and a solution to an initial value problem of the homogenous, source-free equation \(\mathrm{LG}=0;\) or as a sum of “anti-causal” or advanced Green’s functions and a solution to a final value problem of the homogenous, source-free equation. Both representations are mathematically equivalent representations of one and the same state of the system. From this observation the time asymmetry challenge concludes that nothing in the mathematical formalism can legitimately distinguish between the different representations to single out one representation as the correct causal representation. Since interpreting both retarded and advanced representations causally is incompatible with the causal asymmetry, neither representation ought to be interpreted causally.

While the time asymmetry challenge can be raised for the Green’s function associated with hyperbolic equations, it is worth pointing out that there are also theories or theoretical frameworks in physics with time-asymmetric Green’s functions, chiefly among them linear response theory. There is no philosophical consensus on the causal status of the Green’s function formalism. Frisch (2009a; 2009b; 2014) argues for a causal interpretation of the Green’s function formalism, both in the case of the time-reversal invariant wave equation and in the case of the explicitly time-asymmetric linear response theory, while Norton (2009) and Smith (2013) are critical of causal interpretations of the formalism.

2.5.3 Initial conditions and common cause reasoning

Some authors have challenged premise 5 of the time-asymmetry challenge, according to which only those features that can be grounded in physical laws can play a proper role in physics. In effect, this premise implies that the proper content of physics is restricted to physical laws, thereby denying that initial, final, or boundary conditions are an integral part of the content of physics. One motivation for this restriction might be the thought that initial or final conditions are contingent “one-off” states, and hence should not count as part of the content of physics, which consists of general claims about the physical world: that a billiard ball was at rest on a specific spot on a billiard table when it was struck by a second ball is not part of physics but the laws of elastic collision are. But this line of thought ignores that initial conditions can also have more general features that are shared across a wide class of conditions. In fact, many physical situations are characterized by an asymmetry between prevailing initial and final conditions, according to which initial conditions are random while final conditions are not. And this asymmetry arguably is closely related to a causal asymmetry (Arntzenius 1992; Maudlin 2007).

Under certain plausible assumptions an initial independence or initial randomness assumption allows us to derive a principle of the common cause (first proposed by Hans Reichenbach (1956)), according to which spatially distant correlated events A and B that are not related as cause and effect possess a common cause in their past that explains the correlation and screens off the correlation between A and B (Arntzenius 1999 [2010]). That is, formally, if

\[ \tag{1} P(A \amp B) > P(A)P(B), \]

Then there is some event C in the past of A and B that explains the correlation between A and B and which satisfies:

\[\tag{2} P(A\amp B |C) = P(A|C) P(B|C) \]

A central feature of common cause reasoning is that it allows inferences from local data without full knowledge of the state of the world (or the state of a larger system) on a complete final value surface—states to which we very often do not have full access. Common-cause reasoning not only is a core function of causal representations in commonsense contexts but also is a central and ineliminable inference pattern in physics.

As a particularly vivid example illustrating common-cause inferences from very limited knowledge of the state of the universe on a final value surface consider the detection of gravitational waves in 2016, which, physicists concluded, were emitted by two colliding black holes. If we wanted to derive the black hole event within General Relativity from knowledge of the data on a complete final value surface, we would have to know the precise state of the universe in a sphere with a diameter of many, many light-years—something that is obviously impossible for us to know. Instead researchers inferred the black-hole event from the two signals detected locally in the LIGO detectors in Washington and Louisiana, arguing that the extremely strong correlations between the signals detected at both detectors simultaneously are evidence for the colliding black holes as the signals’ common cause.

Implicit in this causal inference is the assumption that there was no “carefully calibrated” gravitational wave coming in from past infinity, converging on the location of the postulated black-hole event, and then re-diverging—thereby mimicking a wave produced by two colliding black holes. This alternative explanation of the simultaneously detected signals is ruled out as utterly implausible, because a source free gravitational field coming in from past infinity that mimicked the field associated with the black hole event would have required absurdly strongly correlated initial conditions in remote parts of spacetime. By positing an initial randomness assumption such seemingly miraculous correlations are effectively excluded.

Notice, however, that, by contrast with correlations among initial conditions, we do not find “absurdly strongly correlated” final conditions implausible: indeed, correlated final conditions are just what we expect as joint effects of a common cause such as the collapsing of the black holes.

The principle of the common cause can be derived within the context of deterministic laws. Yet deterministic laws also appear to undercut the time-asymmetry of common cause inferences. Under determinism, if there is an event C in the past of two events A and B that screens A and B off from each other, then there will also be an event C* taking place after A and B that occurs exactly if C occurs and that renders the two events conditionally independent (Arntzenius 1992). In reply to this worry one can argue that future screening-off events, unlike those in the past, will in general be highly non-natural and non-localized (Woodward 2007). Demanding that appropriate physical variables represent localized and not highly gerrymandered events allows us to preserve the asymmetry induced by the initial randomness assumption.

There is broad agreement in the literature that our universe is characterized by an asymmetry between prevailing initial and final conditions, yet there is an ongoing debate what precisely this asymmetry entails for the status of the causal asymmetry and for the time-asymmetry challenge (see also section 5).

While some authors suggest that time-asymmetric causal relations might be strictly incompatible with time-reversal invariant dynamical laws, it is more promising to try and argue that adding time-asymmetric causal relations to physics cannot be justified within physics. It is this latter claim that an appeal to initial conditions and their role in underwriting common cause reasoning is meant to challenge. From the perspective of the functional project, the central role of common-cause reasoning both in commonsense and in physics contexts provides perhaps the strongest argument for the claim that the very same—or at least very closely related—causal concepts are operative in common sense causal judgements and in causal reasoning in physics.

Within the metaphysical project, granting that an asymmetry in initial conditions can justify an appeal to causal judgments is compatible with two distinct types of view on the metaphysics of causation. Some authors take the asymmetry between prevailing initial and final conditions to be metaphysically primary and maintain that it is this asymmetry which grounds our ability to reason causally. Consequently, on this view, causal relations are metaphysically not on a par with nomic relations: while physical laws are nomologically necessary, causal relations are contingent, since the asymmetry between initial and final conditions, from which causal relations are derived, is merely a de facto, nomologically contingent asymmetry. This view suggests a weaker version of the time-asymmetry argument, which points to the time-reversal invariance of the laws to conclude that causal relations cannot be grounded in the laws but only in a de facto asymmetry between prevailing initial and final conditions. The argument does not deny that causal judgments play a legitimate role in physics but denies that causal relations are metaphysically fundamental and affords them a modally weaker status than that of physical laws. That initial conditions are contingent is denied, however, by Barry Loewer (2007), who argues that the initial randomness assumption comes out as a law according to Lewis’s best system account of laws.

Other authors, by contrast, take the causal asymmetry (rather than the initial randomness assumption) to be primary, and argue that the causal asymmetry can then explain, account for, or ground the asymmetry between prevailing initial and final conditions. Thus, Hausman and Woodward (1999) argue that the reason why the values of initial variables characterizing initial states are uncorrelated is that these variables do not have common causes in their past. The causal asymmetry, on this view, is explanatorily prior to the asymmetry between initial and final states. Similarly, Pearl (2009) argues against the view that the initial randomness assumption allows us to derive the causal asymmetry from a non-causal premise that the initial randomness assumption should itself be thought of as a causal assumption. Maudlin (2007: 133) argues that the asymmetry between initial and final conditions is a manifestation of a more fundamental nomic asymmetry, which he however characterizes in strongly causal terms as an asymmetry of later states being nomically produced by or generated from earlier states.

3. Interventionist accounts of causation

The approaches to causation most widely discussed in the philosophical literature in recent decades have been the Bayes net or structural model accounts of causation developed by Peter Spirtes and his co-authors (Spirtes, Glymour, & Scheines 1993 [2000]) and by Judea Pearl (2000; 2009). The account’s formal framework is also at the heart of Woodward’s highly influential interventionist account of causation and explanation (Woodward 2003a).

Structural model accounts propose mathematically rigorous and precise representations of causal structures. On Pearl’s account, a structural causal model (SCM) consists of a directed acyclic graph (representable in terms of a “blobs-and-arrows” diagram) over a set of variables \(V={X, Y, \ldots}\) consisting of

  • endogenous variables \(V_i\) and exogenous variables \(U_i\);
  • structural equations \(x_{i} = f_{i}(pa_{i}, u_{i}),\) which specify the value of each variable \(x_{i}\) in terms of the value of the variable’s causal parents \(pa_{i}\) and random exogenous disturbances \(u_{i}\); and
  • a probability distribution \(P(u_{i})\) over the values \(u_{i}\) of the exogenous variables \(U_{i}\), which induces a probability distribution over all variables.

It is part of the definition of a structural model that the exogenous variables are probabilistically independent of one another (e.g., Pearl 2000: 44). From this together with the assumption that a causal model is complete one can derive the causal Markov condition, which is a generalized common cause condition and states that for every variable X in V, X is probabilistically independent of the variables in the set \((V - \textrm{Descendants}(X))\) conditional on the parents of X.

There is a debate in the literature to what extent structural model accounts can be applied in physics and what implications these accounts have for the role of causation in physics. Frisch (2014) proposes that we can construct causal representations of physical systems by identifying the variables characterizing a system’s initial state with the exogenous variables in a causal model and the theory’s Green’s functions with the model’s structural equations (see also Lloyd 1996).

One can then use the machinery of structural models to derive a common cause principle from the initial randomness assumption. In particular, the initial randomness assumption can be used to break the symmetry between the retarded and advanced Green’s functions for hyperbolic equations: Causal model constructed with retarded Green’s functions as structural equations satisfy the probabilistic independence assumption required in the structural model framework, while putatively causal models constructed with “anti-causal” or advanced Green’s functions violate the probabilistic independence assumption, since in such models the highly correlated variables characterizing a system’s final state functions as exogenous variables. Thus structural model accounts may provide an appropriate framework to support the claim that causal inferences and judgments play an important role in physics.

By contrast, Pearl (2000) and Woodward (2007) point to an aspect of structural causal models that may make the framework fit less well with at least some aspects of theorizing in physics. Structural causal models make perspicuous the tight connections between the notions of cause and intervention or manipulation. A structural causal model provides us with information on how the values of variables change under external interventions into a system, while causal discovery algorithms allow us to construct causal models from information about probability distributions over the values of variables characterizing the system and information about the effects of interventions. On Woodward’s account the notion of causation is spelled out in terms of so-called “hard” or “arrow-breaking” interventions. Arrow-breaking interventions allow us to investigate how changes to a variable V percolate through a system, when we place V under the full control of an intervention variable and break all other causal arrows into V. Yet arrow-breaking interventions may not be possible within the context of certain physical theories. Newtonian gravitational forces, for example, cannot be turned off.

In reply to this worry one can argue that interventions into physical systems may be more adequately modeled in term of “soft”, non-arrow breaking interventions, as investigated in Eberhardt and Scheines (2007). What the comparative merits of characterizing causal structures in terms of “hard” or “soft” interventions are, is the subject of an ongoing debate.

Pearl (2000) also argues that any account of causation that closely links causal notions and the notion of interventions cannot be applied in the context of a truly fundamental physics that includes models of the universe as a whole. The reason is that global models of the universe as a whole do not have an “outside” that could be represented by an intervention variable and from which an intervention into the universe could take place. Yet Pearl’s own do-calculus first introduces interventions formally in a way that does not posit intervention variables external to the causal model of interest. Nonetheless, interventions into the universe as a whole are not physically possible. Here the question concerning interventions in fundamental physics makes contact with another issue on which there is an active debate: the question on appropriate constraints on allowable interventions and the question to what extent interventions need to be physically or conceptually possible.

Taking a somewhat broader view, the worry concerning global models arises from a conception of physics that is widely held by philosophers—a conception according to which one of the fundamental aims of physics is to present us with global dynamical models of the dynamical laws that adequately represent the universe as a whole. The worry then is that causal models, in particular on an interventionist conception of cause, cannot get a foothold within such a globalist conception of physics. This globalist conception can be contrasted with one according to which the laws of physics are understood as rules governing localized subsystems of the universe (Ismael 2016; see also Cartwright 1999). Defenders of the latter conception would argue not only that it can more easily accommodate causal reasoning than the globalist picture but also that it fits the day-to-day practice of most of physics considerably better than the globalist conception.

4. Conserved Quantity Accounts of Causation

Conserved quantity accounts of causation are reductive accounts of causation that are explicitly designed to locate causation within the realm of physics avoiding the vagueness challenge. Most prominent here is the causal process account first proposed by Wesley Salmon (1984) and developed further in Phil Dowe’s conserved quantity account (Dowe 2000; see also Kistler 1999 [2006]). Proponents of conserved quantity accounts take their accounts to contribute to the metaphysical project of determining objective causal structures that serve as truth-makers of causal claims.

Dowe distinguishes causal processes and causal interactions, which he defines as follows:

A causal process is a world line of an object that possesses a conserved quantity.
A causal interaction is an intersection of world lines that involves exchange of a conserved quantity. (Dowe 2000: 90)

Conserved quantities are those quantities, such as energy, momentum, mass, or charge, that are conserved according to our physical theories. By deriving its inspiration from physics, where conservation laws play a central role, conserved quantity accounts promise to be able to meet the neo-Machian and neo-Russellian challenges. In fact, since, according to Noether’s First Theorem, there is a conservation law associated with each continuous symmetry property of a system, there seems to be a clear formal route for locating causal claims within physics.

It is unclear, however, how broadly applicable Dowe’s account is. Classical electrodynamics satisfies energy-momentum conservation. Yet while charged particles are associated with world lines, the electromagnetic field, with which charged particles interacts, cannot be associated with a world line along which energy is conserved. As Marc Lange (2002) has argued, it is problematic to think of the electromagnetic field energy as a kind of “stuff” that flows in a uniquely identifiable manner among different field-regions. Thus, Dowe’s conserved quantity account appears to be designed for an ontology of discrete objects and it is unclear how the account might be extended to cover field theories as well.

While conserved quantity accounts offer an analysis of the notion of being causally related, they do not, on their own, provide a distinction between cause and effect. To introduce the direction of the causal relation, Dowe supplements his conserved quantity account by appealing to Reichenbach’s fork asymmetry (1956). Reichenbach distinguishes forks that are temporally open from forks that are closed. If there is an event C occurring in past that screens off A from B, but there is no screening-off event in the future of A and B, then this constitutes an open fork. If there is an event C in the past and in addition an event \(C'\) in the future of A and B that screen off A from B, we have a closed fork. Now, Reichenbach’s fork asymmetry thesis consists in the claim that all open forks are open toward the future. Dowe (2000: 204) defines the direction of causal processes by the direction of the majority of open forks (thereby, in principle, allowing for the possibility of backward causation).

Thus, in order to define the direction of causation, the conserved quantity accounts need to be supplemented by probabilistic information. It has also been argued that conserved quantity accounts cannot adequately distinguish those features of a process that are explanatorily relevant from those that are not without relying on counterfactuals (Woodward 2003b [2019]). Earman (2014) argues that the most appropriate way to characterize causal processes is in terms of systems governed by equations that allow for a well-posed initial value formulation, which are systems governed by hyperbolic equations (see also Woodward 2016).

5. Causation and Entropy

Several authors have argued that the causal asymmetry and the direction of causation are closely related to the thermodynamic asymmetry that the entropy of a closed system does not decrease. An early discussion of possible connection between the two “temporal arrows” occurs in Reichenbach (1956). More recent discussions of connections between the two arrows argue more perspicuously that the thermodynamic and the time-asymmetry of causation have as their common origin the initial randomness assumption or the assumption of initial microscopic chaos. The assumption of initial microscopic chaos is a central assumption in neo-Boltzmannian accounts of the thermodynamic asymmetry. These accounts posit a cosmological hypothesis, according to which the universe began its life in an extremely low entropy state \(M(0),\) which Richard Feynman has dubbed the Past Hypothesis (1965), together with an equiprobability distribution over all microstates compatible with \(M(0).\) David Albert and Barry Loewer argue that the package consisting of past hypothesis, probability postulate, and the dynamical laws on the microlevel—a package they call the Mentaculus after the Coen Brother’s movie A Serious Man—not only can account for the thermodynamic asymmetry but also provides the probabilities for every macroscopic generalization as well as the machinery to ground the causal asymmetry and epistemic asymmetries concerning our access to past and future events (Albert 2000, 2015; Loewer 2007, 2012).

While on Albert and Loewer’s account the causal asymmetry is ultimately grounded in the probability postulate, they attempt to derive this asymmetry via a somewhat circuitous route. The first step is to argue that the Mentaculus implies a branching tree structure toward the future on the macrolevel, according to which the universe’s macrostate at a time is compatible with many more different macro-evolutions toward the future than macro-evolutions toward the past. In a second step they argue that this branching tree structure underwrites an asymmetry of counterfactual dependence on the macro-level and thereby supports a broadly Lewisian counterfactual analysis of the temporal arrow of causation. The claim that the Mentaculus implies a temporally asymmetric branching tree structure of the kind postulated by Loewer is criticized in Frisch (2010): since future higher entropy macro states occupy vastly larger regions of phase space than lower entropy past states, thermodynamically normal evolutions, if anything, suggest an upside-down tree structure.

Other authors have proposed more direct arguments for deriving the causal asymmetry from assumptions made in the foundations of thermodynamics, than the one developed by Albert and Loewer, arguing that we can derive the common cause principle and thereby the direction of causation directly from the assumption of initial probabilistic independence. For a large class of microscopic conditions the probabilistic independence assumption follows from the assumption of initial microscopic chaos (Horwich 1987; Papineau 1985). In particular, as Arntzenius argues, the probabilistic independence assumption will be satisfied for spatially separated microstates if we assume initial microscopic chaos (Arntzenius 1999 [2010]). There is also an active debate in the literature on how the causal and thermodynamic asymmetries relate to various epistemic asymmetries, such as an asymmetry of records or an asymmetry concerning our epistemic access to the past and to the future. For different accounts of the knowledge asymmetry and an asymmetry of records see Horwich 1987; Albert 2000, 2015; Loewer 2007; Frisch 2007, 2014; and Ismael 2016.

Most authors exploring the connection between the thermodynamic and causal asymmetries argue that the causal asymmetry is ultimately grounded in some facts about the initial state of the universe. Some authors, however, have argued that the explanatory direction is reversed and that the causal asymmetry accounts for the asymmetry between prevailing initial and final conditions. Maudlin has argued that the difference between initial and final conditions is a reflection of causal laws that, he maintains, underwrite the passage of time (Maudlin 2007: 131).

6. Causation and Radiation

Electromagnetic radiation phenomena exhibit a temporal asymmetry: we observe radiation coherently diverging from a radiating source, such the light emitted by a star, but we do not observe radiation coherently converging into a source, unless we delicately set up such a system. What can explain this asymmetry? And how is the asymmetry related to the causal asymmetry, on the one hand, and the thermodynamic asymmetry, on the other? Debates on these questions have a long history. On one side we find both physicists and philosophers who maintain—in the case of physicists sometimes more, sometimes less explicitly—that the “arrow of radiation” is a manifestation of a causal asymmetry (Ritz 1908; Einstein 1909a; Jackson 1999; Griffiths 2017; Rohrlich 2006; Frisch 2005; 2006; 2014). On the other side, there are physicists and philosophers who maintain that the arrow of radiation has the same root as the thermodynamic arrow, an asymmetry between prevailing initial and final conditions (Einstein 1909b; Wheeler & Feynman 1945; Price 1997; 2006; North 2003; Zeh 2007; Earman 2011).[5]

This debate is far from settled. The laws of classical electrodynamics, the Maxwell-Lorentz equations, imply a wave equation, which is a time-reversal invariant hyperbolic equation of motion and is standardly solved using the Green’s functions formalism. Thus, the disagreement is partly a disagreement over the question whether the radiation field’s causal or retarded Green’s function captures important features of how charged particles and electromagnetic fields interact that are not properly captured by the “anti-causal” or advanced Green’s functions.

Some authors argue that the asymmetry of radiation is, like the thermodynamic asymmetry purely a macroscopic phenomenon (Price 1997; Field 2003). But this claim is not borne out by how physicists treat interactions between charges and fields. To the extent that microscopic charged particles can be (and in fact are) modeled classically, their interactions with fields are modeled as exhibiting temporal asymmetries just as macroscopic field sources do (Jackson 1999). These asymmetries include the fact that accelerating microscopic charged particles are damped (since they radiate off part of the energy they receive), rather than being anti-damped (extracting additional energy from the surrounding field) (Rohrlich 2007). Thus, whatever the correct account of the asymmetry of radiation is, it has to apply to microscopic charged particles as well as to macroscopic collections of charges.

Authors who try to derive the radiation arrow from probabilistic considerations sometimes argue that coherently converging waves do not occur because such waves would require a radically improbable coordinated behavior of incoming waves (Earman 2011; see also Atkinson 2006). But this line of argument is in danger of committing what Price has called “the temporal double-standard fallacy” (Price 1997). From an acausal perspective the coordinated behavior of outgoing waves in the future of a radiating source should appear to be no less improbable than coordinated behavior of incoming waves in the past of the source. Thus, probabilistic accounts that deny a fundamental causal asymmetry need to be careful to avoid probabilistic arguments for the asymmetry ultimately driven by causal intuitions and presumably have to be content with positing the initial randomness assumption as a fundamental de facto asymmetry that cannot be further justified.

It is important here, too, to be clear on what is at stake in the debate. Within the metaphysical project, the debate concerns the question what the fundamental grounds for the asymmetry of radiation phenomena are: is the asymmetry an expression of a fundamental causal asymmetry or is it due to an asymmetry between prevailing initial and final conditions?

From the perspective of a purely functional project, by contrast, there is less disagreement between these two views than it may initially seem. From a functionalist perspective, defenders of a causal picture and defenders of a probabilistic account can be understood as emphasizing two different aspects that both are integral features of causal models: an initial independence assumption and directed causal relationships among variables. Thus, certain criticisms of causal accounts of the asymmetry of radiation, such as Earman (2011), are most charitably understood as attacking a metaphysical account of the role of causation in accounting for radiation phenomena. Earman’s criticism cannot undermine a functional account of causation in physics, since it invokes the very same probabilistic considerations that, on a functional account, underwrite representing radiation phenomena in terms of causal models.

7. Causation and Quantum Mechanics

It is often argued that quantum mechanics is particularly inhospitable to causal notions. Early discussions of a putative tension between causal notions and quantum mechanics focused mainly on the indeterminism of quantum mechanics. More recent discussions by contrast, focus on the problem that nonlocal quantum correlations violate Bell inequalities as presenting a challenge to causal analyses. In a standard setup of a Bell-type experiment one considers two observers who perform experiments in two spatially separated laboratories on two entangled subsystems. The two experiments are performed independently but can have outcomes that can be correlated in ways that are not readily accounted for by classical causal models. There are different strategies for deriving Bell inequalities. Particularly helpful analyses for the status of various causal assumptions are developed in Wiseman and Cavalcanti (2017) and Wood and Spekkens (2015), who examine how to apply Pearl’s structural causal models to Bell experiments (Myrvold, Genovese, & Shimony 2019). Simplifying somewhat, Wiseman and Cavalcanti assume that Bell experiments take place in Minkowski spacetime and have real outcomes that are not relative to anything. They then show that the quantum correlations predicted for Bell experiments conflict with the conjunction of three postulates: relativistic causality, according to which an event’s causal past is its past lightcone; free choice, which states that measurement settings can be freely chosen and, hence, have no causes within the system under consideration; and Reichenbach’s principle of a common cause, according to which correlations among events that are not related as cause and effect are explained by a common cause in their joint past that screens off the correlation.

If we want to accept the quantum mechanical predictions, which appear to be empirically well-confirmed, we have to reject at least one of the postulates. Rejecting free choice amounts to accepting superdeterminism, according to which measurement settings cannot be freely chosen. Alternatively, we can give up relativistic causality, either by allowing for superluminal influences from the outcomes at one wing on that at the other wing, or by positing retro-causal relations, which allow measurement outcomes to influence the earlier state of the source (see, e.g., Price 2012; and references in Friederich & Evans 2019).

While these strategies allow us to retain Reichenbach’s principle that correlations among non-causally related events are explained by a common cause that screens off these correlations, they come at a price and, as Wood and Spekkens (2015) show, violate a condition that goes by the names of faithfulness (Spirtes, Glymour, & Scheines 1993 [2000: 35]), stability (Pearl 2009: 49), or no-fine-tuning and which states that every causal dependence implies a probabilistic dependence. Wood and Spekkens show that faithfulness, the causal Markov condition, and the assumptions that the quantum predictions are correct form an inconsistent set. Thus, at least one of the two conditions—faithfulness or the Markov condition—has to be given up.

What speaks for retaining faithfulness is that it is a central assumption in many causal discovery algorithms. Yet there are also arguments suggesting that faithfulness cannot be a necessary condition on causal models (Cartwright 2001). Paradigmatic cases of violations of faithfulness involve cancelations among different causal paths, as they occur in feedback-control structures. For example, ambient temperature is causally relevant to human body temperature, even though body temperature is probabilistically independent of ambient temperature over a wide range of ambient temperatures, since the human body responds to changes in ambient temperatures through various mechanisms along different causal routes, which are fine-tuned in a way that allow the body to maintain a constant core temperature. Thus, faithfulness arguably is not a necessary condition for causal models.

One might reply, however, that canceling path violations of faithfulness result from a system’s specific causal structure: the causal structures at issue appear to be designed precisely to allow for what amounts to violations of faithfulness. By contrast, Wood and Spekkens show that if we hold on to the Markov condition, then violations of faithfulness have to be a generic feature of quantum causal systems that violate the Bell inequalities. It is unclear, whether a plausible account of such generic violations of faithfulness in quantum systems involving cancelling paths can be given. Näger (2016) explores several alternative ways in which faithfulness might be violated in quantum causal systems. By contrast, Glymour (2006) argues that instead of giving up faithfulness, we ought to reject the Markov condition in quantum contexts.

Another response to the problem of embedding correlations among outcomes in a causal structure has been to assume a type of holism which prohibits treating the spatially separated parts of the entangled system as distinct subsystems. The suggestion is instead to think of the measurement results at the two wings of the experiment as “a single indivisible non-local event” (Skyrms 1984). Hausman and Woodward (1999) argue that it also follows from an interventionist analysis that the measurement outcomes at the two wings of the experiment ought to be treated as a single non-local event. How to causally model entangled states remains a debated question.

One might want to conclude from the fact that quantum correlations are incompatible with the conjunction of faithfulness and the Markov condition that causal notions are inapplicable in the quantum realm. Yet we can experimentally interact with quantum systems and can intervene in and control such systems in ways that appear to be causal in similar ways to our interactions with classical physical systems. Moreover, as Sally Shrapnel (2014) has argued, there are macroscopic phenomena, such as the avian magneto-compass, that seem to require multi-level explanations that include quantum causal effects, which play an apparently causal, difference-making role. Efforts, such as Wood and Spekkens (2015) to try to develop causal representations of our interactions with quantum systems have led to the emergence of a research field devoted to extending the framework of structural causal models to quantum mechanics and to develop quantum causal models (Costa & Shrapnel 2016; Allen et al. 2017; Shrapnel 2019). From the perspective of the three philosophical projects we distinguished above, these efforts are most naturally seen as engaging in the functional project of developing (and de novo engineering) causal concepts appropriate for the quantum realm and showing how such concepts can play a useful role in explanations and in capturing the ways in which we can manipulate and control quantum systems.

8. Causal Explanation

The philosophical literature on causal explanation in general and in physics, more specifically, has developed largely independently of, and without engaging with, philosophical discussions in the neo-Russellian tradition questioning the legitimacy of causal concepts in physics (with Woodward’s work being a notable exception). In fact, while neo-Russellian arguments have attracted renewed attention since the turn of the twenty-first century and continue to be widely endorsed, causal or causal-mechanical theories of explanation, which were developed in response to problems faced by the deductive-nomological model of scientific explanation developed by Carl Hempel (Hempel & Oppenheim 1948), arguably have become the default view in the philosophical literature on scientific explanation (Woodward 2003b [2019]). In fact, one central recent debate within this literature takes for granted that there are causal explanations and then discusses whether all scientific explanations are causal (Lewis 1986; Skow 2014) or whether there is room for genuinely non-causal scientific explanations as well (Lange 2016).

Earlier defenders of causal accounts of explanation took one distinguishing feature of causal accounts to be their metaphysical, or—as Alberto Coffa called it—ontic conception of explanation. The goal of explanation, on this conception is to locate a phenomenon within the objective “causal nexus” (Salmon 1984: 120). Yet as Woodward’s (2003a) work shows, is that it also possible to investigate the relation between explanation and causation within the functional project of examining the cognitive role of explanatory and causal judgments and their connection to prediction, manipulation, and control.

Causal imperialists, as we might call them, argue that all scientific explanations are fundamentally causal. Neo-Russellians, by contrast, deny that causal notions and causal explanation can play any role in suitably fundamental theories of physics. Yet, despite their stark disagreement, neo-Russellians and causal imperialists share a commitment to what Woodward has called “the hidden structure strategy” (Woodward 2003b [2019]). Both views are committed to the existence of what Peter Railton has called an “ideal explanatory text” (Railton 1981) that contains all the information relevant to a complete explanation of some phenomenon. While actual explanations may fall short of providing us with the complete information contained in the ideal explanatory text, they are explanatory, according to the hidden structure strategy, in virtue of providing us with some information about the text.

For the neo-Russellian, the fundamental explanatory structures consist of microphysically complete dynamical models of the backward lightcone of a given explanandum. While the neo-Russellian view is compatible with the claim that in some non-fundamental domains and for pragmatic reasons information about the ideal explanatory text may fruitfully be presented in causal terms, the view holds that ideal physical explanations are not causal. Causal imperialism turns this picture on its head: for Lewis and others the underlying ideal explanatory structures are causal structures. Hence all explanations are causal in virtue of the fact that they provide information about this structure, even though the information provided in an actual explanation may not be presented in causal terms.

As Woodward (2003b [2019]) has argued, a problem for the hidden structure strategy is to explain how hidden structures that are epistemically inaccessible to us can account for the explanatory import of the explanatory accounts we give. For the neo-Russellian the problem is that we seem to be able to provide successful causal explanations of phenomena even when the complete initial data that are part of the ideal explanatory text are in principle inaccessible to us. The causal imperialist’s version of the hidden structure strategy faces an analogous problem. There are apparently successful explanations of phenomena that do not identify causes of the phenomenon.

Consider for example an explanation of the heat capacity of metals and, in particular, of the fact that the heat capacity is much lower than predicted classically (Kittel 2005: 141ff). The explanation appeals to the Pauli exclusion principle and shows how the heat capacity depends on particle statistics. In order to get the correct result for the heat capacity, we need to model free electrons in the metal as satisfying the quantum-mechanical Fermi-Dirac statistics and the exclusion principle. The explanation appeals to the structure of the phase-space available to the electrons.

According to causal imperialists, such as Lewis, this explanation is causal by virtue of the fact that it provides information about the causal history of a sample of metal. Does this construal of the explanation as pointing to a hidden causal structure allow us to make perspicuous its explanatory import? As we have seen, Pearl’s and Woodward’s accounts of causation emphasize two features as characteristic functions of causal notions. First, knowledge of causal structures allows us to identify relationships amenable to manipulation and control; and second, common cause reasoning enables us to draw inferences from one time to another even when we possess only incomplete knowledge of the state of a system on an initial or final value surface.

Now, the explanation of the heat capacity embeds its explanandum into patterns of functional dependencies and allows us to answer how the heat capacity would change if the available phase space were different. That is, the explanation does enable us to answer what Woodward calls what-if-things-had-been-different questions (Woodward 1979), which, according to Woodward’s account of explanation is an important feature of causal explanations. Yet the counterfactuals at issue cannot be interpreted in terms of interventions or manipulations on the electron states. Indeed, the fact that the value of the heat capacity of metals follows from structural features of the electrons’ phase space and is not something that, even in principle, is open to manipulation or control arguably is itself explanatorily relevant. Thus, one might worry that by classifying explanations such as this as causal the causal imperialist obliterates what is an important distinction between different explanatory functions and epistemic goals.


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