Notes to The Common Good

1. In taking the common good to encompass both a set of facilities and a set of common interests, the entry follows the general outlines of Rawls’s discussion (see Rawls 1971 [1999], especially 82–83, 205 and 217). Strictly speaking, Rawls uses the term the “common good” to refer to a set of conditions that serve certain common interests. But it is clear from his discussion that he takes the common good to refer more generally to a standpoint that encompasses both a set of conditions and a set of interests (see section 6 and 7). Finnis (1980) also uses the common good to refer both to a set of facilities (in my sense) and a set of interests. Most other views do not draw a sharp distinction between facilities and interests.

2. A theory is consequentialist in this sense when it conceives of practical reason in terms of a set of values, where there are intrinsic, agent-neutral reasons for these values to be increased.

3. Mill’s view raises interesting interpretative issues. Mill is clearly a critic of “private society” (see section 3) and he thinks that citizens have an obligation to take an interest in public affairs. But on Mill’s view, citizens should be oriented towards public affairs because this orientation is part of a system of public reasoning that experience has shown will bring citizens to perform the actions required by the principle of utility. On Mill’s view, citizens do not owe it to each other to take an interest in their common affairs: friendly feelings and goodwill are useful engines for getting citizens to perform the right actions, but these relational patterns of thought are not responding to genuinely relational obligations. Because it lacks a principle of reciprocity, Mill’s view should not be understood as a common good conception.

4. In economic theory, a public good is a desirable object, condition or state that has the following features: (a) the process for generating the good requires a contribution from almost everyone in society; (b) each individual’s contribution comes at a personal cost to her; (c) each person would be better off paying the cost and enjoying the good; (d) if everyone contributes to the process, everyone in society will enjoy the good; and (e) there is no practical way to exclude those who do not contribute from enjoying the benefit.

5. Worse off, that is, as compared to a baseline condition in which there is a muffin market but no public library.

6. One example of a private society is a society that operates according to the standard economic model of rational behavior (see Rawls 1971 [1999: 457]). According to this model, each individual’s utility function has as variables the resources that she herself holds, but not the resources that other people hold, the level of utility that other people achieve, or the character of society’s basic institutions.

7. The deepest version of the public goods argument treats institutions themselves as public goods. Generalized compliance with institutional rules is a public good, so this pattern of behavior will not develop in a society where individuals take a purely instrumental attitude towards compliance (see Olson 1965; but note the special case of a convention—e.g., Lewis 1969). There would be no market in a private society composed of rational egoists, that is, no pattern of generalized compliance with the rules of private ownership and exchange. Even ordinary communication and linguistic understanding presupposes certain rule-governed practices. See Gauthier 1986; Habermas 1981b; Heath 2001; see also Heath 2006.

8. You could also cultivate a more dispersed pattern of socially oriented motivations in citizens, such as an aversion to free riding, that would stabilize mutually beneficial patterns of cooperation whenever they arise (see Taylor 1984; see also Axelrod 1981 and 1984; Ostrom 1990).

9. A different failure kind of failure involves cases where a Supreme Court Justice uses her position to make decisions on the basis of her own comprehensive moral doctrine rather than a political conception of justice, implicit in the public culture, which could properly serve as the content of public reason in the community (see Rawls 1993). In these cases, the withdrawal from public life consists in a failure to reason from appropriately public standards of justification. Some philosophers identify the common good with “common principles”—i.e., shared standards and principles of justification in a political community—rather than “common interests”. This view is closely connected with a conception of the political relationship as a relationship of mutual justification. See the discussion of “communal” versus “distributive” conceptions of the common good in sections 7 and 8.

10. Philosophers have different views about how the pattern must be realized: some argue that it must be realized in the thought process of citizens in every walk of life (Plato Republic), while others argue that the pattern need only be realized in the wider legislative and policy debates that organize social life (e.g., Hegel 1821; Rawls 1971 and 1993).

11. The privileged class includes only a subset of the interests that all citizens share, so the mere fact that a certain interest is shared does not imply that it belongs in the privileged class.

12. Perhaps the most intensely solidaristic form of mutual concern is the form that Plato sets out in the Republic (462a–466d; see also Schofield 2006: 222–7 and Vlastos 1999). Members of his ideal community conceive of themselves as working for one another’s good as they play their respective roles in society as farmers, soldiers, political officials, and so on. Moreover, they not only identify with one another’s good or interests, but actually feel one another’s pleasures and pains (462b–e).

13. On Aristotle’s view, citizens are not just individuals who are each trying to live well for their own sakes. Citizens take a particular interest in whether their fellow citizens are living well, and they know that their fellow citizens take a special interest in whether they are living well (Cooper 1990). So the members of a political community strive to realize a choiceworthy way of life in their community, both in order to live well themselves and in order for their fellow members to do the same.

14. Philosophers often assume that a joint activity conception of the common good is incompatible with liberalism. But some joint activity conceptions may be compatible with liberal ideals. For example, liberal neutrality says that society’s basic institutions must not presuppose the correctness of any particular conception of the good or any particular comprehensive doctrine (Rawls 1993). Aristotle’s view is incompatible with neutrality, but a conception that focuses on a more abstract kind of joint activity may be compatible with this ideal. Rawls, for instance, argues that citizens in a liberal democracy have reason to value being part of a flourishing social life that has the structure of a “social union of social unions”. They have reason to value being part of this kind of social life, regardless of their particular conceptions of the good (see especially 1971 [1999: 456–64]; 1988 [2005: 204–206]; 1982 [2005: 320–323]). It follows that social institutions may be designed to allow for the development of a social life along these lines without violating the liberal ideal of neutrality.

Rawls himself does not consider a social union of social unions to be part of the common good of a political community (see section 6). On his view, the common good consists in social conditions that answer to the interests attached to the “position of equal citizenship”, that is, the interest in an equal set of basic liberties and the interest in a fair opportunity to reach the more attractive positions in society. A social union of social unions does not answer to either of these interests. Moreover, a social life that has this structure is not mentioned in either of the two principles of justice, so the political relationship does not require citizens to provide one another with a form of life that has this structure. In this sense, a social union of social unions is a good, but it is not a good that is “internal” to the political relationship.

Note that people may regard an ongoing enterprise—e.g., a friendship, a university, a scientific discipline, etc.—as a common achievement (Rawls 1971 [1999: 456–464]). They may see the enterprise as something that they sustain with the cooperation of other participants and something they each value as a final end. The common achievement may then be part of the good of each participant, and this fact may tie the participants to each other in an important way. But the common good is a different idea and should not be confused with this notion of a common achievement (see Hussain forthcoming).

A conception of the common good describes the distinctive way that a certain social relationship directs people who stand in the relationship to care about each other. It describes internal requirements of the relationship itself. Now people who stand in a certain relationship may find that the relationship is a common achievement and this may give them added reason to live up to the relevant requirements: for example, old friends may have added reason to live up to the requirements of their friendship because their friendship is a common achievement. Nonetheless, the common achievement in these cases presupposes a relationship with certain internal requirements and the common good describes an aspect of these internal requirements.

15. They are, of course, free to make choices through consultation and shared deliberation if they want to.

16. For Rousseau, equality in the distribution of social and economic resources is not so much an element of the common good, as a centrally important factor in the ongoing stability of a pattern of social interaction guided by a conception of the common good (see J. Cohen 2010: 51, 53, 116–118). As Joshua Cohen correctly observes in relation to Rousseau’s conception of the common good, “I see no anticipation [in Rousseau’s view] of, say, Rawls’s difference principle” (2010: 51).

17. Communal conceptions of the common good are especially important in conservative thought. Adam Smith (1776), for instance, is a classical liberal thinker who thinks of the common good in terms of a privileged class of common interests in living virtuous, industrious and responsible private lives. These interests require various facilities, including protections for natural liberties (e.g., bodily integrity and property) and an adequate system of moral and civic education (Smith 1776 [2000: 839–846]). These interests may have certain distributive implications, but they do not incorporate a fundamentally distributive form of concern for individual interests (see note 18).

18. A communal conception of the common good, though it is not distributive, may nonetheless have distributive implications. This is because the proper organization of the collective effort by citizens to maintain certain social conditions may require a particular distribution of social resources and social authority. See Finnis 1980: 165–8 and 173–5; see also Walzer’s discussion of longevity and health care (1983: 87–89).

19. Rawls also sometimes suggest a view of the principle of common interest that incorporates distributive concerns. For instance, in a widely cited passage, he says:

…it is a political convention of a democratic society to appeal to the common interest. No political party publicly admits to pressing for legislation to the disadvantage of any recognized social group. But how is this convention to be understood? …Since it is impossible to maximize with respect to more than one point of view, it is natural, given the ethos of a democratic society, to single out that of the least advantaged and to further their long-term prospects in the best manner consistent with the equal liberties and fair opportunity. (1971 [1999: 280–281])

Here Rawls is interpreting a feature of democratic practice and arguing that the difference principle can be seen as a reasonable interpretation of this feature. But he is not offering a definition of the principle of common interest or of the common good. He defines these ideas in other passages (e.g., 1971 [1999: 82–83, 217]).

20. Assume also that they limit the discussion to efficient arrangements, i.e., those that are Pareto optimal.

21. What would stop the outside threat from buying off the protection agencies?

22. You might think of the guardians and their assets together as representing what we today would call “the state”: a large group of citizens, holding various offices, who organize their activities and deploy collectively held assets for the sake of common interests.

23. Many of these theorists criticize market coordination when it goes beyond certain limits, but they all accept the basic compatibility between the political relationship and market society.

24. McMahon (2013) endorses a similar view, but for different reasons.

Copyright © 2018 by
Waheed Hussain <>

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