Notes to The Neuroscience of Consciousness

1. If one had to pick a rubric for the type of neuroscience discussed here, it would be cognitive neuroscience, a label that both psychologists and neuroscientists gravitate towards and which refers to the task of identifying the neural basis of states that have some connection to cognition broadly construed, with much recent focus on perception, decision making, and memory.

2. The relevant notion of information in neuroscience is a statistical notion about reducing uncertainty regarding a random variable. It is not a notion of semantic content. See the entry on the contents of perception. For an accessible deployment of similar notions of information in philosophy of mind as a basis for semantic content, see Dretske 1981.

3. While some neuroscientists intend “neural representation” in a semantical sense (deCharms & Zador 2000), often, they mean information in a statistical sense (e.g., Claude Shannon’s notion of mutual information [Shannon 1949]): information is quantified as the amount of uncertainty reduced by a signal concerning a random variable. In this context, one often speaks of a neuron carrying information about X, but “about” does not signal a semantic value but a way of noting the reduction of uncertainty with respect to X. This entry will ignore this statistical reading in favor, provisionally, of a more robust, semantical, notion of representation that allows for accuracy and inaccuracy. See the entries on information and mental representation. The topic of neural representation is surprisingly underdiscussed (but see Shea forthcoming).

4. Evans wrote:

[A] subject can gain knowledge of his internal informational states [his ‘perceptual experiences’] in a very simple way: by re-using precisely those skills of conceptualization that he uses to make judgements about the world. Here is how he can do it. He goes through exactly the same procedure as he would go through if he were trying to make a judgement about how it is at this place now … he may prefix this result with the operator ‘It seems to me as though…’. (Evans 1982: 227–28).

5. The issues become even more complicated depending on what form of attention we are focusing on (see Chapter 5 of Wu 2014b for detailed discussion). For a theorist who takes attention to be necessary and sufficient for consciousness, see Prinz 2012.

6. Experimental work attempting to dissociate attention from consciousness often fail to be sufficiently specific as to what attention is. For example, some recent work attempts to show consciousness in the “near absence” of attention (Li et al. 2002). This work, while interesting, would not address the central issue of the necessity of attention for consciousness (for discussion, see Wu 2014b: chap. 5).

7. Colin Klein (2017) has argued that vegetative state patients lack a capacity to form intentions. It seems plausible that their normal capacities for forming intentions are defective. It is less clear whether their responses to commands would fail to count as an intentional action, whether this involves acquiring an intention due to “exogenous” stimuli (the command) or whether intentional action does not require an intention (it could be a simpler, action-oriented state). There are also broader issues about “levels of consciousness” that we shall not address here.

8. For useful comments on the role of theories of consciousness in science, with focus on IIT, see Hakwan Lau’s blog entry (Lau 2017 in Other Internet Resources).

9. To motivate IIT, Tononi (2004) contrasts systems that can carry large amounts of information but are not conscious with those that are. For example, he contrasts a large array of photo diodes to the human visual system. Both systems can convey a large amount of information, but only one is conscious. As he notes, a crucial difference between the two systems is that in the human visual system, information is integrated via connections between visual neurons while the photo array, with its disconnected diodes, lacks the capacity to integrate information. Still, this contrast suggests only a necessary condition for consciousness, namely that the absence of integration disrupts what is needed for consciousness. It is not clear that the case motivates a sufficiency claim. It is also not clear that it provides an informative necessary condition (e.g., breathing is an uninformative necessary condition for human consciousness). Second, why should this thought experiment motivate IIT over other theories? While it might be true that the photo array lacks integration, it also lacks many other capacities present in a human system.

Tononi (2008) also motivates IIT by appeal to “axioms” about consciousness that are taken to be self-evident. This raises earlier concerns about an introspective channel that can reliably deliver such truths (section 2.1). The key axiom that Tononi adduces is integration: consciousness is unified [in that] each experience is irreducible to noninterdependent subsets of phenomenal distinctions. So, the Italian verb “sono” is not the conjunction of separable experiences of “so” and of “no”. Thus, rather than thinking of the axiom of integration as entailing information integration (\(Φ >0\)), we can see IIT as something like a best explanation of the axiom (for criticisms of IIT’s axiomatic approach, see Bayne 2018). Taken this way, the challenge will be to test this specific claim, to show that concrete cases of conscious integration are best explained by informational integration. The question remains whether we have reason to endorse IIT over other theories.

10. Another important set of experiments taken to support the ventral-conscious/dorsal unconscious dichotomy concerns work that provides evidence for the seemingly different effects of visual illusions on each stream, with the ventral stream being subject to them yet the dorsal stream impervious to them as evidenced by report and by action respectively. Subjects report seeing an illusory stimulus as being a certain way when it is not, yet motor action towards the stimulus does not show itself to be subject to the illusion. For important early work on this, see Aglioti, DeSouza, & Goodale 1995; Haffenden & Goodale 1998; Haffenden, Schiff, & Goodale 2001 and for criticism, see Smeets & Brenner 2006; Franz & Gegenfurtner 2008; Franz 2001. For an argument from these results to “zombie” action in normal individuals, see Wu 2013.

11. Campion et al. (1983) raised alternative explanations of the data, one to be discussed in the text. The others were: (1) perhaps information reaches spared residual cortex in V1 or (2) vision informs behavior due to light scattering from the stimulus onto a part of the retina corresponding to spared V1. Not every blindsight patient has been tested to rule out these alternatives though in the case of the well-studied patient GY, imaging suggests that no cortex is spared in his V1 lesion. Light scattering mediated behaviors has been demonstrated in some blindsight patients (King et al. 1996) though the effect cannot explain all blindsight cases. For example, in a clever control, a stimulus that elicits blindsight behavior fails to do so when projected to the blindspot (e.g., Stoerig, Hübner, & Pöppel 1985). It seems plausible that there exist cases where (1) and (2) are not true.

12. Binocular rivalry might seem visually idiosyncratic, a product of special laboratory conditions, but it might be common. Consider looking at the distance when there is an occluding tree in one’s right visual field blocking the right eye more than the left. There is a substantial difference in the images of each eye, and rivalry might obtain in such natural viewing conditions (Arnold 2011a,b; O’Shea 2011).

13. Consider Fetsch et al.’s (2014) recent attempt to have monkeys report their confidence about their perception (confidence is not obviously a phenomenal property, but the point here is to get the animals to turn their attention “inward”). Using a paradigm where direction of apparent motion (here, left or right) is reported by an eye movement, the researchers also provided animals with a “sure bet” choice in some trials, a third target to which the animal could move its eye. Where animals are uncertain of the stimuli’s motion, they can opt out by taking the sure (smaller) reward. The authors conclude that when animals were confident, they tended to make reports and reject the sure bet; when not confident, they opted for the sure bet. The researchers also microstimulated on some trials and observed a shift in the psychometric function, one they interpreted as a microstimulation based increase in confidence.

Does the animal in fact turn attention inward, assessing their confidence? One challenge is the meaning of the sure bet stimulus. When the animal moves its eyes to it, what exactly is it reporting? The authors suggest that the animal indicates lower confidence but given that “the monkey accepted the sure bet most often for the stimulus conditions that led to the most equivocal choice proportions” (p. 798, my emphasis), the monkey might in fact be reporting that the stimulus was neither left nor right. That is, the report remains externally directed, a claim about the stimulus category and not about confidence. The report can thus indicate uncertainty without being a report of it.

14. Interestingly, microstimulation had to be generated at a certain intensity to be detected: (a) at low amplitudes (<40 mA)), animals did not detect the microstimulation and appeared to wait for onset of the test stimulus as if they had not noticed anything; (b) at moderate amplitudes (40-65 mA), the animals could detect a stimulation so attempted the task, but their performance fell to chance levels; (c) at higher amplitudes (>65 mA), animals were able to discriminate as well as when the stimulation was mechanical. Clearly mere stimulation is not sufficient to trigger behavior, and action is engaged only when stronger stimulation is applied.

15. Similar work has recently been done using optigenetics to manipulate gustatory guided behavior in rodents (Peng et al. 2015)

16. We set aside issues of distributed representations. The simple code noted here is a version of the grandmother cell hypothesis which maps one-to-one semantic value to neuron. A different view takes representation to be distributed rather than local. Our question is not about the vehicle but about the content of the representation.

Copyright © 2018 by
Wayne Wu <>

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