# Descriptive Decision Theory

*First published Tue Sep 26, 2017*

Descriptive decision theory is concerned with characterising and
explaining regularities in the choices that people are disposed to
make. It is standardly distinguished from a parallel enterprise,
normative decision theory, which seeks to provide an account of the
choices that people *ought* to be disposed to make. Much of the
work in this area has been devoted to the building and testing of
formal models that aim to improve on the descriptive adequacy of a
framework known as “Subjective Expected Utility” (SEU).
This adequacy was first called into question in the middle of the last
century and further challenged by a slew of experimental work in
psychology and economics from the mid 1960s onwards.

This entry first sketches out the basic commitments of SEU, before
moving on to some of its best-known empirical shortcomings and a small
selection of those models that have been proposed to supersede it. The
relation between descriptive decision theory and its normative
counterpart is then discussed, drawing some connections with a number
of related topics in the philosophical
literature.^{[1]}

- 1. The Standard Model: Subjective Expected Utility
- 2. The Issue of Independence
- 3. The Issue of Probabilistic Belief
- 4. The Issue of Weak Order
- 5. Descriptive vs Normative Decision Theory
- 6. Further Reading
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Standard Model: Subjective Expected Utility

The canonical theory of choice—*Subjective Expected
Utility* (SEU)—owes its inception to the work of Savage
(1954), building on previous contributions by De Finetti (1937),
Ramsey (1931) and von Neumann and Morgenstern (1947). It offers a
homogenous treatment of both decisions under
“*risk*”—situations in which the decision
maker has knowledge of, or holds firm beliefs regarding, the objective
probabilities of all events pertinent to the success of his or her
actions—and decisions under
“*uncertainty*”—in which he or she does not.
In its non-normative incarnation, it proposes at the very least that
agents can be described *as if*:

- associating with the possible consequences of the acts available
to them two numerical quantities:
- a “
*utility*” corresponding to the degree to which they would desire the outcome to occur and - a “
*subjective probability*” corresponding to their degree of confidence in the occurrence of the outcome given the performance of the act, a degree of confidence which may or may not be given by a corresponding assessment of objective probabilities;

- a “
- being such that their preferences between acts, and hence their
dispositions to chose certain acts over others, are determined by
these quantities in such a way that acts are ranked by their
*subjective expected utility*, i.e., the subjective probability-weighted sum of the utilities of their possible outcomes.

Ontologically bolder incarnations of the view have it that agents are
so describable because they *really do* have degrees of belief
and desires, introspectively familiar psychological states, that
determine their preferences and choices in such a manner.

A number of important formal results, known as “representation
theorems”, show that this claim about describability can be
derived from a set of *prima facie* plausible general
principles, aka “postulates” or “axioms”,
pertaining to the agents’ preferences over acts. Furthermore,
not only are these axioms *collectively sufficient* to derive
SEU’s claim, but a significant proper subset of them also turn
out to be *individually necessary*. Unsurprisingly then, much
of the work on assessing the empirical adequacy of SEU has focused on
the testing of the aforementioned axioms. Such tests could, in the
best case, undermine a key reason to endorse the claim and, in the
worst, provide grounds to reject it. Accordingly, a brief sketch of
Savage’s own early result is in order.

### 1.1 Savage’s representation theorem

In Savage’s framework, *acts* are modelled as functions
that map possible *states* of the world to *outcomes*,
the consequences, if you wish, of carrying out the relevant act in the
relevant state of nature. The set of acts will be denoted by
\(\mathcal{A}=\{f_1, f_2,\ldots g_1, g_2 \ldots\}\), the set of states
by \(\mathcal{S}=\{s_1, s_2,\ldots\}\) and the set of outcomes by
\(\mathcal{X}=\{x_1, x_2,\ldots,x_n\}\). For present purposes, it can
be assumed that the acts considered are *simple*, i.e., that
their range is finite. An act will be called
“*constant*” if and only if it maps all states onto
one same outcome. Sets of states, also known as *events*, will
be denoted by upper-case letters \(A_1, A_2,\ldots, B_1, B_2, \ldots\)
etc. The set of such events will be denoted by \(\mathcal{E}\).
\(E_i^f\) will denote the set of states that the act \(f\) maps onto
outcome \(x_i\), i.e., \(\{s\in\mathcal{S}: f(s)=x_i\}\). It will also
be useful to denote by \(fAg\) the act that maps the states in \(A\)
to the same outcomes that \(f\) does and the states outside of \(A\)
to the same outcomes that \(g\) does.

The agent’s choice dispositions at a given point in time are taken to be determined by his or her preferences, in such a way that, from any set of particular acts, the agent is liable to choose all and only those acts to which no other act is strictly preferred. \(f\succeq g\) will denote the fact that an agent finds act \(f\) to be no less desirable than act \(g\). \(\succ\) (strict preference) and \(\sim\) (indifference) respectively stand for the asymmetric and symmetric parts of \(\succeq\), so that \(f\succ g\) iff \(f\succeq g\) but not \(g\succeq f\) and \(f\sim g\) iff both \(f\succeq g\) and \(g\succeq f\). It is convenient to extend this preference relation to the set of outcomes by setting, for all outcomes \(x_1\) and \(x_2\), \(x_1\succeq x_2\) iff the constant act that yields \(x_1\) in all states is weakly preferred to the one that yields \(x_2\) in all states.

Savage proves that there exists a certain specific set of constraints on preference orderings over acts that will be satisfied if and only if this ordering is representable by a real-valued function \(U\) with domain \(\mathcal{A}\) (so that \(f\succeq g\) iff \(U(f)\succeq U(g)\)), such that

\[\tag{1} U(f)= \sum\limits_{i=1}^n P(E_i^f)u(x_i)\]where \(u : \mathcal{X}\mapsto \mathbb{R}\) is a consequence utility function unique up to positive linear transformation and \(P: \mathcal{S}\mapsto [0,1]\) is a unique subjective probability function, satisfying \(P(\varnothing)=0\), \(P(\mathcal{S})=1\), and the finite additivity property \(P(A\cup B)=P(A)+P(B)\) for all disjoint events \(A,B\). In other words, \(U\) returns the sum of the utilities of the possible outcomes, each multiplied by the subjective probability of the set of states which are mapped onto that outcome.

For the case in which \(\mathcal{X}\) is finite, Savage’s set of axioms numbers six. Only three of these, however, make an appearance in the subsequent discussion. The first requires no comment:

**Weak Order** \(\succeq\) is a weak order, that is: it
is both transitive (for all acts \(f, g, h\): if \(f\succeq g\) and
\(g\succeq h\), then \(f\succeq h\)) and complete (for all acts \(f,
g\): either \(f\succeq g\) or \(g\succeq f\)).

The second tells us that, in comparing two acts, one ignores their behaviour on the set of states in which they have identical consequences:

**Sure-Thing** For all acts \(f, g, h, h'\) and any event
\(A\): \(fAh\succeq gAh\) iff \(fAh'\succeq gAh'\).

The third is given as follows:

**Weak Comparative Probability** For all outcomes
\(x_1,x_2,x_3,x_4\) and events \(A,B\): if \(x_1\succ x_2\) and
\(x_3\succ x_4\), then \(x_1Ax_2\succeq x_1Bx_2\) iff \(x_3Ax_4\succeq
x_3Bx_4\).

The rationale for its proposal lies in the idea that, if \(x_1\succ x_2\), then \(x_1Ax_2\succeq x_1Bx_2\) reflects a commitment to the claim that \(A\) is at least as probable as \(B\), and hence, so too must \(x_3Ax_4\succeq x_3Bx_4\), when \(x_3\succ x_4\).

These three conditions, it should be noted, are individually necessary for SEU representability, so that any SEU maximizer must satisfy them. In addition, Savage proposes two further non-necessary, aka “structural”, conditions—respectively known as “Non-Degeneracy” and “Small Event Continuity”, as well as a further, necessary, condition of “Eventwise Monotonicity”, which tells us that, under certain mild circumstances, the result of replacing one or more occurrences of a given outcome by another will yield a preferred act if and only if the new outcome is preferred to the original.

### 1.2 Savage’s proof

With all this in hand, Savage’s result can be established as follows. First, one introduces a relation of “subjective comparative probability” \(\unrhd\), such that \(A\unrhd B\) iff for all outcomes \(x_1\) and \(x_2\) such that \(x_1\succ x_2\), \(x_1Ax_2\succeq x_2Ax_1\) iff \(x_1Bx_2\succeq x_2Bx_1\). Savage’s axioms can then be shown to ensure that \(\unrhd\) satisfies a number of appropriate properties, with Small Event Continuity ensuring that \(\unrhd\) is representable by a subjective probability function \(P\) that is unique. It is worth noting that, in the presence of Weak Comparative Probability, it is mainly the Sure-Thing principle that allows the derivation of the additivity property of \(P\).

Second, using these axioms again, it can then be established that an agent is indifferent between any two acts that, for each outcome, assign equal probabilities to the respective sets of states that they each map onto that outcome. In other words:

**State Neutrality** If \(P_f=P_g\), then \(f\sim g\),
where \(P_f(x_i) = P(E^f_i)\).

Since it can also be shown that, for every lottery \(P\) in
\(\mathcal{P}\), there exists an act \(f\) such that \(P_f=P\), the
important upshot of this result is that one can effectively simplify
the representation of the agent’s preferences over acts,
recasting them as preferences over the smaller set \(\mathcal{P}\) of
so-called *subjective lotteries*, i.e., subjective probability
distributions over outcomes. To simplify notation, the preference
relation over \(\mathcal{P}\) will be denoted by the same symbol,
\(\succeq\), allowing context to disambiguate.

A further application of the axioms lets us establish that these preferences over lotteries satisfy three important properties: (i) a “Mixture Weak Order” condition, requiring the preferences over lotteries to be transitive and complete, (ii) a “Mixture Continuity” condition, the details of which are not of importance here and finally (iii) an “Independence” condition, which, alongside the ordering condition, will be the focus of considerable discussion in what follows.

To present this last condition, one more definition is required, alongside a piece of notation: For any two lotteries \(P_f\) and \(P_g\) and \(\lambda\in[0,1]\), one can define a third simple lottery \(\lambda P_f + (1-\lambda)P_g\) in \(\mathcal{P}\), the \(\lambda\)-mixture of \(P_f\) and \(P_g\), by setting \((\lambda P_f + (1-\lambda)P_g)(x)\), the probability assigned to outcome \(x\) by the mixture lottery, equal to \(\lambda P_f(x) + (1-\lambda)P_g(x)\). It is heuristically useful to think of \(\lambda P_f + (1-\lambda)P_g\) as a higher-order lottery that yields a probability of \(\lambda\) of playing lottery \(P_f\) and a complementary probability of playing \(P_g\). The condition then reads:

**Independence** For all acts \(f, g\) and \(h\) and all
\(\lambda\in(0,1]\): \(P_f\succeq P_g\) iff \(\lambda P_f +
(1-\lambda) P_h\succeq \lambda P_g + (1-\lambda) P_h\).

The proof is then completed by appealing to a result of von Neumann and Morgenstern (1947), which shows that the aforementioned trio of properties is necessary and sufficient for the representability of \(\succeq\) by a function \(U\) such that

\[U(P_f)=\sum\limits_{i=1}^{n}P_f(x_i)u(x_i),\]where \(u : \mathcal{X}\mapsto \mathbb{R}\) is a consequence utility function unique up to positive linear transformation.

### 1.3 The probability triangle

The *probability triangle* (aka “Marschak-Machina
triangle”) offers a helpful visual representation of preferences
over the space of lotteries over \(\{x_1, x_2, x_3\}\), with
\(x_3\succ x_2 \succ x_1\). Since, for any \(P\in \mathcal{P}\),
\(P(x_2)= 1- P(x_1)-P(x_3)\), one can represent the situation
two-dimensionally, with lotteries appearing as points in a unit
triangle in which the horizontal axis gives us \(P(x_1)\) and the
vertical one gives us \(P(x_3)\). The northwestern, southwestern and
southeastern corners respectively correspond to the lotteries yielding
\(x_3, x_2\) and \(x_1\) for sure.

Now, as is easily demonstrated, SEU is committed to

**Stochastic Dominance** For all acts \(f\) and \(g\):
if, for any outcome \(x\), the probability according to \(P_f\) of
obtaining an outcome that is weakly preferred to \(x\) is at least as
great as the corresponding probability according to \(P_g\) (in other
words: \(\sum_{\{y\in\mathcal{X}: y\succeq x\}} P_f(y)\) \(\geq\)
\(\sum_{\{y\in\mathcal{X}: y\succeq x\}} P_g(y)\)), then \(P_f\succeq
P_g\).

Indeed, the above principle follows from Independence and is in fact
*equivalent* to Savage’s Eventwise Monotonicity
condition, given the other conditions in place (Grant 1995). Therefore
lotteries become increasingly preferred both as one moves north and as
one moves west, since, in doing either, one shifts probability from a
less to a more preferred outcome (from \(x_2\) to \(x_3\) when moving
north and from \(x_1\) to \(x_2\) when moving west). The indifference
curves are hence upward-sloping. Steeper slopes correspond to greater
risk aversion, in the following sense: northeastern movements increase
the spread of the distribution, i.e., the degree of risk involved,
shifting probabilities from the middle outcome (\(x_2\)) to the
extremal ones (\(x_1\) and \(x_3\)). The steeper the indifference
curve, the greater an increase in probability of the best outcome is
required in order to compensate for this increased risk. SEU clearly
also requires that indifference curves be both linear and
parallel.^{[2]}
To illustrate:

Figure 1

Although SEU continues to enjoy widespread support as a normative
model of choice behaviour (though see
Section 5
below), it is no longer generally taken to be descriptively adequate.
A number of substantial deviations from its predictions were noted as
early as the 1950s and early 1960s by the likes of Allais (1953a,b)
and Ellsberg (1961) and further investigated in the 1970s. These
observations led to the development of alternative models whose own
predictive consequences have become the focus of extensive testing in
the past three decades or
so.^{[3]}

## 2. The Issue of Independence

### 2.1 Allais’ paradoxes

Allais (1953a: 527) considered hypothetical preferences revealed by choices taken from two respective menus of lotteries yielding various increments in wealth with various objective probabilities, one containing \(P_1\) and \(P_2\) below, the other \(P_3\) and \(P_4\):

(a)

(b)

(c)

(d)

Figure 2

He claimed that, for a substantial proportion of agents, one would
find that \(P_{1}\succ P_{2}\) and \(P_{4}\succ P_{3}\) (call these
the “*Allais preferences*”). However, on the
assumptions that (i) the subjects’ degrees of belief align
themselves with the objective probabilities given and (ii) the
outcomes can be adequately characterised entirely in terms of the
associated changes in level of wealth, such a combination of
preferences runs contrary to Independence. More specifically, it runs
counter to the special case of the principle, according to which the
substitution of a common “consequence”, i.e., lottery, in
a pair of mixtures leave the order of preference unchanged:

**Common Consequence** For all acts \(f, g, h, h'\) and
\(\lambda\in(0,1]\):

To see why, let \(\lambda=0.11\), \(Q_1\) (the “consequence” common to \(P_1\) and \(P_2\)) be a lottery yielding $\(1\)M for sure, \(Q_2\) be a lottery yielding $\(5\)M with probability \(10/11\) and \(\$0\) otherwise, and finally \(Q_3\) (the “consequence” common to \(P_3\) and \(P_4\)) a lottery yielding \(\$0\) for sure. \(P_1\) turns out to be a \(\lambda\)-mixture of \(Q_1\) and \(Q_1\), \(P_2\) one of \(Q_2\) and \(Q_1\), \(P_3\) one of \(Q_1\) and \(Q_3\) and \(P_4\) one of \(Q_2\) and \(Q_3\). This is probably best seen by considering the decision trees representing the corresponding compound lotteries:

(a)

(b)

(c)

(d)

Figure 3

The upshot of this, by Common Consequence, is then that \(P_1\succeq
P_2\) iff \(P_3\succeq
P_4\).^{[4]}

The probability triangle affords a helpful illustration of the incompatibility of the Allais preferences with SEU. Indeed, the segments connecting \(P_1\) and \( P_2\), on the one hand, and \( P_3\) and \(P_4\) on the other are parallel, so that an EU maximiser, whose indifference curves are also parallel, would be incapable of exhibiting the modal preferences, since no pair of indifference curves could be, as required, such that one crosses the segment \([P_1,P_2]\) from below while the other crosses \([P_3,P_4]\) from above:

Figure 4

In addition to the above, which has come to be known as the *Common
Consequence* problem, a further issue, the *Common Ratio*
problem, was suggested by Allais (1953a: 529–530). The
difficulty this time concerned a further consequence of Independence,
which tells us that the order of preference between two
identically-weighted mixtures that share a common component lottery is
unaffected by a change in the mixture weight:

**Common Ratio** For all acts \(f,g,h\) and
\(\lambda,\gamma\in(0,1]\):

A presentation of the relevant pairs of options will not be given
here. Note simply that, here again, the problematic choices turn out
to involve two pairs of options whose respective corresponding
segments in the probability triangle run
parallel.^{[5]}

A number of experimental studies in the 1960s and 1970s subsequently confirmed the robustness of the effects uncovered by Allais. Slovic & Tversky (1974), for example, report that 17 out of 29 (59%) of subjects in their study exhibit Allais preferences in their investigation of the Common Consequence problem. See MacCrimmon & Larson (1979) for a helpful summary of this and other early work and further data of their own.

Since the late 1970s, a considerable number of generalisations of SEU have been devised to accommodate the problematic preference patterns. A brief survey of these is provided in the following subsection.

### 2.2 Theoretical responses

#### 2.2.1 Probabilistic sophistication

A substantial proportion of the responses to Allais-type phenomena
have involved generalisations of SEU that remain conservative enough
to preserve the requirement of what Machina & Schmeidler (1992)
call “*probabilistic sophistication*”: that
preferences over acts reduce to preferences over lotteries and that
these in turn obey Mixture Weak Order, Mixture Continuity and
Stochastic Dominance, if not
Independence.^{[6]}
Machina & Schmeidler offer an axiomatic characterisation of
probabilistically sophisticated preferences that gives up
Savage’s Sure-Thing condition, which plays a critical role in
the derivation of Independence, and retains the remainder of his
conditions. Since the Sure-Thing principle, however, *also*
plays an important role in ensuring the existence of a suitable
probability distribution over the set of events, they strengthen the
Weak Comparative Probability condition to the following:

**Strong Comparative Probability** For all outcomes
\(x_1,x_2,x_3,x_4\), acts \(f, g\) and disjoint events \(A,B\): if
\(x_1\succ x_2\) and \(x_3\succ x_4\), then \(x_1Ax_2Bf\succeq
x_2Ax_1Bf\) iff \(x_3Ax_4Bg\succeq x_4Ax_3Bg\).

where \(x_1Ax_2Bf\) denotes the act that yields \(x_1\) for all \(s\in A\), outcome \(x_2\) for all \(s\in B\) and \(f(s)\) for all other \(s\). They then offer a correspondingly amended account of the proposed correspondence between the subjective qualitative probability and preference relations, proposing that, if \(x_1\succ x_2\), then \(A\unrhd B\) iff \(x_1Ax_2Bf\succeq x_2Ax_1Bf\).

#### 2.2.2 Models with Betweenness

Among the models of probabilistically sophisticated preferences that
do not satisfy Independence and, more specifically, do not impose the
property of *parallelism* of indifference curves, a number
still satisfy a weaker principle that imposes *linearity*,
namely:

**Betweenness** For all acts \(f\) and \(g\) and
\(\lambda\in[0,1]\): if \(P_f\sim P_g\), then \(P_f\sim \lambda P_f +
(1-\lambda) P_g\).

This is notably the case of *Weighted Utility* (WU) (Chew &
MacCrimmon 1979; Chew 1983), which proposes that the summands in the
expected utility formula each be multiplied by a corresponding weight,
so that preferences between lotteries are representable by the more
general functional

where \(w\) is a positive real-valued function on \(\mathcal{X}\). If
\(w\) is constant, one recovers the EU functional. The incorporation
of weights accommodates Allais preferences by allowing indifference
curves to “fan out” from a single intersection located in
the quadrant to the southwest of the probability triangle. These
curves become steeper, and hence represent a greater degree of risk
aversion, as one moves northwest, in the direction of increasingly
preferred lotteries. A suitably placed intersection allows
indifference curves to cross both \([P_1,P_2]\) from below and
\([P_3,P_4]\) from above, as
required.^{[7]}

#### 2.2.3 Models without Betweenness

There is however substantial evidence that the linearity of
indifference curves isn’t any more empirically adequate that
their parallelism (see Camerer & Ho 1994 for a survey) and a
number of models of probabilistically sophisticated preferences give
up on Betweenness too. The best known of these is undoubtedly *Rank
Dependent Utility* (RDU), a version of which was first proposed by
Quiggin
(1982).^{[8]}
To present the proposal in functional form, it will be assumed that
the subscripts associated with each outcome in \(\mathcal{X}\)
indicate increasing order of preference, so that \(x_1\preceq
x_2\preceq \ldots \preceq x_n\) and hence \(\bigcup\limits_{j=i}^{n}
E^{f}_{j}\) is the event given which \(f\) yields an outcome at least
as preferable as \(x_i\). RDU proposes:

where \(w : [0,1]\mapsto[0,1]\) is a strictly increasing probability weighting function, such that \(w(0)=0\) and \(w(1)=1\). In other words: the utility of a lottery is equal to the sum of the marginal utility contributions of the outcomes, each multiplied by the weighted probability of obtaining an outcome that is at least as preferable (the marginal contribution of \(x_1\) is \(u(x_1)\) and its associated multiplier is \(w\big(P(\{\mathcal{S}\})\big)=w(1)=1\)). If \(w\) is the identity function, so that \(w\circ P=P\), it turns out that one recovers the expected utility functional. If not, a suitable choice of \(w\) enables one to recover the Allais preferences. To see how, assume for simplicity that \(u(0)=0\). One then has \(P_1\succ P_2\) iff

\[u(1)w(1)>u(1)w(0.99)+\big(u(5)-u(1)\big)w(0.1)\]
and \(P_4\succ P_3\) iff \(u(5)w(0.1)>u(1)w(0.11)\). This implies
that the preferences will be recovered by having \(w\) be such that
\(w(1)-w(0.99)>w(0.11)-w(0.1)\), so that a difference in
probability of \(0.01\) has a greater impact at the higher end of the
probability scale than it does towards its relatively lower
end.^{[9]}

It should be noted that RDU is itself a special case of what is
perhaps the best known alternative to SEU, Kahneman &
Tversky’s *Cumulative Prospect Theory* (Tversky &
Kahneman 1992), which earned Kahneman a Nobel Prize in
Economics in 2002. This model generalises RDU by introducing a
*reference point*, an outcome that partitions the set of
outcomes into positive and negative subsets, according to whether
these are strictly preferred or strictly dispreferred to it.
*Two* probability transformation functions, \(w^+\) and
\(w^-\), are then involved in the preference functional: \(w^+\) in
determining the utility contributions of the negative outcomes and
\(w^-\) playing an analogous role in relation to that of the positive
ones. RDU is recovered when \(w^+\) is the dual of \(w^+\).

While RDU does not satisfy Independence, it does satisfy a weakening
of this principle known as “Ordinal Independence” (Green
& Jullien 1988). This principle is presented as a constraint on
the *cumulative distribution functions* (cdf) corresponding to
various lotteries, which return, for each \(x_i\), the probability of
obtaining an outcome that is no better than \(x_i\) (i.e., an outcome
\(x_j\), with \(j\leq i\)). The cdf corresponding to \(P_f\) shall be
denoted by \(F\). We then have

**Ordinal Independence** For all acts \(f,f',g\) and
\(g'\) and subsets \(A\) of \(\mathcal{X}\): If \(P_f\succeq P_g\),
and

- for all \(x\in A\), \(F(x)=G(x)\) and \(F'(x)=G'(x)\)
- for all \(x\notin A\), \(F(x)=F'(x)\) and \(G'(x)=G'(x)\)

then \(P_{f'}\succeq
P_{g'}\).^{[10]}

The constraint can more helpfully be put as follows: In comparing two acts, one ignores the values of their respective cdf’s on the set of outcomes with respect to which they agree. It is easily verified that the Allais preferences are consistent with this principle. Given probabilistic sophistication, Ordinal Independence can itself be derived from a constraint on preferences over acts known as “Comonotonic Independence”, presented in Subsection 3.2.1 below. Wakker (2010) offers a textbook introduction to RDU and Cumulative Prospect Theory, as well as to related treatments of the issues discussed in the next section.

## 3. The Issue of Probabilistic Belief

### 3.1 Ellsberg’s Three Colour paradox

In another classic challenge to SEU, Ellsberg (1961) asked subjects to consider a setup in which an urn contains 30 red balls and 60 black or yellow balls in unknown relative proportions and report their preferences between various bets on the colour of a ball drawn at random from the urn. The preferences elicited were the ones holding between \(f_1\) and \(g_1\) below, on the one hand, and \(f_2\) and \(g_2\), on the other:

\(\overbrace{\phantom{30 balls}}^{\textrm{30 balls}}\) | \(\overbrace{\phantom{45630 balls}}^{\textrm{60 balls}}\) | ||

r | b | y | |

\(f_1\) | $100 | $0 | $0 |

\(g_1\) | $0 | $100 | $0 |

\(f_2\) | $100 | $0 | $100 |

\(g_2\) | $0 | $100 | $100 |

Ellsberg reported that a majority of subjects exhibited the
preferences \(f_1\succ g_1\), but \(g_2\succ f_2\), an instance of a
phenomenon that has come to be known as *ambiguity aversion*: a
relative preference for betting on events of known rather than unknown
(“ambiguous”) probability.

If one grants that the outcomes are adequately characterised in sole terms of associated changes in level of wealth, these “Ellsberg preferences” stand in direct contradiction with Savage’s Sure-Thing principle. These preferences also violate Machina & Schmeidler’s Strong Comparative Probability principle, on the natural assumption that the subjects strictly prefer the outcome \(\$100\) to the outcome \(\$0\). And indeed it is easy to see that the Ellsberg preferences are inconsistent with probabilistic sophistication. More specifically, they are incompatible with its being the case that both (i) the decision maker’s preferences over acts are reducible to preferences over corresponding lotteries over outcomes, generated by an assignment of subjective probabilities to the set of events and (ii) he or she partially orders these lotteries by first-order stochastic dominance. To see why, assume that these conditions hold. Note first that \(P_{g_1}\) would stochastically dominate \(P_{f_1}\) if and only if \(P(\{b\})\geq P(\{r\})\) and that \(P_{f_2}\) would stochastically dominate \(P_{g_2}\) if and only if \(P(\{r\})\geq P(\{b\})\). \(f_1\succ g_1\) would entail that \(P_{g_1}\) does not stochastically dominate \(P_{f_1}\), and hence that \(P(\{r\}) > P(\{b\})\). But \(g_2\succ f_2\) would entail that \(P_{f_2}\) does not stochastically dominate \(P_{g_2}\), and hence that \(P(\{b\})> P(\{r\})\). Contradiction.

Considerable empirical evidence has confirmed Ellsberg’s informal observations and related phenomena (beginning with Becker & Brownson 1964 and including classic studies such as Slovic & Tversky 1974 and MacCrimmon & Larsson 1979; see the classic Camerer & Weber 1992, as well as the more up-to-date Trautmann & van de Kuilen 2015, for further details) and the literature now contains a substantial number of generalisations of SEU that can accommodate these.

### 3.2 Theoretical responses

#### 3.2.1 Non-additive “probabilities”

One prominent weakening of SEU that is capable of accommodating the
Ellsberg cases is *Choquet Expected Utility* (CEU), initially
proposed by Schmeidler (1989). The key concept in its representation
of preferences is that of a *capacity*: a function \(v :
\mathcal{E}\mapsto [0,1]\), such that \(v(\varnothing)=0\),
\(v(\mathcal{S})=1\) and, for all \(A, B\in \mathcal{E}\),
\(A\subseteq B\) implies \(v(A)\leq v(B)\). One can think of this as a
kind of non-additive “probability” function, since the
additivity property, according to which \(v(A\cup B)=v(A)+v(B)\) for
disjoint events \(A\) and \(B\), does not hold. As with the
presentation of RDU, the convention here is that the indices
associated with the outcomes indicate increasing preference, so that,
again, \(\bigcup\limits_{j=i}^{n} E^{f}_{j}\) is the event given which
\(f\) yields an outcome at least as preferable as \(x_i\). CEU
proposes:

On this suggestion, then an act is valued by the sum of the marginal
utility contributions of the outcomes, each multiplied by the capacity
of the event given which that act would yield an outcome that is at
least as preferable. There are obvious formal similarities here with
RDU and, in fact, the latter can be viewed as the special case of CEU
in which the decision maker’s capacities are derived from his or
her probabilistic degrees of belief by a probability weighting
function (\(v=w\circ
P\)).^{[11]}

Returning to the Ellsberg preferences in the three colour problem, it is easy to see that \(f_1\succ g_1\) iff \(v(\{r\}) > v(\{b\})\) and \(g_2\succ f_2\) iff \(v(\{b,y\}) > v(\{r,y\})\). These inequalities obviously cannot be simultaneously satisfied in special cases in which \(c\) is additive and indeed, in such cases, CEU reduces to SEU. In the more general case, there is no problem: let \(v\), for instance, be such that:

\[\begin{aligned} v(\{r\})&=v(\{r,y\})=v(\{b,y\})=\nicefrac{1}{3}\\ v(\{b\})&=v(\{y\})=0\\ v(\{b,y\})&=\nicefrac{2}{3}. \end{aligned}\]Gilboa (1987) and Wakker (1989) have both provided axiomatisations of the proposal in a Savage framework. The key distinguishing feature of these is the effective restriction of Savage’s Sure-Thing principle to particular kinds of sets of acts:

**Comonotonic Sure-Thing** For all acts \(f, g, h, h'\)
and any event \(A\): if \(fAh\), \(gAh\), \(fAh'\) and \(fAh'\) are
comonotonic, then \(fAh\succeq gAh\) iff \(fAh'\succeq gAh'\).

where two acts \(f\) and \(g\) are *comonotonic* iff, there are
no two states \(s_1\) and \(s_2\), such that \(f(s_1)\succ f(s_2)\)
but \(g(s_2)\succ g(s_1)\), or again iff \(f\) and \(g\) yield
orderings of states by desirability of associated consequence that are
jointly consistent (Chew & Wakker 1996). Clearly, the Ellsberg
preferences are perfectly compatible with this weakening of the
Sure-Thing principle, since the acts involved are not comonotonic. For
instance, \(f_1(r)\succ f_1(b)\) but \(f_2(b)\succ
f_2(r)\).^{[12]}

#### 3.2.2 Multiple priors

The capacity that was used above to illustrate the consistency of CEU
with Ellsberg-style preferences has a noteworthy property: it is
*convex*, meaning that it is such that, for all
\(A,B\in\mathcal{E}\),

It has been shown by Schmeidler (1986) that, if convexity of
capacities is imposed, CEU becomes a special case of an approach known
as *Maxmin Expected Utility* (MEU) (Gilboa & Schmeidler
1989), which represents the decision maker as maximising minimum
expected utility across a non-empty set of probability functions
\(\Gamma\) on \(\mathcal{X}\), so that:

The specific connection is the following: a CEU maximiser with respect
to a convex capacity \(v\) is an EU maxminer over the so-called
*core* of \(v\), defined as the set of probability functions
that assign, for every event, a probability that is at least as great
as the capacity assigned to that event by \(v\): \(\{P\in\mathcal{P}:
P(A)\geq v(A), \forall A\in\mathcal{E}\}\).

Now a common, but not mandatory, interpretation of \(\Gamma\) is that it corresponds to the set of objective probability assignments that the decision maker takes to be consistent with his or her evidence. In view of the result just flagged out, this in turn invites an interpretation of capacities as lower estimates of objective probabilities. More specifically, a CEU maximiser whose capacity is convex can be interpreted as considering possible all and only those assignments of objective probabilities that are consistent with the lower estimates given by that capacity. This interpretation of the capacity in the particular example at hand is obviously particularly tempting, as \(\nicefrac{1}{3}\) and \(\nicefrac{2}{3}\) constitute plausible lower bounds on the decision maker’s estimates of the probabilities of \(\{r\}\) and \(\{b,y\}\), respectively.

If one interprets \(\Gamma\) this way, relaxing CEU with convex
capacities to MEU becomes an attractive option, since it allows one to
not only model Ellsberg preferences but also accommodate the
preferences of decision makers whose views on objective probabilities
cannot simply be captured in terms of lower estimates (for example,
those involving commitments to certain facts about ratios of
probabilities). Due to space considerations, the details of the
axiomatic treatment of MEU are omitted
here.^{[13]}

Still, MEU remains rather restrictive, as it enforces a fairly radical
form of ambiguity aversion. One popular generalisation of the model,
\(\alpha-\)*MEU* (Ghirardato *et al.* 2004), proposes
that the preferences imposed by MEU lie only at one end of a spectrum
of possible ambiguity aversion, captured by the following weakening of
\((\ref{eq:MEU})\):

where \(\alpha\in[0,1]\). With \(\alpha=1\), one recovers the highly
ambiguity-averse MEU. With \(\alpha=0\), we have strongly
ambiguity-loving preferences. The parameter \(\alpha\) is thus in a
sense interpretable as a measure of ambiguity
aversion.^{[14]}^{,}^{[15]}

Just as with MEU, however, \(\alpha\)-MEU restricts its attention to
extremal expected utilities (in this instance best- as well as
worst-case). A popular class of proposals allows for the full range of
expected utilities across \(\Gamma\) to be factored in, by
supplementing the multiple prior model with a *higher order
probability distribution* \(\mu\). One well-known functional form,
that notably features in the “*Smooth Model*” of
Klibanoff *et al.* (2005), involves taking the expectation,
relative to \(\mu\), of the *weighted* expected utilities,
relative to the members of \(\Gamma\):

A concave \(\Phi\) will overweigh low expected utilities, resulting in relatively ambiguity-averse preferences.

## 4. The Issue of Weak Order

### 4.1 Transitivity

While all models mentioned above impose transitivity on preferences, there is a long history of investigating possible violations of the principle, both with respect to choice under certainty and choice under risk. Regarding the latter, in a classic early study, Tversky (1969), suggested significant systematic violations of the transitivity of strict preference, which is entailed by that of weak preference, in relation to a series of lotteries \(P_1\)–\(P_5\), each offering a chance \(p_i\) of receiving a prize \(x_i\) and a complementary chance of receiving nothing:

\(p_i\) | \(x_i\) | |
---|---|---|

\(P_1\) | \(\nicefrac{7}{24}\) | $\(5\) |

\(P_2\) | \(\nicefrac{8}{24}\) | $\(4.75\) |

\(P_3\) | \(\nicefrac{9}{24}\) | $\(4.5\) |

\(P_4\) | \(\nicefrac{10}{24}\) | $\(4.25\) |

\(P_5\) | \(\nicefrac{11}{24}\) | $\(4\) |

Tversky took his data to suggest that a significant number of subjects
were prone to expressing strict preferences for each lottery over its
immediate successor, but a strict preference for the last lottery over
the first. He proposed that these subjects ranked adjacent lotteries
by mere payoff as the differences in the probabilities of winning were
barely perceptible, but took probability of winning into consideration
in the comparison between \(P_1\) and \(P_5\), since the difference in
values there was large. Although Tversky’s results were later
replicated, it should be noted that there is ongoing controversy
surrounding the level of empirical support for intransitive preference
(see Regenwetter *et al.* 2011 for a recent literature
review).

Intransitivities of a somewhat different kind are also predicted by
Loomes & Sugden’s (1982, 1987) *Regret
Theory*.^{[16]}
The guiding idea behind this proposal is that the appreciation of a
given outcome in a given state is an essentially comparative matter.
It is determined by the regret (or the rejoicement) associated with
the thought that the alternatively available acts would have led, in
the same circumstances, to a particular set of alternative outcomes.
In the special case of binary alternatives, this intuition translates
into the following *menu-dependent* preference functional:

where \(M: \mathcal{X}\times\mathcal{X}\mapsto \mathbb{R}\) is a comparative utility function that is increasing in its first argument and non-decreasing in its second. In their discussion of the framework, Loomes & Sugden present things equivalently as follows:

\[\tag{9} \label{eqn:RT'} f\succeq g\text{ iff } \sum\limits_{s\in\mathcal{S}} P\big(\{s\}\big) \Psi \big(f(s),g(s)\big) \geq 0\]where \(\Psi \big(f(s),g(s)\big)\) is defined as \(M\big(f(s),g(s)\big)-M\big(g(s),f(s)\big)\). This quantity thus corresponds to the net balance of regret/rejoicement associated with choosing \(f\) over \(g\) in states \(s\). Depending on the properties of \(\Psi\), decision makers can be characterised as being ‘regret-neutral’, ‘regret-averse’ or even ‘regret-seeking’. Regret neutrality corresponds to the case in which, for all \(x_1,x_2,x_3\in \mathcal{X}\),

\[\Psi(x_1, x_3)=\Psi(x_1, x_2)+\Psi(x_2, x_3).\]Under these conditions, choice behaviour is consistent with SEU. Regret aversion corresponds to the situation in which \(\Psi\) satisfies the following convexity requirement: for \(x_1\succ x_2\succ x_3\),

\[\Psi(x_1, x_3)>\Psi(x_1, x_2)+\Psi(x_2, x_3).\]
Loomes & Sugden (1982) have shown that, at least under the
assumption of probabilistic independence of the lotteries involved,
this type of disposition can predict both the Common Consequence and
the Common Ratio effects: Regret Theory does not entail
Independence.^{[17]}

To obtain a sense of the violations of transitivity predicted by Regret Theory, here is an example due to Loomes & Sugden 1987. Assume convexity of \(\Psi\) and consider the following decision problem, where \(x_1\prec x_2\prec x_3\) and \(P(A_i)=\nicefrac{1}{3}\):

\(A_1\) | \(A_2\) | \(A_3\) | |
---|---|---|---|

\(f\) | \(x_1\) | \(x_2\) | \(x_3\) |

\(g\) | \(x_3\) | \(x_1\) | \(x_2\) |

\(h\) | \(x_2\) | \(x_3\) | \(x_1\) |

According to Regret Theory, \(f\succ g\) iff

\[\Psi(x_1,x_3)+\Psi(x_2,x_1)+\Psi(x_3,x_2)>0.\]
Convexity of \(\Psi\) will ensure that this inequality holds. By
similar reasoning, it can then be established that \(g\succ h\) and
\(h\succ
f\).^{[18]}

The above example also clearly demonstrates that Regret Theory permits violations of State Neutrality, since the different acts yield the same probability distributions over outcomes. Loomes & Sugden (1987) further show that violations of Stochastic Dominance are licensed by their model. However, in spite of these departures from orthodoxy, it should be noted that Regret Theory retains a number of other strong consequences of SEU, including the Sure-Thing principle, as well as Betweenness for probabilistically independent distributions. An instructive axiomatisation of a generalisation of \((\ref{eqn:RT})\) to finite menus is offered in Sugden 1993. See Bleichrodt & Wakker 2015 for a clear overview of the framework, and its relation to the experimental data.

### 4.2 Completeness

Although the issue comes last in this catalogue of empirical challenges to SEU, early doubts regarding the empirical adequacy of the completeness assumption were aired by the very architects of the framework, including von Neumann & Morgenstern (1947: 630) and Savage (1954: 21). For instance, von Neumann & Morgenstern write:

It is very dubious, whether the idealization of reality which treats this postulate as a valid one, is appropriate or even convenient.

Failure of completeness has been claimed to stem both from either (i)
incompleteness in judgments of comparative probability or (ii)
incompleteness in preferences between outcomes. Both sources of
incompleteness can be handled in “*multi-prior expected multi
utility*” models, which offer what one might call a
“supervaluationist” representation of preferences over
acts, as follows:

where \(\Phi\) is a set of pairs of probability and utility functions.
Due to space considerations, axiomatic details are left out here. The
interested reader is referred to the recent general treatment given by
Galaabaatar & Karni (2013), who relate their results to important
earlier work by the likes of Bewley (1986), Seidenfeld *et al.*
(1995), Ok *et al.* (2012), and Nau (2006), among others.

## 5. Descriptive vs Normative Decision Theory

While it was fairly immediately recognised that Allais had
demonstrated an empirical shortcoming of SEU, it is important to note
that his ambitions somewhat outstripped this achievement. He further
suggested that his findings also give reason to doubt the
*normative* adequacy of the theory. On his view, two types of
consideration can be brought to the table in the assessment of a
theory of rational choice. The first is a demonstration that the
theory deductively follows from, or lies in logical conflict with,
various general principles of secure epistemic standing. The second is
a body of experimental evidence regarding

the conduct of persons who, one has reason in other respects [(“that is on criteria that are free of all reference to any consideration of random choice.”)] to believe, act rationally. (Allais 1953b: 34)

^{[19]}

However, he found no adequate evidence of the first kind that could be marshalled to support anything quite as strong as SEU. He rejected, for instance, Marschak’s (1951) “long-run success” argument for expected utility maximisation in situations of risk (Allais 1953b: 70–73). He did grant the existence of a “consistency” requirement according to which

a man will be deemed to act rationally (a) if he pursues ends that are mutually consistent (i.e., not contradictory), (b) if he employs means that are appropriate to these ends. (Allais 1953b: 78)

But, this requirement, he claimed, simply entailed that preferences over lotteries be weakly ordered and satisfy Stochastic Dominance. This left data on choice behaviour to adjudicate on the further commitments of SEU. This data, in his view, clearly supported the rational permissibility of violating Independence.

Savage did not explicitly discuss the probative force of the
collective preferences of his peers in relation to Allais’
cases. He did however comment on the bearing of *his own*
personal preferences, which Allais had famously elicited from him at a
Paris symposium 1952 and which found themselves in violation of the
recommendations of SEU . Granting that it would have been irrational
for him to maintain both these preferences and a commitment to the
normative adequacy of his axioms, he reported that further
“reflection” inclined him to revise the former, judging
these to have been in error, on par with a logical inconsistency in
beliefs. This fact, he claimed, entitled him to retain his normative
commitments (see Savage 1952:
101–103).^{[20]}
Since it is easy to surmise that Savage took his own inclinations to
be representative of those of the population at large, his comments
have been widely taken to implicitly suggest an alternative
experimental route to the testing of theories of rational choice. (See
Slovic & Tversky 1974 and Jallais & Pradier 2005. This is also
the view of Ellsberg, who offers, in Ch. 1 of his 1961 doctoral
dissertation, reprinted as Ellsberg 2001, a worthwhile discussion of
the issues of present interest, with Zappia 2016 providing a recent
philosophically-oriented discussion.). This procedure would involve
determining, not whether certain decision makers exhibit patterns of
preference proscribed by the theory, but whether they still exhibit
such patterns *after* reflection on their conflict with the
theory’s basic axioms.

A number of studies set out to test the normative adequacy of SEU along the proposed lines. MacCrimmon (1968) reported violations, in a sample of experienced business executives, of a wide range of consequences of SEU, a number of which persisted after subjects were notably provided with considerations both supporting and undermining these principles. Those principles with respect to which offending preferences were later corrected included most notably Transitivity and Stochastic Dominance. Allais- or Ellsberg-style preferences were substantially more resilient, however, a fact confirmed in a later study by Slovic & Tversky (1974). Another type of resilience of preferences, not considered by Savage, was more recently investigated by van de Kuilen & Wakker (2006). They studied the effects of providing feedback on decision outcomes on the prevalence of common consequence effects in sequences of choices, finding, however, a significant reduction in SEU violations.

In spite of a long-standing tradition of bringing to bear theories of
rational choice on various philosophical
problems,^{[21]}
the issue of the potential relevance of descriptive decision theory
to its normative counterpart does not appear to have sparked much
interest in the philosophical community. Allais’ challenge to
Savage has largely been ignored in the philosophical
literature.^{[22]}

Having said this, a fair amount of philosophical attention has been
devoted to the related issue of the connection between norms of
*reasoning* and observed patterns of *inference*. One
influential line of thought to be found there, which seems pertinent
to Allais’ claims, originates in Goodman’s discussion of
the justification of inductive reasoning. On his view,

[t]he task of formulating rules that define the difference between valid and invalid inductive inferences is much like the task of defining any term with an established usage. (Goodman 1965: 66)

Just as semantic analyses can be endorsed on the basis of providing good systematisations of a set of intuitions regarding the applicability of particular terms in particular situations, Goodman claims, normative theories of reasoning can similarly be justified by their good fit with “the particular…inferences we actually make and sanction” (Goodman 1965: 63): no further considerations are required in order to be able to endorse a particular principle as rationally binding.

Goodman’s discussion is a brief one and, on our reading at
least, leaves open a number of questions. Should we admit as relevant
any considerations beyond observed patterns of inference, such as
properties of long-run convergence to the truth, and so on? To whom
does “we” refer to when Goodman speaks of “the
particular…inferences we actually make and sanction”?
Experts? The human population at large? Should we be circumscribing
the class of relevant inferences to those judgments that one might
want to call “considered”? These are important matters to
settle. Indeed, a certain combination of answers to
these—entailing that the justification of normative theories of
reasoning hinges entirely on their ability to systematise
“immediate and untutored” inferential dispositions
observed in the general population—notoriously led Cohen (1981)
to endorse the startling claim that, since normative and descriptive
models are borne of the very same data set, behavioural evidence is in
principle incapable of establishing human irrationality. For further
discussion of this general topic, see for instance Stich (1990: Ch.
4), Stein (1996: Ch. 5), Stanovich (1999: Ch. 1), and Thagard
(1982).^{[23]}

Although neither Allais nor Goodman draw the connection, a potential
justification for the evidential relevance of experimental data in
normative theory building can perhaps be sought in the literature on
the Condorcet Jury Theorem and related
results.^{[24]}
This theorem tells us that, under certain conditions, the probability
that a majority verdict, with regards to a particular matter, in a
group of \(n\) minimally reliable people casting yes/no votes on a
particular question converges to 1 as \(n\) tends to infinity,
converging more quickly the greater the individual reliabilities.
Furthermore, majority reliability reaches significant levels, even
given very limited individual reliability, for fairly modest group
sizes. Of course, the issue of interest does not quite fit that
specific model: while the expression of Allais preferences can be
arguably interpreted as a “vote” against the normative
adequacy of Independence, the expression of preferences consonant with
this principle can hardly be interpreted as a vote in favour of
it.

Finally, while this section has focused on the issue of the bearing of
descriptive decision theory on its normative counterpart, it should be
noted that there has been some discussion of the converse direction of
influence. Both Guala (2000) and Starmer (2005) have argued that the
development of descriptive theories of choice has been guided by a
bias towards retaining a core of principles taken to be normatively
adequate. In the case of decision making under risk these are
essentially the transitivity component of Weak Order and Stochastic
Dominance, which are satisfied according to the vast majority of
non-SEU theories that have been developed to
date.^{[25]}
Starmer claims to find an argument justifying this practise in a
well-known paper by Friedman and Savage (1952). This line of thought,
which Starmer takes issue with, proceeds from the assumption that bona
fide principles of rationality would be evident as such to most
subjects and that decision makers will accordingly behave in line with
them.

## 6. Further Reading

While the philosophical literature on the topic remains rather sparse,
there is no shortage of first-rate summaries in the economics and
psychology literatures. For thorough presentations of the technical
results referred to in
Section 1,
see Fishburn (1970: Ch. 14) or the slightly less detailed Kreps
(1988: Ch. 9). Ch. 3 of Joyce (1999) is also helpful here. Regarding
the literature on Independence specifically, discussed in
Section 2,
see Machina (1987), Starmer (2000) and Weber & Camerer (1987).
Regarding the issue of probabilistic belief specifically, discussed in
Section 3,
see Camerer & Weber (1992), Etner *et al.* (2012), Gilboa
& Marinacci (2013), Machina & Siniscalchi (2014), and
Trautmann & van de Kuilen (2015).A number of broader surveys cover
both the above issues, and some. These include most notably Camerer
(1995) and the excellent Sugden (2004). Finally, for a clear and
detailed historical account of the development of the experimental
literature on decision-making, see Heukelom (2014).

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### Acknowledgments

I am extremely grateful to John Quiggin, Peter Wakker, Paul Weirich and Greg Wheeler for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this entry. Any remaining omissions, errors or inaccuracies remain, of course, my own responsibility.