Descartes' Modal Metaphysics

First published Mon Apr 15, 2002; substantive revision Fri Jan 12, 2018

Descartes sometimes speaks of things that have possible existence, in addition to speaking of things as having actual existence. He also speaks of eternal and necessary truths that are the product of God’s free and wholly unconstrained activity. One of the interpretive projects that is inspired by Descartes’ sometimes provocative claims about possibility and necessity is the construction of a general Cartesian theory of modality. Any such theory would of course need to be sensitive to all of the claims that Descartes makes that bear on possibility and necessity, but it would also need to understand and interpret those claims in the light of the terminology and commitments of his larger metaphysical system.

1. Modality and Clear and Distinct Perception

Though Descartes makes a number of claims about possibilities and necessities, not all of them are to be considered in determining his views on modality if we take seriously his view that when doing metaphysics we ought not affirm what we do not clearly and distinctly perceive. Descartes reveals his commitment to this view in a number of places:

I should like you to remember here that, in matters which may be embraced by the will, I made a very careful distinction between the conduct of life and the contemplation of the truth. As far as the conduct of life is concerned, I am very far from thinking that we should assent only to what is clearly perceived. …But when we are dealing solely with the contemplation of the truth, surely no one has ever denied that we should refrain from giving assent to matters which we do not perceive with sufficient distinctness.[1]

If Descartes holds that when doing strict metaphysics we ought not speak of what we do not clearly and distinctly perceive, a general Cartesian theory of modality should not be sensitive to claims about possibilities or necessities that Descartes himself would identify as wholly confused. There are modal claims that seem intuitive and obvious, Descartes might say, and modal claims that actually are intuitive and obvious, and he would want his account of modality to accommodate only the latter.

Indeed, one reason why it is important to highlight the distinction between modal claims that are confused and modal claims that are not is that there are many modal claims that we might want to give a rigorous analysis but that Descartes would not. That is to say, the account that he offers will not necessarily square with all of the modal claims that we would advance pre-reflectively. For example, we might observe a blue table in front of us and put forward the claim that it is possible that the table not be blue and that it could have been black. Descartes himself is going to be careful about accepting such a claim at face-value. He subscribes to the view that strictly speaking our senses “provide only very obscure information” (The Sixth Meditation, AT 7:84, CSM 2:58) about the bodies located outside of us. Our “knowledge of the truth of such things [located outside of us] seems to belong to the mind alone, not to the combination of mind and body” (ibid., AT 7:82–83, CSM 2:57), and what the mind perceives clearly about bodies are non-sensory qualities like extendedness and flexibility (The Second Meditation, AT 7:30–31, CSM 2:20). Or as he says elsewhere, the certainty that we seek in metaphysical inquiry “occurs in the clear perceptions of the intellect and nowhere else” (Second Replies, AT 7:145, CSM 2:104). Returning now to the claim that it is possible that a given table not be blue and that it could have been black, we need to keep in mind that on Descartes’ view colors are not in objects in the way that we normally imagine them to be (Principles of Philosophy I.68, AT 8A:33, CSM 1:217). We might also advance the claim that our blue table could occupy a different position in empty space, or the claim that it could begin to move without being pushed into motion by a cause. The first claim supposes what Descartes denies – that there is empty space (Principles II.10–12, AT 8A:45–47, CSM 1:226–28) – and the second contradicts a Cartesian law of motion that falls immediately out of our idea of God (Principles II.36–37, AT 8A:61–63, CSM 1:240–41; Nadler 1987). However the debate is resolved on these important systematic issues, it is important to keep in mind that Descartes’ theory of modality will be somewhat circumscribed.[2] His theory of modality will do justice to truths about possibility and truths about necessity, but much of what he takes to be possible or necessary is not what we would take to be possible or necessary at first glance. If we suppose that we are being charitable by allowing his theory of modality to accommodate a modal claim that we are certain is true, we might be foisting upon him an interpretation that he would prefer to resist. No doubt he might be mistaken in what he takes to be the set of true modal claims, but his account would end up being mindful of those and not any others.

A related reason why it is important to highlight the distinction between modal claims that are confused and modal claims that are not is that in what is perhaps his most important and influential philosophical work – Meditations on First Philosophy – Descartes often advances a claim that in the final analysis he rejects. He advances modal claims that he takes to be false, and many other claims that he advances he takes to be false as well. For example, he says that what we know best we know either from or through the senses (First Meditation, AT 7:18, CSM 2:17); that it is possible that God is an extreme deceiver (CSM 2:19); that it is possible that God does not exist (CSM 2:19); that it is possible that God, the supreme being on whom all entities depend for their existence, has allowed the existence of an evil demon that is constantly deceiving (CSM 2:20); that we should use imagination to get to know our selves better (Second Meditation, AT 7:27, CSM 2:18); that general perceptions are apt to be more confused than particular ones (ibid., AT 7:30, CSM 2:20); that bodies literally possess qualities like color and taste and sound (ibid.) and heat (Third Meditation, AT 7:41, 43–44, CSM 2:28, 30–31); and that the appropriate way to inquire into whether or not the works of God are perfect is to examine the universe in its entirety (The Fourth Meditation, AT 7:55–56, CSM 2:38–39). Descartes does not subscribe to a single one of these views. He thinks that upon further reflection we can recognize that God is a necessary existent and that it is impossible for Him to be a radical deceiver or to allow the existence of a radical deceiver; that what is known best is known by purely mental scrutiny (Second Meditation, AT 7:31, CSM 2:21); that general perceptions are more clear than perceptions of particulars (ibid.); that color and taste and sound and heat are not in bodies in anything like the way that we imagine (Sixth Meditation, AT 7:81–83, CSM 2:56–58; Principles IV.198, AT 8A:322–23, CSM 1:285); and that things are good by virtue of the fact that God wills them (Sixth Replies, AT 7:431–36, CSM 2:291–94).

Descartes advances a number of claims that are false in the Meditations, but he does this for good reason. He is writing in the voice of a meditator who at the start of inquiry is not yet a Cartesian and who in the course of inquiry is expressing views that seem to him to be true from his non-Cartesian point-of-view. The meditator will express and evaluate these views and see for himself how they collapse on their own weight.

It might seem surprising that as a philosopher Descartes ever flirts with confusions at all. When he does so he is just employing his analytic method – what he calls the “best and truest method of instruction…” (Second Replies, AT 7:156, CSM 2:111). Descartes does not hide that he sometimes makes claims early in the Meditations that from a later and more sophisticated point of view he will retract. He says,

The analytic style of writing that I adopted there [in the Meditations] allows us from time to time to make certain assumptions that have not yet been thoroughly examined; and this comes out in the First Meditation where I made many assumptions which I proceeded to refute in subsequent Meditations.[3]

Descartes advances these claims because he is trying to teach his metaphysics and because he thinks that his readers will not be in a position to grasp that metaphysics if he only makes claims that are true.[4] Reflecting the epistemic individualism that is common in 17th-Century Philosophy, Descartes insists that we should not accept a view until we see its truth for ourselves (Appendix to Fifth Replies, AT 9A:208, CSM 2:272–73). But he also holds that at the start of inquiry our conceptions and commitments are way off. Most of us are inclined to affirm that what we know best we know through the senses, along with the other falsities already mentioned, but in addition: our conceptions of mind and God represent mind and God as sensible when they are not; we think and speak by way of terms that we do not understand or that may have no corresponding idea; and what we take to be the paradigm of a distinct perception is hardly distinct at all.[5] We take in information against the background of our current commitments and conceptions, and so are primed to reject what conflicts with them.[6] When we work through the Meditations from the first-person point-of-view, we accept or reject things when we see for ourselves that they are to be accepted or rejected, but until our intellects are emended we do not have the best perspective from which to see the truth.

Descartes sees little alternative to proceeding as he does. If he just asserts the claims that he is certain are true, other individuals who are in a position to see those claims as obvious will recognize their truth, but these are not necessarily the individuals whom Descartes is trying to reach. He is also trying to reach a much larger set of individuals: those who disagree with him, and who disagree with him deeply. He must say something to these people, but if they are not in a position to see the true, he will have to meet them where they are or else they will not be prepared to engage. About the many false claims that Descartes puts forward in the Meditations, he writes

A philosopher would be no more surprised at such suppositions of falsity than he would be if, in order to straighten out a curved stick, we bent it round in the opposite direction. The philosopher knows that it is often useful to assume falsehoods instead of truths in this way in order to shed light on the truth, e.g. when astronomers imagine the equator, the zodiac, or other circles in the sky, or when geometers add new lines to given figures. Philosophers frequently do the same. If someone calls this ‘having recourse to artifice, sleight of hand, or circumlocution’ and says it is ‘unworthy of philosophical honesty and the love of truth’ then he certainly shows that he himself, so far from being philosophically honest or being prepared to employ any argument at all, simply wants to indulge in rhetorical display. (Fifth Replies, CSM 2:242)

In Second Replies Descartes makes a distinction between the simple and primary notions of metaphysics – which are not derivable from anything – and other truths that can be generated from these (CSM 2:104, 111). A dilemma that he highlights is that if a person is so confused that they do not recognize the truth of primary notions, it is not clear what to say to them. The primary notions are not derived from other notions – that is what makes them simple and fundamental – and so they cannot be demonstrated or argued for, but if the philosopher just repeats them, that won’t do much good either. A further dilemma, according to Descartes, is that primary notions often contradict the everyday worldview to which most of us subscribe uncritically (CSM 2:111–112). If so, we are primed to reject the primary notions of metaphysics and the further disorienting conclusions that they entail. A philosopher like Descartes needs to say something to his audience – to get them to see the force of his view – but ironically enough, the truth will not cut it, at least not at first. What Descartes does, then, is to employ a version of the analytic method of ancient geometry, in which claims are made that strictly speaking are false but that help a student to see (eventually) what is true. In the First Meditation especially, Descartes will advance claims that are false but that he anticipates his readers will find plausible: we will think through the implications of these claims in a way that puts us on course to arrive at a clear and distinct grasp of the primary notions of metaphysics. On the way Descartes will make claims – including modal claims – that range from false to incoherent, but later on we will be in a position to juxtapose these against the obvious truths at which we have arrived, and our earlier claims will be seen for the confusions that they are.

2. The First Meditation and the Possibility of Radical Deception

For example, in the First Meditation Descartes entertains a number of possibilities to the effect that we might be mistaken about results that are perfectly evident to us. One such possibility is that we have been created by a supremely good God but that, for reasons unbeknownst to us, our nature is such that we “go wrong every time [we] add two and three or count the sides of a square, or in some even simpler matter” (AT 7:21, CSM 2:14). Another is that we have not been created by God but have “arrived at [our] present state by fate or chance or a continuous chain of events” (AT 7:21, CSM 2:14). A third is that we are constantly deceived by a malicious demon (AT 7:22, CSM 2:15). Descartes mentions all of these possibilities to set up his Third Meditation point that until we know what made our minds, we are not in a position to trust them and so not in a position to know anything at all (AT 7:36, CSM 2:25). None of these is an actual possibility, though Descartes allows that we may not appreciate this until later:

[Voetius claims that in my philosophy] “God is thought of as a deceiver.” This is foolish. Although in my First Meditation I did speak of a supremely powerful deceiver, the conception there was in no way of the true God, since, as he himself says, it is impossible that the true God should be a deceiver. But if is asked how he knows that this is impossible, he must answer that he knows it from the fact that it implies a contradiction – that is, it cannot be conceived. (“Letter to Voetius,” May 1643, CSMK 222)

Descartes allows that if we are careless or not paying attention, we can entertain the supposition that “God” does not exist or is a deceiver, but he holds that upon reflection the supreme being is a necessary existent, and a necessary existent that cannot deceive (The Fifth Meditation, CSM 2:46–48). We might have thought otherwise at the start of inquiry, before we had carefully unpacked and examined our concepts – at a moment when we were not yet putting forward a priori non-sensory claims, which are the only sort of claim that are suitable as premises in a metaphysical argument. As often happens in philosophy, we come to recognize that there are things that seem clear to us before we have thought them through, and we recognize that the reason why they seemed clear was that we hadn’t thought them through yet. As Descartes himself writes,

In order to philosophize seriously and search out the truth about the things that are capable of being known, we must first of all lay aside all our preconceived opinions, or at least we must take the greatest care not to put our trust in any of the opinions accepted by us in the past until we have first scrutinized them afresh and confirmed their truth. Next, we must give our attention in an orderly way to the notions that we have within us, and we must judge to be true all and only those whose truth we clearly and distinctly recognize when we attend to them in this way. …When we contrast all this knowledge with the confused thoughts we had before, we will acquire the habit of forming clear and distinct concepts of all the things that can be known. These few instructions seem to me to contain the most important principles of human knowledge. (Principles I.75, AT 8A:38–9, CSM 1:221)

When we construct arguments on the basis of basic a priori principles of metaphysics – what Descartes calls “primary notions” (Second Replies, AT 7:145–46, CSM 2:104; Principles I.50, AT 8A:23–24, CSM 1:209) – and not the non a priori premises that constitute much of the early thinking of Descartes’ meditator, we recognize that God is a necessary existent who cannot deceive and also that He is the independent and supreme creator of all reality, both possible and actual (“To [Mesland], 2 May 1644,” AT 4:118–19, CSMK 235; “To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630,” AT 1:152, CSMK 25; Third Meditation, AT 7:45, CSM 2:31). If so, we know on a priori grounds that the possibilities introduced in the First Meditation are fictional and indeed are not possibilities at all. It turns out, upon reflection, that God did not create them. This is not just to say that the possibilities exist but do not obtain. To say that a possibility exists but does not obtain would be to say that it exists as a possibility that is not actualized; it would be to say that in addition to actual reality there also exists possible reality and that some possible reality is never actualized. If in Descartes’s system God created only actual reality and not in addition any possible reality, then possibilities themselves are not real – they have no ontological status and so are not in fact possibilities, because they are not anything. God did not create the possibility that we exist with minds that might be certain of things that are false; He did not create the possibility that we evolved from chance; He did not create the possibility of an evil demon. None of these possibilities exists automatically, and they do not exist just because the cognitive deliverances of the First Meditation meditator tell us that they do. When we (or the meditator) postulated their existence in the First Meditation, we were being hasty, and all that we had to go on at that early stage of inquiry was our confused pre-Meditations conceptions.

We might wonder though if Descartes would be happy to identify the possibilities of the First Meditation as epistemic possibilities, even if they are not real possibilities. After all, the meditator is entertaining doubts in the First Meditation, and she is honestly reporting that because she is not yet certain that God exists or is not a deceiver, for all she knows God might not exist exist or might be a deceiver. She concludes that it is possible that God does not exist and that it is possible that He is a deceiver, and indeed both of those claims, in the sense in which they are uttered, would appear to be true at the moment that she utters them. It certainly seems as though the meditator is saying something true when she expresses that for all she knows God is a deceiver (or does not exist), but a complication arises when we consider Descartes’ own view that a mind is not really thinking of God if they are imagining an extremely powerful being that is a deceiver (“Letter to Voetius,” May 1643, CSMK 222, cited above). Nor are we thinking of God if we have an imagistic idea of a giant man on a cloud (Fifth Replies, CSM 2:252), and we are not thinking of mind or self if we have an imagistic idea of air or fire (Fifth Replies, CSM 2:264). Regardless of how we might report or describe our own thinking in such cases, those just are not the things that we have in mind. If so, a question arises about whether or not Descartes would want to allow that the First Meditation possibility that (for example) God is a deceiver is in fact the epistemic possibility that (for all the First Meditation meditator knows) God might be a deceiver. He would be reluctant to allow this, I think, because he is committed to saying that the First Meditation meditator who thinks of God as a deceiver is not thinking of God at all. But even if Descartes did want to speak in line with common sense and accept the First Meditation meditator’s understanding of their own thought processes, he would still conclude that none of the possibilities of the First Meditation is a real possibility.

Descartes is very explicit about the importance of employing (what some might regard as a not completely honest) pedagogical method. In order to maneuver his readers into a position in which they are able to understand his metaphysics, he needs to help them to clear up their ideas. If he simply tells us his view, we will hear it against the background of confused ideas that (on his view) it is imperative we discard. The view that we would walk away with would not be Descartes’ view but something else. Descartes therefore opts for a special strategy for presenting his metaphysics: he puts things in terms of the confusions that we understand, otherwise we will not understand him. If we object (as does Gassendi) to this kind of maneuver, Descartes insists that under the circumstances it is only appropriate. He does not see anything objectionable in guiding us to truth by way of conceptions that are false or incoherent. Instead, he is providing a service:

[T]ake the case of someone who imagines a deceiving god – even the true God, but not yet clearly enough known to himself or to the others for whom he frames his hypothesis. Let us suppose that he does not misuse this fiction for the evil purpose of persuading others to believe something false of the Godhead, but uses it only to enlighten the intellect, and bring greater knowledge of God’s nature to himself and to others. Such a person is in no way sinning in order that good may come. There is no malice at all in his action; he does something which is good in itself, and no one can rebuke him for it except slanderously. (“To Buitendijck 1643,” AT 4:64, CSMK 230)

The possibilities that Descartes mentions early in the Meditations are not a part of his ontology. When he talks about these, he is not interested in truth but, rather, in helping his reader to move through and past confusion.[7] Unless we are going to saddle Descartes with the view that it really is possible that our minds are radically defective and that nonetheless we ought to go on reasoning anyway, we should conclude that Descartes holds that the possibilities of the First Meditation were never created and that hence they are nothing at all.

3. The Eternal Truths

Descartes is infamous for his doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths:

You ask me by what kind of causality God established the eternal truths. I reply: by the same kind of causality as he created all things, that is to say, as their efficient and total cause. (“To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630,” AT 1:152, CSMK 25)

On the surface the position is baffling, especially when considered in conjunction with Descartes’ view that God is omnipotent. The author of Fifth Objections, Pierre Gassendi, complained that the view is very difficult to conceive. Descartes’ reply is interesting:

You say that you think it is ‘very hard’ to propose that there is anything immutable and eternal apart from God. You would be right to think this if I was talking about existing things, or if I was proposing something as immutable in the sense that its immutability was independent of God. But just as the poets suppose that the Fates were originally established by Jupiter, but that after they were established he bound himself to abide by them, so I do not think that the essences of things, and the mathematical truths which we can know concerning them, are independent of God. Nevertheless I do think that they are immutable and eternal, since the will and decree of God willed and decreed that they should be so. Whether you think this is hard or easy to accept, it is enough for me that it is true. (Fifth Replies, AT 7:380, CSM 2:261)

Descartes holds that each and every thing depends on God for its existence and that, as things, eternal truths depend on God as well. One of Gassendi’s worries is that if God can do anything and thus can alter any item that He creates, nothing that He creates is immutable.

Another reason that Descartes’ view is difficult to conceive is that Descartes takes eternal truths to be necessary. That is, it is difficult to conceive how eternal truths could be necessary if they were created by a free act of God. Descartes is clear that the eternal truths are necessary: he says that “the necessity of these truths does not surpass our knowledge” (“To Mersenne, 6 May 1630,” AT 1:150, CSMK 25). If eternal truths are necessary, however, it should not be the case that they could have been otherwise. Yet Descartes’ commitment to divine omnipotence appears to commit him to this view:

You ask what necessitated God to create these truths; and I reply that he was free to make it not true that all the radii of the circle are equal – just as free as he was not to create the world. And it is certain that these truths are no more necessarily attached to his essence than are other created things. (“To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630,” AT 1:152, CSMK 25)

It appears that something in Descartes’ comments about the eternal truths has to give. It might be that, since Descartes is clearly not prepared to adjust his commitment to divine omnipotence, he instead has to abandon his view that they are necessary.[8] On this interpretation, developed and defended by Harry Frankfurt, all eternal truths are inherently contingent because they could have been false, and they could have been false because God could have made their contradictories true. Frankfurt’s interpretation is motivated not only by Descartes’ commitment to divine omnipotence; there are also some texts:

… God cannot have been determined to make it true that contradictories cannot be true together, and therefore… he could have done the opposite.[9]
I do not think that we should ever say of anything that it cannot be brought about by God. For since every basis of truth and goodness depends on his omnipotence, I would not dare to say that God cannot make a mountain without a valley, or bring it about that 1 and 2 are not 3.[10]

If Frankfurt is right, Cartesian eternal truths are not really necessary; they “are inherently as contingent as any other propositions” (42). They may appear to be necessary to our rational faculties, but this is just a function of the makeup of our rational faculties and not of the necessity of the truths themselves. Frankfurt then argues more generally that Descartes holds that for all we know our rational faculties may be wrong about other things as well. After all, we are mistaken about the necessity of the eternal truths, which seems so very obvious, and so we might might be mistaken about anything else that is similarly evident. If Frankfurt is correct, Descartes holds that there is a way that reality appears from the viewpoint of the clearest of human reasoning, and the best that we can do as rational agents is to take up that viewpoint. But we can never get outside of it to see how things are absolutely.[11]

If Descartes holds that eternal truths are necessary in any robust sense, Frankfurt’s view has an obvious drawback. It also suffers from the problem that it [Frankfurt’s view] cannot be formulated without supposing that Descartes allows that there is a human perspective from which eternal truths can be seen to be non-necessary, but an important component of Frankfurt’s view is the thesis that Descartes thinks that it is part of the structure of a human mind to regard eternal truths as wholly necessary.

The most serious drawback for Frankfurt’s view, however, is that it is self-contradictory in postulating that, according to Descartes, we cannot make claims about what reality is like absolutely. On Frankfurt’s view, Descartes holds that God is omnipotent in the sense that He can do anything at all and has authority over even the eternal truths. That is to say, Descartes holds that it is true that God is omnipotent in this sense. Descartes then concludes that the eternal truths could have been other than they are and hence are not necessary; they just appear to be necessary to finite human minds. Indeed, to a finite human mind it is obvious that eternal truths like that 2+2=4 are necessary, even though we are mistaken and 2+2=4 is just as contingent as any other truth. Frankfurt then concludes that for Descartes what is maximally obvious to a clear-thinking finite mind is no more than that – it is what is maximally obvious to a finite mind, and it is not a guarantee of actual truth. However, Frankfurt cannot generate the result that for Descartes it is false that the eternal truths are necessary, or the result that eternal truths are as contingent as any other truths, unless he supposes on Descartes’s behalf that it is actually true that God is omnipotent in the sense that he [Frankfurt] specifies.

An alternative view (developed and defended by Edwin Curley) is that Descartes holds that eternal truths are necessary, but that they are not necessarily so. On this reading, Descartes’ view involves iterated modalities: a number of truths are possibly necessary, but God chooses only some of these possibilities to be the actual necessary truths.[12] One of the passages that supports such a reading is from the already-cited letter to Mesland:

And even if God has willed that some truths should be necessary, this does not mean that he willed them necessarily; for it is one thing to will that they be necessary, and quite another to will this necessarily, or to be necessitated to will it.[13]

On Curley’s reading, Descartes secures the necessity of eternal truths by arguing that God willed them to be necessary, and hence it can be said that it is false that they could have been otherwise. But Descartes also holds that God created the possibility that they not be necessary, and that is why they are not necessarily necessary, as it could have been the case that they could have been otherwise. Some commentators have argued that a problem for Curley’s view is that it cannot allow Descartes to hold that eternal truths are absolutely necessary – if it could have been the case that a given truth could have been otherwise, then it is not a necessary truth.[14] Curley indeed admits that, on his view, Descartes was confused about the modal status of eternal truths (Curley 1984, 589). They might be hypothetically necessary, but nothing more than that. Another problem is that Curley’s view appears to put a severe constraint on divine omnipotence: if God wants to make an eternal truth false, He cannot make it false without first willing that it not be necessary, for a necessary truth cannot be made false. If God alters the status of the truth so that it is no longer a necessary truth, He can make it false, but He cannot make it false straightaway. A final problem is that Curley’s reading supposes that there is some point at which God’s will could have been otherwise, but God is eternal, and part of His essential perfection is to be wholly immutable (Principles II.36, AT 8A:62).

An alternative reading of Descartes’ comments on the eternal truths suggests still another interpretation. Jonathan Bennett has pointed out that in some of the key passages in question Descartes does not say that God can make contradictories true, but that we should not say that God cannot make contradictories true (Bennett 1994, 653–55). In such passages, for example in the already-cited 1648 letter to Arnauld, Descartes is not saying anything about God’s power but about us and what we ought not say. Presumably, he is just invoking his Fourth Meditation rule for judging in these passages, as he is very explicit that when we do metaphysics we ought not affirm what we do not clearly and distinctly understand.[15] Since we do not come close to understanding what it would be for one and two to add up to something other than three, and since we do not understand God’s being unable to do something, the prospect that God cannot make 1 and 2 not add to 3 is hopelessly confused. Accordingly, we ought not speak of it. The same analysis also applies to the important passage in the Mesland letter. Immediately after saying that God can make contradictories true together, Descartes takes it back: “… even if this be true, we should not try to comprehend it, since our nature is incapable of doing so.” Descartes’ claim that God can make contradictories true is something that we ought not affirm when doing metaphysics and thus something that should have no bearing on our interpretation of Descartes’ system.

Bennett is right to emphasize the passages in which Descartes says of a number of incoherent states of affairs that we ought not say that God cannot bring them about. Bennett extends his view in ways that lead to some of the same problems that arose for Frankfurt, however. According to Bennett, Descartes does not take true modal claims to apply or conform to real possibilities or necessities. In particular, they do not apply to God. Instead, modality is just a function of how our minds have been constructed. Bennett thus arrives at a conclusion that is similar to the one in Frankfurt, but from a different point of departure. Frankfurt supposes that for Descartes God is omnipotent in such a way that He can make eternal truths false, and thus that for any truth that we find to be necessary, its necessity is merely apparent. But Bennett does not think that any modal truths pertain to God. He grounds his interpretation on a text in which Descartes appears to offer the conceptualist account straightaway:

If by ‘possible’ you mean what everyone commonly means, namely ‘whatever does not conflict with our human concepts’, then it is manifest that the nature of God, as I have described it, is possible in this sense, since I supposed it to contain only what, according to our clear and distinct perceptions, must belong to it; and hence it cannot conflict with our concepts. Alternatively, you may well be imagining some other kind of possibility which relates to the object itself; but unless this matches the first sort of possibility it can never be known by the human intellect, and so it does not so much support a denial of God’s nature and existence as serve to undermine every other item of human knowledge. (Second Replies, CSM 2:107; Bennett 1994, 647–648)

Bennett also relies on the set of passages in which Descartes says that what we take to be necessary or possible is a function of how our minds have been structured, and that our minds might have been structured in such a way that we would have found other things to be necessary or possible instead (Bennett 1994, 656–658). Like Frankfurt, Bennett concludes that any claims that we make about God and His necessary existence, or about the impossibility of His being a deceiver, are not a reflection of real possibilities and necessities that pertain to God, but just a reflection of our minds and how we are compelled to think. A worry for Bennett (which was also raised for Frankfurt) is that Descartes appears to want to secure the actual necessity of eternal truths, and that he appears to want his epistemology to yield results that are true absolutely speaking. But even if we are not so concerned about this worry, and we suppose that Descartes is not interested in absolute truth, a textual concern for Bennett is that in the passage that he takes to be the “strongest evidence for [his] reading” (Bennett 1994, 647) Descartes does not say that possibility has no relation to the “object itself.” He says that any serious account of possibility must coincide with what our concepts tell us is possible; otherwise, there would be no way for our minds to know possibility, and “every other item of human knowledge… [would be] undermine[d]” as a result. This is an evidential misfire, but even worse – Bennett’s interpretation supposes that there is an unbridgeable gap between what we take to be true and what is actually true, and as such it would appear to undermine all human knowledge from the very start. It rules out all human knowledge from the start by supposing that for Descartes we can never obtain any assurance that our clearest and most compelling perceptions of reality correspond to the way that reality is in fact. If there is an interpretation of Descartes according to which there is no such gap, Cartesian knowledge would have at least some chance at vindication.

Lilli Alanen has proposed an interpretation along these lines. She objects to all of the views considered above: if they do not downplay the necessity of Descartes’ eternal truths by making them merely hypothetical, the interpretations eliminate their necessity altogether and at the same time commit Descartes to saying that best we can do epistemologically speaking is to arrive at results that seem to be true from human our point-of-view (Alanen 2008, 359–364). Alanen herself concludes that in Descartes’s system there are necessary truths that are fully necessary and that have been authored by God. She adds, however, that our understanding of divine activity is limited in such a way that we have no understanding of how necessities (or possibilities) could be the product of His free will (Ibid., 364–367). A fulcrum point of Alanen’s view is that there are no modal claims that apply to divine activity because God is always the author of any modal claims and hence they are always the subsequent product of that activity:

The idea that I take Descartes’s controversial claims to express is, roughly, that it would be a mistake to assume some notion of modality in terms of which Descartes’s concept of divine power could be explicated, and that we should not even try to do so. There is no modality prior to or independently of God’s act of exercising his power…. (Ibid., 364)

Alanen argues that for Descartes we are being hasty if we attempt to point to considerations that we do not at all understand – for example divine activity and any modalities that we think might apply to it – and if we then appeal to those considerations as a basis for understanding the necessity of eternal truths. But that does not mean that we should conclude that truths about the necessary and the possible are merely subjective. Eternal truths like that two and two add to four are in fact necessary, even if we do not understand the backstory of God’s production of them (Ibid., 365–367).

Alanen’s view is ingenious, but a serious worry that arises for it is that Descartes appears to hold (and without the slightest bit of equivocation) that there are modal claims that pertain to God and that are useful for explicating His behavior. For example, we conclude in the Fourth Meditation that God cannot be a deceiver and therefore that whatever we clearly and distinctly perceive is true. We would also appear to be entitled to include that because God is wholly immutable, the laws of nature are utterly constant (Principles of Philosophy II.36, CSM 1:240). Alanen is certainly right that none of the necessary truths that God wills would apply to His activity, but that does not mean that no modal notions at all apply to His activity – especially if Descartes himself makes so clear that divine immutability and the impossibility of divine deception are data that are to guide us in inquiry. And they are not simply guides in the sense of regulative principles or heuristics. We cannot once and for all lay down a result, for Descartes, unless we recognize that it is true that God exists and that it is impossible for Him to be a deceiver.

Another attempt to preserve the necessity of eternal truths in Descartes’ system is is to run with such data and argue that if God wills a truth for eternity and His will is wholly immutable, the truth is eternal and necessary, and there does not exist the possibility that it be otherwise. Such a possibility would not exist automatically – for it would only exist if God created it – and if Descartes holds that eternal truths are necessary, that is a signal that he supposes that God never created that possibility at all.

One important passage is in the 1644 letter to Mesland (quoted above) in which Descartes says that “God cannot have been determined to make it true that contradictories be true together, and therefore that he could have done the opposite.” As has already been noted, later in the paragraph he takes it all back:

But if we would know the immensity of his power we should not put these thoughts before our minds, nor should we conceive any precedence or priority between his intellect and will; for the idea which we have of God teaches us that there is in him only a single activity, entirely simple and entirely pure. This is well expressed by the doctrine of St. Augustine: ‘They are so because thou see’est them to be so’; because in God seeing and willing are one and the same thing.

There are similar passages elsewhere in Descartes’ corpus, where the view that Descartes that takes himself to be able to express, and to express intelligibly, is that “there is always a single identical and perfectly simple act by means of which he [God] simultaneously understands, wills, and accomplishes everything.” If God is wholly immutable and wills the truths of mathematics and geometry in a single act for eternity, it would appear that we are entitled to infer the result that those truths are necessary, just like we can infer from the impossibility of divine deception that our clear and distinct perceptions are true. We might also consider the Third Meditation passage in which Descartes says that in God there is absolutely nothing that is potential (AT 7:47, CSM 2:32). If there is just a single activity in God, and if it is simple and eternal, and also immutable, then it makes no sense to talk of God as changing course and actualizing an alternative set of possibilities aside from than the one that actually obtains. There do not exist alternative possible eternal truths, and there does not exist the possibility of a change in God’s eternal and immutable will, and so (contra Frankfurt et al) eternal truths are absolutely necessary.

A final consideration to mention in favor of the view that Descartes holds that eternal truths are absolutely necessary is that it is sensitive to the important worry raised by Broughton (1987) and Nadler (1987) – that if Descartes holds that the eternal truths of mathematics, etc., could have been otherwise, then he is committed to the conclusion that physical laws admit of more necessity than (for example) the truth that two and two add to four. Descartes is clear that physical laws follow from God’s nature (for example Principles II.36–37, CSM 1:240–241), and so they are absolutely necessary, but that would mean that he supposes that physical laws are more necessary than eternal truths. If anything, we would expect the story to go the other way around – that eternal truths would be necessary and that physical laws would be wholly contingent. In Descartes’ system it would appear that laws of physics are necessary and that eternal truths are necessary as well.

Still, we need to contend with the passage in which Descartes says that God was free to make the radii of a circle unequal, and with the passages in which Descartes says more generally that God is free with respect to each and every thing that He does. One way to read these passages is to make the assumption that Descartes has a libertarian conception of divine freedom and then conclude that if Descartes says that God is free to do something, there exists the possibility that He do it and also the possibility that He do something else (perhaps the opposite).[16] Descartes himself appears to understand divine freedom in very different terms, however. He writes,

As for the freedom of the will, the way in which it exists in God is quite different from the way in which it exists in us. It is self-contradictory to suppose that the will of God was not indifferent from eternity with respect to everything that has happened or will ever happen; for it is impossible to imagine that anything is thought of in the divine intellect as good or true, or worthy of belief or action or omission, prior to the decision of the divine will to make it so. (Sixth Replies, AT 7:431–32, CSM 2:291)

Descartes holds that God is free in creating the eternal truth about the radii of a circle. If God’s freedom in this and other cases just consists in His complete indifference and independence, then the Cartesian claim that God is free to do x does not entail that there exists the possibility that God not do x or that there exists the possibility that God do something else. As Descartes makes very clear, such possibilities exist only if God takes the extra step of creating them.

Descartes makes a number of otherwise puzzling claims about God’s freedom to create the eternal truths, but if we interpret these in the light of Descartes’ stated conception of divine freedom, they begin to look fairly mundane. A problem, however, is that taken together the claims encourage the reading that Descartes is a necessitarian. We consider for example the following comment that Descartes makes to Mersenne:

It will be said that if God had established these truths he could change them as a king changes his laws. To this the answer is: Yes he can, if his will can change. ‘But I understand them to be eternal and unchangeable.’ – I make the same judgment about God. ‘But his will is free.’ – Yes, but his power is beyond our grasp. (“To Mersenne, 15 April 1630,” AT 1:145–46, CSMK 23).

Here Descartes allows that there exists the possibility that God create alternate eternal truths only if God’s will is mutable, but of course Descartes holds that God’s will is wholly immutable, and immutable for eternity. God is still free of course, but in a way that squares with His immutability: divine freedom is to be understood in terms of indifference and independence. The worry that is starting to arise is that if God is the immutable and eternal author of all reality – the eternal truths and everything else that exists – then there does not exist the possibility that God will an alternate series of creatures, and hence God does not author that possibility, but instead everything that happens happens necessarily. Descartes subscribes to a version of the Spinozistic view that divine freedom is a matter of indifference,[17] and there is also some systematic evidence that Descartes accepts the Spinozistic doctrine of necessitarianism. As Descartes recognizes in the 15 April 30 letter to Mersenne, we might encounter some cognitive dissonance in recognizing God’s freedom as omnipotence.[18] He appears to subscribe to the view that the eternal truths are necessary and that everything else that happens is necessary as well.[19] As he is reported to have said in Conversation with Burman:

Concerning ethics and religion,… the opinion has prevailed that God can be altered, because of the prayers of mankind; for no one would have prayed to God if he knew, or had convinced himself, that God was unalterable…. From the metaphysical point of view, however, it is quite unintelligible that God should be anything but completely unalterable. It is irrelevant that the decrees could have been separated from God; indeed, this should not really be asserted. For although God is completely indifferent with respect to all things, he necessarily made the decrees he did, since he necessarily willed what was best, even though it was of his own will that he did what was best. We should not make a separation here between the necessity and the indifference that apply to God’s decrees; although his actions were completely indifferent, they were also completely necessary. Then again, although we may conceive that the decrees could have been separated from God, this is merely a token procedure of our own reasoning: the distinction thus introduced between God himself and his decrees is a mental, not a real one. In reality the decrees could not have been separated from God: he is not prior to them or distinct from them, nor could he have existed without them. (AT 5:166, CSMK 348)

We must repeat again, however, that this latter passage is from Conversation with Burman, which was an interview in which Descartes reported his views, and not a primary text that Descartes wrote himself. The view that Descartes puts forward in the passage is very much in line with the texts in which Descartes says that God is simple and immutable, and creates by way of a single unchanging act for all eternity, and indeed it pushes those texts to their logical conclusion. The passage is from an interview, however, and some might worry that it is not fully authoritative.

If Descartes holds in the final analysis that everything that happens happens necessarily, it is easy to see how he can hold that eternal truths are necessary and created by a God that is free (in the Cartesian sense). However, Descartes will still have to contend with the objection that there are texts in which he seems to be committed to the existence of unactualized possibilities and, in particular, texts in which he appears to be committed to a non-compatibilist view of human freedom.[20] This objection will be discussed in sections four and six below.

Thus far we have considered the interpretive issue of whether or not Descartes’ eternal truths could have been otherwise. A question that still remains to be considered concerns the ontological status of Descartes’ eternal truths, regardless of whether or not they could have been otherwise.

One view is that since Descartes’ eternal truths are neither finite mental things, finite physical things, nor God, they must be something akin to Platonic forms.[21] A problem with this view, of course, is that it does violence to Descartes’ parsimonious dualism. Another problem with the view is that Descartes says that eternal truths are beings which “have no existence outside our thought” (Principles I.48, AT 8A:23, CSM 1:208).

A second view is that eternal truths are to be located in God.[22] One of the merits of this view is that it provides for eternal truths to be eternal in a very robust sense. God is eternal, and anything else is eternal if it is housed in His eternal mind. Still, the view conflicts with the fact that Descartes holds that eternal truths are creatures and are housed in finite minds only.

A third reading of Descartes on eternal truths is that they are ideas in finite minds. If truth is the conformity of thought with its object (“To Mersenne, 16 October 1639,” AT 2:597, CSMK 139), then eternal truths are ideas. But Descartes has also said that eternal truths have no existence outside of our thought. They are true ideas, but not true ideas in the mind of God because eternal truths are creatures. A problem with this third reading, however, is that, although it allows eternal truths to be truths, it is not clear that it allows them to be eternal.[23] In some passages Descartes does distance himself from the appellation ‘eternal truth’: he refers to “those truths which are called eternal” (“To Mersenne, 27 May 1638,” AT 2:138, CSMK 103) and to “[t]he mathematical truths which you call eternal” (To Mersenne, 15 April 1630, AT 1:145, CSMK 23). And he allows that things can be identified as ‘eternal’ so long as they “are always the same” (Fifth Replies, AT 7:381, CSM 2:262). So a deflationary view of the eternality of Cartesian eternal truths might be in order. However, Descartes says to Mersenne that “from all eternity [God] willed them [eternal truths] to be, and by that very fact he created them” (“To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630,” AT 1:152, CSMK 25). Descartes as a rule shies away from making claims about theological matters, but it is not clear that we want to attribute to him the view that finite minds are co-eternal with God.[24] Perhaps he holds that human minds exist at every point in the series that God wills, or perhaps his understanding of the eternality of eternal truths is more deflationary: God wills a single series for all eternity, and that series includes unchanging true ideas in finite minds.

4. Unactualized Possibles

Descartes is unambiguous that there are some things that we clearly and distinctly perceive to be possible. To Mersenne he speaks of beings whose existence we clearly perceive to be possible (“To Mersenne, March 1642,” AT 3:544–45, CSMK 211); he also says that God “can bring about everything that I clearly and distinctly recognize as possible” (Fourth Replies, AT 7:219, CSM 2:154). In First Replies he says that

…we must distinguish between possible and necessary existence. It must be noted that possible existence is contained in the concept or idea of everything that we clearly and distinctly understand; but in no case is necessary existence so contained except in the case of the idea of God.[25]

In addition, he says to Mesland that “our mind is finite and so created as to be able to perceive as possible things which God has wished to be in fact possible.”[26] The interpretive issue here is what Descartes is talking about when he speaks in such terms. One interpretation that immediately suggests itself is that Descartes holds that there are things or states of affairs that, though not actual, are counterfactually possible.[27] A number of considerations speak in favor of such a reading. One is that Descartes’ view that mind and body are really distinct appears to be the view that minds and bodies that are in fact united can exist apart.[28] Another is that Descartes says that we have clear and distinct perceptions of possible existence and of what is possible, thus making it appear that he holds that God’s creatures include not only actuals but also unactualized possibles.[29] Finally, this sort of reading fits Descartes within a long tradition of figures like Scotus and Bradwardine who posit possible being to secure the meaning and reference of claims about things that could be but aren’t.[30] If Descartes wants to make claims about unactualized possibles and if he does not want those claims to be non-sensical, unactualized possibles need to have some kind of ontological status in his system.

Descartes may in fact be committed to attributing reality to unactualized possibles, but a few interpretive problems arise if he does. One is that Descartes says elsewhere that unactualized being is nothing. In the Third Meditation, he argues that the objective reality of the idea of God cannot have been caused by potential perfections towards which a finite being might be evolving because potentialities are nothing and so have no causal power. He says,

… I perceive that the objective being of an idea cannot be produced merely by potential being, which strictly speaking is nothing, but only by actual or formal being. (AT 7:47, CSM 2:32)

If Descartes holds that potential being is nothing, then it is difficult to see how he can include unactualized possibles in his ontology.

Another interpretive problem is that it is difficult to see exactly where possible reality would fit into Descartes’ ontology. For Descartes, all reality depends for its existence on God – even possible reality (“To [Mesland], 2 May 1644,” AT 4:118–9, CSMK 235). A possible being is thus a creature with an ontological status. Descartes holds that truth is the conformity of thought with its object, that “[t]ruth consists in being” (“To Clerselier, 23 April 1649,” AT 5:356, CSMK 377), and that true ideas are “ideas of real things” (The Third Meditation, AT 7:43, CSM 2:30). Clear and distinct perceptions of possibilities conform to reality and are of real things; they have a truth-maker. A clearly and distinctly perceived possibility has some ontological status, and the question is what exactly that is. This is a question on which the Descartes literature has been largely silent, but the options would appear to be that possibilities are either creatures or ideas in the mind of God.

If possible beings are creatures, there is some difficulty in making room for them in Descartes’ ontology. Descartes is fairly clear that the only creatures that exist are finite minds and bodies and their modes:

I recognize only two ultimate classes of things: first, intellectual of thinking things, i.e. those which pertain to mind or thinking substance; and secondly, material things, i.e. those which pertain to extended substance or body. Perception, volition and all the modes both of perceiving and willing are referred to thinking substance; while to extended substance belong size (that is, extension in length, breadth and depth), shape, motion, position, divisibility of component parts and the like.[31]

One category of being in Descartes’ ontology is thinking substance (and its modes), and another is extended substance (and its modes). If Descartes’ possibles are just created thinking or extended substances, then presumably they are actuals and not possibles.

Of course, one might suggest that Descartes’ dualism entails that there are two kinds of things – thinking things and material things – but that in each of these classes there are substances with actual existence and also substances with possible existence. On such a view, the class of thinking substances (for example) includes thinking substances with actual existence and thinking substances with possible existence.

There are a couple of problems with this view, however. One is that Descartes holds that it follows from God’s essence that God is eternal and that His will is wholly immutable (The Third Meditation, AT 7:45, CSM 2:31; Principles I.56, AT 8A:26, CSM 1:211; “To Mersenne, 15 April 1630,” AT 1:145–6, CSMK 23; Principles II:36, AT 8A:61, CSM 1:24). If it is a necessary truth that God is eternal and that His will is immutable, then there does not exist the possibility that God’s eternal will could have been other than it is. So that possibility does not exist; and neither does it appear that there exist any possible creatures. Descartes holds that there is a single series that God preordains and that is (as would be expected) immutable (Principles I.40–41, AT 8A:20, CSM 1:206). If God created things that were merely possible, it is unclear how He would be able to actualize them instead of the things that are actualized in the series, if none of the requisite possibilities exist, and so it is unclear how they would constitute possibilities. These alleged possibilities (if they are anything) would be among all of the other creatures; they would be actuals.

It might of course be the case that Descartes just insists that there are possible existents in addition to actual existents. Alternately, it might be the case that like Spinoza (in Ethics Part IV, definitions three and four), Descartes uses the expression “possible existence” to describe actually-existing creatures, and in a way that is consistent with a denial of non-actual reality. For example, in some places Descartes identifies things as having possible existence to highlight that they are dependent creatures, and creatures whose existence cannot be read straight from their concept. To describe the kind of existence had by finite creatures generally, he uses ‘possible existence’ and ‘contingent existence’ interchangeably: he sometimes speaks of the beings that depend on God for their existence as having “possible or contingent existence” (Second Replies, AT 7:166, CSM 2:117; Notae, AT 8B:361, CSM 1:306), and sometimes he speaks of them as having just “contingent existence” (Principles I.15, AT 8A:10, CSM 1:198). When he says that creatures have possible or contingent existence, he identifies the two kinds of existence: “possible or [vel] contingent existence.” If contingent existence is just the kind of existence had by beings that depend for their existence on God’s will and whose existence cannot be established by an analysis of their concept alone (Fifth Meditation, AT 7:63–66, CSM 2:44–46; Rules for the Direction of the Mind, AT 10:421–22, CSM 1:45–46), then the fact that a thing has possible existence in Descartes’ ontology does not suggest that the thing does not actually exist. Such a thing exists, but in a way that has it wholly dependent on God. Descartes also suggests this definition of “possible existence” when he contrasts necessary existence with the kind of existence had by creatures in First Replies: unlike necessary existence, the existence had by a creature is marked by the fact that it “has no power to create itself or maintain itself in existence” (AT 7:118, CSM 2:84). It might be that like some of his predecessors Descartes is using ‘possible existence’ to describe a kind of being had by actually existing things.[32]

If possibilities are not creatures that exist in addition to thinking substances and extended substances, another interpretive option is to say that they are ideas in the mind of God, but that God does not actualize. This interpretive option is precluded by Descartes’ commitment to the identity of God’s will, intellect, and creative activity:

…in God, willing, understanding, and creating are all the same thing without one being prior to the other even conceptually. (“To Mersenne, 27 May 1630,” AT 1:152, CSMK 25–26)
In God willing and knowing are a single thing in such a way that by the very fact of willing something he knows it and it is only for this reason that such a thing is true. (“To Mersenne, 6 May 1630,” AT 1:149, CSMK 24)

A philosopher like Leibniz will insist on a distinction between God’s understanding and will so as to secure the existence of things in God’s understanding that God does not actually create. A philosopher like Spinoza will point out that a thinker who is committed to the identity of God’s will and intellect is committed to the view that there is nothing that God understands that God does not create. Spinoza will add that such a thinker is not restricting God’s omnipotence if God is the cause of all being and if alleged unactualized possibilities are outside the scope of God’s intellect and will. Descartes appears to be siding with Spinoza here: what is not the object of God’s understanding is nothing at all, and what is the object of God’s understanding is created and made actual.[33] If Descartes is seriously committed to the identity of God’s intellect and will, it is difficult to see how he can also be committed to the existence of unactualized possibles.

There are a number of passages in which Descartes speaks of what is possible. To fix an interpretation of these passages, we can look to a number of different places. One is common-sense. We might argue that any view is crazy that does not admit that there are things that could happen or exist but that do not. Since Descartes is not crazy, what he must mean when he speaks of the possible is unactualized being. Or, we might argue that Descartes is continuing in the tradition of thinkers who clearly do posit unactualized possibles. If these figures include unactualized being within their ontologies, and if Descartes is building on their work, then his claims about the possible are about unactualized being. Or, we might attempt to isolate parts of Descartes’ system that have a bearing on what “possible” might mean in his system. Parts of this system entail that ‘possible existence’ is just the actual existence of dependent beings. If by “possible existence” Descartes just means the dependent existence of actually existing creatures, then passages in which Descartes speaks of a thing as being possible or having possible existence are not evidence that Descartes holds that there are things that could be but are not. Of course, it might just be the case that Descartes has reason to help himself to entities that the rest of his system shuts out.

If Descartes does hold that there are things that could be but are not, his view still demands the important qualification discussed in the first section above. He of course realizes that in everyday discourse we speak of things that can happen but don’t. However, if our understanding of these things is not clear and distinct, and if our understanding of them as possible is not clear and distinct, then Descartes will not introduce them as possibilities. Descartes appreciates that according to common ways of speaking, all kinds of things are possible. As we have seen, he considers this concept of ‘possible’ after Mersenne introduces it in Second Objections:

If by ‘possible’ you mean what everyone commonly means, namely ‘whatever does not conflict with our human concepts’, then it is manifest that the nature of God, as I have described it, is possible in this sense…. (Second Replies, AT 7:150, CSM 2:107)

Here Descartes might seem to be offering a theory of possibility according to which what it means for something to be possible is just for it to be conceivable.[34] However, this cannot be Descartes’ view. Descartes holds that whatever we clearly and distinctly perceive is true and that truth is “the conformity of thought with its object” (“To Mersenne, 16 October 1639,” AT 2:597, CSMK 139). If a possibility that we are considering is clearly and distinctly perceived, then our clear and distinct perception conforms to reality, and the possibility that we are conceiving is not merely conceptual. Instead, there is also an object to which the clear and distinct perception conforms – the sort of thing posited by commentators who argue that Descartes holds that God’s creation consists not only of actuals but of unactualized possibles. Thus, for any possibility of which we have a conception, if there is no object to which that conception conforms – that is, if the possibility exists only in thought – the possibility is not clearly and distinctly perceived. Possibilities which exist only in thought are not part of Descartes’ ontology and so on Descartes’ view are not possibilities at all. Descartes’ remarks to Mersenne actually bear this out. He is indeed considering the view of possibility as conceivability, but in doing so he is merely acknowledging what “everyone commonly means” by ‘possible’. Descartes sometimes speaks of the possible as clearly and distinctly perceived. It is on these passages that any interpretation of Descartes’ views on possibility must be built.

5. Real Distinction

Any interpretation of Descartes’ views on modality needs to be sensitive to his view that mind and body are really distinct. The conclusion of his Sixth Meditation argument for substance dualism is that “I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it” (AT 7:78, CSM 2:54). A natural reading of Descartes’ conclusion has him saying that, for any minds and bodies that are united, it is counterfactually possible that they be separated.[35] His argument would be as follows:

  1. I clearly and distinctly understand mind apart from body and body apart from mind.
  2. God can bring about whatever I clearly and distinctly perceive.
  3. God can bring about that mind is apart from body and body is apart from mind.
  4. If God can bring about that mind is apart from body and body is apart from mind, then mind and body can exist apart.
  5. Mind and body can exist apart.

Such a reading is sensitive not only to Descartes’ Sixth Meditation comments but also to his further remarks on real distinction in Fourth Replies. There Descartes says that for “establishing a real distinction it is sufficient that two things can be understood as ‘complete’ and that each one can be understood apart from the other” (AT 7:221, CSM 2:156). A thing is complete, for Descartes, when it is a substance:

… [B]y a ‘complete thing’ I simply mean a substance endowed with the forms or attributes which enable me to recognize that it is a substance. (AT 7:222, CSM 2:156)

Since a Cartesian substance is a thing that is ontologically independent (Principles I.51–52), a complete thing is an ontologically independent thing. When we clearly and distinctly perceive mind and body to be complete, we know that they are substances. When we still clearly and distinctly perceive them to be substances after clearly and distinctly perceiving them apart from each other, we know that they are not the same substance under different descriptions. On this view, Descartes holds that mind and body are ontologically independent substances, and their distinctness consists in their ability to continue to exist even after God separates them.[36]

An alternative interpretation of Descartes on the real distinction between mind and body reads the distinction as consisting in the ontological independence of mind and body, but not in their separability.[37] Descartes holds that a sufficient condition for establishing a real distinction between two things is clearly and distinctly perceiving them to be non-identical substances (“Synopsis of these following six Meditations,” AT 7:13, CSM 2:9; Fourth Replies, AT 7:221–223, CSM 2:156–58). If so, he holds that the substantiality of two non-identical substances does not consist in their being separable, even though in fact they are separable.[38] On this view, mind and body are separable for Descartes; it’s just that their separability is a consequence of the (different) fact that they are really distinct.[39]

A third reading of the Cartesian real distinction stresses the difficulty in making room for unactualized possibilities in Descartes’ system. The reading also highlights that Descartes holds that our clear and distinct perceptions are veridical but says (in his proof of real distinction) that God can bring about whatever we clearly and distinctly perceive. Descartes is clear in other texts that the reason why he mentions God’s power in the proof of real distinction is to remind us that no matter how unlikely we think it is that our intimately united minds and bodies could also be really distinct, God has enough power to have made all of our clear and distinct perceptions veridical:

You agree that thought is an attribute of a substance which contains no extension, and conversely that extension is an attribute of a substance that contains no thought. So you must also agree that a thinking substance is distinct from an extended substance. For the only criterion we have enabling us to know that one substance differs from another is that we understand one apart from the other. And God can surely bring about whatever we can clearly understand; the only things that are said to be impossible for God to do are those which involve a conceptual contradiction, that is, which are not intelligible. But we can clearly understand a thinking substance that is not extended, and an extended substance that does not think, as you agree.[40]

In Fourth Replies Descartes say that his reason for mentioning God’s power in the Sixth Meditation proof of real distinction is to remind his reader that our clear and distinct perceptions are veridical (AT 7:226, CSM 2:159). In the Sixth Meditation itself he arrives at a clear and distinct perception of mind as an immaterial substance and body as a material non-thinking substance and is immediately struck by the union of his mind and body: “It is true that I may have… a body that is very closely joined to me” (AT 7:78, CSM 2:54). He says that “nevertheless” his mind and body are really distinct. Descartes appreciates that the facts of mind-body union and mind-body separation are opposed.[41] In the context of demonstrating the real distinction between mind and body he reminds us that God’s power is such that there can be creatures that have nothing in common but that are intimately united.[42]

If we take seriously the consideration that there is no room in Descartes’ ontology for unactualized possibilities, the real distinction between mind and body does not amount to their counterfactual separation.[43] God has willed the series of creatures from eternity, and the claim that mind and body can exist apart might amount to the claim that when a given mind and body are separated in the series, each is ontologically independent and so continues to exist.[44] That is, instead of reflecting that there is anything more in Descartes’ ontology than what is contained in the series that God wills and preordains, the claim that mind and body can exist apart might amount to Descartes’ note in “Synopsis of these following six Meditations” that in the Sixth Meditation he is attempting to re-assure us that “the decay of the body does not imply the destruction of them mind” (AT 7:13, CSM 1:10).

If Descartes holds that potential being is strictly speaking nothing, and if his ontology and his commitment to divine immutability, divine preordination, and (his particular conception of) omnipotence bar possibilities from his system, it is not exactly clear what to make of the possibility of mind and body existing in separation. One view is that Descartes is committed to the reality of this possibility and that, with his commitment to other possibilities, this commitment is part of a pattern of Descartes’ helping himself to entities that his system does not allow. That is, it might be the case that Descartes wants his system to be rich enough to posit possibilities and that, when it isn’t, he posits them anyway. Or, it might be the case that because the Meditations does not attempt to analyze (and then refine) the meditator’s pre-Meditations view of modality, the ‘can’ in Descartes’ claim that mind and body can exist apart is the not fully analyzed ‘can’ of the vernacular.[45]

6. Possibility and Human Freedom

The whole project of the Fourth Meditation would appear to suggest that Descartes is committed to the view that human beings can do something other than what God preordains. The Fourth Meditation tells us that error is avoidable, that we err not as as a result of the way that we are constructed but as a result of our mis-use of one of the faculties that God has provided us, and that to avoid error we must refrain from affirming what we do not perceive clearly and distinctly.

But there are passages in Descartes’ corpus that make a surface reading of the Fourth Meditation problematic. One is of course the Principles I.40–41 text in which Descartes says that God pre-ordains everything from eternity. He does admit that “we can easily get ourselves into great difficulties if we attempt to reconcile this divine preordination with the freedom of our will, or attempt to grasp both these things at once” (AT 8A:20, CSM 1:206). But this just means that he himself appreciates the problem.

There are other difficult texts as well:

…[P]hilosophy by itself is able to discover that the slightest thought could not enter a person’s mind without God’s willing, and having willed from all eternity, that it should so enter.… When Your Highness speaks of the particular providence of God as being the foundation of theology, I do not think that you have in mind some change in God’s decrees occasioned by actions that depend on our free will. No such change is theologically tenable; and when we are told to pray to God, that is not so that we should inform him of our needs, or that we should try to get him to change anything in the order established from all eternity by his providence…[,] but simply to obtain whatever he has from all eternity, willed to be obtained by our prayers. (“To Princess Elisabeth, 6 October 1645,” AT 4:314–6, CSMK 272–73)
As for free will, I agree that if we think only of ourselves we cannot help regarding ourselves as independent; but when we think of the infinite power of God, we cannot help believing that all things depend on him, and hence that our free will is not exempt from this dependence. … The independence which we experience and feel in ourselves, and which suffices to make our actions praiseworthy or blameworthy, is not incompatible with a dependence of quite another kind, whereby all things are subject to God. (“To Princess Elisabeth, 3 November 1645,” AT 4:332–3, CSMK 277)
Henceforth, because he [the man who meditates upon God] knows that nothing can befall him which God has not decreed, he no longer fears death, pain or disgrace. He so loves this divine decree, deems it so just and so necessary, and knows that he must be so completely subject to it that even when he expects it to bring death or some other evil, he would not will to change it even if, per impossible, he could do so. (“To Chanut, 1 February 1647,” AT 4:609, CSMK 310)

In the Principles I.40–41 discussion, Descartes appeals to divine incomprehensibility to make sense of how human freedom and divine preordination are to be reconciled. God is infinitely powerful, and He somehow made a universe in which it is true both that human beings are free and that God has preordained everything from eternity (AT 8A:20, CSM 1:206). Perhaps we should just assume that Descartes thinks that human freedom is inconsistent with divine pre-ordination and that we cannot make sense of human freedom (except by appeal to divine incomprehensibility).

Another interpretive option is to emphasize that in Principles 1.40–41 Descartes is saying only that our experience of freedom and independence is in tension with divine pre-ordination (Cunning 2010, 138–42). There is a way in which our experience of freedom is perfectly consistent with divine pre-ordination, of course, if God has immutably decreed all of our mental life for all eternity and if our mental life includes some experiences and not others. But it might seem puzzling why we have an experience of freedom at all. Still, if Descartes allows that human freedom itself is consistent with divine pre-ordination, then he is not a libertarian but a compatibilist.

Passages outside of the Meditations might be easily read as consistent with the view that for Descartes there does not exist any unactualized possible reality, but the view appears not to square with many of the claims of the Fourth Meditation. The Meditation does contain compatibilist-sounding claims – for example, that the will is maximally free when it is compelled to affirm truth (AT 7:58, CSM 2:40); that it would be impossible for us to be in a state of indifference if we had distinct perceptions only (ibid.); and that assent and dissent are a matter of the will being pulled and compelled by reasons (AT 7:59; CSM 2:41). However, the whole point of the Fourth Meditation would seem to be that God is imperfect if our errors (and false affirmations) are inevitable, and thus that on any given occasion it is always possible for us to affirm or deny. In a recent book, C.P. Ragland reasons along these lines – he argues that the Fourth Meditation supposes a view of freedom according to which a finite mind has a two-way libertarian power to affirm or not affirm in cases where its perception is not clear and distinct. Otherwise, it is not clear what the sense is in which finite minds would have the power to avoid error, or what the sense is in which error would be on us and not on God (Ragland 2016,77–81, 234). Ragland points to a number of other passages in defense of his libertarian interpretation. One is Principles I.37, in which Descartes says that

it is a supreme perfection in man that he acts voluntarily, that is, freely; this makes him in a special way the author of his actions and deserving of praise for what he does. We do not praise automatons for accurately producing all the movements they were designed to perform … when we embrace the truth, our doing so voluntarily is much more to our credit than would be the case if we could not do otherwise. (CSM 1:205)

This passage as quoted is strongly suggestive of the libertarian reading, especially the bit at the end, but there is actually an issue of translation that needs to be addressed. A more literal translation of the last clause – “… quam si non possemus non amplecti” – is “… than if we were not able to not embrace it.” This latter language is in fact similar to the language in the Fourth Meditation, where Descartes sounds quite compatibilist. He says in the Fourth Meditation that “the will consists simply in our ability to do or not do something” (CSM 2:40), but he also says in the same breath that our will is free in cases where it is irresistibly compelled to affirm a clearly and distinctly perceived truth. The will does not possess a two-way power in such instances, but it still consists in an ability to do or not do. That is to say, the will has in its arsenal a capacity to affirm and a capacity to deny, but not a two-way contra-causal power. Ragland would presumably respond to the translational concerns about Principles I.37 by saying that there is a larger and more pressing philosophical concern: that Descartes holds that volitions are praiseworthy, but volitions cannot be said to be praiseworthy if they could not be otherwise (Ragland, 61–62, 77–78). However, we might present the same concern back to the libertarian: if a volition is a modification of a mental substance, and it materializes in that substance without a prior modification as its cause, volitions would seem to pop into existence from nowhere, and the will instead would be a loose cannon. Perhaps Ragland might respond here by introducing the notion of agent causation and saying that, for Descartes, a mental substance itself is able to generate a volition, and not as a result of the activity of any of its modes. However, there are tremendous difficulties in trying to make sense of how agent causation would work in a substance-mode ontology. If we imagined a substance with no modes whatsoever – in line with the thought experiment that Spinoza presents in Short Treatise on God, Man, and His Well-Being (84) – it is difficult to make any sense at all of the process by which a volition would form in that substance. If the substance has no modes, but then it all of a sudden had a volition, there would be no reason why it formed that particular volition rather than some other, and there would be no reason why it formed the volition at that particular moment and not at a different moment. If we do start positing reasons, in terms of some specific underlying mental activity that was brewing beforehand and was a precursor to the volition, we could then think about the case of two identical substances that both have that same underlying activity and a lot more activity besides. If both substances are identical and have all of the same modes, we could ask if a volition could occur in one that did not occur in the other. But the same set of concerns would seem to arise. There would be no reason for the volition to appear, in which case it would again be random, and the notion of accountability for volitions would make little sense.

A compatibilist reading of the Fourth Meditation resolution of the problem of error would have to emphasize the following: that the Meditation provides reasons that push and compel the will to refrain from affirming perceptions that are not clear and distinct; that the Meditation speaks of the will as being pushed and pulled by reasons that are presented to it (CSM 2:40–41); and that Descartes insists that upon further reflection – reflection which occurs past the Meditations – it is clear that the entirety of our mental lives depends on God’s eternal and immutable will and that, as a result, nothing that happens (including pain and death, and presumably error) is bad; and that something (like error) can be the outcome of God’s will if we just understand it in its full context. In the Sixth Meditation, Descartes offers a similar theodicy to explain the occurrence of misleading sensations – for example, the feeling of a pain in a part of the body that has been amputated. Descartes argues there that if we are going to have a body, things like that will sometimes happen; they are just part of the territory for a mind that is embodied, and for reasons that are not entirely clear to us, it is better to be embodied than not (CSM 2:57–61). The Fourth Meditation theodicy might be exactly parallel. If we had just a will or just an intellect, we would never err, but there are advantages to having both. When the two are brought together, however, the intellect sometimes pushes and pulls the will to affirm or deny. A finite intellect has limited information, and some of the affirmations that it compels the will to make will not conform exactly to reality, but it is better that we have both than that we have just one. Furthermore, we can trust that “insofar as these acts depend on God, they are wholly true and good” (CSM 2:42), and so perhaps there is a perspective from which even our erroneous affirmation are getting at truth, in an incomplete manner, or just confusedly.

A final problem for the view that Descartes subscribes to a libertarian conception of freedom is that in the end it is required to appeal to a doctrine of divine incomprehensibility to explain how divine providence and foreknowledge are consistent with libertarian freedom. Ragland does this (Ragland 2016, 230–235), as does Wee (in Wee 2014, 199–200). We do not need to force Descartes to appeal to divine incomprehensibility if we interpret him as a compatibilist, and as we have seen we could save him from additional trouble as well. He does appeal to divine incomprehensibility in the course of trying to understand why we would have an experience of independence if God has preordained everything from eternity, and that experience is mysterious indeed, but Descartes does not say anywhere that freedom itself is inconsistent with divine preordination. As we have seen, however, in one passage he speaks of the

independence which we experience in ourselves, and which suffices to make our actions praiseworthy or blameworthy, [and which] is not incompatible with a dependence of quite another kind, whereby all things are subject to God. (CSMK 277; also Ragland, 212)

A final issue to consider in the context of discussing Descartes’ view on human freedom is the issue of the extent to which finite minds are compelled or drawn to affirm clear and distinct perceptions. There are a number of texts in which Descartes reflects that view that finite minds are wholly unable to refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception.[46] Indeed, we might think that the only way that we would be able to know that God’s non-deceiverhood secures the truth of clear and distinct perceptions is if those perceptions are utterly compelled. There are passages, however, in which Descartes appears to reflect the view that it is within the power of the will to refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception. One is Principles I.37, in which Descartes says that “when we embrace the truth, our doing so voluntarily is much more to our credit than would be the case if we could not do otherwise” (AT 8A:19, CSM 1:205). But this passage is especially odd given that only a few lines later in Principles I.43 Descartes offers one of his statements of the view that we are unable to doubt clear and distinct perceptions (in which we are embracing the truth…).[47]

Another passage in which Descartes appears to reflect the view that it is within the power of a finite will to refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception is in “To [Mesland], 9 February 1645.” There Descartes writes that

absolutely speaking… it is always open to us to hold back from pursuing a clearly known good, or from admitting a clearly perceived truth, provided we consider it a good thing to demonstrate the freedom of our will by so doing. (AT 4:173, CSMK 245)

An examination of the larger context of this passage in the shows that it is not in fact evidence that Descartes holds that it is within the power of a finite will to refrain from affirming a clear and distinct perception. In the previous letter to Mesland Descartes had said that

I agree with you when you say that we can suspend our judgment; but I tried to explain in what manner this can be done. For it seems to me certain that a great light in the intellect is followed by a great inclination in the will; so that if we see very clearly that a thing is good for us, it is very difficult – and on my view impossible, as long as one continues in the same thought – to stop the course of our desire. “To [Mesland], 2 May 1644,” AT 4:115–6, CSMK 233)

Descartes’ view that clear and distinct perceptions are will-compelling is the view that so long as the intellect has a clear and distinct idea, it is impossible for the will to refrain from affirming it. What it is for a finite mind to clearly and distinctly perceive X is for its intellect to have a clear and distinct idea of X and for its will to affirm X, but while the intellect is presenting this clear and distinct idea, the will cannot stop affirming it to turn its attention to something else. Instead, another idea must be put in place of the clear and distinct idea, and by something other than the will.[48] As Descartes says by way of qualification in the February 1645 letter, we suspend judgment when something else distracts the will from a clear and distinct idea (AT 4:173, CSMK 245) – for example the desire to exhibit our freedom.[49]

It is tempting to assume that Descartes accepts the Spinozistic view that the will is at the mercy of the clarity with which the intellect has ideas. (Of course, in Spinoza’s language the view is that there is no distinction between will and intellect and that to the extent that we understand something our will is drawn to affirm it.) Descartes appears to accept this view in the case of clear and distinct ideas at least, and it would make sense for him to think that the compellingness of truth and goodness does not disappear when our grasp of it is slightly weakened. But such a reading is speculative at best.

7. The System and its Pillars

It is presumably an adequacy condition on the interpretation of the work of any systematic philosopher that the work be interpreted in light of the central tenets of that philosopher’s system. The interpretive problem of course is that for almost any such philosopher there are controversies about what these central tenets are. It is uncontroversial that Descartes sometimes speaks of possibility and necessity. What is not so uncontroversial is what he is talking about when he talks about these. In particular, if Descartes is committed to the view that there is unactualized possible being, then either (1) the alleged parts of his system that seem to disallow such being are not parts of his system, (2) the parts of his system that seem to disallow such being do not really disallow it, or (3) he is not a wholly systematic philosopher. There is no chance that (3) is right, but much work remains to be done in debates over (1) and (2).


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