Notes to Einstein’s Philosophy of Science

1. Not even Mach subscribed to the view standardly designated as “Machian” positivism, certainly not if the latter is understood to have at its core a reductionist phenomenalism that serves as an epistemological premise for proscribing the employment of unobservable theoretical entities in physics. Various members of the Vienna Circle might have found it convenient to read Mach this way for the purpose of legitimating their own anti-metaphysical posture, but if that had been Mach’s real view, then how are we to explain such facts as his acceptance of atomism after the experimental confirmation of Einstein’s analysis of Brownian motion around 1909 or his high praise for precisely those features of Pierre Duhem’s philosophy of science-his holism and his famous critique of crucial experiments (see Duhem 1906)-that are today regarded, thanks to Quine (1951) as most antithetical to reductionist phenomenalism (see Mach 1906; for more detailed discussion, see Howard 1993)? What is later mistaken for an epistemic thesis about the legitimation of scientific concepts was understood by Mach, himself, as a genetic thesis about the origin and development of concepts. As he regularly explained, his perspective was that of a biological-economical view of human knowledge (see, for example, Mach 1900), and his preferred mode of criticism was, as mentioned above, the “historical-critical” method. Einstein’s account of his debt to Mach, as quoted above from his 1916 memorial note, emphasizes not phenomenalism but precisely this historical-critical method.

2. Friedman (1983, 22–25) gives an explicitly proto-verificationist interpretation of Einstein’s emphasis on the observability of spacetime coincidences.

3. Arthur Fine (1986) characterizes such a move, this not the only instance in Einstein’s thinking, as the “entheorizing” of a methodological principle in the form of a physical postulate. Fine, however, argues that determinism is, for Einstein, the entheorized version of realism.

4. As Einstein himself seems to concede, principle theories are explanatory deficient, they constrain a range of phenomena that can occur, but they do not explain the phenomena that do occur. Therefore, it has been argued that relativity theory should ultimately take the form of a constructive theory, either as a theory about the material structure of rods and clocks (Brown 2005) or about the geometrical structure of space-time (Janssen 2009). The explanatory power of Einstein’s principle theories has been emphasized by Lange 2014.

Copyright © 2019 by
Don A. Howard
Marco Giovanelli <>

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