Latin American Feminism
Latin American feminism, which in this entry includes Caribbean feminism, is rooted in the social and political context defined by colonialism, the enslavement of African peoples, and the marginalization of Native peoples. Latin American feminism focuses on the critical work that women have undertaken in reaction to the forces that created this context. At present, the context is dominated by neoliberal economic policies that, in the environment of globalization, have disproportionally impacted the most vulnerable segments of society. Against this political backdrop, Latin American feminism is grounded in the material lives of people, often women, as it explores the tensions engendered by the confluence of histories that generate relationships among gender, citizenship, race/ethnicity, sexuality, class, community, and religion.
Latin American feminism broadly encompasses multiple positions, many of which are in tension with each other. As a result, many refer to Latin American “feminisms” in the plural. The diversity of feminisms is owed to the various regions and their histories which demanded social, cultural, governmental, and organizational transformations in their own capacities. Hence, the present discussion of the general concept of Latin American feminism methodologically necessitates historical sensitivity to apprehend the intimate relationship between the development of different ideas and the heterogeneous political conditions that give rise to them.
In the United States, tracing the history of Latin American feminism and its ideas is an urgent task. While growing interest in the broader Latin American philosophy calls for increased textual representation and access, the role that women have played in the evolution of Latin American philosophical ideas has been largely neglected. Yet, there exists a wealth of critical feminist ideas for theories of identity, politics, and culture.
- 1. History: A Genealogy of Latin American Feminism
- 1.1 Latin American Feminist Origins (Pre-20th Century)
- 1.2 Latin American Feminist Ideas of the Early 20th Century
- 1.3 The Years of Silence (1950–1970)
- 1.4 Ideas of a Movement: Latin American Feminism of the Late 20th Century (1970s–1990s)
- 1.5 Dissident Voices: Latin American Feminist Ideas of the 21st Century
- 2. Key Issues and Debates
- 3. Latin American Feminist Philosophy
- 4. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. History: A Genealogy of Latin American Feminism
1.1 Latin American Feminist Origins (Pre-20th Century)
Most historical genealogies of Latin American feminism trace their origins to the social movements beginning in the 1960s and 1970s centered around women’s liberation. However, feminist ideas in Latin America are much older than those which have been documented as part of feminist political action. The origins of Latin American feminist ideas can be found in reflections on conditions of otherness that emerge as a result of colonialism and in critiques of norms that render the category of man the entry point for humanity. By the 60s and 70s, feminism in Latin America had a firmly rooted history concerned with articulating difference and alterity from a non-dominant perspective (Gargallo 2004: 80).
There are lacunas in Latin American feminist genealogy as the writings of non-white women from the 19th and early 20th centuries (and earlier) are seldom found in written form, given that many non-white women were illiterate, and their stories were not textually documented. Their ideas and histories were orally transmitted, and current local oral traditions account for them (Gargallo 2010: 12a). For instance, the colonial resistance of Baraúnda, wife of Garifuna leader Satuyé, is legendary for her people; her memory travels in songs sung by Garifuna women of Honduras and Belize. Similarly, the story of Anacaona, Taino chief (cacica) of Jaragua Hispañola, is one of colonial resistance; prior to her execution she was offered clemency in return for becoming a concubine for a Spaniard, and her refusal and subsequent death solidified her legendary status which is immortalized in songs from Haiti, Dominican Republic, and Puerto Rico. The stories of Indigenous women of these times continue to be shared orally through myth, songs, and proverbs, and contribute to the foundations of Latin American feminist thought (Gargallo 2010: 14a).
One of the earliest documented writers in the Latin American feminist tradition comes from the 17th century. Arguing in favor of the educational and intellectual rights of women, Juana Inés María del Carmen Martínez de Zaragoza Gaxiola de Asbaje y Ramírez de Santillana Odonojú (1651–1695), recognized by many as Juana Inés de la Cruz or Sor Juana of Mexico, was a self-educated scholar of the Baroque period whose writings have garnered quite a bit of philosophical attention as part of the Latin American philosophical canon. She was well known during her lifetime as evidenced by multiple publications of her work. However, by the second half of the 18th century, her fame diminished as attention to Baroque poetry declined. In 1951, her work recovered attention with the publication of her complete works (Gargallo 2009: 419).
Juana Inés de la Cruz was one among many feminist writers who advocated for social and cultural changes, including the role of women. Teresa Margarida da Silva e Orta of Brazil (1711–1793) was the first woman in the Portuguese-speaking world to publish a novel and the first Brazilian-born person to edit a book in Europe. She advocated for the autonomy of the Indigenous and the rights of women in science (Gargallo 2004: 80). Flora Tristán of Perú (1803–1844) argued for women’s equality and its important relationship to workers’ rights (Gargallo 2004: 80). Argentinian abolitionist Juana Manso (1819–1875) detailed education and philosophical instruction as a route to the moral and intellectual emancipation of women. This position was taken up at the end of the century by figures like Rita Cetina Gutiérrez of Mexico (1846–1908) and Visitación Padilla of Honduras (1882–1960) (Gargallo 2009: 418). Cetina Gutiérrez founded La Siempreviva in Mérida, Mexico’s first secular school for poor girls and an art college for young women. She is cited as one of Mexico’s first feminists who promoted secular education of women and fought for their self-determination. Padilla founded the Sociedad Cultural Feminina, which promoted access to education, especially for women.
The existence of early Latin American feminist ideas was not attended to until years after their inception. The impact of ideas centering on women’s rights to intellectual and educational life, equality, and workers’ rights was not immediate since they were not given importance in their respective contexts. During the feminist movements of the 20th century, many of these figures re-emerged as part of a Latin American feminist theoretical landscape (Gargallo 2004: 81). Early Latin American feminist ideas came to be evaluated through historical memory that gives weight to the claim that Latin American feminist ideas existed prior to the women’s movements of the 1960s and 1970s.
1.2 Latin American Feminist Ideas of the Early 20th Century
Feminist ideas from the early 20th century are transnational. Ideas move with pushes for social change. Hence, a key issue for contemporary Latin American feminist writers is the importance of tracking the movement of ideas and reminding us that ideas migrate and reconfigure depending on their contexts. The intersection between women’s ideas about resistance and the ideas that could lead to social transformation was not necessarily understood as feminist in its time. More often than not, women’s ideas in regards to justice, equality, and political change converged with other political projects that focused on improving the poor working class’s conditions and not specifically women’s conditions. Their ideas for social change were molded into general claims about access to education and transformation of laboring material conditions. Ideas that are now coded as feminist are identified as such in retrospect, but in order to do them justice, they need to be accounted for in their historicity.
The Mexican Revolution (1910–1920) had a profound impact on the development of feminist ideas (Gargallo 2004: 82). Most notably, the revolution focused on education, and in this political landscape, feminist ideas had the historical impact of influencing the thoughts and actions of women in Mexican society (Gargallo 2004: 82). In 1915, Salvador Alvarado became governor of the Yucatán and functioned as a vehicle for social and political change until 1918 when he was called to return to military duty. He supported a feminist movement in the region initiated by Rita Cetina Gutiérrez in 1870, noted earlier as one of Mexico’s earliest feminists and founder of La Siempreviva. Moreover, his tenure in office gave room and support for women’s political activism in the region. The first two feminist congresses in the history of Mexico were held in Mérida in January and November of 1916, giving floor to discussions on the right to vote and political participation, abortion and contraception, as well as education (Gargallo 2004: 83). By 1923, the socialist party of the Yucatán had three women deputies and one alternate (Gargallo 2004: 84).
Given the impact of the Mexican Revolution, it is no surprise that some of the first feminist ideas to reach historical identification are found in its wake. Nevertheless, feminist ideas stretched beyond Mexico and across Latin America and the Caribbean. In 1880, women abolitionists in Brazil published a newspaper titled A familia and argued for changes in dress norms. In 1910, Argentina witnessed the first Feminist International Congress which fought for peace, education, and social participation (Gargallo 2004: 85). In 1912, women in Colombia declared the defense of civil rights of married women. In 1916, women in Panamá founded Club Ariel and Centro de Cultural Feminina, which supported intellectual and physical education as well as the political life of women, and whose motto centered on virtue and nationhood. In 1924, Visitación Padilla denounced the presence of U.S. marine military infantry in Honduras and Central America in the Boletín de la Defensa Nacional. She founded the Círculo de Cultura Femenina which supported the education of women and resisted North American military intervention during the Second Honduran Civil War (1924). In 1928, women of Ecuador sued the state, demanding the right to vote, and received it one year later (Gargallo 2004: 86).
Luisa Capetillo (1879–1922) exemplifies the convergence of feminist ideas and ideas concerning broader social transformation. Born in Arecibo, Puerto Rico, Capetillo was home schooled and secured a job as a reader in cigar-making factories, reading to workers and transferring ideas to workers as they rolled cigars. Capetillo’s employment as a reader served as an important locale from which workers developed a consciousness of trade unions, socialism, anarchism, and women’s rights (Ruiz 2016: 6). Although readers were typically men, it was not uncommon to find women in cigar factories as the cigar-making industry modernized and became the second national industry in the first decades of the 20th century (Ramos 1992: 29). Hence, it is not accidental that some of the first feminist ideas of Puerto Rico emerged in cigar factories and in the proletariat presses significantly before the suffrage movement later in the century (Ramos 1992: 30). Capetillo’s feminist ideas are grounded in her class politics that saw emancipation occurring at the nexus between labor empowerment and gender equality (Ruiz 2016: 13). Although often heralded as the first feminist writer of Puerto Rico and the first woman to ever publish a book about women in Puerto Rico, Capetillo’s work most importantly shows how early 20th century Latin American feminist ideas and writers were very much grounded in the lived material conditions of their times. In the case of Capetillo, her feminist anarchism brewed at the core of her understanding of workers’ emancipation as a woman who herself labored in the trenches of modernity.
Early 20th century Latin American feminist history concludes with women’s suffrage. The years spanning 1870–1947 are generally considered the pivotal years for women’s suffrage (Gargallo 2004: 94). However, to view this slice of history as merely centered on suffrage misrepresents the multiplicity of feminist ideas and activities developed during the time. These years also witnessed the push for social transformation oriented around ideas of equality and justice that included, but was not limited to, the right to vote. The push for equality framed women’s insistence on public access to education, which impacted not just women but the impoverished as well. The call for a more just social order framed how women were thinking about their locale in resistance to military intervention as well as labor movements. Hence, the ideas that emanate from this period are multidimensional. The era is identified as closing out with the accomplishment of suffrage. However, the right to vote emerged at different times throughout the region, owing to the diversity of local politics. For instance, Ecuador was the first country in South America to enfranchise women in 1929. That same year, Puerto Rico enfranchised literate women and in 1935, gave the vote to all women. Uruguay followed shortly after in 1932, Cuba in 1933, and El Salvador in 1939. However, the suffrage movement stagnated in other countries: women were enfranchised in Nicaragua and Perú in 1955, and only in 1961 did Paraguay give women the vote.
1.3 The Years of Silence (1950–1970)
Coined by Julieta Kirkwood of Chile as the “years of silence”, the years spanning from 1950–1970s/1980s saw women (mostly middle-class) increasing their political presence by participating in popular social movements and political parties (Kirkwood 1986: 70). However, their social and political participation lacked explicit feminist demands. Although not a strict set of dates, the years of silence lasted well into the 1980s for some parts of Latin America (e.g., Chile); these years, the time of baby boom and populism, were politically rife in post-World War II Latin America. It was also a time characterized by McCarthyism which precipitated the U.S. intervention in Guatemala and the Dominican Republic with intentions of warding off communism (Gargallo 2004: 94). These years also witnessed the fall of the Somoza dictatorship in Nicaragua in 1956 as well the rise of conflict and military regimes in countries like Colombia, Argentina, and Chile. Hence, political mobilization took place around the changing landscape of Latin America, and middle-class women participated, but their explicit role in these movements is complicated by the fact that their presence and impact were not readily documented (Ungo Montenegro 2000: 45). Notwithstanding, the years of silence were not quiet on pages. Women during these years were literarily active and produced texts that privileged their position which was theoretically underappreciated because of their literary style (Gargallo 2004: 95).
The relationship between literature and philosophy has been explored as part of the Latin American philosophical tradition. For instance, one position holds that the Latin American literary tradition of essay writing contains insights that can ameliorate the troubles of Latin American philosophy at large (Pereda 2006: 196). Nevertheless, the points of literary departure for many Latin American philosophers are seldom women, although Latin American women in the middle of the 20th century wrote amply about their identities in relationship to gender, race, ethnicity, and nationality (Gargallo 2004: 97). It is important to appreciate that not all women’s writing during this time pushed for social change. Some narratives played into patriarchy and machismo, forced marriage, and social isolation. At the same time, some women presented narratives that exposed doubts and resistances to the patriarchal ordering of the world (Gargallo 2004: 97). Unfortunately, women writers of this time are often folded into literary traditions, hindering their recognition as thinkers and theorists. One notable example is Rosario Castellanos of Mexico.
In 1950, at the age of 25, Castellanos defended her master’s thesis in philosophy at Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México (UNAM). The project, titled Sobre cultura feminina, explored women’s role in the production of culture (Gargallo 2004: 89). She was a prolific writer. However, Castellanos is largely remembered as a literary figure and a poet. It was not until 1974 (after her death), that the publication of her most famous work El Eterno Feminino was recognized as theoretically rich, speaking on themes of gender, ethnicity, and nationhood. Today, she is recognized as a leading voice in the feminist movement of Mexico, her work arguing for the construction of a feminine subjectivity that defies the identity imposed by patriarchal cultural norms. As a result, her work has aided in establishing a different vision of political life for women in Mexico (Gargallo 2004: 90).
The 1950s–1970s was a fervent time of women’s writing across Latin America. Antonia Palacios of Venezuela wrote Ana Isabel, una niña decente (1949), Castellanos of Mexico wrote Balún-Canán (1957), and Albalucía Ángel of Colombia wrote Estaba la pájara pinta sentada un verde limón (1975). Further notable examples include the Mexican poet Enriqueta Ochoa whose published works span 1947–2008 and Marvel Moreno, one of the most influential female writers of Colombia. In the 1980s, Moreno broke through the literary mold of her times marked by the work of Gabriel García Marquez with the publication of Algo tan feo en la vida de una señora bien (1980). The protagonists of the book, who are women, serve as vehicles for the exploration of life in a patriarchal society. Moreno placed value on providing a genealogy of women as her protagonists (e.g., the daughter, the mother, the grandmother), reflecting the importance of transgenerational communication amongst women. Thus, some argue her works provide a thematic thread of rebellion that runs through the lives of women and unites them in their histories of resistance to patriarchal social orders (Gargallo 2004: 106).
While dubbed the “years of silence”, the work of women writers during this period did find voice through literature and poetry. Their theoretical reflections were subsequently appreciated with the resurgence of feminism in the later decades.
1.4 Ideas of a Movement: Latin American Feminism of the Late 20th Century (1970s–1990s)
The years spanning the 1970s–1990s were marked with important social and political transformation for women in Latin America amidst complex political backdrops. Transitions from military regimes and processes of democratization as well as peace negotiations provide the context in which women’s mobilization emerges across Latin America. The plurality of political conditions gave way to the development of diverse feminist ideas. The feminism of this time, also commonly referred to as neofeminism, was particularly attuned to the body (Bartra 2001: 1). Grounded in the pre-1970 history of Latin American feminism, neofeminism strove toward the validation of women’s rights, but specifically centered on women’s freedom over their bodies. The neofeminist perspective translated into mobilizing on issues of abortion, motherhood, sexual autonomy, rape, and abuse (Bartra 2001: 1).
Contemporary Latin American feminism surged during politically somber times, especially under the presence of military regimes or nominal democracies that repressed civil liberties often in the name of national security (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 397). Hence, as a social movement, Latin American feminism was born with an intrinsically oppositional and occasionally clandestine character (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 397). As international organizations attempted to influence national health and population policies and governments to control women’s bodies, the foci of Latin American feminisms grew more complex (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 403).
One notable characteristic of feminism during this time is the recognition of womanhood as a shared status. Women during these decades found identity in their status of womanhood and their shared condition that differentiated them from men (Gargallo 2004: 88). They rejected “man” as the standard model around which their political action organized. The push for social and political transformation focused less on equality (e.g., the right to vote) and more on a desire for liberty, denying notions of femininity as subordinate to masculinist constructions of humanity (Gargallo 2004: 111). Latin American feminism of the late 20th century encouraged encounters between women that recognized them as subjects, with their own histories, and on their own terms (Gargallo 2004: 88).
1.4.1 The 1970s
Amid military regimes, the 1970s were characterized by a mobilization of women that took motherhood to be a political category. In some countries, women resisted state repression as mothers of those who had disappeared at the hands of the state (Gargallo 2004: 113). The CoMadres (Comité de Madres) of El Salvador formed in 1977 to investigate the disappearance of missing relatives. They photographed the bodies of people found in the streets of El Salvador in order to aid in identification. In the same year, the Asociación Madres de Plaza de Mayo in Argentina organized as mothers to search for their disappeared children as a result of state terrorism enacted by the military dictatorship that spanned the years of 1976–1983. In Mexico, critical stances on motherhood were initiated by the neofeminist group Mujeres en Acción Solidaria (MAS), which protested the sanctifying myth of motherhood on the eve of Mother’s Day at El Monumento a la Madre (a monument honoring mothers) in Mexico City. They resisted the myth that a woman’s role in society should be circumscribed to motherhood (Gutiérrez 2012: 42). The protest continued in the years that followed.
The push to disconnect motherhood from womanhood set the stage for a separation between the reproductive capacities of women’s bodies and their sexual health (Gargallo 2004: 114). Claims to the decriminalization of abortion emerged under access to reproductive rights that sought to give women control over their own bodies. Thus, the right to abort was defended on the grounds of a woman’s right to individual autonomy (Gargallo 2004: 114). In 1976, El Movimiento Nacional de Mujeres, along with other autonomous feminist groups, organized one of the first congresses on the decriminalization of abortion that maintained the interruption of pregnancy as a woman’s decision that should be made accessible through all institutions of public health (Gargallo 2004: 114). In the years that followed, feminists in Mexico used a variety of symbolic strategies in their fight for the legalization of abortion. They dressed in black to publicly mourn the women who had died as a result of clandestine abortions (Garagallo 2004: 115). Today, abortion remains tiered in access throughout Latin America. Countries such as Chile, Nicaragua, Dominican Republic, and El Salvador prohibit abortion entirely, even under conditions where it would save a woman’s life. In countries like Mexico, Guatemala, Panamá, and Venezuela abortion is legal only under conditions where it saves the life of the woman. However, in countries like Argentina, Costa Rica, and Ecuador abortion is legal to the extent that it preserves the physical health of the woman. In some countries, conditions of rape are understood as part of the preservation of physical health (e.g., Argentina), while in others, the extension is made to allow abortion to the extent that it preserves the mental health of the woman (e.g., Colombia). Cuba, Uruguay, and Puerto Rico are places that have legalized abortion without any restrictions that would require some particular reason. Although the battle for access to abortion began during the 1970s, it continues to be a contested political issue especially in places where access is entirely denied or restricted by other factors: physical health, mental health, or life preservation. Moreover, in places like Puerto Rico, the question of abortion is intricately bound up with histories of forced sterilization, making the issue more politically charged and complex.
As a time characterized by state repression, the 1970s were also a time of awakening for many women who demanded social change (Bartra 2001: 6). Latin American feminists not only challenged patriarchy by defining themselves as distinct political subjects, but also challenged male paradigms of domination expressed through the militaristic and counter-insurgent state. The reality of state repression made Latin American feminisms distinct in their ability to unveil the patriarchal foundations of militarism and institutionalized violence (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 397). The intimate relationship between patriarchy and military state repression is best elucidated by the intersection between Chilean feminist activism and the push for democratization in Julieta Kirkwood’s famous phrase: “Democracia en el país, en la casa y en la cama”, which translates to: “Democracy in the nation, in the house, and in the bed” (Kirkwood 1986: 14). Latin American feminism of the 1970s was linked to an activism that believed authoritarian regimes found their roots where patriarchal oppression trickled into the “private” sphere. By the late 1970s, opposition movements emerged throughout Latin America, joined by women from all walks of life defying their historical exclusion from political life (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 398–399).
The heterogeneity of contemporary Latin American feminism can be traced to the diverse political conditions from which its activism emerged. Nevertheless, a theme can be found in the commitment to change the social relations of production, including reproduction. Throughout the region, women collectively participated in movements to engender human rights by seeking better access to education, healthcare, and urban services as well as resistance to military state repression (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 401). Latin America’s economic dependence and political repression during these years set the stage for a distinct militant feminist activism that would continue to spread into the decade of the 1980s.
1.4.2 The 1980s
The 1980s were characterized by the expansion of feminist theory and practice. Feminists started focusing on specialized activities that deepened their vision of politics, culture, and society. The number of feminist magazines, films, and video collectives increased. Furthermore, the number of centers for rape victims and abused women, as well as feminist health collectives, lesbian groups, and other specifically gendered projects grew during this time (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 404). As feminists increased their activities in feminist projects, they began creating more civil society organizations or NGO’s (non-government organizations) (Millán 2014: 154).
One of the most important events to mark the 1980s was the first Encuentro Feminista Latinoamericano y del Caribe held in Bogotá, Colombia. The Encuentros (“Encounters”), as they came to be called in short, served as regional critical forums for debates about feminist politics and the movement’s overall relationship to social justice in Latin America and the Caribbean. The attendees of the First Encuentro came together on the heels of geographic and political isolation with a desire to carve out a path for autonomous politics. Over the years, the Encuentros extended the map of feminist politics (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 405).
The First Encuentro convened in Bogotá, Colombia, over the course of four days in July 1981; more than two hundred women from over fifty organizations attended. The region-wide gathering brought together many strands of feminism, creating a heterogeneous movement with considerable tensions and conflicts. For instance, during the planning stages of the meeting, heated discussions emerged between independent/autonomous feminists, often identified as autónomas or feministas, and militant political feminists affiliated with political parties (e.g., socialist), often referred to as militantes. Independent feminists expressed concern over the possibility that feminists aligned with political parties might try to impose sectarian agendas diverting attention from issues central to feminist organizing (e.g., reproductive rights) (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 407).
The most widely attended Encuentro of 1981, “Feminism and Political Struggle”, focused on the autonomy of the feminist movement, double militancy (concurrent participation in a political party and the feminist movement), and feminism and imperialism (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 408). The response to the session exemplified the diversity of ideas involved in the feminist struggle. All of the participants agreed that women suffer a specific oppression by virtue of their womanhood, which is exacerbated by class. Their agreement translated into particular demands: equal pay, end of the double workday, and the right to safe abortion as well as the right to choose motherhood (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 408). Furthermore, it was clear that the political parties of the time across the region were not centered on these demands in their claims for social change. Two notable positions were developed in response to the session. The first position maintained that neither capitalism nor socialism on their own could end women’s oppression. Women’s liberation needed to be articulated outside the networks of party-affiliated activism that would make demands for complete social transformation to alter oppressive relations. They held that severing the militante and the feminista was to misunderstand feminist politics, which is a comprehensive political praxis. The focus of feminist political activism needed to be in targeted feminist organizations, since the revolutionary Left tended to place men in the center (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 409). The second position held that feminism on its own could not be revolutionary because of its inherent commitment to socialism. They thought feminism should be an organic outgrowth of socialist struggles that could not be separated from struggles against class oppression. Double militancy, on this view, was a practical difficulty, but one that could be overcome (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 409).
The 1981 Encuentro reflected the larger social and political conditions out of which Latin American feminisms were evolving. The conflict between the feministas and the militantes exemplified the divergences in Latin American feminisms during the 1980s. However, it also reflected the genesis of Latin American feminist ideas in women’s political activism. So, although mired in conflict, the Encuentros signaled the intimate ties between ideas regarding gender struggle and the political conditions that give rise to those ideas.
The Second Encuentro, held in Lima, Perú in July 1983, thematically focused on patriarchy, a controversial topic given its association with imperialist American and European feminisms. The Encuentro reflected a shift in feminist claims, identifying that sexism was not just an outcome of capitalism, but rather shaped by a patriarchal sex/gender system that functioned autonomously (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 412). Moreover, the Second Encuentro experienced a public response to the visibility of lesbian identity within Latin American feminisms, forcing many heterosexual women to confront their homophobia (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 412). The meeting also pushed the topic of racism, which resurfaced in subsequent years both in the Encuentros and the larger landscape of Latin American feminist ideas that launched staunch critiques on the omission of race and racism from dominant feminist conversations.
The growth of the Encuentros testified to the growth of feminisms throughout the region. The Fourth Encuentro held in Taxco, Mexico (1987) brought together 1,500 women. As the end of the decade was nearing, the Fourth Encuentro reflected increased complexity in Latin American feminist politics, which was made palpable by the recurrence of the question: “Who is a feminist?” (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 421). The discussion reflected divergences in what constituted feminist politics and whether general community organizing was sufficient to characterize feminist organizing, particularly where community groups were controlled by the church or local political parties (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 421). Nevertheless, a key point remains that when the Encuentros began in 1981, feminism was still a “dirty word”, but by 1987, feminism had gained legitimacy and was validated in Leftist political circles, notably in the Nicaraguan revolution (Saporta Sternbach et al. 1992: 421). The Encuentros continued to demonstrate the diverse growth of Latin American feminisms as a thriving and expansive map of ideas grounded in different strands of political activism. Although the Encuentros continue to the present day, the Encuentros of the 1980s were significant developments which reflected an evolving social movement with tense but important relationships among revolutionary struggles, feminist goals, and claims for social justice.
At the end of the 1980s, as the HIV/AIDS epidemic peaked, sexual politics became increasingly conservative. Sex, once viewed as a political act that could blur the private/public divide and subvert traditional gender roles, became fraught with difficulty. Young feminists came of age at a time when sexual education shifted toward narratives of the risks of sex and not its disruptive political potential (Gargallo 2004: 123–124). Furthermore, the closing of the decade saw the continued linking between feminism and NGOs that would be characteristic of the institutionalization of feminism in the 1990s. For some, institutionalization entailed de-radicalization of feminist politics in Latin America and the Caribbean (Gargallo 2004: 125).
1.4.3 The 1990s
Latin American feminisms during the 1990s are characterized by a focus on gender equality and non-discrimination within the confines of institutions governed by neoliberal policies (Coba & Herrera 2013: 18). As a result, they are referred to as liberal feminisms not grounded in resistance, but rather in their adaptation to a neoliberal infrastructure that was ushered in throughout the region. Neoliberalism had a distinct impact on women’s activism and the development of feminist ideas. Women were one of the most affected groups with the shifts in economic policies, and the phrase “feminization of poverty” accurately captured the detrimental impact on women’s lives. Many women joined the menial labor force (e.g., maquilas, agricultural labor) without any labor rights or access to fair wages (Gargallo 2004: 117).
At the same time, feminist activists started coupling their efforts with organizations that targeted policy change in favor of women and operated with a distinct language about violence, health, and human rights in tune with liberal politics (Gargallo 2004: 125). The concept of the autonomous individual reigned as the explanatory framework for development. Under the umbrella of individuality, people were responsible for their own survival and development which were dependent on their initiative in a market economy (Coba & Herrera 2013: 18). In this context, the activist politics that had once characterized feminist organizing shifted to less radicalized organizational institutions. A substantial portion of the feminist movement that transitioned to institutions did so without critiquing economic policies and neoliberalism (Bastian Duarte 2012: 157). Institutionalized feminists started working alongside governments and agencies, which prioritized change in public policy but did not seek to investigate the roots of inequality that justified the need for policy change. Moreover, conditions emerged where NGO’s were able to offer specialized resources for women. In doing so, they promoted far-reaching gender discourse that was standardized with the universalizing criteria of the United Nations. With their hands tied by donors, these organizations were not necessarily mindful of the priorities of local organizations or their populations (Bastian Duarte 2012: 157). As a result, the infrastructure of institutionalization exacerbated existing power imbalances across ethnic and class lines.
Among the institutions participating in the institutionalization of feminisms was the academy. From the late 1980s well into the 1990s, women’s studies programs started organizing throughout universities. Moreover, the study of feminist philosophy more broadly started finding its way into curricula as the activism of earlier decades pressured universities to support women’s and gender studies (Schutte & Femenías 2010: 400). The decade marked the professionalization of feminism. Feminism, which had once been an orienting force of activism, became employable and profitable (Bartra 2001: 11). However, this is not to discredit the tremendous effort that the development of university programs required. As university programs became institutional fixtures, they also served as counter-hegemonic spaces where resistance could be facilitated.
The 1990s also saw the initiation of journals and formal publications. In 1990, Debate Feminista was launched by Marta Lamas. It remains one of the most impactful journal publications on intellectual feminisms. In 1991, La Correa Feminista was created to bring together the thoughts of autonomous and radical feminists. It ran until 1998 when the editors self-assessed the journal’s goals and decided to launch Creatividad Feminista, an online publication which ran until 2008, when its daughter site, MamaMetal, was created. Finally, La Doble Jornada sprang as a feminist supplement to La Jornada, Mexico’s leading Leftist newspaper, and ran from 1986–1998 (Millán 2014: 156).
During this time, Latin American feminisms began to privilege the use of the category gender or the gender perspective over patriarchy as the conceptual framework from which to talk about the situation of women. The shift to using language of gender is largely owed to the importation of North American feminist ideas. In the Latin American context, Gayle Rubin’s work received substantial attention as evidenced by numerous translations as well as by extensive commentary on its complex understanding of the sex/gender system (Gargallo 2004: 21). However, it is important to note that the term was already being deployed by scholars and carried with it a variety of connotations (Schutte 1998b: 88).
Gender was translated to Spanish as “género”, which to many was a poor translation. Género, which translates to English as “species” or “kind”, traveled to the Latin American context via academic publishing and sparked debate on its aptness to map onto the feminist conditions of the region. The gender perspective, which employs the paradigm of radical individualism characteristic of the decade, comes to stand alongside the concept of empowerment as one that can specifically target women’s needs. The language of gender and empowerment was used by the United Nations as part of their universalizing goals for women during the 1995 World Conference on Women held in Beijing, a moment which marked mounted tensions around the de-politicization of Latin American feminisms (Bastian Duarte 2012: 157).
The use of the themes of gender and empowerment was further deployed by newly democratized states. Feminist activists found themselves in a different relationship to the state as it adopted the language of gender. Once a vehicle of repression, especially under military rule, Latin American feminists now had to contend with a drastically different engagement with the role of the state, one that had co-opted the very terms of a movement that was initiated in opposition to its repression. Newly formed liberal democracies understood women as potential markets for modernizing and development, thus deploying the language of gender and empowerment (Alvarez 1998: 271). However, the way in which the state managed poverty as part of its modernizing mission was mired in individualism with little focus on communities.
Political and economic transitions influenced the development of feminist ideas. Activism became institutionalized and the feminist movement grew in various directions. As the 90s came to a close, what started out as a spontaneous social movement with radical ideas about patriarchy, militarism, and democratization found its way into the halls of institutions and organizations that stifled feminist activism. The institutionalization of feminism was so profound that its political promise seemed lost. However, as the opening of the 21st century demonstrates, this was not the case. Institutionalization was not without critique, and the early 2000s marked the emergence of new voices that took liberal dominant feminisms to task by focusing on anti-neoliberal and decolonial critique which began to call out the hegemonic practices of Latin American feminisms.
1.5 Dissident Voices: Latin American Feminist Ideas of the 21st Century
The institutionalization of feminism came under scrutiny in the 2000s. Autonomous feminists argued that as feminist practices continued to normalize, they failed to account for the inequities among women. As the century came to a close, critiquing (marginal) voices emerged, arguing that liberal feminism tended to overlook difference, inequity, and exclusion amongst women located in vastly different social and cultural locations (Coba & Herrera 2013: 18). The Eighth Encuentro (November 1999) held in Juan Dolio, Dominican Republic, reflected the presence of these emerging voices as dominant feminisms’ “Others”: Indigenous women, Afro-descended women, and lesbians whose position relative to the Encuentros had been marginal. The claims of inclusivity and diversity of the Encuentros were brought under critical scrutiny as they argued that their identities had been obscured under liberal feminism, which took gender to be characteristic of a foundational unity for the encounters. These desencuentros (“disencounters”) formed the basis of new social and political critique that characterized the emerging voices.
In response to the neoliberal shifts of the 80s and 90s, the early 21st century brought with it an anti-neoliberal discourse to Latin American feminisms that was further fed by decolonial and anti-patriarchal stances. Amongst these were positions that argued for the decolonization of universal feminism by taking into account the axes of race, ethnicity, and sexuality in the articulations of identity. The 2000s were also marked by an attempt to dry out the institutionalization of gender. At the same time, there has not been an impetus to reconfigure a social movement in the wake of neoliberal shifts (Coba & Herrera 2013: 19).
We are currently witnessing an emergence of ideas that is starting to reshape how we think about Latin American feminisms. However, the project of reconfiguration is still very much in process. In this context, critical ideas about race and the history of racism have entered mainstream concerns, predominantly voiced from Afro-descended standpoints (Curiel 2007). Further, lesbian feminists have brought forth criticisms of liberal feminism for not only paying less attention to race and racism, but also for centering on heteronormativity as part of the feminist agenda. One notable position holds that there is an inextricable link between lesbianism and feminism insofar as the adoption of a self-conscious feminism entails shifting engagement with dominant masculinity on all levels and this includes the realm of desire (Espinosa Miñoso 2011: 403). Indigenous feminists have also uncovered critical insights in the relationships among community, the state, and political belonging. Their ideas about the balance between ethnic belonging and critiques of sexism are a call to dominant liberal feminism to rethink its concept of culture and community that risks reducing Indigenous women to targets of development (Bastian Duarte 2012: 164). The emergence of these critical ideas takes liberal feminism to task by calling out the dominance of middle-class, white/mestiza, and heteronormative models for feminist projects as not only exclusionary, but also profoundly harmful. Notably, most of these positions take decolonization as an orienting project and maintain that racism and heterosexism are rooted in colonialism whose impact continues to plague Latin America and the Caribbean.
In 2007, GLEFAS (Grupo Latinoamericano de Estudio, Formacíon y Acción Feminista) was founded with the intention of creating a space for dialogue within the lesbian and feminist movement in Latin America and the Caribbean as well as with other social and land struggle movements in the region. They self-describe as seeking to produce political analysis from an anti-racist, anti-military, anti-colonial, anti-capitalist, lesbian feminist perspective. In line with their philosophical vision, they published Tejiendo de otro modo: Feminismo, epistemología y apuestas decoloniales en Abya Yala (2014b) as an outgrowth of a colloquium held in Chapel Hill, North Carolina in 2012. The book brings together a diverse group of contemporary voices that intervene on hegemonic understandings of feminism in the region in order to make room for a collective that appreciates the diversity of knowledges. Speaking from the margins, the book takes as its central claim that decolonization is concomitant with de-patriarchialization. Hence, it reflects a shift in contemporary Latin American feminist writings that are paving the way for critical considerations of capitalism, imperialism, democracy, and identity. These new voices of dissent are changing the landscape of Latin American feminisms with unique ideas that call for rethinking what it means to be a feminist today.
2. Key Issues and Debates
2.1 Latin American Feminist Autonomy
Autonomy is a foundational, albeit contested, concept in Latin American feminisms. It is a foundational concept to the extent that feminist identity has hinged on the conceptualization of autonomy. However, how autonomy is defined has been widely debated as the term has been deployed in varying capacities. Autonomy has been used conceptually to forge alliances between women’s groups in Latin America that seek to eradicate gender-based oppression. It has also been used to avoid co-option by actors like political parties, NGO’s, the state, and funding agencies. The result is a tension between the retention of ideological and financial autonomy and the widening of feminisms’ scope and impact. Thus, the varying use of autonomy calls into question how it is being defined (Alvarez et al. 2003: 542).
The history of feminist autonomy in Latin American feminism is rooted in the activism of the 1970s and 1980s where it was invoked in opposition to militant feminists (militantes) involved with the political parties of the Left. Autonomy, in this context, was defined as independence from any organization that understood the fight for women’s liberation as a secondary goal. On the other side stood those who took the fight for revolutionary social change as concurrent with feminist involvement and advocated for double participation (Alvarez et al. 2003: 543). The rise of the political Left in many Latin American countries involved resistance to political regimes, and the question of where dedication was rooted reflected the relationship between feminism and the possibilities for social change. Feminist activism revealed the way in which the negotiation of autonomy was and continues to be an evolving concept. As the 1980s progressed with their shifting political landscape, the idea of autonomous feminism came to be redundant. Hence, an understanding of engaged autonomy emerged, which maintained the importance of retaining a feminist stance while negotiating or participating in social practice (Alvarez et al. 2003: 543).
The concept of autonomy surfaced throughout the Encuentros that spanned the 1970s–1990s and further illuminated the question of inclusion. If being autonomous entailed commitments to women’s liberation, being autonomous also signaled participation in a feminist project. However, it is contestable what the criteria of inclusion under the label of feminism was. As Latin American feminisms underwent institutionalization, two logics characterized the problem of inclusion.
The policy-advocacy logic argued for promoting feminist-influenced gender policy through governmental or non-governmental organizations. On the other hand, the identity-solidarity logic distanced itself from formal institutions and remained centered on women’s movements through the development of feminist ideas in community and politics (Alvarez et al. 2003: 548). However, neither one of these necessarily entailed the inclusion of all women as is demonstrated by contemporary critiques of the hegemonic practices of Latin American feminisms that failed to pay attention to the importance of race, class, ethnicity, and sexuality in shaping subordination (Alvarez et al. 2003: 565). Cutting across these logics is the way in which inclusion in feminism is contingent upon practice. How autonomy is understood hinges upon an understanding of feminist practice, and those practices are shaped by dynamics of inclusion and exclusion. Eventually, autonomy would be re-defined through individual and collective commitment to the transformation of women’s lives and society as a whole (Alvarez et al. 2003: 557). At present, there is not a settled definition of feminist autonomy, but rather a pluralism of understanding that tracks a variety of proposals for understanding feminist engagement and practices.
2.2 The Politics of Translation and Location
Attention to North-South hemispheric relations has been one key theoretical issue of Latin American feminism reflected in the ample scholarship on the migration of ideas. Latin American feminisms, much like Latin American philosophy, have shown concern over the authenticity of ideas that have traveled from epistemic centers (e.g., the United States, Europe). However, unlike Latin American philosophy, Latin American feminisms have responded to this concern by developing theories that attend to dynamics with which ideas travel and the way in which ideas are re-negotiated and re-signified as they move across locations. Generally, the claims about the ways in which ideas are reconfigured as they enter new contexts emerge over concerns about the travel of ideas in a North-South direction, which not only remains non-reciprocal, but further signals the centrality of North America and Europe as the centers of knowledge production. Latin American feminisms have critically argued against the general understanding that ideas are formed in the “North” and travel to the “South” (Connell 2014). In order to defend this position, it is argued that the act of translating is itself a materially situated political task that re-signifies ideas as they migrate into varying contexts. The ideas that emerge in the Latin American context are themselves unique to the circumstances that generate their conditions of articulation. However, circumstance is not sufficient to create uniqueness; rather, the processes of translation involved in the movement of ideas across hemispheres shift meaning.
Translation can be understood as any act of description, interpretation, or dissemination. It is always caught up in power relations that are configured by the asymmetries between people, languages, and regions (Lima Costa 2014a: 20). In the context of the Americas, the movement of ideas occurs across asymmetrical power relations. Ideas encounter roadblocks and migratory checkpoints as they attempt to cross borders (Lima Costa 2014a: 21). As a result, dialogue across hemispheres mirrors asymmetries of power and has led to the mistaken notion that nothing originates from the Global South, but rather is only imported into the region from the Global North. Translation is made further complex by “theory brokers” (e.g., academics, donors, feminist NGO’s) that mediate the movement of ideas (Lima Costa 2014a: 25). As ideas move, their meanings shift, and their transformation is contingent on the culture or discipline that receives them (Lima Costa 2014a: 29). Hence, discursive migration is not neutral, and in the process, location comes to frame how to understand the reconfiguration of ideas. Thinking about translation through the matrix of discursive migration illuminates the way in which difference and power play a crucial role in how knowledge becomes legitimated across difference.
Placing translation at the center of feminist practices recognizes that translation is both politically and theoretically indispensable for feminist, anti-racist, decolonial, and anti-imperial alliances (Alvarez 2014: 1). Translation is framed as a translocal phenomenon insofar as it does not involve a fixed location, but further links geographies of power (e.g., national, local) with subject positions (e.g., gender/sexual, ethnoracial) (Alvarez 2014: 2). In this conceptual space, Latin America and the Caribbean are configured with a heterogeneity of Latinidades within the United States and within Latin America and the Caribbean that exist and move across multiple border spaces (Alvarez 2014: 2). Identities are formed in the nexus between borders, the spaces of intense confluence that characterize transmigrations across the region.
Subjectivity is both place-based and mis- or displaced with the movement of ideas. In this context, difference emerges as a rich terrain from which to engage others. For some, the difference that mediates speaking positions is always characterized by degrees of incommensurability as we can never be fully transparent with each other across conditions of alterity. However, the condition of incommensurability is not sufficient to abandon translation, but rather an imperative to hear others in and across their difference (Schutte 1998a: 61).
One method of navigating the conditions of incommensurability is recognizing the complexity and diversity of speaking positions with which we engage. The term transloca has been argued to aid in elucidating such complexities of difference. Embodying both the processes of translation (“trans”) and the material effects of location (“loca”), the transloca highlights multiple dimensions that shape conditions of difference (Alvarez 2014: 4). Following the claims about translocation, transloca as a subject position attends to the movement of bodies, text, capital, and theory along the North-South axis as they produce new epistemologies for apprehending the globalizing Americas (Alvarez 2014: 4). Translocas are world-traveling translators, cultural and political mediators, and hence also agents of transculturation (Alvarez 2014: 8). The term is intended to illuminate the way in which subjectivity is forged in and through movement across hemispheres mediated by location and translation. Attending to the dimensions of hemispheric movement elucidates the conditions of alterity that generate incommensurability, but also puts into focus the way translation mediates the processes of identity formation.
The arguments in regard to discursive migration, translation, and translocas further capture the links among Latin America, the Caribbean, and the United States as part of an intertwined diaspora (Alvarez 2014: 7). The intertwining is one that stretches in many hemispheric directions and as a result, makes Latin/a America a heterogeneous epistemic horizon. From Latinas in the United States to Afro-Latinas in Latin America, the ideas produced at the borders and nexus between, in, and through hemispheres are best understood by appreciating practices of translation. Hence, to think through Latin/a America as an epistemic locale, in its multidimensionality, requires a politics of translation that can foster coalition-building across hemispheres in spite of alterity. If taken seriously, feminist theories of translation demonstrate that ideas are products of hemispheric locations, incommensurable with their predecessors (local or imported). The discourses produced in Latin America and the Caribbean are not only alternative reconfigurations of ideas, but also ruptures in political epistemic practices. They call into question the notion that knowledge production is a naturalized feature of particular places (Femenías 2007: 14). Thus, the traffic of ideas generates new and diverse spaces from which to think about locations of difference (Femenías 2007: 15).
2.3 Gender in Hemispheric Context
Another key debate that has emerged as a part of the broader Latin American feminist conversation on the politics of translation has been over the use of the term gender, which, as previously noted, entered the hemispheric frame with the translation of Gayle Rubin’s scholarship into Spanish. The term was translated into Spanish as género, whose direct translation is more akin to “genre” or “species”. Latin American feminists have contested the legitimacy of gender as a category of feminist analysis (Schutte & Femenías 2010: 403).
Prior to the introduction of the term gender, feminists most readily used the concept of patriarchy because it offered a framework grounded in ideological and socioeconomic conditions that allowed for articulating the cause of women’s oppression (Schutte & Femenías 2010: 403). In many ways, patriarchy served as a glue of consciousness-raising in late 20th century women’s movements of Latin America, helping connect women by identifying their shared subordinate status under conditions of patriarchy.
During the Second Encuentro in 1982 (Lima, Perú) patriarchy was declared the foundational category from which Latin American feminists sought to understand their realities. It was deployed as an explanation for the subordination of women, but also extended as an explanation for the conditions of compulsory heterosexuality, repression, violence against women and children, the prohibition of abortion, and varying forms of social injustice (Gargallo 2004: 92). It was further linked into frameworks that sought to identify the role of militarization and capitalism in the oppression of women. Hence, it provided a methodological frame from which to articulate claims about power, oppression, and domination that united women on many fronts. Patriarchy was a conceptual stronghold of Latin American feminism akin to what imperialism was to national liberation struggles (Gargallo 2004: 92). It was explanatorily powerful because it could account for complex realities while also providing an explanation for the shared experiences of women. Unfortunately, the explanatory power of the term was so expansive that it rendered historical specificities opaque since nothing could exist at its margins (Gargallo 2004: 92).
Replacing the focus on patriarchy, the gender perspective (“perspectiva de género”) or gender focus (“enfoque de género”) became the methodological framework from which to talk about women and women’s issues across Latin America. Woman was replaced as a foundational category by gender, which became a blanket term so user-friendly that anyone could use it as a referent to women’s issues (Schutte & Femenías 2010: 404). The ease with which it was used entailed the softening of radical militant critiques of patriarchy that had characterized feminist theorization in earlier decades. Gender was incorporated into public policy and social programs by state and intergovernmental organizations, reflecting the way in which it could be taken up as part of the lexicon for even policies not feminist-inspired (Lima Costa 2014a: 26). On the flip side, the Vatican during its preparation for the 1995 Conference on Women feared using the word gender as it might entail the acceptance of homosexuality, the destruction of the patriarchal family, and the dissemination of feminism (Lima Costa 2014a: 28).
Although the movement of gender across hemispheres is far from complete, it is important to recognize the way in which the traffic of gender took place in and through material conditions. One notable method of translating and migrating concepts is through academic journals, and the debates on the uses of gender have revealed broader reflections on how concepts come to carry epistemic weight. The transnational citational market is one key dimension in this process as who gets cited, where, and by whom exposes the routes through which theories have traveled in global contexts (Lima Costa 2014b: 142). In light of the conceptual travel and use of gender, Latin American feminisms ask that one consider the way in which the global privileging of English as the linguistic medium impacts what knowledge is allowed to circulate (Lima Costa 2014b: 142). Moreover, these reflections bring to the fore the fact that English cannot be viewed as a transparent medium as its privileged status sets the stage for what gets taken up as worth translating in the first place. It should then be no surprise that gender has traveled so far. Its traffic is a marker of the imperative to create conditions for productive “mis-translations” that create spaces for heterogeneous conceptual development (Lima Costa 2014b: 144).
2.4 Negotiating Complex Identities
Although gender has been a key focus of analysis, Latin American feminist thought has also concentrated on the importance of accounting for the complexity of identity. Conceptually, gender on its own is insufficient to account for the complexities of identity. Notably, Latin American feminisms have paid attention to the ways in which class, race/ethnicity, and sexuality are necessary components for understanding the lived experience of identity, which is never conceptualized as pure nor one-dimensional (Feménias 2007: 16).
The idea that class is a key dimension of women’s lives is one that is rooted in Latin American feminist activisms of the late 19th and early 20th centuries. As previously noted in Section 1 (on the history of Latin American feminism), women’s fights for equality of this time were framed in terms of equitable access to social goods (e.g., education). The impact of this push was the transformation of the material lives of people living in poverty more generally. Considerations of the importance of class conditions in understanding the plight of women and the poor have been long rooted in Latin American feminist ideas. Feminist projects concerned with the advancement of women in civil society converged with labor movements and anti-imperial resistance (e.g., Luisa Capetillo). This trend re-emerged during resistance movements of the 1970s that aligned feminist projects with revolutionary parties of the Left across Latin America. As a result, attention to class dimensions has long been part of the feminist methodology. However, this attention has not been without fault. Contemporary theories from the work of Afro-descended women have argued that the overwhelming attention paid to class has come at the expense of analyzing the role that racism has played in the marginalization and exclusion of African-descended and Indigenous populations (Curiel 2007).
The reflections on race/ethnicity of Latin American feminist methodology are diverse, demonstrating the racial heterogeneity generated by the colonial condition. Colonialism not only initiated contemporary understandings of race/ethnicity but generated conditions of racial formation under systems of exploitation and subordination. Specifically, the colonial history of Latin America entailed the subordination of Indigenous and Afro-descended peoples (Schutte & Femenías 2010: 407). Economically, colonialism entailed the enslavement and exploitation of these populations. Culturally, colonialism ensured the imposition of a socio-symbolic order that entrenched whiteness as a norm and cultural authority (Schutte & Femenías 2010: 407). Concurrently, norms of gender and class emerge through the production of race, whose economic impact is reflected through the link between whiteness and class ascension. Subsequently, nation-building projects in Latin America and the Caribbean were forged by political elites with patriarchal ideologies mired in racism and classism. The impact of these ideologies has entailed a racialized social stratification that reflects the privilege of whiteness and leaves women disproportionally affected (Curiel 2007: 98).
Against this backdrop, feminist reflections on race/ethnicity have sought to undermine the racism of national ideologies that have led to their subordination and marginalization. One such ideology is that of mestizaje which emerged as part of nation building projects throughout Latin America and the Caribbean. Mestizaje favored the formation of a racially-mixed people but came saturated with Eurocentrism and privileged the whitening of the Americas. Mestizaje ensured structural inequalities as it racialized class differences while maintaining racism a myth. On the heels of these conditions, notable contributions to the discussion on race/ethnicity in Latin America and the Caribbean have come from Afro-descended and Indigenous women who have been systemically marginalized in these social processes. They argue that mestizaje functions as a sequel to colonialism that continues to entail subordination and marginalization in social life (Curiel 2007: 98).
Racialized women in Latin America and the Caribbean have also pointed to the racism of dominant feminist methodology that took womanhood to be a shared categorical status but dismissed the importance of the specificities determined by race/ethnicity and class identity. In so doing, the voices of racialized women have opened up new avenues for contemporary critical feminist investigation. For instance, Afro-descended women have shown how the methodologies of studying women from colonial times detrimentally read the lives of enslaved women one-dimensionally as solely victims of slavery, overlooking the ways in which many participated in acts of resistance. Acts like the waste of household goods or self-induced abortions to avoid the enslavement of children are best understood as acts of domestic marronage and need to be read as part of the history of Afro-descended women in the Americas (Albert 2003). In this context, the call for a more multidimensional analysis of racialized women also entails demonstrating that for racialized women, the public and the private spheres are not separate entities as hegemonic feminism purported (Curiel 2016: 49). Hence, a call for the blackening of feminism has emerged as a way of elucidating the relationship between racism and sexism in order to better understand the histories of women throughout the Americas (Carneiro 2005).
Further, racialized women of Latin America and the Caribbean have provided new constructive frameworks for conceptualizing racialized and ethnic identities. One such attempt can be found in the development of Amefricanidad, a term coined by Afro-Brazilian scholar Léila Gonsalez, that resists the use of Latinidad because of its Eurocentric underpinnings, much like how mestizaje downplays the Indigenous and African dimension of Latin America and the Caribbean (Curiel 2007: 99). Building on the use of Amefricanidad or Amefricanicity, others have argued for the use of the term as a privileged epistemology that enhances the visibility of Afro-descended feminism in the region (Alvarez & Caldwell 2016: v). Amefricanidad tracks the importance of African and Indigenous roots of identity, but also seeks to think from within those identities as it pursues an intersectional approach to racism, colonialism, and imperialism (Alvarez & Caldwell 2016: v). Amefricanidad tracks racialized identity, but at the same time signals plurality in its capacity to capture the multiple inheritances of Latin America and the Caribbean.
By keeping the impact of the colonial condition at the center of theory, contemporary Latin American and Caribbean feminists have also critically evaluated norms of sexuality, a topic which dominant liberal feminism long maintained at the margins. The lesbian movement of Latin America and the Caribbean stems from mixed-gender homosexual organizations that were in dialogue with the feminist movement of the late 20th century (Bastian Duarte 2012: 165). However, for much of this time, discussions on sexual preference were set aside within the liberal feminist agenda. Lesbian feminism, much like the larger panorama of Latin American feminism, is heterogeneous. Nevertheless, there is one common theoretical denominator: the imperative to transform ideas and practices related to heteronormativity, lesbianism, and gender relations (Bastian Duarte 2012: 169). At stake in the analysis of lesbian feminism is the way in which heteronormativity permeates all aspects of lived experience, including the intersections among sexuality, race/ethnicity, class, and gender. For instance, Afro-descended lesbian feminists have linked racism and sexism to heteronormativity by arguing that the obligatory dimensions of heterosexuality are intimately bound up with the reproduction of racist and sexist practices (Curiel 2016: 50). Others have argued that there is an intimate relationship between lesbianism and feminism that hinges on the recognition that liberation for women is founded in decentering patriarchy, which often involves re-negotiating relationships with men and masculinity on all levels (Espinosa Miñoso 2011: 404).
Implicit in discussions of the complexity of identity is the relationship between the individual and the collective. The relationship between structural collective conditions and the formation of individual identity attends to the ways in which human beings are not isolated meaning-makers. However, when the conditions of meaning-making reflect the heirlooms of colonialism, oppression, patriarchy, or obligatory heterosexuality, tense negotiations are required between the individual and the collective. Indigenous feminists have negotiated the political and personal value of ethnic belonging with individual feminist claims (Bastian Duarte 2012: 164). The liberal neofeminist movement has long emphasized the importance of sexual and reproductive rights of women, but while these issues may represent core aspects of many women’s lives, they do not represent core issues in Indigenous women’s struggles.
For instance, the topic of violence is one at the center of feminist concerns of many political persuasions. However, from the perspective of Indigenous feminism, violence is not just constructed in terms of gendered violence but is also generated by those who have seized and destroyed Indigenous lands (Bastian Duarte 2012: 163). Hence, an understanding that projects violence solely centered on individuality will not be sufficient to generate conditions of equality for Indigenous feminists whose collective identities serve as the primary method of preserving their cultural systems (Bastian Duarte 2012: 164). The meaning of equality and justice for Indigenous feminists of Latin America and the Caribbean follows the specificity of their politics, which takes the role of the community as central to identity and hence calls for new ways of thinking about the relationship between individual feminist demands and collective transformation (Bastian Duarte 2012: 165). Although not all Indigenous peoples of Latin America and the Caribbean reside in their own communities as many have migrated to more urban areas, it is important to appreciate the ways in which community in a multifaceted sense operates as an important feature of transformative projects.
3. Latin American Feminist Philosophy
Latin American feminist philosophy emerges at the nexus between theory and practice. The social activism of the 20th century fueled the production of theories that form the tradition of Latin American feminist philosophy as well as its place in the academy. However, the study of Latin American feminist philosophy remains scarce and derelict (Gargallo 2015, Other Internet Resources). The existence of Latin American feminist philosophers has been largely denied, and the specificities of their theoretical contributions have been erased under the sexist, Eurocentric orientation of philosophy. Recognition of their existence is a political act that contests the dominant architecture of the history of philosophy. Taking account of Latin American feminist philosophy requires a historical and philosophical reconstruction that understands the fact that women from Latin America and the Caribbean have long been thinkers. The philosophical work that remains to be done requires engagement with their ideas.
Latin American feminist philosophy is political (Gargallo 2004: 41). The ideas that pushed social transformation in the 20th century movements are grounded in politics that recognized the imperative for social change. The political dimension of Latin American feminist philosophy is reflected in the fact that many Latin American feminist philosophers were or are activists, and the span of their thought often reflects their participation in resistance movements. Resistance can mean many types of political projects, and in the context of Latin American feminist philosophy, the act of citing is understood as political because it works toward building a philosophical canon that legitimizes the voices of women long excluded from philosophical practice.
Tracing a philosophical history of Latin American feminist thinkers is a task that merits scholarly attention, and to date there is a lacuna of resources. One major obstacle is linguistic as a lot of textual sources have not been translated. Furthermore, the resources themselves are not ample, although some notable publications have been made. The Antología del pensamiento feminista nuestroamericano: tomo 1 del anhelo a la emancipación (2010a) and Antología del pensamiento feminista nuestroamericano: tomo 2 movimiento de liberación de las mujeres (2010b) coordinated by Francesca Gargallo are some of the first large-scale publications to anthologize Latin American and Carribean feminist philosophical writings. They are non-exhaustive resources that testify to the theoretical, argumentative, and methodological contributions of Latin American and Caribbean feminist writers spanning from the 15th to the 20th century. As the anthology rescues writers often lost to the pages of history, it also takes Latin America and the Caribbean, as nuestra or our America, as the point of theoretical departure. Thus, it enables a collective recognition of a history of feminist thought that does not depend on North America or Europe for its identity. The anthology further demonstrates that Latin American feminist philosophical thought is hardly new. It is grounded in a history of resistance to social and political conditions that impeded the recognition of women as knowledge-producers (Gargallo 2009: 418). It has been argued that early feminist philosophies are some of the first systems of thought to account for the politics of legitimacy whereby social conditions grant privilege to the epistemic productions of one group in order to exclude and delegitimize the voices of others (Gargallo 2009: 420). The critique of legitimacy is one that follows Latin American feminist philosophy well into the 20th and 21st centuries.
For instance, Juana Inés de la Cruz (1651–1695), one of the most cited writers of this tradition, advocated for the intellectual life of women, which entailed denouncing norms of hegemonic masculinity. Her image as a protofeminist writer has been associated with lesbianism, as she led a monastic life and in so doing, resisted the dominance of masculinity (Gargallo 2009: 419). Her existence as an intellectual defied the authority of her times and her resistance is reflected in her writing.
A further example can be found in the thought of Luisa Capetillo (1879–1922), which is rooted in her participation in labor movements in Puerto Rico and the United States during her lifetime. As a cigar factory reader, she was employed by the workers and functioned as an intellectual and cultural intermediary by reading workers everything from news to political theory. Capetillo became a reader at a time when forty percent of the tobacco workers and eighty-seven percent of the agricultural work force of Puerto Rico were illiterate (Ramos 1992: 14). However, the presence of readers, like Capetillo, made the tobacco labor force one of the most socially conscious (Ramos 1992: 21). Her activism drew intellectual support from European anarchist philosophy that traveled to Puerto Rico through translations of authors like Tolstoy, Dostoevsky, Diderot, Bakunin, Kropotkin, Marx, and Nietzsche (Ramos 1992: 27). Capetillo made a mark on the Puerto Rican labor movement, but she became a transnational migrant as she was driven out of Puerto Rico by a government crackdown on anarchists (Ruiz 2016: 3). In her short life of forty-two years she would come to reside in New York City, Ybor City, and La Habana as she continued her activism by organizing labor strikes, arguing against the institution of marriage, engaging in stylized resistance by wearing men’s clothing, and publishing four books (Ramos 1992: 66). Capetillo’s most important contribution was producing ideas rooted in a workers’ rights movement that moved across nations and was itself inspired by the travel of ideas.
Philosophy as a field of study in Latin America and the Caribbean was institutionalized and professionalized in the years spanning 1940–1960. Hence, it is no surprise that subsequently women gained formal university education in philosophy. Matilde Carranza (1892–1981), born in San José, Costa Rica, was Costa Rica’s first woman to receive a Ph.D. in philosophy. She attended the University of Wisconsin and is also noted as one of the first women to receive a doctoral degree from the university. Her philosophical thought centered on the importance of education for social transformation, which aligned with her anti-despotic and egalitarian politics. However, her most notable impact was shattering the myth that women were not apt for philosophy, thus paving the way for women of other generations (Prada Ortiz 2013: 32–33). Ana Isabel Alfaro (1944–1990), born in Alajuela, Costa Rica, studied philosophy at the University of Costa Rica. Her philosophical commitments centered on the role of education in national development, as she took education to be socially transformative. As a result, Alfaro saw the role of the university as an integral part of social change. Her commitments to the transformative powers of education were methodologically rooted in interdisciplinarity and cultural diversity. Notably, Alfaro placed importance on the creative power of women within her philosophy of education, arguing for their creative potential and reflecting this commitment in her political alliances with poor women (Prada Ortiz 2013: 55).
Following suit, Monelisa Lina Pérez Marchand, Victoria Junco Posadas, Olga Victoria Quiroz Martínez, Rosa Krauze, Elsa Cecilia Frost, Vera Yamuni, and María del Carmen Rovira Gaspar entered academic philosophy in Mexico in the middle of the 20th century through the seminars of José Gaos (Gargallo 2015, Other Internet Resources). Notable among these is Vera Yamuni (1917–2003) and María del Carmen Rovira, who recognized the importance of doing philosophy from a Latin American perspective with a keen eye toward the specificities of women. Rovira would apply this methodology to historicism and Yamuni to humanism (Gargallo 2009: 423). Yamuni is particularly important as her work and place in the academy influenced many generations of feminist philosophers. She was a transnational thinker born of Lebanese parents in Costa Rica, although she did most of her studying, teaching, and writing in Mexico. Yamuni studied under Gaos and would dedicate a part of her intellectual career to engaging with the work of Gaos, notably critiquing his misogyny. She further dedicated time to translate texts from English and Arabic to Spanish, reflecting her commitment to creating conditions of philosophical access (Prada Ortiz 2013: 71). However, she is notably remembered as a feminist thinker through her work on Sappho, Virginia Woolf, and Simone de Beauvoir, as well as her feminist analysis of the role of women in the history of philosophy. Her writing conceptually explored sameness and difference long before it became a hotbed of feminist philosophical analysis in the 1990s (Prada Ortiz 2013: 87). Her influence as a feminist philosopher is profound as she has been cited as the first to introduce feminist philosophy into Mexico by her student Graciela Hierro, who became an iconic figure of Latin American feminist philosophy in the 1980s and 1990s (Prada Ortiz 2013: 83).
The social transformation of the 1970s and 1980s reverberated into the field of philosophy. As women increasingly began to establish themselves in the academy, their ideas developed. On the shoulders of symbolic mothers and the politics of the times, Latin American feminist philosophy began to proliferate as a diverse system of thought that took feminist theorizing to be a form of politics. However, the points of departure for analysis varied. Graciela Hierro, student of Yamuni, developed a feminist ethics informed by utilitarianism that explored the intimate relationship between ethics and politics focused on liberation and pleasure. For Hierro, women’s politics is one centered on making claims about the role of women in a society where the condition of womanhood is understood as a variant characteristic of human life (Hierro 1990). Hierro, much like Yamuni and the women that came before her, functioned as a symbolic philosophical mother to many as she heavily influenced a generation of feminist scholars. Eli Bartra, a student of Hierro’s, maintained that feminism is a theoretical current dedicated to uncovering what it means to be a woman. For her, the feminist project is political because feminism is a political philosophy (Bartra 2001: 12). Diana Helena Maffía of Argentina, influenced by Bartra, further maintains that feminism is both a political position and a critical theory that lends itself toward the revision of political ideals (Rietti & Maffía 2005). María Luisa Femenías, also writing from Argentina, maintains a link between feminism and politics but takes Latin American feminism to be characterized by its unique appreciation of the intersections among gender, class, race/ethnicity, and religion as they collectively forged conditions of existence (Femenías 2007). Urania Ungo Montenegro of Panamá defines feminism as a political theory of women that reflects the relationship between women and politics (Ungo Montenegro 2000).
Although they diverge in their characterizations of the relationship between feminism and politics, all of these positions share a general understanding that to philosophically discuss Latin American feminism is to engage in political theory in a way that elucidates the diverse and complex relationships among women, gender, and politics. This list is by no means exhaustive, and further figures like Rosario Castellanos of Mexico and Celia Amorós of Spain should not be forgotten as they influenced the positions developed by these thinkers. Furthermore, philosophers like Ofelia Schutte, Cuban-born and writing in the United States, have made notable contributions to the landscape of Latin American feminist philosophy, reminding readers that the feminist tradition occupies a part of a wider tradition of political liberation and theory of Latin America. All of these women dared to be thinkers at times when being a Latin American woman in philosophy was unheard of, and they have come to form the foundation of a canon of thinkers that paved the way for new and emerging voices.
Dissident voices of the early 2000s waged a decolonial critique that came to characterize contemporary Latin American feminist philosophical scholarship. Influenced by the pivotal contributions of María Lugones (2007, 2008), contemporary decolonial Latin American feminist scholarship has tackled Eurocentrism, colonial underpinnings, and omissions of identity in feminist philosophy. Lugones was an integral voice in the formation of a decolonial feminist tradition as she was the first scholar to articulate the concept of the coloniality of gender. In conversation with the scholarship of Peruvian Aníbal Quijano (2000), she maintained that the modern sex/gender system is rooted in the colonial project that imposes a dimorphic sex/gender system framed through heteronormativity. Complementing Quijano, she maintains that the colonial/modern gender system required the categorization of human and non-human and the invention of racial divisions of the human. However, she critically adds that gender played an important role in these relationships, a point Quijano overlooks. As a result, the status of white women, existing alongside colonizing white men, operated on a different nexus committed to the reproduction of racialized humanity. The peoples of the colonized world did not participate in the modern gender system prior to its imposition. The import of this argument is that gender and sexuality are co-constitutive of race and are formed in and through the colonial project that sought to subordinate colonized peoples. Hence, to theorize about gender entails a look at the heirlooms of colonialism that built the possibilities of the modern world through the categorization of people into racialized, gendered humanity. This critique problematizes any idea of shared gender in womanhood because it fails to account for the racial and class differences that cut across the formations of identities in the Americas.
One of the most notable and comprehensive texts that brings Latin American decolonial voices together is Tejiendo de otro modo: feminism, espistemología y apuestas descoloniales en Abya Yala (2014b), edited by Yuderkys Espinosa Miñoso, Diana Gómez Correal, and Karina Ochoa Muñoz. The book provides a critical intervention in contemporary Latin American feminisms from the diverse positions and experiences of women (Escobar 2014: 11). Rooted in decolonial epistemic practices, the book reconceives Latin America as Abya Yala, the Kuna (Indigenous people of Panamá and Colombia) term for what colonizers termed “America”. Abya Yala translates as “land of full maturity” or “land of vital blood” and is taken as a methodological starting point for theorizing ways of knowing through a decolonial lens. The contributors adhere to the claim that decolonization cannot occur without de-patriarchialization. In other words, resistance to capitalism, racism, homophobia, and all forms of domination related to our modern social order has to incorporate strategies of de-patriarchialization (Escobar 2014: 11). As such, the text brings to the fore the importance of intersecting Latin American feminisms with decolonial thought and exemplifies new emerging critical voices that contribute to growth and proliferation.
The scholarship notably produces a Latin American feminist genealogy committed to prioritizing the voices of those systematically marginalized or ignored and decenters dominant white, upper/middle-class feminisms that have failed to account for difference (Espinosa Miñoso et al. 2014a: 14). The scholarship is a further testament to the fact that no one dominant category will solve the problem of unification (Espinosa Miñoso et al. 2014a: 20). The project of decolonial feminisms is not framed by privileging one category of analysis over another (e.g., race over gender); rather, it proposes a systemic critique focused on the conceptual framework of dominant Latin American feminisms, calling attention to the ways it has reified classism, sexism, racism, and heteronormativity. The project of decolonial feminisms is a movement in process, but its core seeks to bring together the productions of thinkers, intellectuals, feminist activists, lesbian feminists, Afro-descended women, Indigenous peoples, poor mestizas, and allies committed to the historical recuperation of anti-racist theory and practice from the epistemic position of Abya Yala (Espinosa Miñoso et al. 2014a: 32).
The Latin American decolonial feminist tradition has found influential allies in the Latina/x feminist tradition of the United States. Latina/x feminisms took shape during the 1960s and 1970s as part of a wide range of political struggles seeking gender and social justice that comes to form a wide landscape of theories. The term “Latina/x” is broad, but far from monolithic as it can capture a range of identities (e.g., Afro-Latina, Afro-Caribbean, Nuyorican, Xicana). It symbolically encapsulates identity conditions of migration, immigration, and diaspora to the United States from countries in Latin America and the Caribbean. Although Latina/x feminisms are a wide-ranging field, they generally adhere to a system of thought that attempts to unravel interlocking systems of oppression, reflecting on the conditions of borderlands, race/ethnicity, gender, sexuality, immigration, and religion in unique ways. Most importantly, Latina/x feminist theory pays close attention to lived experience and made notable contributions to theories of identity that extend beyond the borders of the United States. Here, figures like Gloria Anzaldúa, Cherríe Moraga, Emma Pérez, Juanita Ramos, Norma Alarcón, Chela Sandoval, Mariana Ortega, Ofelia Schutte, and María Lugones have been of significance. Notably, the work of Anzaldúa influenced Lugones’ conceptualization of the coloniality of gender, which is at the centerfold of decolonial feminist theory in both Latin America and the United States. Although theories are always tied to their locations, they also travel in ways that require attending to the processes of re-signification undergone through their traffic. It is for this reason that some decolonial feminist thinkers have called for closer attention to the specificities of alterity that might set limits on the theoretical application of ideas (Mendoza 2014: 101). Notwithstanding, the Latina/x feminist tradition has been influential on its own merits and continues to pave coalitional roads with Latin American and Caribbean thinkers both within and outside the United States.
The history of Latin American and Caribbean feminist ideas is extensive. However, it is one that remains underappreciated in North American and European academic spaces. The omission of Latin American feminisms is further compounded by the fact that most of its primary resources remain untranslated from Spanish, making the travel of ideas difficult. For some, the linguistic inaccessibility might not be problematic as it signals the need for epistemic centers to accommodate across difference, and for others, it merely highlights the ample amount of work that remains to be done. Either way, the Latin American feminist tradition is one that methodologically reminds its readers that theory is always grounded in practice. Thus, placing the ideas of women and their push for social transformation at the centerfold of philosophical and theoretical activity demands contextualization. For philosophical practices more specifically, Latin American feminisms remind us that women have been thinking much longer than they have been credited for and philosophers need to merely start asking: What were they thinking about?
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Other Internet Resources
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- GLEFAS: Grupo Latinoamericano de Estudios, Formación y Acción Feminista.
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The research for this essay was supported (in part) by a Summer Stipend from the Research Center for the Humanities and Social Sciences (2017) at William Paterson University and the Woodrow Wilson Career Enhancement Fellowship (2017–2018). I would like to thank Andrea J. Pitts, Mariana Ortega, Adriana Novoa, and Jamilett Aguirre for their advice, encouragement, and support in the research process as well as the reviewers whose suggestions greatly helped the framing of the essay.