Feminist Perspectives on the Body
For much of the history of western philosophy the body has been conceptualized as simply one biological object among others, part of a biological nature, which our rational faculties set us apart from, as well as an instrument to be directed, and a possible source of disruption to be controlled. Problematically, for feminists, the opposition between mind and body has also been correlated with an opposition between male and female, with the female regarded as enmeshed in her bodily existence in a way that makes attainment of rationality questionable. “Women are somehow more biological, more corporeal, and more natural than men” (Grosz 1994: 14). Such enmeshment in corporeality was also attributed to colonized bodies and those attributed to the lower classes (McClintock 1995, Alcoff 2006). Challenging such assumptions requires feminists to confront corporeality in order to elucidate and confront constructions of sexed difference. The accounts of the relationship between subjectivity, corporeality and identity which have thereby been developed have implications for other aspects of our corporeal existence. Feminist theorists are therefore in active conversation with critical race theorists (Alcoff, Ahmed, Crenshaw, Fanon, hooks, Hill Collins, Gilman, Gooding-Williams, Tate), theorists of (dis)ability (Clare, Inahara, Garland-Thomson, Mairs, McRuer, Shildrick, Thomas, Toombs Wendell), and theorists exploring gender diversity (Bettcher, Lane, More and Whittle, Prosser, Salamon, S. Stone).
- 1. Historical Background
- 2. The Second Sex
- 3. Sexual Difference
- 4. Intersectionality
- 5. Bodily Practices
- 6. Biology and the New Materialisms
- 7. A Return to Phenomenology
- 8. The Ethics of Embodiment
- 9. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Historical Background
It is unsurprising that early western feminists should have regarded embodiment with suspicion, choosing instead to stress the rational powers of the female mind; for as François Poullain de la Barre famously claimed in 1673, “the mind has no sex” (1673 [1990: 87]). For some early feminists this meant enthusiastically endorsing a dualism between mind and body, with bodily features regarded as contingent characteristics of the self, and the potentially rational minds as its core. For them, as indeed for later feminists, it was essential to break any suggested deterministic link between corporeal characteristics, mental faculties and social role. Reason, they mostly claimed, was a universal human capacity independent of corporeal differences (Wollstonecraft, Mill and Taylor Mill). There were additional reasons for early feminists such as Wollstonecraft in the eighteenth century and Taylor Mill in the nineteenth, to regard their bodies with suspicion. In the context in which they lived as middle class women, their bodies were commodities to be preened and maintained, to enable them to entice men into matrimony so that they would have the material means to live. Women’s attention to their bodies therefore took the form of producing them as objects for others’ appraisal, and the dangers which Wollstonecraft saw in this have been echoed in feminist work up to the present day. Wollstonecraft’s 1792 text, A Vindication of the Rights of Woman, provides, as Bordo (1993) notes, a clear example of the disciplining of the female body as we, post- Foucault, would now describe it.
To preserve personal beauty, woman’s glory! The limbs and faculties are cramped with worse than Chinese bands, and the sedentary life which they are condemned to live, whilst boys frolic in the open air, weakens the muscles … artificial notions of beauty, and false descriptions of sensibility have been early entangled with her motives of action. (Wollstonecraft 1792 [1988: 55])
The body was also a source of vulnerability. Mill and Taylor Mill were preoccupied with the way their susceptibility to illness interrupted their ability to produce philosophical work and cast the shadow of early death over their life plans. Moreover any celebration of the female body as source of sensual pleasure was constrained by a risk of pregnancy.
The body also came to prominence in nineteenth century feminism in Britain through the campaign led by Josephine Butler against the Contagious Diseases Act (Jordan 2001). This act permitted women to be forcibly examined for venereal disease. Butler extended ideas of individual rights, prominent within liberal political philosophy, to rights over one’s body. The campaign of inspection was viewed as a particularly outrageous violation of such rights and the women viewed as victims of male and medical appropriation of their bodies. Here we find the beginnings of arguments picked up later in campaigns against rape and sexual violence, as well as in campaigns for access to birth control and abortion, and in the feminist health movement; all of which stress women’s rights to control what happens to their bodies. This absence of control found its most extreme example in the case of the bodies of slave women, where the body became literally the property of another, disciplined in a way that bore a marked contrast to that articulated by Wollstonecraft.
Her back and her muscle … pressed into field labour where she was forced to … work like men. Her hands were demanded to nurse and nurture the white man and his family … Her vagina used for his sexual pleasure … the womb … the place of capital investment … the resulting child the … surplus worth money on the slave market. (Omolade 1983: 354)
In the nineteenth and early twentieth century the campaign for women’s suffrage dominated feminist activity in the west. The Seneca Falls Convention Statement does not mention the body, but Sojourner Truth’s famous speech to the Ohio Women’s Convention drew attention to the body as a marker of race and class differences within the feminist movement:
I have as much muscle as any man, and can do as much work as any man. I have ploughed, and planted, and gathered into barns, and no man could head me! And ain’t I a woman? I could work as much and eat as much as a man—when I could get it—and bear de lash a well! And ain’t I a woman? (Truth 1851 [1881: 116]).
Moreover, in the writings of Cady Stanton we find a recognition of the way bodily markers are used to perpetuate both racial and sexual oppression:
The prejudice against color, of which we hear so much, is no stronger than that against sex. It is produced by the same cause, and manifested very much in the same way. The negro’s skin and the woman’s sex are both prima facie evidence that they were intended to be in subjection to the white Saxon man. (Stanton 1860 [1881: 681])
Following the first world war and the granting of suffrage in many countries, women continued to campaign on issues of sexual equality, and control over their bodies. The issue of reproduction came to the fore in political philosophies of the right and left. On the political right, following the loss of life in the war, motherhood became a concern of the state and a public duty. Moreover increasing concerns with eugenics and racial purity led to a desire to control the reproduction of certain groups within society. At the same time, within United Kingdom feminist circles, the Abortion Reform Association was formed and echoed both earlier and later feminist demands for the right of every woman to decide what should happen to her body. But an implicit dualism remained. The body was seen as something owned by, and thereby separate from, the self, something over which the self had rights.
Nonetheless in the early twentieth century, with the emergence of psychoanalysis, came a different model of our relationship to our body, which was to become crucial to later feminist philosophers. For Freud the ego, the conscious sense of self, was a bodily ego: “the ego is first and foremost a bodily ego” (Freud 1923 [1962: 26]). This means that our sense of self is a sense of a body, and involves an awareness of that body as having a certain shape or form. Significantly, the shape or form we experience our body as having is not dictated simply by anatomy, but by the affective and sensory significance with which different parts are invested. (Freud 1923). Certain aspects of the body have a salience, and other anatomical parts do not show up, unless painful, in the sense of our body which constitutes our sense of self (the insides of the body, perhaps the back of the knees). Some parts are more significant than others, linked to experiences of pleasure and pain, for example, or to the possibility of effective agency, (the hands), to relations with others, (the face). This insight of Freud and others (Schilder), informed much of the critical theorizing around the body which followed.
2. The Second Sex
It was, however, with the publication of The Second Sex by Simone De Beauvoir, that feminist theorizing about the relation between the body and the self took center stage. Along with other phenomenologists, particularly Merleau-Ponty, and Sartre, Beauvoir recognizes that “to be present in the world implies strictly that there exists a body which is at once a material thing in the world and a point of view towards the world” (Beauvoir 1949 [1982: 39]). The self, for phenomenologists, as for Freud, is necessarily corporeal, the body constitutes the self. It is not a separate entity to which the self stands in relation. This body, however, is not simply what biology offers us an account of. The body which gained their attention was the body as lived, as yielding the sensory experiences and lived intentionality of a subject negotiating its world. It is also a body which is encountered by others whose response to it mediates our own sense of being. What is central to Beauvoir’s account is that such bodily existence, the point of view it provides, and the response it garners, is different for men and women. Her account provides a complex and non-reductive picture of the intertwining of the material and the cultural in the formation of our embodied selves (see the entry on Simone de Beauvoir, Kruks 2010, Sandford 2006, Moi 1999).
2.1 The Data of Biology
In the first chapter of The Second Sex Beauvoir reviews the data of biology. But she does so with a warning. Such data are not to be thought of as determining individual characteristics or social life. With that warning she goes on to describe what are claimed as biological characteristics of the female qua animal or organism which, in addition to differences in reproductive role, includes claims that “woman is weaker than man, she has less muscular strength, … can lift less heavy weights” (1949 [1982: 66]). She rehearses these “facts” while also declaring that “in themselves [such facts] have no significance” (1949 [1982: 66]). This is because “it is only in a human perspective that we can compare the female and the male of the human species”, and from this human perspective “the physiological facts … take on meaning, this meaning … dependent on a whole context” (1949 [1982: 66]). So, for example, in relation to “the burden imposed on women by her reproductive function … society alone is the arbiter” (1949 [1982: 67]).
Such remarks have led to Beauvoir being regarded as an originator of the sex/gender dichotomy, which became pivotal to feminist theorizing in the 1970s (see the entry: feminist perspectives on sex and gender). Standardly sex was seen as fixed by biology, and gender, as the social meanings attached to such biology, seen as historically and socially variable, and open to change. It is in this context that Beauvoir’s famous claim that “One is not born, but rather becomes, a woman”, is consistently quoted (1949 [1982: 295]). Nonetheless Beauvoir’s own position does not map onto this sex /gender distinction in a straightforward way (Sandford 2006, Lennon and Alsop 2019, cp 4). For her the data of biology, offered as facts, lack the fixity which later accounts sometimes took for granted. She shows herself aware of the way in which cultural myths and metaphors influence the telling of the biological story, even as she herself offers it to us. In pointing out the ideological influence on the descriptions of the active sperm and the passive egg (1949 [1982: 44] she anticipates the work of later writers (Martin 1987). Moreover she shows herself consistently aware of the possibilities which the biological data leave open to us, stressing alternatives to heterosexual reproduction throughout the biological realm, the incidence of hermaphrodism in human and other animals, and drawing attention in the animal kingdom to cases where care of the eggs and the young is done by both male and female animals. The consequence is that not even the biology of sexual difference is determined.
It is only through existence that the facts are manifest … and nothing requires that this body have this or that particular structure … the perpetuation of the species does not necessitate sexual differentiation … [while] it remains true that both a mind without a body and an immortal man are strictly inconceivable … we can imagine a parthenogenetic or hermaphroditic society. (1949 [1982: 390], my emphasis)
On the other hand, the meanings and significance which we attach to our materiality do not float free of that materiality. The way the body is lived by us has to accommodate the data which biology variably tries to capture, including facts of reproduction, menstruation and menopause. “Sex” for Beauvoir was not, then, a biological category. It is, as Sandford (2006), points out an existential one. And in exploring what constituted existing as a woman, biological data was just one of the constituents.
2.2 Living the Female Body
In later chapters Beauvoir provides a phenomenology of the body as lived throughout the different stages of a woman’s life. Here she is explicitly offering her narrative as an account of lived experience, the body in situation. In childhood the young girl’s body is experienced in a different way from that of the young boy. She is trained into a different way of inhabiting it. He is encouraged to climb trees and play rough games. She is encouraged to treat her whole person as a doll, “a passive object … an inert given object” (1949 [1982: 306–307]). The consequence is an inhibited intentionality, her spontaneous movements inhibited, “the exuberance of life … restrained” (1949 [1982: 323]), “lack of physical power” leading to a “general timidity” (1949 [1982: 355]). The account which Beauvoir is offering here is one in which girls undergo something like a training in bodily habits which structure the possibilities for interaction with their world.
As the girl enters puberty, Beauvoir notes, her body becomes to her a source of horror and shame. “This new growth in her armpits transforms her into a kind of animal or algae” (1949 [1982: 333]), her menstrual blood a source of disgust. These negative descriptions are continued for sexual initiation, marriage, and motherhood. Her phenomenology of the maternal body has been especially controversial:
ensnared by nature the pregnant women is plant and animal … an incubator, a conscious and free individual who has become life’s passive instrument … not so much mothers… as fertile organisms, like fowls with high egg production. (1949 [1982: 513])
These accounts have been a source of criticism, particularly when later feminists sought to celebrate the female body as a source of pleasure, fertility, and empowerment, (see below). However it is important to recognize that what she was offering was a descriptive phenomenology of female bodies as lived in specific situations. She was describing a particular set of experiences at a specific social and historical point. As she explicitly says:
if the biological condition of women does constitute a handicap, it is because of her general situation …. It is in a total situation which leaves her few outlets that her peculiarities take on their importance. (1949 [1982: 356–357])
It is this situation which her writings aimed to highlight and change.
2.3 The Body and Others
The way in which the young girl and then the woman experiences her body is, for Beauvoir, a consequence of a process of internalizing the view of it under the gaze of others.
Through compliments and admonishments, through images and words, she discovers the meaning of the words pretty and ugly; she soon knows that to be pleased is to be pretty as a picture; she tries to resemble an image, she disguises herself, she looks at herself in the mirror, she compares herself to princesses and fairies from tales. (1949 [2010: 304])
Here is the beginning of the way in which women live their bodies as objects for another’s gaze, something which has its origin not in anatomy but in “education and surroundings” (1949 [2010: 304]). Beauvoir’s account of the way in which women live their bodies in such an objectified way, internalizing the gaze and producing their bodies as objects for others, has been one of her most important contributions to a phenomenology of female embodiment, anticipating and influencing the work of later feminists such as Bartky and Young (see below sections 5.1 and 7.1) .
Beauvoir’s phenomenology of women’s experience was also, itself, influential on, and in conversation with, philosophers theorizing raced embodiment. The phenomenological writer Franz Fanon, (Black Skins White Masks, 1952 ) describes how, on his arrival in France, he discovers his blackness:
I discovered myself as an object among other objects…the other fixes me, just like a dye is used to fix a chemical solution….It is not a question of the Black being black anymore, but rather of his being Black opposite the White…we came to have to confront the white gaze …. I was all at once responsible for my body, responsible for my race, for my ancestors. I ran an objective gaze over myself, discovering my blackness, my ethnic characteristics and then I was deafened by cannibalism, intellectual deficiency fetishism, racial defects, slave ships, and above all, above all else, “Sho good Banana”. (1952 [1968: 185–186])
Later theorists have, however, pointed out that in, offering her own account, Beauvoir herself failed to recognize the way in which both race and gender intersect in providing a phenomenology of lived corporeality (Gines 2017; see the discussion of intersectionality in section 4 below).
3. Sexual Difference
The descriptions which Beauvoir offers us of the female body as lived, are in marked contrast to the valorization of that body which we find in the writings of sexual difference theorists: “What is at stake in the debate … is the positive project of turning difference into a strength, of affirming its positivity” (Braidotti 1994: 187). Engagement with female embodiment, the goal of which is to give positive accounts of it, are found in two different strands of feminist thought: Anglo-American radical feminism (particularly in the late 1970s and 80s) and psychoanalytic feminism, drawing on the work of Freud and Lacan. Sexual difference theorists, whether working from a radical feminist tradition or from a psychoanalytic feminist tradition, insist on the specificity of female embodiment, a horizon which becomes invisible when the male is taken as the norm of the human. For many of these theorists sexual difference is fundamental and immutable. Braidotti claims “being a woman is always already there as the ontological precondition for my existential becoming as a subject” (1994: 187).
3.1 Radical Feminism
There are some controversies over exactly what is to be termed radical feminism. As used here the term refers to feminists who stress essential or very deep rooted differences between men and women, and who celebrate the distinctive modes of embodiment and experiential capacities that women have. Radical feminists were/ are centrally involved in highlighting sexual violence against women globally, which they sometimes see as rooted in male nature, or deep processes of socialization. Despite Shulamith Firestone’s (1970 ; Merck and Sandford 2010), early visions of liberating women from reproductive tasks; within most Anglo-American radical feminism, both female sexuality and the female capacity to give birth are seen as grounds for affirming the power and the value of the female body. Female sexuality is celebrated for its power and its supposed capacity to escape from structures of dominance and submission, (Rich 1979). Women’s maternal bodies are seen as a source of positive values to set against male norms, stressing care and inter-subjectivity, as opposed to autonomy and duty (Rich 1979, Ruddick 1989). Women’s engagement with the reproductive process is also regarded as anchoring both anti-militarism and a respect for the natural world, which puts them at the forefront of peace and ecological movements (Griffin 1978). Reproduction and their caring roles also sets them against the widespread violence of men. These approaches are very significant for giving women’s bodies a positive value which induces pride rather than shame. However, such approaches also suffer from the dangers of homogenizing what are very variable experiences both of sexuality and maternity. As Grimshaw points out, for women childbearing has been seen “both as the source of … greatest joy and as the root of their worst suffering” (1986: 73). Moreover woman themselves engage in military professions, and can themselves be violent in private and public space. Claims celebrating female embodiment therefore need to heed Beauvoir’s insistence that the experience of embodiment is a product of situation.
3.2 This Sex Which is Not One
In the work of Irigaray, (1975, 1977, 1993), we find a sustained critique of both philosophy and psychoanalysis, for their masculinist presuppositions. She points out that in these bodies of work “man” is presented as the universal norm, and sexual difference is not recognized, or it is recognized in such a way that woman is conceptualized as the “maternal-feminine”, which has been left behind in the move to abstract thought. Such a critique insists on the recognition of sexual difference and the difference that female corporeality can make to the shape which thought can take. She makes here what may seem like a rather startling claim: namely that the morphology of the body is reflected in the morphology of certain thought processes. So, for example, western rationality is marked by principles of identity, non-contradiction, binarism, atomism and determinate individuation. She sees this as: “the one of form, of the individual, of the (male) sex organ”. In contrast: “the contact of at least two (lips) keeps woman in touch with herself” (1977 [1985: 79]), and suggests an ambiguity of individuation, a fluidity and mobility, a rejection of stable forms.
Such claims have been interpreted by some as suggesting that Irigaray is a biological essentialist, that she sees the biology of male and female bodies as yielding (potentially) different patterns of thought, and that she is insisting that the thinking and writing which is expressive of women’s bodies should be made visible. In contrast to such a reading however, is Irigaray’s own insistence on the impossibility of returning to a body outside of its representation within culture. This makes evident that the bodily features which she invokes in her writings are not brute materialities, but, (as is perhaps made clearest in Whitford 1991), bodies as they feature in the interconnected symbolic and imaginary of western culture. (1991: chapter 3). When Irigaray refers to male and female bodily characteristics she is, according to Whitford, capturing the way she finds these features both represented and imagined, that is, affectively experienced, in the personal and social domain. She argues for the need to reconstruct an inter-connected imaginary and symbolic of the female body which is liveable and positive for women. Whitford suggests this is not an essentialist task of providing an accurate description of women’s bodies as they really are. It is a creative one in which the female body is lovingly re-imagined and rearticulated to enable women to both feel and think differently about their embodied form. Irigaray’s attention to the imaginary body is, however, informed by a respect for a materiality, a nature, which although open to multiple modes of disclosure, offers us two kinds of sexed bodies, to which our imaginary significations remain answerable.
Irigaray herself considers how philosophical and psychoanalytic thinking would be different if we took a re-imagined female or maternal body as its starting point instead of the male body, imagined in phallic terms. Such work has been continued in the writings of, for example, Battersby (1998), Cavarero (1995) and Alison Stone (2011). Battersby explores “what happens to the notion of identity if we treat the embodied female as the norm for models of the self” (1998: 38). Natality challenges a fixed conception of identity, makes evident that self and non-self are not in opposition, and that identity “erupts from the flesh” (1998: 39). For Cavarero the lack of attention paid to the fact that we are born from woman has given western metaphysics a preoccupation with death rather than birth. Stone (2011) explores the maternal body to suggest models of subjectivity of a new kind, immersed in relations of intimacy and dependence. Stone “analyses this form of subjectivity in terms of how the mother typically reproduces with her child her history of bodily relations with her own mother, leading to a distinctive maternal and cyclical form of lived time” (2011: Jacket).
Both the foundational status and the inevitability of sexual difference has become a key point of contention between sexual difference theorists and intersectional theorists whose work is anchored particularly in black feminist thought (Crenshaw 2019, Hill Collins and Bilge 2016 ), but also in contributions from theorists of bodily abilities and trans theorists. (Garland-Thomson 2002, Bettcher and Garry 2009, Koyama 2006) These theorists challenge the priority of sexual difference, in our accounts of embodied subjectivity, and the possibility of providing generic accounts of what such difference consists in. What counts as being a man or a woman, what life opportunities result from gendered positionality, and how these factors are internalized to form our lived experience of being gendered, is mediated by the other categories which intersect with gendered ones. Being a “black man/woman”, or “gay man/woman”, or “trans man/woman” (themselves categories which also mediate each other and are mediated further by, for example, nationality, religion, age, class and our positioning on the ability/disability axis), each has a different content from being a “white, straight, middleclass, cis gendered, able bodied woman or man”. The normative ideals attached to the concepts are different, though also overlapping. These positionalities have consequences for our life opportunities both economically and in the wider social realm, which the structural data make evident. And all of this has consequences for our lived subjectivity, how we experience our bodies, our sense of ourselves as male or female, amongst other identifiers.
Black feminist critiques challenge the racism of mainstream white feminist thought for theorizing womanhood from the perspective of white women thereby rendering the particular experiences of black and other groups of marginalized women invisible. Audre Lorde writes:
As a Black lesbian feminist comfortable with the many ingredients of my identity, and a woman committed to racial and sexual freedom of expression, I find I am constantly being encouraged to pluck out some aspect of myself and present this as a meaningful whole, eclipsing or denying the other parts of self. But this is a destructive and fragmenting way to live. (Lorde 1984)
Two centuries earlier Sojourner Truth, in her famous “Ain’t I a Woman” speech at Seneca Falls (see above) signalled the very different modes of embodiment for black slave women and white bourgeois women. The coining of the term intersectionality is often accredited to African-American civil rights advocate and feminist and critical race scholar, Kimberle Crenshaw (2019). As black women we do not experience racism AND sexism as separate discrete strands of oppression, Crenshaw argues, but instead racism and sexism intersect and combine to shape the lives, including the experiences of embodiment, of black women, in very specific ways. This is not a matter of adding on experiences of being raced to a foundational sexed identity. What constitutes being a woman is inter-articulated with being black, in ways that challenge the universalism of sexual difference theory.
Disability theorists from the 1990s onwards explored how disability affected the gendering process and gender the experiences and outcomes of differing bodily abilities (Mairs 1990, Thomas 1999). Feminist theory, as Garland-Thomson argues:
interrogates how subjects are multiply interpellated; in other words, how the representational systems of gender race, ethnicity, ability, sexuality and class mutually construct, inflect and contradict one another. (2002: 3)
the status of the lived body, the politics of appearance, the medicalisation of the body, the privilege of normalcy (2002: 4)
all look different from the perspective of women regarded as disabled. And the relative privileges of normative femininity are often denied to these women. Such work by intersectional feminists challenge any foundational role, or universal articulation of, sexed difference itself.
5. Bodily Practices
5.1 Disciplining the Body
Feminist writers from Wollstonecraft onwards have drawn attention to the way in which society prescribes norms in relation to which subjects regulate their own bodies and those of others. Beauvoir’s account of this has been highlighted above. “Our bodies are trained, shaped and impressed with the prevailing historical forms of … masculinity and femininity” (Bordo 1993: 91). By regimes of dieting, makeup, exercise, dress, and cosmetic surgery, women, and increasingly men, try to sculpt their bodies into shapes which reflect the dominant societal norms. Such disciplinary practices attach not only to the production of appropriately gendered bodies, but to other aspects of bodily identity subject to social normalization. Hair straightening, blue tinted contact lenses, surgical reconstruction of noses and lips, are practices in which the material shapes of our bodies are disciplined to correspond to a social ideal, reflecting the privileged position which certain kinds of, usually, white, always able, always young, bodies occupy.
This became a major theme in 1970s feminist writing. Dworkin writes:
In our culture not one part of a women’s body is left untouched, unaltered.… From head to toe, every feature of a woman’s face, every section of her body, is subject to modification. (1974: 113–114)
From the 1990s, feminist attention to the power relations working through such disciplinary practices has made extensive use of the work of Foucault (Foucault 1975, Bartky 1990, Bordo 1993). Foucauldian insights regarding disciplinary practices of the body are applied to the disciplining of the gendered, and most insistently the female, body. Such accounts stress the way in which women actively discipline their own bodies not only to avoid social punishments, but also to derive certain kinds of pleasure. There are two key features of such accounts. One stresses the way in which the material shape of bodies is modified by such practices. The second that such modifications are a consequence of bodies carrying social meanings, signalling within specific contexts, sexual desirability, or availability, or respectability, or participation in social groupings. With attention to the work of Foucault and other poststructuralist writers, also came the recognition that practices of bodily modification could have multiple meanings, with disagreements over responses to cosmetics, fashion and cosmetic surgery (Davis 1995, Alsop and Lennon 2018). It was against this background that Bordo (1993) developed her complex and influential reading of the anorexic body:
female slenderness … has a wide range of sometimes contradictory meanings … suggesting powerlessness … in one context, autonomy and freedom in the next. (1993: 26; see the Ethics of Embodiment, section 8, below)
In the work of Butler (1990, 1993, 2004), the subjection of our bodies to such normalizing practices become viewed, not only a way in which already sexed bodies seek to approximate an ideal, but as the process whereby sexed subjects come into existence at all. Here Butler is following Beauvoir’s claim that we become differentiated as women and men, rather than being born as such. Since 1990 with the appearance of Gender Trouble, her performative account of gendered subjectivity has dominated feminist theory. Butler rejects the view that gender differences, with their accompanying presumptions of heterosexuality, have their origin in biological or natural differences. She explores, instead, how such a “naturalising trick” is pulled off; asking by what means a unity of biology, gendered identification, and heterosexuality comes to appear natural. Butler, like Foucault, views discourses as productive of the identities they appear to be describing. When a baby is born and the midwife says “it’s a girl” she is not reporting an already determinate state of affairs, but taking part in a practice which constitutes that state of affairs. The effect of repetition of acts of this kind is to make it appear that there are two distinct natures, male and female. These gendered performances are ones which we act out ourselves and which others act out in relation to us. They are acted out in accordance with social scripts prescribing ideals which are unrealizable, but which none the less provide the framework for our activities. These dominant ideals reinforce the power of certain groups; e.g., men and heterosexuals, over others. These others: women, gay people, trans and gender non-conforming people, those with differently abled bodies, or bodies differently shaped from the dominant ideal, are treated socially as outsiders, “the abject”, and subject to social punishments.
The performances by means of which our bodies become gendered vary in different contexts, and can change over time. Constituting myself as a caring mother, my performance would differ from that of a sexy pop star. Moreover these practices are not independent of those which produce other aspects of our identity. Butler has stressed the way in which gendered performances incorporate a presumptive heterosexuality; but, as intersectional theorists have made clear, they also are co-constituted with class, race and national and cultural positioning, as well as age and a variety of forms of abilities and disabilities. In bodily acts manifesting gendered positionality, other social positions are carried along, in such a way that it is not possible to disentangle a strand of gender which is universally present.
If gender becomes a matter of bodily style and performance, as this model suggests, then there is no necessary link between gender and any particular bodily shape. The alignment between anatomical shape and gendered performance is itself just a norm. Furthermore this norm, along with others governing gendered performance, is open to destabilization and change. For Butler same sex practices are one way of destabilizing the normative links of gender and heterosexuality. Various trans performances, in a parallel way, challenge the link of anatomical shape and gender. The trans community, problematised by sexual difference theory, therefore comes to occupy a central position for Butler. They are pivotal to the process of “queering” by means of which gender binaries, established by normalizing practices, are to be undermined and unravelled. So, for example, the television documentary, Pregnant Man by McDonald (2008), featuring a pregnant man who is referred to as a man and presented as a regular guy, works to undermine our binaries. What remains problematic about this, however, is that the effect of performance is unpredictable. Drag, for example, can support or dislodge gendered stereotypes and we cannot always sort out which any instance will produce. This make possibilities for reflective agency difficult to negotiate (McNay 2000).
For some commentators such a performative account of the formation of sexed bodies, fails to capture how the materiality of the body enters into our sense of self. In the preface to Bodies that Matter Butler reports a common response to her work:
What about the materiality of the body, Judy? … an effort … to recall me to a bodily life that could not be theorized away … for surely bodies live and eat; eat and sleep; feel pain and pleasure; endure illness and violence; and these facts … cannot be dismissed as mere construction. (1993: ix)
Butler answers such questions by giving an account of the materiality of the body in terms of a process of materialisation. Here she is “calling into question the model of construction whereby the social unilaterally acts on the natural and invests it … with … meaning” (1993: 4). Instead she offers us a picture in which what we count as the material, as nature, as the given, is not something to which we have unmediated access. It is itself a product of particular modes of conceptualizing, modes which do not escape the workings of power. “Sex posited as prior to construction will, by virtue of being posited, become the effect of that very positing” (1993: 5). She concurs with the position of Spivak:
If one thinks of the body as such, there is no possible outline of the body as such. There are thinkings of the systematicity of the body, there are value codings of the body. The body, as such, cannot be thought, and I certainly cannot approach it. (Spivak 1989)
For Butler, we have to think of matter in terms of “a process of materialisation that stabilises over time to produce the effect of boundary, fixity … we call matter” (1993: 9). We cannot, then, ask questions about what limits are set by something outside of what we conceptualize. We can, however, explore the possibilities of conceptualizing otherwise. This does not mean that there is nothing outside of discourse. Butler makes clear that the body exceeds any attempt to capture it in discourse. It is just such excessiveness which allows the possibility of alternative formations of it, for the body outruns any of the ways we might have of thinking about it. But we cannot approach the extra-discursive except by exploring discursive possibilities.
6. Biology and the New Materialisms
Butler’s (1993) thinking together of the material and the discursive, has, however, been criticized, for not allowing the body more of a drag on signification (Alaimo and Hekman 2008; Lennon and Alsop 2019). Such a “flight from the material” according to Alaimo and Hekman, has foreclosed attention to “lived material bodies and evolving corporeal practices” (2008: 3). To correct such a deficit, in the framework of what is termed the new materialism, what is stressed instead is that, although “language structures how we apprehend the ontological, it doesn’t constitute it” (2008: 98). The insight of the new materialist discussions has been to ensure that matter, the material, is accorded an active role in this relation.
For Grosz, there is:
an elision of the question of nature and of matter in Butler’s work. Mattering becomes more important than matter! Being “important”, having significance, having a place, mattering, is more important than matter, substance or materiality. (interview with Ausch, Doane, and Perez 2000)
In Grosz’s own work such materiality is conceived of in terms of “active forces”. The body is involved in a process of active “becoming” which outruns any account which might be offered of it within culture. In the same interview she claims: “Nature is … is openness, resource, productivity”. Here the body is not simply a materiality which outruns any attempt to conceptualize it; it is actively involved in processes of change and transformation. Grosz’s recent work (1999 ), exploring biology and its relationship to culture, shows an increasing interest in unravelling the nature/culture opposition by a stress on “the virtualities, the potentialities, within biological existence that enable cultural, social, and historical forces to work with and transform that existence” (1999 [2008: 24]). Returning to the work of Darwin, she sees in his work “the genesis of the new from the play of repetition and difference within the old” (2008: 28). Nonetheless she draws some problematic conclusions which are not endorsed by current feminist biologists (Fausto-Sterling 2000; Fine 2012, 2017). In embracing natural selection she appears to give it a foundational explanatory role so that
language, culture, intelligence, reason, imagination memory, -terms commonly claimed as defining characteristics of the human and the cultural-are all equally effects of the same rigorous criteria of natural selection. (Grosz 1999 [2008: 44])
Moreover within this process a binary sexual difference is required, as, “one of the ontological characteristics of life itself” (1999 [2008: 44]). And this sexual differentiation and the sexual selection with which, for her, it is interwoven, is then invoked to ground racial and other forms of bodily differences.
Grosz’s endorsement of a biology which renders the sexual binary unassailable, has been criticized for going beyond recognizing the importance of the material, to privilege a particular biological account of matter (Jagger 2015). The history of sex difference research show that the biological theories, which give an account of sex differences, are the products of particular historical and culturally specific moments of production. Such a recognition has allowed biological accounts of sex differences to be revisited with an eye as to where cultural assumptions about gender have influenced them. Of key importance in this regard has been the assumption that there are simply two sexes, male and female, a model which has come increasingly under challenge. Fausto-Sterling points out the range of inter-sex bodies that are forced into a binary classificatory system (1992, 2000). She points out that “the varieties are so diverse … that no classificatory scheme could do more than suggest the variety of sexual anatomy encountered in clinical practice” (1993: 22). Oudshoorn (1994), in a genealogy of the emergence of the theory of sex hormones, shows how a model of binary sex differences prevailed, in a context in which dualistic notions of male and female could have been abandoned (see entry feminist philosophies of biology and also Fausto-Sterling 1992, 2000; Fine 2012, 2017). Lane argues that
mobilizing a reading of biology as open-ended and creative, supports a perspective that sees sex and gender diversity as a continuum, rather than a dichotomy—put simply, “nature” throws up all this diversity and society needs to accept it. (2009: 137)
Lane, as a trans theorist, is confronting what is seen as an anti-biologism within performative gender theory, and exploring the complex interpellation of biological and cultural factors in the aetiology of trans subjectivity, without treating Grosz’s biological account as authoritative (see entry on feminist perspectives on trans issues).
This is not to deny that there is something independent of our conceptualizations which sets constraints on what can be said about it. What we cannot do is disentangle the bit which is given from our ways of thinking about it. What needs addressing according to Barad is “the entanglement of matter and meaning” (Barad 2007), the inter-implication of the discursive and the material in which no priority is given to either side. Barad explores this entanglement with particular reference to the work of physicist Niels Bohr. Viewing matter as an active “agent” ensures that matter and meaning are mutually articulated. Importantly, however, although the empirical world of matter takes an active part this does not involve according it some sort of immediate givenness, or a straight-forwardly determining role. In her approach Barad is following in the footsteps of Haraway. In 1985, prior to Butler’s Gender Trouble, Haraway had published her “Cyborg Manifesto” (1985 ). Haraway’s project had some overlap with that later articulated by Butler. She wished to overcome the binary between nature and culture, replacing the two terms with nature/culture, in which different elements cannot be disentangled. She was also concerned to draw attention to the complex factors which go into constituting what is to count as nature for us. Most crucially she was concerned to undermine the supposed naturalness of certain binaries; insisting on a breaching of boundaries between human and animal and between animal and machine. So came her invocation of the cyborg: a creature “simultaneously animal and machine” populating a world “ambiguously natural and crafted” (1985 [1991: 149]). In pointing to the cyborg as the figure which captures our “bodily reality”, Haraway is resisting any appeal to a pure nature which is supposed to constitute our bodily being. There is no clear boundary between what is natural and what is constructed. In Haraway’s picture, however, the body, along with the rest of the natural world, has what she calls “a trickster quality that resists categories and projects of all kinds” (1997: 128). In this and her later work (Haraway 2003, 2008), her account of the quirkiness and agency which, in Butler, is primarily discussed as a feature of discursive practices, is as much a feature of nature. Nature is viewed as an agent, actively contributing to the indivisible nature/culture with which we are faced. “We must find another relationship to nature besides reification, possession, appropriation and nostalgia” (2008: 158). This other relation is to view nature as “a partner in the potent conversation” (2008: 158), in which we attempt to constitute it. What is so notable about her work is the careful respect shown to the concreteness of bodily existence and to the biological narratives, alongside narratives of historical and cultural kinds.
7. A Return to Phenomenology
A return to an interest in feminist phenomenology, in the footsteps of Beauvoir, started with the work of Bartky and Young in the late 1970s, but became widespread only in the 1990s. At the center of phenomenological accounts of embodiment is the lived experience of the body. For such writers embodiment is our mode of being-in-the-world (Young 2005: 9). The notion of experience is treated with great suspicion in the poststructuralist framework within which Butler is primarily positioned. The suspicion is a consequence of empiricist uses of the term, in which experience is tied to a “myth of the given” whereby body and world are offered to us in an unmediated way. The experiences to which phenomenological writers draw attention are not, however, of such a pure kind. For they are experiences of bodies in situations, in which it is impossible to disentangle so called “natural” and “social” elements. For as Merleau-Ponty points out,
everything is both manufactured and natural in man, as it were, in the sense that there is not a word, not a form of behaviour which does not owe something to purely biological being—and which at the same time does not elude the simplicity of animal life. (1945 [1962: 189])
Here there is an entanglement of nature/culture, matter and meaning, which parallels that insisted on by Haraway and Barad discussed above. But the phenomenological accounts foreground lived experience of the body in a way that is often absent from, what are now termed, the new materialist writings, (although it is foregrounded in the writings of some trans theorists, see Salamon 2010).
Interest in the phenomenology of embodiment is an attempt to further articulate Freud’s claim that “the ego is a bodily ego” (Freud 1923 ), to capture the way corporeal characteristics surface in our experiences of ourselves and others. Feminist writers such as Bartky, Young, Alcoff, Heinämaa, and Weiss are carrying on the project started by Beauvoir; but a major influence for many of them is also the work of Merleau-Ponty. They put such resources to work to make visible the variable experiences of gendered, raced, classed, differently abled and differently aged bodies, to reflect on the way such experiences, mediate social positionality, and constitute our sense of self.
7.1 Throwing Like a Girl
In a series of essays written early in her career, Young, (reprinted 2005), captured everyday experiences of women’s embodiment. Such accounts were not simply descriptive, but were aimed, initially, to make evident the way in which the social norms governing female “bodily comportment” yielded an inhibited intentionality, an interruption in the pre-reflexive engagement with our environment to which Merleau-Ponty had drawn our attention (1945 ). So, for example, in “Throwing Like A Girl” (1980) she points to studies which suggest that girls and boys throw in different ways and that women, when attempting physical tasks, frequently fail to use the physical possibilities of their bodies. Here she is echoing the descriptions offered by Beauvoir. Also following Beauvoir, Young suggests that the inhibited intentionality characteristic of female embodiment derives from the fact that women often experience their bodies as things/objects, “looked at and acted upon” (1980 [2005: 39]), as well as the source of capacities. “She often lives her body as a burden, which must be dragged and prodded along, and at the same time protected” (1980 [2005: 36]). For Young, as for Beauvoir, such experiences of embodiment are not a consequence of anatomy, but rather of the situation of women in contemporary society, but they point to significant ways in which female lived embodiment can be an obstacle to intentional engagement with the world.
Other of Young’s essays, for example, “Pregnant Embodiment” (1984), “Breasted Experience” (2005, but a shorter version in 1992) and “Menstrual Meditations” (2005a), focus on distinctive aspects of female embodiment that yield distinct ways of being in the world. Here the stress is not only on inhibited intentionality. There is also recognition that such experiences can offer alternative possibilities for embodied engagement that can be positive as well as negative. In her accounts Young stresses that it is such everyday ordinary experiences of embodiment, variable as they are, that constitute women’s sense of their identity as women. Young develops this insight in a discussion of Moi’s suggestion that we should replace categories of both sex and gender with the category of the lived body. Moi (1999) suggests that the category of the lived body can capture the way material features of our bodies play a role in our subjective sense of self, without giving a reductionist, biological account of such embodiment.
7.2 Visible Identities
Alcoff points out that such phenomenological accounts “require a cross-indexing by cultural and ethnic specificity” (Alcoff 2006: 107). In her work a phenomenological account is employed to give an account of those identity categories which are anchored in material bodily features, what she terms visible identities. Alcoff is offering an account which integrates social identity categories with people’s experiences of the bodies of themselves and others. Focusing primarily on raced and gendered identities, she makes clear the way in which bodily features, (color, hair, nose, breasts, genitals) are invested with a significance which becomes a part of our immediate perceptual experience of them:
Both race and sex … are most definitely physical, marked on and through the body, lived as a material experience, visible as surface phenomena and determinant of economic and political status. (2006: 102)
Because of the material reality of the features and the immediacy of our perceptual response, the meanings attached to such features become naturalized. The fact that they are the product of learned modes of perception is not evident to us, for such perceptual practices have become habitual and are resistant to change. She points out how “race and gender consciousness produce habitual bodily mannerisms that feel natural and become unconscious after long use” (2006: 108).
The significance, therefore, of certain bodily shapes, informs our sense of our own body and of the bodies of others. The sense of our own body reflects, as was articulated by Sartre, Fanon, and Beauvoir, the way it is perceived by others. The very shape of the body carries its position in patterns of social interaction. In a striking example regarding raced physiognomies, Alcoff quotes from Rodriguez’s book Days of Obligation (1992):
I used to stare at the Indian in the mirror. The wide nostrils … the thick lips …. Such a long face—such a long nose—sculpted by indifferent, blunt thumbs, and of such common clay. No one in my family had a face as dark or as Indian as mine. My face could not portray the ambition I brought to it. (Alcoff 2006: 189; my emphasis)
Ambition is something expressible in a body of a different kind, and the face he looks at points to a positioning at odds with what he desires. Although Alcoff restricts her analysis to race and sex, it is clear that it also has relevance to other bodily identities. The body in the wheelchair has similar difficulty expressing physical prowess that Rodriguez’s has of expressing ambition. Lennon and Alsop (2019, Ch. 7) point out, that such a framework makes sense of the desires of some trans people for corporeal transformation. For experiences of material features of the body are foundational to our sense of our sexed identity and used by others to position us in patterns of social interaction. Despite the polarising and often damaging consequences of the perceptual practices which Alcoff draws our attention to, she remains optimistic about the possibilities for change, though stressing the difficulties of even bringing these practices into view. Such changes require that people are brought to viewexpereince their own bodies and the bodies of others in a different way: “perceptual practices are dynamic even when congealed into habit … people are capable of change” (Alcoff 2006: 189).
7.3 Bodily Imaginaries
Alcoff is drawing attention to the salience which particular bodily features have in our experiencing of our own bodies and the bodies of others. This links her work to that of other theorists who explore this relation with reference to the notions of both “body image” and “bodily imaginaries”. Weiss (1999) begins her exploration of body images with the work of Merleau-Ponty (1945 ) and Schilder (1935 ), though castigating both for ignoring the difference that sexed and raced positionality make. For Merleau-Ponty our body image or body schema is the awareness we have of the shape or form of our body: “my posture in the inter-sensory world, a form” (Weiss, 10). Such an awareness is not as of an objective anatomical body, but the body in the face of its tasks, a body in which some aspects stand out and others are invisible. It is by means of such body schemas that we are able to act intentionally in the world, and, although they most commonly operate at a pre-reflective level, they constitute our sense of ourselves as corporeal beings. In the work of Schilder the multiple nature of such body images and their dynamic nature is stressed. For him the phenomenological account is interwoven with a psychoanalytic one. Our corporeal or postural schema is formed, in part, by the emotional and imaginative significance which is given to parts of the body by our personal relations with others, and by the significance attached to corporeal features in the social domain: “the touches of others, the interest others take in the different parts of our body, will be of enormous importance in the postural model of the body” (Weiss 1999: 16). This, ensures that our body image is formed by the way the body is experienced and emotionally invested rather than cognitively represented. This is what for many writers is captured by the notion of the bodily imaginary. (Gatens 1996, Lennon 2015). Feminists employing the concept of the bodily imaginary,(influenced by the work of Irigaray discussed above), therefore, stress that the way we have of experiencing our bodies invests particular contours with emotional and affective salience. Gatens (1996), in exploring the notion of bodily imaginaries, also draws on the work of Spinoza. For her the imaginary body is
the social and personal significance of the body as “lived”, socially and historically specific in that it is constructed by a shared language … and common institutional practices. (1996: 11–12)
Many of the emotional saliencies which are attached, socially or only individually, to specific bodily features are damaging and destructive. There are many damaging imaginaries of women’s bodies, gay bodies, black bodies, or those imagined as disabled. It therefore seems imperative that such ways of thinking/feeling specific corporeal features can be subject to change. The matter becomes complex once we recognize that the affective salience which our bodies bear may not be available to reflective scrutiny, but nonetheless reveals itself in the habitual perceptual practices to which Alcoff drew our attention. To effect change we need to offer alternative pictures which make emotional (imaginative) and not only cognitive sense. This is a crucial issue for all writers who want to provide an account of corporeal identities in terms of affectively laden body images, or bodily imaginaries. We can see this process at work in the rewriting of the female body offered by Irigaray, and in the re-imagining of the black body which we find in writers such as hooks, where the skin of the man lying next to her, “soot black like my grand-daddy’s skin” can return her to “a world where we had a history … a world where … something wonderful might be a ripe tomato, found as we walked through the rows of Daddy Jerry’s garden” (hooks 1990: 33; see also Tate 2009). Feminist theorists of the body, working with the notion of the bodily imaginary, therefore see creative acts directed at alterations in our mode of perceiving bodies, as central to the process of political and social transformation. (Lennon 2015).
8. The Ethics of Embodiment
The work on bodily imaginaries from within the phenomenological framework, makes explicit the extent to which our embodied identities are dependent on the responses of others. They are negotiated intersubjectively, linked to the possible pattern of social interactions within which we can recognizably be placed. It is also clear that the imaginaries which are normatively attached to certain bodily morphologies can be restricting and damaging. Both Beauvoir and Fanon described the damaging consequences of encountering the myths and images carried by female and black bodies, which become internalized to mediate our embodied sense of self. The work of many theorists of bodily abilities point to the norms surrounding bodily shape and form in relation to which non normative bodies are seen as freaks and monsters. (Garland-Thomson 1997). Mairs admits experiencing shame of her body:
it is a crippled body. Thus it is doubly other, not merely by the … standards of patriarchal culture but by the standards of physical desirability erected for everybody in our world…. My belly sags from loss of muscle tone, which also creates all kind of intestinal disruptions, hopelessly humiliating in a society in which excretory functions remain strictly unspeakable. (Mairs 1990 [1997: 299, 301])
The way Mairs experiences her body is formed in relation to normalizing discourses in which the “crippled” body, in particular the “desiring crippled body”, is banished to the realm of the rejected, often unthinkable, other. The blossoming of the aesthetic surgery industry amongst women, and increasingly men, is a consequence of an increasingly narrow set of bodily morphologies being accepted as attractive and desirable, Moreover these morphologies are usually of young bodies. This fuels the demand for body modification of aging bodies. (Alsop and Lennon 2018; Dolezal 2015; Gilman 1999; Heyes and Jones 2009).
As a consequence of these insights, there is increasing work amongst feminist philosophers concerning the ethics of embodiment. Weiss (2015) points to
specific feminist philosophers, critical race scholars, and disability theorists who … illustrate, and ultimately combat, the insidious ways in which sexism, racism, and “compulsory able-bodiedness” (McRuer 2006), impoverish the lived experience of both oppressors and the oppressed, largely by predetermining the meaning of their bodily interactions in accordance with institutionalized cultural expectations and norms. (2015: 77)
There are two special issues of the feminist journal Hypatia (Bergoffen and Weiss 2011, 2012) devoted to the ethics of embodiment, dealing with the implications of situating bodies at the center of ethical theory. This requires looking at the operation of bodily norms, and which bodies and modes of comportment are valued and which not. It also requires engaging with bodily vulnerability in relation to the normative human and ethical ideals of autonomy and subjecthood. Garland-Thomson discusses what she terms “misfitting”, a lack of fit between body and world and between our bodies and other peoples (2011, also Bergoffen and Weiss 2011). When we fit harmoniously and properly into the world, we forget the contingency of this, because the world sustains us.
When we experience misfitting and recognize that disjuncture for its political potential, we expose the relational component and the fragility of fitting. Any of us can fit here today and misfit there tomorrow. (Garland-Thomson 2011: 597)
Our bodily vulnerability, and consequently our vulnerability to others, is also central to the later work of Butler. It is through the body that we become vulnerable to our material environment and to the violence which may be inflicted on us by others: “living in a world of beings who are …physically dependent on one another, physically vulnerable to one another” (2004: 22). The vulnerability to social punishments and the threats of violence attach particularly to those who fail to conform to social norms. But Butler stresses the vulnerability and precariousness of everyone’s subjectivity, formed as it is by public systems of meaning which are themselves precarious and crisscrossed by differences. We are affected by the outside, the social and familial bonds, which enable us to assume subjectivity and agency, but are also injurious to us in closing down possibilities for our ways of being.
I am affected not just by this one other or set of others, but by a world in which humans, institutions and organic and inorganic processes all impress themselves upon this me, who is, at the onset, susceptible in ways that are radically involuntary. (2015: 6/7)
Such susceptibility is for her, the mode of being of embodied sensibility. (See Gonzalez-Arnal, Jagger and Lennon (eds.) 2012, for papers highlighting the distinctiveness of different modes of embodiment and the vulnerability of the body to pain and assault. Also see Widdows 2018 for a discussion of Beauty as an Ethical Ideal and the entry on feminist perspectives on disability).
Feminist theorists of embodiment have made a central contribution to philosophy of embodiment and ensured, along with critical race theorists and theorists of (dis)ability, that attention to the body plays a central role in metaphysical, ethical, social and political thought. The theories which emerge are not simply of gendered embodiment. They provide a general account of the relations between bodies and selves. What is stressed within the feminist literature is the range of philosophical theories which are required to make sense of the embodied self. Naturalising frameworks need supplementing with phenomenological, poststructuralist and psychoanalytic ones, in just way the feminist theorists have exemplified, if embodied subjectivity is to become intelligible.
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