Notes to Formalism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

1. Subject to some qualifications with respect to variables free in \(M\) being captured in \(N\) and where \(\lambda x.NM = \lambda x.N\) if \(x\) is not free in \(N\).

2. For a useful account of this history here see (Wadler, 2015) and in particular the notes from Howard quoted therein.

3. Where the variable \(y\) is not free in \(\lambda y.N\) then the result of substituting \(M\) for \(y\) in \(N\), that is \(\lambda y.N [y := M]\) is just \(N\).

4. Here by ‘TT’ I am loosely picking out any type theory with sufficient power, a sort of generic “vanilla” version, not a specific theory.

5. A great many even relatively simple truths about fictional characters cannot be extracted in such simplistic way from the relevant body of fiction and such an approach seems to have no chance with more complex examples of fictional discourse such as: “Stepan Oblonsky is less of a villain than Fyodor Karamazov” (Tolstoy and Dostoyevsky never wrote a joint novel in which both characters feature).

Copyright © 2019 by
Alan Weir <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free