Gelukpa [dge lugs pa]

First published Tue Feb 4, 2014; substantive revision Sun Feb 18, 2018

The Gelukpa (or Geluk) tradition of Tibetan Buddhist philosophy is inspired by the works of Tsongkhapa (1357–1419), who set out a distinctly nominalist Buddhist tradition that differs sharply from other forms of Buddhist thought not only in Tibet, but elsewhere in the Buddhist world. The negative dialectics of the Middle Way (madhyamaka) is the centerpiece of the Geluk intellectual tradition and is the philosophy that is commonly held in Tibet to represent the highest view. The Middle Way, a philosophy systematized in the second century by Nāgārjuna, seeks to chart a “middle way” between the extremes of essentialism and nihilism with the notion of two truths: the ultimate truth of emptiness and the relative truth of dependent existence. The Geluk school’s unique presentation of the Consequence School (prāsaṅgika) of the Middle Way—a tradition that does not build foundational epistemological systems, but affirms existence merely in terms of transactional usage – is a hallmark of its philosophy.

1. Ultimate Truth and the Middle Way

The Geluk interpretation of the Middle Way offers a unique presentation of the Buddhist doctrine of two truths: the ultimate truth and conventional (or relative) truth. Geluk philosophy primarily aims to overcome reifications of the ultimate truth and denials of conventional truths, as conventional existence and ultimate nonexistence are intimately bound together. In this tradition, the relationship between the two truths is said to be “essentially the same but conceptually distinct” (ngo bo gcig la ldog pa tha dad). That is, the two truths are not really different, but can be distinguished conceptually, like an impermanent phenomenon and a product. The following two claims characterize the Geluk school’s distinctive interpretation of the two truths: (1) to exist is to be empty and (2) to exist is to exist conventionally (see Changkya in Cozort 1998, 429).

The ultimate truth has no positive content in the Geluk tradition; it is simply the lack of essence in any phenomena: “The ultimate truth is posited as solely the negation of truth [that is, inherent existence] upon a subject that is a basis of negation…” (Tsongkhapa, 396). Thus, no ultimate truth is affirmed (or rather, nothing is claimed to exist ultimately). This lack of essence in phenomena, or “emptiness,” does not annul their appearance. Rather, emptiness is held to be the condition for the possibility for any appearance. To be empty means to arise dependently—to lack independent, real existence. Since nothing can be found to be independent, everything is said to be empty. Thus, in the Geluk tradition, emptiness is the nature of all phenomena (or their lack of independent nature), and all phenomena are necessarily empty.

The ultimate truth is said to be emptiness because things are not found to exist separate from their parts, causes, or designations; this non-finding itself is the meaning of emptiness. Emptiness, too, is not “found” when sought (emptiness is empty, too). To be found (when an ultimate essence is sought) is to be intrinsically or ultimately real, and nothing has this status for the Geluk tradition, not even emptiness.

Emptiness is interpreted in the Geluk tradition as a non-implicative negation (med dgag). As opposed to a negation that implies something else, a non-implicative negation is simply an absence, such as a lack of true existence. This mere lack or absence, as a negation of essence that implies nothing, is the meaning of the ultimate truth in the Geluk tradition. Nevertheless, the claim that there is nothing ultimately true—or that the ultimate truth is “emptiness,” a null set—is a (conventional) truth, not a truth ultimately, because nothing is ultimately true. Thus, conventional truths are the only types of affirmative truths there are (other than the absence of true existence) (Jinpa 2002, 46–48).

2. Conventional Truth and the Consequence School

The summit of Geluk philosophy is the Consequence School. The Consequence School is a branch of the Middle Way tradition that radically undermines any and all foundations. The Consequence School gets its name from the form of reductio argument used to demonstrate emptiness, in contrast to formal (autonomous) arguments. According to Tsongkhapa, a formal argument for emptiness is not able to convey the meaning of emptiness (to someone who has not understood it) because formal arguments presuppose essences. That is, a formal argument presumes that a subject matter is objective or given, and this cannot be the case, particularly when an anti-realist (who understands emptiness) and a realist (who lacks an understanding of emptiness) engage in dialogue (Changkya in Cozort 1998, 451). This is because a proponent of the Consequence School consents to no such given, objective facts.

For the Consequence School, a valid argument for emptiness, like “the table is empty because it is dependent,” is not an objective truth. The reason for this is simply because there are no objective truths; there is nothing given. That is, the rules of logic, even when followed, are just rules without any intrinsic reality or objective status to ground their truth outside those rules (Jinpa 2002, 63–69). Moreover, perception is not foundational in this system. Neither perception nor inference is foundational in the Middle Way: perceptions validate inferences and inferences validate perceptions; neither has priority as both simply function to sustain a consensual reality.

By invoking consensus as the mark of (conventional) reality, the Geluk school’s coherence theory of truth anticipates some of the insights of the later Wittgenstein (see Thurman 1980). There are no foundations in the Geluk tradition, neither ultimate nor conventional; there is only transactional usage—“what is renowned in the world.” Thus, unlike some other Middle Way philosophies, like the Autonomy School (svātantrika), there is no “correct” or “incorrect” relative truth, for no independent means exists that could verify a truth claim to be a “correct” relative truth. “What works” is the criterion; that is, what conforms to the ways of the world is a conventional truth in the way that a game works when you subscribe to its rules. Any further notion of a “correct” relative implicates a foundation, an essentialist presumption about the way things are (Changkya 1998, 321; Bötrül 2011, 141). Therefore, the measure of what is correct is simply what conforms to the world rather than based on any other warrant that would serve as a deeper structure or more fundamental layer of reality beyond what is simply conventional (Cozort 1998, 52).

A key point to Tsongkhapa’s Consequence School is that nothing exists on its own even conventionally (Tsongkhapa 1988, 585). Thereby, there is no need to ground conventions in any deeper foundation. Without the need for conventional foundations—like a foundational consciousness or self-awareness—there is no need for ultimate foundations, either, as if a real ultimate were needed to ground unreal conventions. When there is nothing but groundless conventions—all the way up and all the way down—the ultimate and the conventional are no longer separate; the two truths are none other than two aspects of the same thing. Thereby, the two truths are not only without contradiction, but are mutually supportive, and this is a key to Tsongkhapa’s interpretation of the Consequence School of the Middle Way.

Another essential point of Tsongkhapa’s Consequence School is that distinctions within the conventional—between truth and falsity, existence and non-existence, real and unreal—are not objective; that is, they are not determined from objects themselves. Conventional distinctions between what is real and unreal are made in terms of the world. That is to say, these distinctions are not made based on any real differences in objects themselves; rather, what constitutes what is real and unreal is intersubjective. Significantly, what is intersubjective necessarily incorporates a subjective dimension.

One might think that if objective distinctions are not accepted in the Consequence School, then this position would be not different from the subjective idealism of the reviled “Mind-Only” school. Rather than claim that the mind is independently real in contrast to unreal external objects, like a subjective idealist, a proponent of the Middle Way explicitly affirms the interdependency of minds and objects. Following Candrakīrti, a nineteenth-century scholar, Künzang Sönam (1823–1905), unpacks Tsongkhapa’s interpretation when he describes how minds and external objects are equally existent in worldly convention (and in Abhidharma) and equally nonexistent when their nature is sought in analysis (and in a sublime being’s meditative equipoise). He goes on to show how external objects are accepted conventionally in the Consequence School because the coextensive presence and absence of objects and cognitions undermines the claim that even conventionally there are no external objects. That is, when there are external objects, there are internal cognitions, and when there are internal cognitions, there are external objects; cognitions and objects are paired and thus rise and fall together. He reiterates this point by saying that not only does no conventional analysis negate external objects, but that conventional analysis undermines the absence of externality (Künzang 2007, 706-707).

Elaborating on the difference between the Middle Way and Mind-Only, Künzang Sönam says that “the distinction of whether or not external objects are asserted or not conventionally comes down to the acceptance of something existing on its own (rang mtshan gyis grub pa).” This is the main issue for Tsongkhapa’s unique interpretation of the Consequence and undergirds his claims. He argues that proponents of Mind-Only are not satisfied with assenting to the external world as it is proclaimed by the world; they think that if there were external objects, they would have to be the types of things that would be findable upon analysis, and existing separately from cognition. Yet since there are no such things, they deny them. The Consequence School, in contrast, asserts external objects without these criteria, namely, without there being any objective basis of designation for these claims. Thus, proponents of the Consequence School simply assent to external objects in accord with the ways of the world, and this is due to the fact that they do not accept anything existing on its own (rang mtshan gyis grub pa), neither an external or an internal world, even conventionally (Künzang 2007, 707).

Künzang Sönam clarifies Tsongkhapa’s claim that external objects are asserted in the Consequence School by arguing that it is not at all like the assertions of those who come to affirm external objects based on ontological analysis. This is because the Consequence School rejects the kind of realism that is implicated by the acceptance of an analytically determined external world. Rather, external objects are simply accepted (conventionally) in the Consequence School in accord with the ways of the world, without (ontological) analysis (Künzang 2007, 707).

There is a subtle distinction to be made here that can easily be overlooked. One might think that since the external world is affirmed in the Consequence School, then it is one that accepts external realism. Perhaps some in the Geluk tradition may fall into this camp, but this need not be the case when the affirmation of an external world is understood as an assertion that is made from her own perspective as to the status of an external world in reality. Rather, it is simply a claim that conforms to intersubjective agreement determined by mundane convention. In any case, ultimately there is no external world for the Consequence School, so while they may not be idealists, they are certainly not external realists, either. That is, proponents of the Consequence School are not external realists despite claiming the reality of an external world because they acknowledge that the external world does not stand on its own, even conventionally; like minds and objects, an external world rises and falls together with an internal world.

3. Unique Assertions of the Consequence School

While the “foundational consciousness” (kun gzhi rnam shes) and self-awareness (rang rig) are keystones for idealist systems of Buddhist philosophy to get beyond what is merely conventional, the Consequence School does not follow suit. In fact, foundationalists and idealists that deny the reality of an external world are targets of the Consequence School. The Consequence School squarely rejects idealism. It does not assent to any independent means to verify the claims of idealism (or physicalism for that matter). Rather than denying an external world, external objects are acknowledged to exist as long as internal minds are counterposed with them. Thus, neither objects nor minds have a privileged status in this tradition.

Self-awareness (rang rig), as distinct from object-awareness (gzhan rig), ascribes to the mental a unique way that a mind knows itself, a way that is different from the way a mind knows any other object. Geluk scholars deny any special status to self-awareness; the mind is simply a dependently arisen phenomenon, just like any other one. Moreover, nothing appears the way it really is to an ordinary being (Jamyang Zhepa in Hopkins 2003, 930). For this reason, this philosophy does not partake in ordinary phenomenology. Instead, it is primarily concerned with critical ontology, or what we could call a form of “ontological deflationism,” in that it aims to undermine the foundations of the entire ontological project (MacKenzie 2008, 197). 

In the Geluk tradition, self-awareness is rejected as a notion that attributes to the mind a special status as an independently existent entity, and this idea is seen as one that hypostasizes the mind. One reason for this is that a unique, first-personal access to self-awareness, being simply given in experience, presumes that there are grounds for immediate access to truth, and nothing has that status for Tsongkhapa. For his Geluk tradition, conventional truths are always mediated and contingent. Geluk scholars argue that self-awareness, understood as a form of epistemologically primary, private knowledge, is not necessary to account for mind and memory. They do not entertain the notion of self-awareness understood phenomenologically either, as some sort of nonthetic, intransitive cognition, as this concept is seen as simply another reification.  Moreover, such a notion offers no explanatory power in the realms of either the conventional or ultimate truth. 

Not only does Tsongkhapa deny the existence of self-awareness, but also the notion of a “foundational consciousness” separate from mental consciousness. The foundational consciousness is another Buddhist concept that often serves as a substrate for the self, one that reifies personal identity. The notion of the foundational consciousness is an attempt for Buddhists to account for personal causality without affirming a real self. Tsongkhapa dispenses with this notion of a substrate consciousness and sees it as simply another reification, another conceptually constructed essence that masquerades as the primary reality of the self. Instead of a foundational consciousness, Tsongkhapa posits “the entity of disintegration” (zhig pa’i dngos po) to account for causality (Hopkins 2003, 934–35). The “entity of disintegration” is his attempt to offer a coherent causal process in the absence of real entities.

The impetus for the theory of the entity of disintegration, or so it seems, is to provide an account for causality in the absence of foundations. That is, disintegration is said to function like other entities in the absence of real entities. With no real entities, an entity’s disintegration—which is typically held within Buddhist philosophical systems to be a non-entity—is thus attributed with the same status as an efficacious entity (nominal). That is, both an entity and its disintegration are nothing more than nominal designations. While injecting disintegration with causal power is an attempt to preserve a nominalist theory of causality, this theory invites other problems, such as the reification of absence (i.e., treating emptiness as a “thing”), which has been a frequent target for critics of the Geluk tradition.

Along with positing the entity of disintegration, among the unique features of the Consequence School are that the foundational consciousness and self-awareness are not only denied ultimate existence, but are held to not exist even conventionally. Conventional truths are always subject to rational analysis; when their conventional status is analyzed, no such self-awareness or foundational consciousness is analytically found, and when analyzed in terms of their ultimate status, they are found to be groundless like every other phenomenon. Tsongkhapa claims that the denial of true existence even conventionally is a unique feature of the Consequence School (Cozort 1998, 60). This is because he holds that the claim to uncover a deeper foundation of conventional existence beyond transactional truth is a back door to essentialist ultimate presuppositions. Thus, not only ultimate foundations, but even conventional foundational theories are repudiated in his Consequence School.

Despite the important role of absence in the Geluk tradition, emptiness—the absence of essence—does not refer to total negation, but refers in particular to the negation of the ultimate status of a phenomenon. That is, conventional phenomena are denied existence ultimately, not conventionally. Significantly, the denial of self, too, does not mean the denial of the “mere self” (bdag tsam), or the conventionally existent self (Jinpa 2002, 71). The mere self (trimmed away of metaphysical baggage or conceptual reification) is unapologetically affirmed by the Geluk tradition. That is, the characteristically Buddhist denial of self is interpreted to refer only to mistaken conceptions of self – such as that of a permanent, singular, or truly existing entity – not the self simpliciter. The mere self, like the mere table or chair (i.e., the table or chair apprehended without the overlay of true existence), is unequivocally claimed to exist. Conventional existence, what undeniably functions within the transactional world, is not negated. Rather, it is reification or true existence that is denied.

The Geluk tradition’s unapologetic affirmation of conventional reality, including the self, is a point of contention with other schools, who argue that their philosophy simply affirms the status quo and thus cannot accommodate a means to revise or transform the world or one’s relation to it. Yet the Geluk tradition holds that it is precisely the denial of essences, which are superimposed on the conventional world or elsewhere, that leads to true transformation and liberation.

4. Buddhist Context of Geluk Philosophy

It is important to recognize how Geluk philosophy is embedded within a distinctively Buddhist soteriology. That is, the truth of no-self is liberating because understanding this is held to free one from the mistaken idea of a self that binds one to suffering. Knowledge of emptiness is key to this emancipatory process, as Tsongkhapa claims, for one must realize the emptiness of the Consequence School, the lack of true essence, to be free from the subtle sense of self and achieve nirvāṇa (Cozort 1998, 316). For the Geluk tradition, there is no higher view than just the emptiness in the Consequence School, and this view is also maintained to be a prerequisite for the esoteric practices of tantra. Tantra is an important part of the path to liberation in the Geluk tradition. It is a path to liberation that is held to involve distinct, esoteric methods, but without diverging from the philosophical view of emptiness, which is indispensible. For this reason, Geluk philosophy is located squarely within the exoteric domain of discourse: the intersubjective spaces of dialogue and debate.

Therefore, rather than overcoming mistaken concepts by circumventing them in a mystical flash of insight or an ecstatic experience of union, the Geluk tradition offers a more sober way to overcome misconceptions, one based on clear, rational analysis. That is, this tradition holds reasoned analysis to be necessary to understand the nature of phenomena (or rather, their lack of nature). This is because an ascertainment of the lack of true existence is held to be necessary to counteract the directly opposed notion – the apprehension of true existence—which is the misinterpretation of reality (as more than simply conventionally existing) that binds one to suffering. To do this, it is not sufficient to simply “let be,” stare into space, or ignore the cause of misinterpretation in some tranquil “nonconceptual” meditation; rather, one must have insight induced by reason that counteracts the habit of holding onto true existence.

Thus, in Geluk philosophy, we can say that meaning is limited to intelligibility. That is, insight into reality is not held to be beyond thought, or attributed to some third category beyond the world that is neither existent nor nonexistent, but is simply insight into a world that is neither (ultimately) existent nor (conventionally) nonexistent. Even though Geluk scholars consent to the fact that emptiness can be perceived nonconceptually—in the rarified case of a highly developed meditation – they maintain that the emptiness that is known nonconceptually is no different from the emptiness that is conceptually known. It is the conceptual ascertainment of emptiness that is the principal element of the Geluk school’s philosophy. Moreover, their emphasis on the practice of insight is not based on an appeal to a direct, unmediated access to what is beyond concepts, but to reason. Reason is also given priority over scriptural authority, which is subjected to the scrutiny of analysis and is adjudicated by reason (Tsongkhapa in Hopkins 1999, 71).

5. Geluk Education

Following Tsongkhapa, the Geluk tradition came to establish large monastic institutions that set the standard for scholastic education in Tibet. The curriculum at Geluk monastic institutions involves five primary topics: metaphysics (abhidharma), epistemology (pramāṇa), negative dialectics (madhyamaka), path structure (Abhisamayālaṃkāra), and ethics (vinaya). Buddhist metaphysics instills the contours of a Buddhist view, including causality, impermanence, and an event-metaphysics that ties these two together. The path structure also plays a central role in traditional Buddhist philosophy: it provides the philosophy with a telos, a narrative arch toward liberation and complete enlightenment. Ethics, too, is integral to this path and to Buddhist philosophy in general, but the most distinctive and interesting features of Geluk philosophy are found in its epistemology, and in particular, negative dialectics. 

Geluk monks who train in philosophy study epistemology early in their careers, and debate is a primary means by which this tradition is internalized and enacted. Buddhist epistemology, as codified in Dharmakīrti’s Commentary on Valid Cognition (Pramāṇavārttika), lays out a systematic presentation of the means of knowledge and the rules for valid inference.  Dharmakīrti’s epistemology can be said to be antirealist or conceptualist, in that he denies that language directly relates to the contents of perception, which are ineffable particulars. Yet to account for the relationship between real particulars and unreal universals, the Geluk tradition develops what has been dubbed a “semi-realist” position, whereby it asserts that there are universals that are real entities in contrast to the anti-realism that denies that universals are entities (Dreyfus 1997, 173). 

Straddling the delicate line between a realist view that affirms the reality of universals and an antirealist one that denies the reality of concepts, a Geluk account of epistemology holds that universals are real, but that they do not exists separately from their particular instances. For instance, the universal “cow” and the particular instances of cow are held to be not utterly distinct, as antirealists would have it, nor are they held to be the same, as a strict realist would claim, but are rather said to be “essentially the same but conceptually distinct” (Dreyfus 1997, 174–78). This relationship – of neither complete identity nor utter difference—is an important part of the way the Geluk account for the relationship between the two truths, as we saw above in their description of the negative dialectics of the Middle Way. In the epistemological context, articulating this relationship is an attempt to account for the efficacy of concepts without giving universals an autonomous existence apart from their instances.   Yet since the Geluk tradition claims that Dharmakīrti’s epistemological project represents an inferior philosophical position, arguably studied for didactic purposes, we need not dwell further on this thorny, scholastic topic. It is the nominalism of what Geluk authors consider their own tradition—the view of the Consequence School of the Middle Way—that is the hallmark of their philosophy.


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