# Optimality-Theoretic and Game-Theoretic Approaches to Implicature

*First published Fri Dec 1, 2006; substantive revision Thu Apr 7, 2022*

Linguistic pragmatics studies the context-dependent use and
interpretation of expressions. Perhaps the most important notion in
pragmatics is Grice’s (1967) *conversational
implicature*. It is based on the insight that by means of general
principles of rational cooperative behavior we can communicate more
with the *use* of a sentence than the *conventional semantic
meaning* associated with it. Grice has argued, for instance, that
the exclusive interpretation of ‘or’—according to
which we infer from ‘John or Mary came’ that John and Mary
didn’t come both—is not due to the semantic meaning of
‘or’ but should be accounted for by a theory of
conversational implicature. In this particular example,—a
typical example of a so-called Quantity implicature—the
hearer’s implication is taken to follow from the fact that the
speaker could have used a contrasting, and informatively stronger
expression, but chose not to. Other implicatures may follow from what
the hearer thinks that the speaker takes to be normal states of
affairs, i.e., stereotypical interpretations. For both types of
implicatures, the hearer’s (pragmatic) interpretation of an
expression involves what he takes to be the speaker’s reason for
using this expression. But obviously, this speaker’s reason must
involve assumptions about the hearer’s reasoning as well.

In this entry we will discuss formal accounts of conversational implicatures that explicitly take into account the interactive reasoning of speaker and hearer (e.g., what speaker and hearer believe about each other, the relevant aspects of the context of utterance etc.) and that aim to reductively explain conversational implicature as the result of goal-oriented, economically optimised language use. For this entry, just as in traditional analyses of implicatures, we will assume that sentences have a pre-existing semantic meaning and will mostly focus on generalised conversational implicatures.

- 1. Bidirectional Optimality Theory
- 2. Implicatures and Game Theory
- 3. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Bidirectional Optimality Theory

### 1.1 Bidirectional OT and Quantity implicatures

Optimality Theory (OT) is a linguistic theory which assumes that
linguistic choices are governed by competition between a set of
candidates, or alternatives. In standard OT (Prince & Smolensky,
1993) the optimal candidate is the one that satisfies best a set of
violable constraints. After its success in phonology, OT has also been
used in syntax, semantics and pragmatics. The original idea of
optimality-theoretic semantics was to model interpretation by taking
the candidates to be the alternative interpretations that the hearer
could assign to a given expression, with constraints describing
general preferences over expression-interpretation pairs. Blutner
(1998, 2000) extended this original version by taking also alternative
expressions, or forms, into account that the speaker could have used,
but did not. The reference to alternative expressions/forms is
standard in pragmatics to account for Quantity implicatures.
Optimization should thus be thought of from two directions: that of
the hearer, and that of the speaker. What is optimal, according to
Blutner’s Bidirectional-OT (Bi-OT), is not just interpretations
with respect to forms, but rather form-interpretation pairs. In terms
of a ‘better than’ relation ‘\(\gt\)’ between
form-interpretation pairs, the pair \(\langle f,i\rangle\) is said to
be **(strongly) optimal** iff it satisfies the following
two conditions:

The first condition requires that \(i\) is an optimal interpretation of form \(f\). In Bi-OT this condition is thought of as optimization from the hearer’s point of view. Blutner proposed that \(\langle f,i'\rangle \gt \langle f,i\rangle\) iff \(i'\) is a more likely, or stereotypical, interpretation of \(f\) than \(i\) is: \(P(i'\mid \llbracket f\rrbracket) \gt P(i\mid \llbracket f \rrbracket)\) (where \(\llbracket f\rrbracket\) denotes the semantic meaning of \(f\), and \(P(B\mid A)\) the conditional probability of \(B\) given \(A\), defined as \(P(A\cap B)/P(A))\). The second condition is taken to involve speaker’s optimization: for \(\langle f,i\rangle\) to be optimal for the speaker, it has to be the case that she cannot use a more optimal form \(f'\) to express \(i. \langle f',i\rangle \gt \langle f,i\rangle\) iff either (i) \(P(i\mid \llbracket f'\rrbracket) \gt P(i\mid \llbracket f\rrbracket)\), or (ii) \(P(i\mid\llbracket f'\rrbracket = P(i\mid\llbracket f\rrbracket)\) and \(f'\) is a less complex form to express \(i\) than \(f\) is.

Bi-OT accounts for classical Quantity implicatures. A convenient
(though controversial) example is the
‘exactly’-interpretation of number terms. Let us assume,
for the sake of example, that number terms semantically have an
‘at
least’-meaning.^{[1]}
Still, we want to account for the intuition that the sentence
“Three children came to the party” is normally interpreted
as saying that *exactly* three children came to the party. One
way to do this is to assume that the alternative expressions that the
speaker could use are of the form “(*At least*) \(n\)
children came to the party”, while the alternative
interpretations for the hearer are of type \(i_n\) meaning that
“*Exactly* \(n\) children came to the
party”.^{[2]}
If we assume, again for the sake of example, that all relevant
interpretations are considered equally likely and that it is already
commonly assumed that some children came, but not more than four, the
strongly optimal form-interpretation pairs can be read off the
following table:

\(P(i\mid \llbracket f\rrbracket)\) | \(i_1\) | \(i_2\) | \(i_3\) | \(i_4\) |

‘one’ | \(\Rightarrow\)¼ | ¼ | ¼ | ¼ |

‘two’ | 0 | \(\Rightarrow ⅓\) | \(⅓\) | \(⅓\) |

‘three’ | 0 | 0 | \(\Rightarrow\) ½ | ½ |

‘four’ | 0 | 0 | 0 | \(\Rightarrow 1\) |

In this table the entry \(P(i_3 \mid
\llbracket\)‘two’\(\rrbracket) = ⅓\) because
\(P(i_3 \mid \{i_2,i_3,i_4\}) = ⅓\). Notice that according to
this reasoning ‘two’ is interpreted as ‘exactly
2’ (as indicated by an arrow) because (i) \(P(i_2 \mid
\llbracket\)‘two’\(\rrbracket) = ⅓\) is higher than
\(P(i_2 \mid \llbracket\)‘\(n \textrm{'} \rrbracket)\) for any
alternative expression ‘\(n\)’, and (ii) all other
interpretations compatible with the semantic meaning of the numeral
expression are *blocked*: there is, for instance, another
expression for which \(i_4\) is a better interpretation, i.e., an
interpretation with a higher conditional probability.

With numeral terms, the semantic meanings of the alternative expressions give rise to a linear order. This turns out to be crucial for the Bi-OT analysis, if we continue to take the interpretations as specific as we have done so far. Consider the following alternative answers to the question “Who came to the party?”:

- John came to the party.
- John or Bill came to the party.

Suppose that John and Bill are the only relevant persons and that it is presupposed that somebody came to the party. In that case the table that illustrates bidirectional optimality reasoning looks as follows (where \(i_x\) is the interpretation that only \(x\) came):

\(P(i\mid \llbracket f\rrbracket)\) | \(i_j\) | \(i_b\) | \(i_{jb}\) |

‘John’ | \(\Rightarrow ½\) | 0 | \(½\) |

‘Bill’ | 0 | \(\Rightarrow ½\) | \(½\) |

‘John and Bill’ | 0 | 0 | \(\Rightarrow 1\) |

‘John or Bill’ | \(⅓\) | \(⅓\) | \(⅓\) |

This table correctly predicts that (1) is interpreted as saying that
*only* John came. But now consider the disjunction (2).
Intuitively, this answer should be interpreted as saying that either
only John, or only Bill came. It is easy to see, however, that this is
predicted only if ‘John came’ and ‘Bill came’
are not taken to be alternative forms. Bi-OT predicts that in case
also ‘John came’ and ‘Bill came’ are taken to
be alternatives, the disjunction is uninterpretable, because the
specific interpretations \(i_j, i_b\), and \(i_{jb}\) all can be
expressed better by other forms. In general, one can see that in case
the semantic meanings of the alternative expressions are not linearly,
but only partially ordered, the derivation of Quantity implicatures
sketched above gives rise to partially wrong predictions.

As it turns out, this problem for Bi-OT seems larger than it really
is. Intuitively, an answer like (2) suggests that the speaker has
incomplete information (she doesn’t know who of John or Bill
came). But the interpretations that we considered so far are world
states that do not encode different amounts of speaker knowledge. So,
to take this into account in Bi-OT (or in any other analysis of
Quantity implicatures) we should allow for alternative interpretations
that represent different knowledge states of the speaker. Aloni (2007)
gives a Bi-OT account of ignorance implicatures (inferences, like the
above, that the speaker lacks certain bits of possibly relevant
information), alongside *indifference implicatures* (that the
speaker does not consider bits of information relevant enough to
convey). Moreover, it can be shown that, as far as ignorance
implicatures are concerned, the predictions of Bi-OT line up with the
pragmatic interpretation function called ‘*Grice*’
in various (joint) papers of Schulz and Van Rooij (e.g., Schulz &
Van Rooij, 2006). In these papers it is claimed that *Grice*
implements the Gricean maxim of Quality and the first maxim of
Quantity, and it is shown that in terms of it (together with an
additional assumption of competence) we can account for many
conversational implicatures, including the ones of (1) and (2).

### 1.2 A Bi-OT analysis of Horn’s division

Bi-OT can also account for *Horn’s division of pragmatic
labor* or *M-implicatures*, as they are alternatively
sometimes called after Levinson (2000). From this division of
pragmatic labor it follows, according to Horn, that while
(morphologically) *unmarked * expressions typically get an
unmarked, or stereotypical interpretation via Grice’s maxim of
Relation, * marked* expressions—being morphologically
complex and less lexicalised—tend to receive a marked,
non-stereotypical, interpretation. Horn (1984) claimed that this
follows from the interaction between both Gricean submaxims of
Quantity, and the maxims of Relation and Manner, and that for the
interpretation of marked expressions it is crucial that an alternative
unmarked expression is available as well. To illustrate, consider the
following well-known example:

- John killed the sheriff.
- John caused the sheriff to die.

We typically interpret the unmarked (3) as meaning stereotypical
killing (on purpose), while the marked (4) suggests that John killed
the sheriff in a more indirect way, maybe unintentionally. Blutner
(1998, 2000) shows that this can be accounted for in Bi-OT. Take
\(i_{st}\) to be the more plausible interpretation where John killed
the sheriff in the stereotypical way, while \(i_{\neg st}\) is the
interpretation where John caused the sheriff’s death in an
unusual way. Because (3) is less complex than (4), and \(i_{st}\) is
the more stereotypical interpretation compatible with the semantic
meaning of (3), it is predicted that (3) is interpreted as \(i_{st}\).
Thus, in terms of his notion of *strong* optimality, i.e.,
optimality for both speaker and hearer, Blutner can account for the
intuition that sentences typically get the most plausible, or
stereotypical, interpretation. In terms of this notion of optimality,
however, Blutner is not able yet to explain how the more complex form
(4) can have an interpretation at all, in particular, why it will be
interpreted as non-stereotypical killing. The reason is that on the
assumption that (4) has the same semantic meaning as (3), the
stereotypical interpretation would be hearer-optimal not only for (3),
but also for (4).

To account for the intuition that (4) is interpreted in a
non-stereotypical way, Blutner (2000) introduces a weaker notion of
optimality that also takes into account a notion of *blocking*:
one form’s pragmatically assigned meaning can take away, so to
speak, that meaning from another, less favorable form. In the present
case, the stereotypical interpretation is intuitively blocked for the
cumbersome form (4) by the cheaper alternative expression (3).
Formally, a form-interpretation pair \(\langle f,i\rangle\) is
**weakly
optimal**^{[3]}
iff there is neither a strongly optimal \(\langle f,i'\rangle\) such
that \(\langle f,i'\rangle \gt \langle f,i\rangle\) nor a strongly
optimal \(\langle f',i\rangle\) such that \(\langle f',i\rangle \gt
\langle f,i\rangle\). All form-interpretation pairs that are strongly
optimal are also weakly optimal. However, a pair that is not strongly
optimal like \(\langle\)(4),\(i_{\neg st}\rangle\) can still be weakly
optimal: since neither \(\langle\)(4),\(i_{st}\rangle\) nor
\(\langle\)(3),\(i_{\neg st}\rangle\) is strongly optimal, there is no
objection for \(\langle\)(4),\(i_{\neg st}\rangle\) to be a (weakly)
optimal pair. As a result, the marked (4) will get the
non-stereotypical interpretation. In general, application of the above
definition of weak optimality can be difficult, but Jäger (2002)
gives a concise algorithm for computing weakly optimal
form-interpretation pairs.

## 2. Implicatures and Game Theory

The first to systematically explore the use of game theory for an
account of communication as *strategic inference* was Prashant
Parikh in his 1988 dissertation (Parikh 1988). Parikh’s theory
is based on what he calls *games of partial information*,
revolves around the game-theoretic solution concept of
*Pareto-optimal Nash equilibrium* and has been refined and
applied to various phenomena, including but not restricted to
implicature-strengthened utterance meaning, in a series of articles
and monographs (e.g., Parikh 1991, 1992, 2000, 2001, 2010, 2019).
Another noteworthy early contribution is the work of Asher, Sher, and
Williams (2001), which tries to rationalize Grice’s Maxims of
Conversation using ideas from game theory. In the following we focus
on approaches to implicatures based on so-called iterative reasoning
in signaling games. The relation between optimality theory and game
theory is explored by Dekker and van Rooij (2000) and Franke and
Jäger (2012). Stevens and Benz (2018) give another insightful
overview of game-theoretic pragmatics.

### 2.1 Signaling games

David Lewis (1969) introduced signaling games to explain how messages can be used to communicate something, although these messages do not have a pre-existing meaning. In pragmatics we want to do something similar: explain what is actually communicated by an expression whose actual interpretation is underspecified by its conventional semantic meaning. To account for pragmatic inferences in game theory, Parikh (1991, 1992) introduced games of partial information. These games are much like Lewis’s original signalling games, except that messages are taken to have a conventional semantic meaning, and speakers are assumed to say only messages that are true. In the interest of a broad overview, we gloss over interesting but subtle differences between Lewis' signaling games and Parikh's games of partial information.

A signaling game, then, is a game of asymmetric information between a
sender \(s\) and a receiver \(r\). The sender observes the state \(t\)
that \(s\) and \(r\) are in, while the receiver has to perform an
action. Sender \(s\) can try to influence the action taken by \(r\) by
sending a message. \(T\) is the set of states, \(F\) the set of forms,
or messages. The messages already have a semantic meaning, given by
the semantic interpretation function \(\llbracket \cdot \rrbracket\)
which assigns to each form a subset of \(T\). The sender will send a
message/form in each state, a *sender strategy* \(S\) is thus a
function from \(T\) to \(F\). The receiver will perform an action
after hearing a message with a particular semantic meaning, but for
present purposes we can think of actions simply as interpretations. A
*receiver strategy* \(R\) is then a function that maps a
message to an interpretation, i.e., a subset of \(T\). A *utility
function* for speaker and hearer represents what interlocutors
care about, and so the utility function models what speaker and hearer
consider to be relevant information (implementing Grice’s Maxim
of Relevance). For simplicity, it is normally assumed that the utility
functions of \(s\) and \(r (U_s\) and \(U_r)\) are the same
(implementing Grice’s cooperative principle), and that they
depend on (i) the actual state \(t\), (ii) the receiver’s
interpretation, \(i\), of the message \(f\) sent by \(s\) in \(t\)
according to their respective strategies \(R\) and \(S\), i.e., \(i =
R(S(t))\), and (iii) (in section 2.3) the form \(f = S(t)\) used by
the sender. Nature is taken to pick the state according to some
(commonly known) probability distribution \(P\) over \(T\). With
respect to this probability function, the expected, or average,
utility of each sender-receiver strategy combination \(\langle
S,R\rangle\) for player \(e \in \{s,r\}\) can be determined as
follows:

A signaling game is taken to be a (simplified, abstract) model of a single utterance and its interpretation, which includes some of the arguably most relevant features of a context for pragmatic reasoning: an asymmetry of information (speaker knows the world state, hearer does not), a notion of utterance alternatives (in the set of messages/forms) with associated semantic meaning, and a flexible representation of what counts as relevant information (via utility functions). If this is not enough, e.g., if we want the listener to have partial information not shared by the speaker as well (such as when the speaker is uncertain about what is really relevant for the listener), that can easily be accommodated into a more complex game model, but we refrain from going more complex here. The strategies of sender and receiver encode particular ways of using and interpreting language. The notion of expected utility evaluates how good ways of using and interpreting language are (in the given context). Game-theoretic explanations of pragmatic phenomena aim to single out those sender-receiver strategy pairs that correspond to empirically attested behavior as optimal and/or rational solution of the game problem.

The standard solution concept of game theory is *Nash
equilibrium*. A Nash equilibrium of a signaling game is a pair of
strategies \(\langle\)*S\(^*\)*,*R\(^*\)*\(\rangle\)
which has the property that neither the sender nor the receiver could
increase his or her expected utility by unilateral deviation. Thus,
*S\(^*\)* is a best response to *R\(^*\)* and
*R\(^*\)* is a best response to *S\(^*\)*. There are
plenty of refinements of Nash equilibrium in the game-theoretic
literature. Moreover, there are alternatives to equilibrium analyses,
the two most prominent of which are: (i) explicit formalizations of
agents’ reasoning processes, such as is done in epistemic game
theory (e.g., Perea 2012), and (ii) variants of evolutionary game
theory (e.g., Sandholm 2010) that study the dynamic changes in
agents’ behavioral disposition under gradual optimization
procedures, such as by imitation or learning from parents. These
issues are relevant for applications to linguistic pragmatics as well,
as we will demonstrate presently with the example of
M-implicatures/Horn’s division of pragmatic labor.

### 2.2 A game-theoretic explanation of Horn’s division

Parikh (1988, 1991, 1992) proposed the use of game theory to account for disambiguation and implicature. As it turns out, the same proposal can be used to account for Horn’s division of pragmatic labour as well. Parikh assumes that a message, or form, \(f_u\), is semantically ambiguous, and can have a stereotypical interpretation, \(t_{st}\), and a non-stereotypical interpretation \(t_{\neg st}\), with \(P(t_{st}) \gt P(t_{\neg st})\). Both meanings, however, could be expressed unambiguously as well by a more complex form. Interpretation \(t_{\neg st}\), for instance, can be expressed not only by \(f_u\), but by form \(f_m\) as well that literally expresses it. As is usual in so-called costly signalling games, and also consistent with Parikh’s proposal, the sender’s utility function can be decomposed into a benefit and a cost function, \(U_s (t,f,i) = B_s (t,i) - C(f)\), where \(i\) is an interpretation. We adopt the following benefit function: \(B_s (t,i) = 1\) if \(i = t\), and \(B_s (t,i) = 0\) otherwise. The cost of the ambiguous message \(f_u\) is lower than the cost of the unambiguous message \(f_m\). We can assume without loss of generality that \(C(f_u) = 0 \lt C(f_m)\). In the use of signalling games for the analysis of human communication it is standard to assume that it is always better to have successful communication with a costly message than unsuccessful communication with a cheap message, which means that \(C(f_m)\), though greater than \(C(f_u)\), must remain reasonably small. If we limit ourselves to a game with 2 states, \(t_{st}\) and \(t_{\neg st}\), and three messages, \(f_u\) and the two forms that literally express the two states, and think of sender and receiver strategies as before, the combination of sender and receiver strategies that gives rise to the bijective mapping \(\{\langle t_{st},f_u\rangle , \langle t_{\neg st},f_m\rangle \}\) is a Nash equilibrium of this game. Intuitively, this is also the correct solution of the disambiguation game, because the ambiguous message \(f_u\) expresses the stereotypical interpretation \(t_{st}\), while the non-stereotypical state \(t_{\neg st}\) is expressed by the marked and costlier message \(f_m\). Unfortunately, also the mapping \(\{\langle t_{st},f_m\rangle , \langle t_{\neg st},f_u\rangle \}\)—where the lighter message denotes the non-stereotypical situation—is a Nash equilibrium of the game, which means that on the present implementation the standard solution concept of game theory cannot yet single out the desired outcome.

This is were considerations of equilibrium refinements and/or
alternative solution concepts come in. Parikh (1988, 1991, 1992)
observes that of the two equilibria mentioned above, the first one
Pareto-dominates the second—being the unique Pareto-Nash
equilibrium—and that for this reason the former should be
preferred. Van Rooij (2004) suggests that because Horn’s
division of pragmatic labor involves not only language use but also
language organization, one should look at signaling games from an
evolutionary point of view, and make use of those variants of
evolutionary game theory that explain the emergence of Pareto-optimal
solutions. As a third alternative, following some ideas of De Jaegher
(2008), van Rooij (2008) proposes that one could also make use of
forward induction (a particular game-theoretic way of reasoning about
surprising moves of the opponent) to single out the desired
equilibrium. As an example of an approach that draws on detailed
modelling of the epistemic states of interlocutors, Franke (2014a)
suggests that we should distinguish cases of M-implicature that
involve rather clear *ad hoc* reasoning, such as (5) and (6),
from cases with a possibly more grammaticalized contrast, such as
between (3) and (4).

- Mrs T sang ‘Home Sweet Home’.
- Mrs T produces a series of sounds roughly corresponding to the score of ‘Home Sweet Home’.

Franke suggests that the game model for reasoning about (5) and (6) should contain an element of asymmetry of alternatives: whereas it is reasonable (for a speaker to expect that) a listener would consider (5) to be an alternative utterance when hearing (6), it is quite implausible that (a speaker believes that) a listener will consider (6) a potential alternative utterance when hearing (5). This asymmetry of alternatives translates into different beliefs that the listener will have about the context after different messages. The speaker can anticipate this, and a listener who has actually observed (6) can reason about his own counterfactual context representation that he would have had if the speaker had said (5) instead. Franke shows that, when paired with this asymmetry in context representation, a simple model of iterated best response reasoning, to which we turn next, gives the desired result as well.

### 2.3 Quantity implicatures and iterated reasoning

Unlike the case of M-implicatures, many Quantity implicatures hinge on the fact that alternative expressions differ with respect to logical strength: the inference from ‘three’ to the pragmatically strengthed ‘exactly three’-reading, that we sketched in Section 1.1, draws on the fact that the alternative expression ‘four’ is semantically stronger, i.e., ‘four’ semantically entails ‘three’, but not the other way around, under the assumed ‘at least’-semantics. In order to bring considerations of semantic strength to bear on game-theoretic pragmatics, we must assign conventional meaning some role in either the game model or the solution concept. In the following, we look at two similar, but distinct possibilities of treating semantic meaning in approaches that spell out pragmatic reasoning as chains of (higher-order) reasoning about interlocutors’ rationality.

A straightforward and efficient way of bringing semantic meaning into
game-theoretic pragmatics is to simply restrict the set of viable
strategies of sender and receiver in a signaling game to those
strategies that conform to conventional meaning: a sender can only
select forms that are true of the actual state, and the receiver can
only select interpretations which are in the denotation of an observed
message. This may seem crude and excludes cases of non-literal
language use, lying, cheating and error from the start, but it may
serve to rationalize common patterns of pragmatic reasoning among
cooperative, information-seeking interlocutors. Based on such a
restriction to truth-obedient strategies, it has been shown
independently by Pavan (2013) and Rothschild (2013) that there is an
established non-equilibrium solution concept that nicely rationalizes
Quantity implicatures, namely *iterated admissibility*, also
known as *iterated elimination of weakly dominated strategies*.
Without going into detail, the general idea of this solution concept
is to start with the whole set of viable strategies (all conforming to
semantic meaning) and then to iteratively eliminate all strategies
\(X\) for which there is no *cautious belief* about which of
the opponent’s remaining strategies the opponent will likely
play that would make \(X\) a rational thing to do. (A cautious belief
is one that does not exclude any opponent strategy that has not been
eliminated so far.) The set of strategies that survive repeated
iterations of elimination are then compatible with (a particular kind
of) common belief in rationality. In sum, iterated admissibility is an
eliminative approach: starting from the set of all (truth-abiding)
strategies, some strategies are weeded out at every step until we
remain with a stable set of strategies from which nothing can be
eliminated anymore.

An alternative to restricting attention to only truthful strategies is
to use semantic meaning to constrain the starting point of pragmatic
reasoning. Approaches that do so are the *optimal assertions
approach* (Benz 2006, Benz & van Rooij 2007), *iterated
best response models* (e.g., Franke 2009, 2011, Jäger 2014),
and related *probabilistic models* (e.g., Frank & Goodman
2012, Goodman & Stuhlmüller 2013, Franke & Jäger
2014). The general idea that unifies these approaches can be traced
directly to Grice, in particular the notion that speakers should
maximize the amount of relevant information contained in their
utterances. Since information contained in an utterance is standardly
taken to be semantic information (as opposed to pragmatically
restricted or modulated meaning), a simple way of implementing Gricean
speakers is to assume that they choose utterances by considering how a
literal interpreter would react to each alternative. Pragmatic
listeners then react optimally based on the belief that the speaker is
Gricean in the above sense. In other words, these approaches define a
sequence of Theory-of-Mind reasoning: starting with a (non-rational,
dummy) literal interpreter, a Gricean speaker acts (approximately)
rationally based on literal interpretation, while a Gricean listener
interprets (approximately) rationally based on the behavior of a
Gricean speaker. Some contributions allow for further iterations of
best responses, others do not; some contributions also look at
reasoning sequences that start with literal senders; some
contributions assume that agents are strictly rational, others allow
for probabilistic approximations to classical rational choice (see
Franke & Jäger 2014 for overview and comparison).

A crucial difference between iterated best response approaches and the previously mentioned approach based on iterated admissibility is that the former does not shrink a set of strategies but allows for a different set of best responses at each step. This also makes it so that (some) iterated best response approaches can deal with pragmatic reasoning in cases where interlocutors’ preferences are not aligned, i.e., where the Gricean assumption of cooperativity does not hold, or where there are additional incentives to deviate from semantic meaning (for more about game models for reasoning in non-cooperative contexts, see, e.g., Franke, de Jager & van Rooij 2012, de Jaegher & van Rooij 2014, Franke & van Rooij 2015). Another difference between iterated best response models and iterated admissibility is that the latter do not by itself account for Horn’s division of pragmatic labor (see Franke 2014b and Pavan 2014 for discussion).

To illustrate how iterated best response reasoning works in a simple (cooperative) case, let us look briefly at numerical expressions again. Take a signaling game with 4 states, or worlds, \(W = \{w_1, w_2, w_3, w_4\}\) where the indices give the exact/maximal number of children that came to our party, and four messages \(F = \{\)‘one’,‘two’,‘three’, ‘four’\(\}\), as shorthand for ‘\(n\) children came to our party’. On a neo-Gricean ‘at least’-interpretation of numerals, the meanings of the numeral expressions form an implication chain:

\[ \llbracket `\text{four}\rsquo \rrbracket \subset \llbracket `\text{three}\rsquo \rrbracket \subset \llbracket `\text{two}\rsquo \rrbracket \subset \llbracket `\text{one}\rsquo \rrbracket, \]because, for instance, \(\llbracket\)‘three’\(\rrbracket = \{w_3, w_4\}\). A literal interpreter, who is otherwise oblivious to contextual factors, would respond to every message by choosing any true interpretation with equal probability. So, for instance, if the literal interpreter hears ‘three’, he would choose \(w_3\) or \(w_4\), each with probability \(½\). But that means that an optimal choice of expression for a speaker who wants to communicate that the actual world is \(w_3\) would be ‘three’, because this maximizes the chance that the literal interpreter selects \(w_3\). Concretely, if the speaker chooses ‘one’, the chance that the literal listener chooses \(w_3\) is ¼; for ‘two’ it’s ⅓; for ‘three’ it’s \(½\), and for ‘four’ it’s zero, because \(w_3\) is not an element of \(\llbracket\)‘three’\(\rrbracket\). So, a rational Gricean speaker selects \(\llbracket\)‘three’\(\rrbracket\) in \(w_3\) and nowhere else, as is easy to see by a parallel argument for all other states. But that means that a Gricean interpreter who hears ‘three’ will infer that the actual world must be \(w_3\).

In recent years, a few promising extensions of this pragmatic reasoning scheme have been proposed. One is to include probabilistic choice functions to model agents’ approximately rational choices, so as to allow for a much more direct link with experimental data (for overview see Franke & Jäger 2016, Goodman & Frank 2016). Such probabilistic pragmatic models have been applied to a number of phenomena of interest, including reasoning about referential expressions in context (Frank & Goodman 2012), ignorance implicatures (Goodman & Stuhlmüller 2013), context effects on scalar implicatures (Degen et al. 2015), non-literal interpretation of number terms (Kao et al. 2014), pragmatic meaning modulation associated with particular intonation (Bergen & Goodman 2015, Stevens 2016), and Quantity implicatures in complex sentences (Bergen et al. 2016, Potts et al. 2016). These models of pragmatic reasoning have furthermore been used successfully also in natural language processing applications (Andreas & Klein 2016, Monroe et al. 2017) and other areas of linguistic research, such as sociolinguistics (Burnett 2019). Another recent approach is to allow for uncertainty of the semantic meanings of the involved expressions, and for uncertainty of the beliefs and preferences of the participants of thee conversation and of other aspects of the ‘common ground’ (e.g., Brochhagen 2017). Finally, in recent work more pragmatic phenomena are accounted for than just generalised conversational implicatures, such as particular conversational implicature, explicatures or free enrichment (e.g., Parikh 2010), the analysis of presupposition (Qing et al. 2016), and politeness (e.g. Clark 2012, Yoon et al. 2020).

## 3. Conclusion

Bidirectional Optimality Theory and Game Theory are quite natural, and similar, frameworks to formalize Gricean ideas about interactive, goal-oriented pragmatic reasoning in context. Recent developments turn towards epistemic or evolutionary game theory or to probabilistic models for empirical data. Finally, we remark that formal techniques similar to what is explored here are applicable to a wider range of problems in diverse areas, such as philosophy (e.g., Parikh 2019), language evolution (e.g., Ahern and Clark 2014; Brochhagen, Franke, and Rooij 2018; Carcassi 2020), as well as computational linguistics (e.g. Vogel et al. 2014, Cohn-Gordon, Goodman, and Potts 2019).

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## Other Internet Resources

- Probabilistic language understanding: An introduction to the Rational Speech Act framework, an interactive web-book, by Gregory Scontras, Michael Henry Tessler and Michael Franke, which introduces probabilistic pragmatic reasoning models.