Supplement to Infinity

Al-Ghazālī’s Objection

Some precursors to Galileo thought that there is a straightforward contradiction in the idea that there could be denumerable physical infinities. For example, five hundred years earlier, al-Ghazālī argued as follows. Suppose that past time is infinite, and that the solar system has persisted in its current state throughout that infinite time. Then Jupiter and the Earth have made infinitely many rotations of the sun, even though, for every rotation of the sun that Jupiter makes, the Earth makes thirteen rotations. However, al-Ghazālī continues, it is a contradiction to suppose both that Jupiter and the Earth have made the same number of rotations of the sun and that the Earth has made thirteen times as many rotations of the sun as Jupiter has made. While al-Ghazālī’s main target is the claim that the past is infinite, his argument is easily adapted against any denumerable physical infinity. (Note that we have updated the cosmology of al-Ghazālī’s argument.)

Is it a contradiction to suppose both that

  1. Jupiter and the Earth have made the same number of rotations of the sun,

and that

  1. the Earth has made thirteen times as many rotations of the sun as Jupiter has made?

That depends upon the interpretation given to ‘makes the same number of rotations as’ in these two claims. In the infinite case, there is one-to-one correspondence between the rotations of the Earth around the sun and the rotations of Jupiter around the sun: this is what justifies the claim that the cardinality of the rotations of the Earth is the same as the cardinality of the rotations of Jupiter. Given that \(n \times \aleph_0 = \aleph_0\), one might say that, for any n, the number of rotations of the Earth around the sun is n times the number of rotations of Jupiter around the sun; and, equally, for any n, the number of rotations of Jupiter around the sun is n times the number of rotations of the Earth around the sun. But, if this is what one says, then there is no contradiction between (a) and (b): indeed, in the infinite case, the number of rotations that the Earth makes around the sun is thirteen times the number of rotations that the Earth makes around the sun! (Compare: the number of unicorns is thirteen times the number of unicorns. It comes as no surprise that \(13 \times 0 = 0.\) It comes as more of a surprise that \(\aleph_0\) shares this ‘absorption’ property with 0, but it’s still true.)

Something else is true about the case that al-Ghazālī presents: the limit, as \(t\) tends to infinity, of the cardinal number of rotations made by the Earth in period \(t\) divided by the cardinal number of rotations made by Jupiter in period \(t\), is thirteen. Since, in the limit, the Earth makes thirteen times as many rotations as Jupiter, there is a perfectly good sense, in the case that al-Ghazālī presents, in which the Earth does make thirteen times as many rotations as Jupiter. But, it is not true that, in the limit, the Earth makes the same number of rotations as Jupiter. If we interpret (a) and (b) in this sense, then it is true that they are contradictory, but it is also obvious that only (b) is true, and the contradiction puts no pressure at all on the claim that there could be denumerable physical infinities.

Finally, if we understand (a) to be the claim that the cardinality of the rotations of the Earth is the same as the cardinality of the rotations of Jupiter, and (b) to be the claim that, in the limit, the Earth makes thirteen times as many rotations as Jupiter, then there is no contradiction between these two claims. Understood this way, ‘makes the same number of rotations as’ is simply understood differently in the two claims, and there is no worry that the two claims are in conflict.

Nothing in this discussion should be taken to suggest that it was silly for al-Ghazālī to argue as he did. It has been a long, slow march to understand the nature of infinity.

Copyright © 2021 by
Graham Oppy <Graham.Oppy@monash.edu>
Alan Hájek <alan.hajek@anu.edu.au>
Kenny Easwaran <easwaran@tamu.edu>
Paolo Mancosu <mancosu@socrates.Berkeley.EDU>

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