First published Thu Aug 7, 2003; substantive revision Tue Feb 7, 2023

In philosophy, intentionality is the power of minds and mental states to be about, to represent, or to stand for, things, properties and states of affairs. To say of an individual’s mental states that they have intentionality is to say that they are mental representations or that they have contents. Furthermore, to the extent that a speaker utters words from some natural language or draws pictures or symbols from a formal language for the purpose of conveying to others the contents of her mental states, these artifacts used by a speaker too have contents or intentionality. ‘Intentionality’ is a philosopher’s word: ever since the idea, if not the word itself, was introduced into philosophy by Franz Brentano in the last quarter of the nineteenth century, it has been used to refer to the puzzles of representation, all of which lie at the interface between the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of language. A picture of a dog, a proper name (e.g., ‘Fido’), the common noun ‘dog’ or the concept expressed by the word can mean, represent, or stand for, one or several hairy barking creatures. A complete thought, a full sentence or a picture can stand for or describe a state of affairs. How could some of the represented things (e.g., dinosaurs) be arbitrarily remote in space and time from the representation (e.g., a human thought or utterance about dinosaurs tokened in 2018), while others (e.g., numbers) may not even be in space and time at all? How could some representations (e.g., direct quotations such as ‘dinosaur’) even stand for themselves? How does a complex representation (e.g., a complete thought or a full sentence) inherit its meaning or content from the meanings or contents of its constituents? How should one construe the relationship between the iconic content of pictorial representations and the conceptual content of proposition-like representations (thoughts and utterances)? How should one understand the relation between the content of an individual’s mental state and the meanings of external symbols used by the individual to express her internal mental states? Are representations of the world part of the world they represent? Do all of an individual’s mental states have intentionality or only some of them? The entry falls into ten sections:

1. Why is intentionality so-called?

Contemporary discussions of the nature of intentionality are an integral part of discussions of the nature of minds: what are minds and what is it to have a mind? They arise in the context of ontological and metaphysical questions about the fundamental nature of mental states: states such as perceiving, remembering, believing, desiring, hoping, knowing, intending, feeling, experiencing, and so on. What is it to have such mental states? How does the mental relate to the physical, i.e., how are mental states related to an individual’s body, to states of his or her brain, to his or her behavior and to states of affairs in the world?

Why is intentionality so-called? For reasons soon to be explained, in its philosophical usage, the meaning of the word ‘intentionality’ should not be confused with the ordinary meaning of the word ‘intention.’ As indicated by the meaning of the Latin word tendere, which is the etymology of ‘intentionality,’ the relevant idea behind intentionality is that of mental directedness towards (or attending to) objects, as if the mind were construed as a mental bow whose arrows could be properly aimed at different targets. In medieval logic and philosophy, the Latin word intentio was used for what contemporary philosophers and logicians nowadays call a ‘concept’ or an ‘intension’: something that can be both true of non-mental things and properties—things and properties lying outside the mind—and present to the mind. On the assumption that a concept is itself something mental, an intentio may also be true of mental things. For example, the concept of a dog, which is a first-level intentio, applies to individual dogs or to the property of being a dog. It also falls under various higher-level concepts that apply to it, such as being a concept, being mental, etc. If so, then while the first-level concept is true of non-mental things, the higher-level concepts may be true of something mental. Notice that on this way of thinking, concepts that are true of mental things are presumably logically more complex than concepts that are true of non-mental things.

Although the meaning of the word ‘intentionality’ in contemporary philosophy is related to the meanings of such words as ‘intension’ (or ‘intensionality’ with an s) and ‘intention,’ nonetheless it ought not to be confused with either of them. On the one hand, in contemporary English, ‘intensional’ and ‘intensionality’ mean ‘non-extensional’ and ‘non-extensionality,’ where both extensionality and intensionality are logical features of words and sentences. For example, ‘creature with a heart’ and ‘creature with a kidney’ have the same extension because they are true of the same individuals: all the creatures with a kidney are creatures with a heart. But the two expressions have different intensions because the word ‘heart’ does not have the same extension, let alone the same meaning, as the word ‘kidney.’ On the other hand, intention and intending are specific states of mind that, unlike beliefs, judgments, hopes, desires or fears, play a distinctive role in the etiology of actions. By contrast, intentionality is a pervasive feature of many different mental states: beliefs, hopes, judgments, intentions, love and hatred all exhibit intentionality. In fact, Brentano held that intentionality is the hallmark of the mental: much of twentieth century philosophy of mind has been shaped by what, in this entry, will be referred to as “Brentano’s third thesis.”

Furthermore, it is worthwhile to distinguish between levels of intentionality. Many of an individual’s psychological states with intentionality (e.g., beliefs) are about (or represent) non-mental things, properties and states of affairs. Many are also about another’s psychological states (e.g., another’s beliefs). Beliefs about others’ beliefs display what is known as ‘higher-order intentionality.’ Since the seminal (1978) paper by primatologists David Premack and Guy Woodruff entitled “Does the chimpanzee have a theory of mind?”, under the heading ‘theory of mind,’ much empirical research of the past thirty years has been devoted to the psychological questions whether non-human primates can ascribe psychological states with intentionality to others and how human children develop their capacity to ascribe to others psychological states with intentionality (cf. the comments by philosophers Jonathan Bennett, Daniel Dennett and Gilbert Harman to Premack and Woodruff’s paper and the SEP entry folk psychology: as a theory).

The concept of intentionality has played a central role both in the tradition of analytic philosophy and in the phenomenological tradition. As we shall see, some philosophers go so far as claiming that intentionality is characteristic of all mental states. Brentano’s characterization of intentionality is quite complex. At the heart of it is Brentano’s notion of the ‘intentional inexistence of an object,’ which is analyzed in the next section.

2. Intentional inexistence

Contemporary discussions of the nature of intentionality were launched and many of them were anticipated by Franz Brentano (1874, 88–89) in his book, Psychology From an Empirical Standpoint, from which I quote two famous paragraphs:

Every mental phenomenon is characterized by what the Scholastics of the Middle Ages called the intentional (or mental) inexistence of an object, and what we might call, though not wholly unambiguously, reference to a content, direction toward an object (which is not to be understood here as meaning a thing), or immanent objectivity. Every mental phenomenon includes something as object within itself, although they do not do so in the same way. In presentation, something is presented, in judgment something is affirmed or denied, in love loved, in hate hated, in desire desired and so on.

This intentional inexistence is characteristic exclusively of mental phenomena. No physical phenomenon exhibits anything like it. We can, therefore, define mental phenomena by saying that they are those phenomena which contain an object intentionally within themselves.

As one reads these lines, numerous questions arise: what does Brentano mean when he says that the object towards which the mind directs itself ‘is not to be understood as meaning a thing’? What can it be for a phenomenon (mental or otherwise) to exhibit ‘the intentional inexistence of an object’? What is it for a phenomenon to ‘include something as object within itself’? Do ‘reference to a content’ and ‘direction toward an object’ express two distinct ideas? Or are they two distinct ways of expressing one and the same idea? If intentionality can relate a mind to something that either does not exist or exists wholly within the mind, what sort of relation can it be?

Replete as they are with complex, abstract and controversial ideas, these two short paragraphs have set the agenda for all subsequent philosophical discussions of intentionality in the late nineteenth and the twentieth century. There has been some discussion over the meaning of Brentano’s expression ‘intentional inexistence.’ Did Brentano mean that the objects onto which the mind is directed are internal to the mind itself (in-exist in the mind)? Or did he mean that the mind can be directed onto non-existent objects? Or did he mean both? (See Crane, 1998 for further discussion.)

Some of the leading ideas of the phenomenological tradition can be traced back to this issue. Following the lead of Edmund Husserl (1900, 1913), who was both the founder of phenomenology and a student of Brentano’s, the point of the phenomenological analysis has been to show that the essential property of intentionality of being directed onto something is not contingent upon whether some real physical target exists independently of the intentional act itself. To achieve this goal, two concepts have been central to Husserl’s internalist interpretation of intentionality: the concept of a noema (plural noemata) and the concept of epoche (i.e., bracketing) or phenomenological reduction. By the word ‘noema,’ Husserl refers to the internal structure of mental acts. The phenomenological reduction is meant to help get at the essence of mental acts by suspending all naive presuppositions about the difference between real and fictitious entities (on these complex phenomenological concepts, see the papers by Føllesdal and others conveniently gathered in Dreyfus (1982). For further discussion, see Bell (1990) and Dummett (1993).

In the two paragraphs quoted above, Brentano sketches an entire research programme based on three distinct theses. According to the first thesis, it is constitutive of the phenomenon of intentionality, as it is exhibited by mental states such as loving, hating, desiring, believing, judging, perceiving, hoping and many others, that these mental states are directed towards things different from themselves. According to the second thesis, it is characteristic of the objects towards which the mind is directed by virtue of intentionality that they have the property which Brentano calls intentional inexistence. According to the third thesis, intentionality is the mark of the mental: all and only mental states exhibit intentionality.

Unlike Brentano’s third thesis, Brentano’s first two theses can hardly be divorced from each other. The first thesis can easily be recast so as to be unacceptable unless the second thesis is accepted. Suppose that it is constitutive of the nature of intentionality that one could not exemplify such mental states as loving, hating, desiring, believing, judging, perceiving, hoping, and so on, unless there was something to be loved, hated, desired, believed, judged, perceived, hoped, and so on. If so, then it follows from the very nature of intentionality (as described by the first thesis) that nothing could exhibit intentionality unless there were objects—intentional objects—that satisfied the property Brentano called intentional inexistence.

Now, the full acceptance of Brentano’s first two theses raises a fundamental ontological question in philosophical logic. The question is: are there such intentional objects? Does due recognition of intentionality force us to postulate the ontological category of intentional objects? This question has given rise to a major division within analytic philosophy. The prevailing (or orthodox) response has been a resounding ‘No.’ But an important minority of philosophers, whom I shall call ‘the intentional-object’ theorists, have argued for a positive response to the question. Since intentional objects need not exist, according to intentional-object theorists, there are things that do not exist. According to their critics, there are no such things.

We shall directly examine the intentional-object theorists approach in section 7. Before doing so, in section 3, we shall examine the way singular thoughts about concrete particulars in space and time can be and have been construed as paradigms of genuine intentional relations. On this relational construal, an individual’s ordinary singular thought about a concrete physical particular involves a genuine relation between the individual’s mind and the concrete physical particular. In sections 4–5, we shall examine two puzzles that further arise on the orthodox paradigm. First, we shall deal with the puzzle of how a rational person can believe of an object referred to by one singular term that it instantiates a property and simultaneously disbelieve of the same object referred to by a distinct singular term that it instantiates the same property. Section 4 is devoted to Frege’s solution to this puzzle. In section 5, we shall scrutinize Russell’s solution to the puzzle of true negative existential statements. In section 6, we shall see how the theory of direct reference emerged within the orthodox paradigm out of a critique of both Frege’s notion of sense and Russell’s assumption that most proper names in natural languages are disguised definite descriptions.

3. The relational nature of singular thoughts

Many non-intentional relations hold of concrete particulars in space and time. If and when they do, their relata cannot fail to exist. If Cleopatra kisses Caesar, then both Cleopatra and Caesar must exist. Not so with intentional relations. If Cleopatra loves Caesar, then presumably there is some concrete particular in space and time whom Cleopatra loves. But one may also love Anna Karenina (not a concrete particular in space and time, but a fictitious character). Similarly, the relata of the admiration relation (another intentional relation) are not limited to concrete particulars in space and time. One may admire not only Albert Einstein but also Sherlock Holmes (a fictitious character). As the following passage from the Appendix to the 1911 edition of his 1874 book testifies, this asymmetry between non-intentional and intentional relations puzzled Brentano:

What is characteristic of every mental activity is, as I believe I have shown, the reference to something as an object. In this respect, every mental activity seems to be something relational. […] In other relations both terms—both the fundament and the terminus—are real, but here only the first term—the fundament is real. […] If I take something relative […] something larger or smaller for example, then, if the larger thing exists, the smaller one exists too. […] Something like what is true of relations of similarity and difference holds true for relations of cause and effect. For there to be such a relation, both the thing that causes and the thing that is caused must exist. […] It is entirely different with mental reference. If someone thinks of something, the one who is thinking must certainly exist, but the object of his thinking need not exist at all. In fact, if he is denying something, the existence of the object is precisely what is excluded whenever his denial is correct. So the only thing which is required by mental reference is the person thinking. The terminus of the so-called relation does not need to exist in reality at all. For this reason, one could doubt whether we really are dealing with something relational here, and not, rather, with something somewhat similar to something relational in a certain respect, which might, therefore, better be called “quasi-relational.”

While the orthodox paradigm is clearly consistent with the possibility that general thoughts may involve abstract objects (e.g., numbers) and abstract properties and relations, none of which are in space and time, special problems arise with respect to singular thoughts construed as intentional relations to non-existent or fictitious objects. Two related assumptions lie at the core of the orthodox paradigm. One is the assumption that the mystery of the intentional relation should be elucidated against the background of non-intentional relations. The other is the assumption that intentional relations which seem to involve non-existent (e.g., fictitious) entities should be clarified by reference to intentional relations involving particulars existing in space and time.

The paradigm of the intentional relation that satisfies the orthodox picture is the intentionality of what can be called singular thoughts, namely those true thoughts that are directed towards concrete individuals or particulars that exist in space and time. A singular thought is such that it would not be available—it could not be entertained—unless the concrete individual that is the target of the thought existed. Unlike the propositional contents of general thoughts that involve only abstract universals such as properties and/or relations, the propositional content of a singular thought may involve in addition a relation to a concrete individual or particular. The contrast between ‘singular’ and ‘general’ propositions has been much emphasized by Kaplan (1978, 1989). In a slightly different perspective, Tyler Burge (1977) has characterized singular thoughts as incompletely conceptualized or de re thoughts whose relation to the objects they are about is supplied by the context. On some views, the object of the singular thought is even part of it. On the orthodox view, part of the importance of true singular thoughts for a clarification of intentionality lies in the fact that some true singular thoughts are about concrete perceptible objects. Singular thoughts about concrete perceptible objects may seem simpler and more primitive than either general ones or thoughts about abstract entities.

Consider, for example, what must be the case for belief-ascription (1) to be true:

  1. Ava believes that Lionel Jospin is a Socialist.

Intuitively, the belief ascribed to Ava by (1) has intentionality in the sense that it is of or about Lionel Jospin and the property of being a Socialist. Besides being a belief (i.e., a special attitude different from a wish, a desire, a fear or an intention), the identity of Ava’s belief depends on its propositional content. What Ava believes is identified by the embedded ‘that’-clause that can stand all by itself as in (2):

  1. Lionel Jospin is a Socialist.

On the face of it, an utterance of (2) is true if and only if a given concrete individual does exemplify the property of being a Socialist. Arguably, it is essential to the proposition that Ava believes—the proposition expressed by an utterance of (2)—that it is about Jospin and the property of being a Socialist. Just by virtue of having such a true belief, Ava must therefore stand in relation—the belief relation—to Jospin and the property of being a Socialist. Notice that Ava can have a belief about Jospin and the property of being a Socialist even though she has never seen Jospin in person.

From within the orthodox paradigm, one central piece of the mystery of intentionality can be brought out by reflection on the conditions in which simple singular thoughts about concrete individuals are true. This is the problem of the relational nature of the contents of true singular beliefs. In order to generate this problem, it is not necessary to ascend to false or abstract beliefs about fictional entities. It is enough to consider how a true thought about a concrete individual that exists in space and time can arise. On the one hand, Ava’s belief seems to be a singular belief about a concrete individual. It seems essential to Ava’s belief that it has the propositional content that it has. And it seems essential to the propositional content of Ava’s belief that Ava must stand in relation to somebody else who can be very remote from her in either space or time. On the other hand, Ava’s belief is a state internal to Ava. As John Perry (1994, 187) puts it, beliefs and other so-called ‘propositional attitudes’ seem to be “local mental phenomena.” How can it be essential to an internal state of Ava’s that Ava stands in relation to someone else? How can one reconcile the local and the relational characters of propositional attitudes?

4. How can distinct beliefs be about one and the same object?

The problem of the relational nature of the contents of true singular thoughts can be made more acute by the following puzzle that exercised Gottlob Frege (1892): how can one rationally hold two distinct singular beliefs that are both about one and the same object? As we shall see momentarily, this puzzle is related to a second puzzle: the puzzle of how a statement expressing a belief about identity can both be true and informative. If the belief relation is a genuine relation, then it would seem that it is like kicking: if Jacques Chirac kicked Lionel Jospin and if Lionel Jospin was the French Prime minister in 2001, then Jacques Chirac kicked the French Prime minister in 2001. Not so with belief, as we shall see momentarily. Notice that in ordinary contexts, the word ‘belief’ can be used to denote either a person’s state or the content of that state.

Ever since Frege, it has been standard practice in analytic philosophy to investigate the intentional structure of much human thought by inquiring into the logical structure of the language used by speakers to express it or to ascribe it to others. (See, e.g., Dummett (1973) for a forceful justification.) Suppose that Ava correctly believes that Hesperus is shining as a result of seeing that Hesperus shines. Suppose also that she fails to believe that Phosphorus is shining because, although she correctly believes that Hesperus is called ‘Hesperus,’ she incorrectly believes that ‘Phosphorus’ is the name of a different planet (that she is not currently seeing) and she fails to know that ‘Phosphorus’ is in fact another name for Hesperus. So whereas the first belief report is true, the second belief report is false:

  1. Ava believes that Hesperus is shining.
  2. Ava believes that Phosphorus is shining.

Given that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are just names of the same object, how can Ava believe one thing and disbelieve the other? Given that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ apply to the same object, it would seem that ‘Hesperus is shining’ is true if and only if ‘Phosphorus is shining’ is true and that these two sentences express one and the same proposition. If what is essential to the proposition that Ava believes is that it is about Hesperus and the property of shining, how can she believe one thing and fail to believe the other since both are about Hesperus?

Another related puzzle is the puzzle of how identity statements can both be true and informative. It seems clear that Ava could not doubt that ‘Hesperus is Hesperus’ expresses a truth. But it seems clear that she can—in fact she does—doubt that ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ expresses a truth. In fact, when she learns that ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ does express a truth, she is surprised. How can it be? (See Richard 1990 and Salmon 1986.)

Frege (1892) offered a very influential solution to both puzzles. This common solution is based on his famous distinction between the reference (or Bedeutung) and the sense (or Sinn) of an English proper name. The sense, which is the mode of presentation of the reference, is presumably something abstract that can both be instantiated by a concrete individual and present to, or grasped by, a mind. This distinction is in some ways reminiscent of the distinction between extension and intension and is inconsistent with John Stuart Mill’s (1884) view that proper names have a denotation and no connotation.

The reason (3) and (4) can, on Frege’s view, have different truth-values is that the embedded sentences or ‘that’-clauses in (3) and (4)—namely (5) and (6)—do not express one and the same proposition. They express different propositions (or thoughts). Frege uses the German Gedanke for ‘thought.’

  1. Hesperus is shining.
  2. Phosphorus is shining.

How can (5) and (6) express different propositions? Unlike non-ordinary contexts such as (3) and (4), in which they are part of an embedded ‘that’-clause, in ordinary contexts such as (5) and (6), ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ have the same Bedeutung (or reference). But they have different senses (Sinn) or different modes of presentation of their common reference. On the Fregean view, what is essential to the thought or proposition expressed by an utterance of a sentence containing a singular term is its sense, not its reference. Propositions have senses, not individuals, as constituents. Ava lacks a piece of knowledge. But given that ignorance is not irrationality, Ava can rationally believe that Hesperus is shining and fail to believe that Phosphorus is shining. Similarly, a statement expressing a belief about identity can both be true and informative because the two singular terms that flank the identity sign in an identity statement have both a sense and a reference. The identity statement is true because they have the same reference. It is informative because they have different senses or they present their common reference via different modes of presentation.

On the Fregean view, in (3) and (4), ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ do not have their ordinary reference (or Bedeutung), namely the planet to which they both apply: they have an ‘oblique’ reference. In (3), the oblique reference of ‘Hesperus’ is its ordinary sense. In (4), the oblique reference of ‘Phosphorus’ is its ordinary sense. And we already agreed that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ in (5) and (6) have different ordinary senses. So in (3), ‘Hesperus’ has an ‘oblique’ or ‘indirect’ sense, which is the mode of presentation of the ordinary sense ‘Hesperus’ has in (5). Similarly, in (4) ‘Phosphorus’ has an ‘oblique’ sense, which is the mode of presentation of the ordinary sense ‘Phosphorus’ has in (5). On the Fregean view, a thought or belief can be about a concrete individual (its reference), but what matters to the individuation (or the identity) of the thought’s content is not the reference of the singular term, but the sense or mode of presentation of the reference, i.e., something abstract. For further discussion, see the entry on Gottlob Frege.

5. True negative existential beliefs

When Brentano reflected on the “quasi-relational” nature of the intentionality of thoughts about things that need not exist, he wrote that if one “is denying something, the existence of the object is precisely what is excluded whenever [one’s] denial is correct”. He thus assumed that one can correctly and coherently deny the existence of things that do not exist. To show that one can do so, however, is no easy task. The version of the puzzle that exercised both Alexius Meinong (a disciple of Brentano’s) and Bertrand Russell at the turn of the twentieth century is the puzzle of true negative existential beliefs. How can a person correctly believe that Pegasus does not exist? For a person to correctly believe that Pegasus does not exist, she must have a belief whose content is the same as the content expressed by a true utterance of sentence (7).

  1. Pegasus does not exist.

How can the proposition expressed by an utterance of (7) be both true and about Pegasus? The puzzle arises from the observation that if the proposition is true, then presumably it is not about Pegasus since it says that Pegasus does not exist. Conversely, if it is about Pegasus, then Pegasus must exist. But if so, then it cannot be true since it denies the existence of Pegasus. Thus, the puzzle has the form of a dilemma: either the proposition expressed by (7) is false or it is not about Pegasus. At least, the puzzle is generated by the pair of assumptions that ‘Pegasus’ is a proper name and that proper names must have a reference. Is the first assumption right?

In his 1905 paper, “On denoting,” Russell embraced the view that neither ‘Pegasus’ nor in fact most proper names of natural languages are genuine ‘logical’ proper names. He held the epistemological view that unless one is directly acquainted with something, one cannot use in thought or language a genuine ‘logical’ proper name referring to it. Nor can one entertain a genuine singular thought about it. If one is not directly acquainted with an object, then one must instead form a general thought that is not about any particular individual. In fact, Russell (1911, 1919) held a dual view of acquaintance: on the one hand, he thought that acquaintance is a relation that can only hold between someone’s mind and his or her own sense data. On the other hand, he held the view that one can be acquainted with universals (such as e.g., colors). If most—if not all—names of natural languages are not genuine ‘logical’ names, then what are they and what is their function in human thought and communication? On Russell’s view, they are “disguised” or abbreviated definite descriptions, i.e., they are short for some definite description. Their logical function is that of a definite description.

On the face of it, the grammatical form of the quasi-English sentence ‘the F is G’ indicates that it serves to express a subject-predicate (or singular) proposition true if and only if the object that exemplifies the property expressed by predicate ‘F’ also exemplifies the property expressed by predicate ‘G’. But Russell (1905) designed a method—his famous theory of definite descriptions—for eliminating the English definite article ‘the’ (as in ‘the F’) by means of a logical formula of first-order logic involving only quantifiers and variables. On his analysis, ‘the F is G’ can be paraphrased into the general existentially quantified proposition (8):

  1. x[Fx & ∀y(Fyy=x) & Gx]

(8) is true if and only if there is one and only one individual that is F and G. This proposition will be false just in case nothing or more than one thing is both F and G.

Combined with the assumption that ‘Pegasus’ is not a name but a disguised definite description—that it is short for e.g., ‘the winged horse’—Russell’s theory of definite descriptions thus leads to a solution to the puzzle of true negative existential beliefs. The solution is to accept the second horn of the dilemma: the proposition is not about Pegasus. On this account, one can correctly believe that Pegasus does not exist, since what one believes is what is expressed by an utterance of (7), namely the true proposition that there does not exist a unique individual that is a winged horse. Clearly, Russell’s solution to the puzzle of true negative existential beliefs shows how, in Brentano’s own terms, “if someone thinks of something, the one who is thinking must certainly exist, but the object of his thinking need not exist at all” and furthermore the thought may be true. For further discussion, see the entry on Bertrand Russell.

6. Direct reference

Within the orthodox paradigm in the philosophy of mind and language of the 1960’s and 1970’s, there was an important swing of the pendulum away from the implications of Frege’s and especially Russell’s doctrines for intentionality. The so-called “theory of direct reference” has contributed to rehabilitate the view that concrete individuals matter more to the identity of the singular thoughts that humans entertain than the Frege/Russell doctrines allow. According to Frege’s distinction between sense and reference, what matters to the identity of a thought about a concrete individual is not the individual thought about but the abstract sense by means of which he is thought about. According to Russell, most thoughts that seem prima facie to be about concrete individuals are in fact not singular thoughts but generally quantified propositions. Much of the impetus for the theory of direct reference came from the implications of the semantics of modal logic for the intentionality of singular thoughts and beliefs.

Saul Kripke (1972) noticed an important difference between the behavior of a proper name and the behavior of a coreferential definite description expressing a contingent or non-essential property of its referent, in modal contexts. Consider two sentences (9) and (10), each containing some modal operator like ‘might’ (that expresses a possibility) and such that the former contains a proper name while the latter contains a coreferential definite description:

  1. Jacques Chirac might have been a Socialist.
  2. The president of France elected in 2002 might have a been a Socialist.

The definite description ‘the president of France elected in 2002’ happens to be true of Jacques Chirac of whom it expresses a contingent property. There certainly exists a metaphysically possible world in which either Chirac was not a candidate in the 2002 French presidential elections or he was a candidate but he lost the election.

An utterance of (9) asserts that there exists a possible world in which Jacques Chirac is a member of the Socialist party, which he in fact is not. Given the deep connection between the speech act of assertion and speaker’s belief, an utterance of (9) expresses the counterfactual belief about Chirac that he could have been a Socialist. Unlike an utterance of (9), an utterance of (10) is ambiguous. On one reading, it has the same truth-conditions as does an utterance of (9) and it serves to express the same belief. Alternatively, an utterance of (10) says of someone who is in fact a Socialist, and who therefore is not Chirac, that he could have been elected president in 2002.

Thus, the following contrast emerges. An utterance of (9) can only serve to express a counterfactual belief or thought about Chirac, i.e., the belief ascribing to Chirac the counterfactual property of being a Socialist. An utterance of (10) can serve to express the same belief about Chirac. But it can also serve to express an entirely different counterfactual belief about a different individual, who as a matter of fact happens to be a Socialist. This different counterfactual belief would be true e.g., in a possible world in which Jospin (who is a Socialist) won the 2002 presidential elections.

On the basis of the fact that, unlike (9), (10) can serve to express two distinct counterfactual beliefs, Kripke (1972) hypothesizes that a proper name is what he calls a rigid designator. ‘Jacques Chirac’ in (9) is rigid for in all possible worlds it refers to one and the same concrete individual, i.e., the individual to whom it in fact refers in the actual world. By contrast, the definite description ‘the president of France elected in 2002’, which happens to express a contingent property of Chirac, is not a rigid designator because it does not pick one and the same individual in all possible worlds. When evaluated with respect to different worlds, it is true of different individuals. Of course, some definite descriptions (e.g., ‘the square root of 21’) do express essential properties of what they are true of (in this case, a number). According to Kripke (1980), unlike proper names, whose rigidity is de jure, definite descriptions expressing essential properties of an object are rigid de facto. For further discussion, see the entry on reference.

Arguably, the goal of the theory of direct reference is to emphasize the depth of the gap between the intentionality of singular thoughts and the intentionality of general thoughts. Concrete individuals are not constituents of the contents of the latter. But they are constituents of the contents of the former. Three arguments have been buttressed to dismantle the Russellian disdain for the peculiar intentionality of singular thoughts expressible by proper names: a modal argument, an epistemological argument and what can be called a “transcendental” argument.

According to the modal argument, if the proper name ‘Cicero’ were just short for some definite description, e.g., ‘the Roman orator who denounced Catiline,’ then it would follow that the sentence ‘Cicero is the Roman orator who denounced Catiline’ would express a necessary truth, i.e., a proposition true in all possible worlds. But this seems absurd: there certainly is a possible world in which Cicero did not denounce Catiline.

According to the epistemological argument, from the same assumption, it follows that the sentence ‘Cicero is the Roman orator who denounced Catiline’ expresses a proposition knowable a priori, so that it makes no sense to imagine that historians may discover by empirical research that in fact somebody else denounced Catiline or that nobody did. But this too seems absurd.

Finally, according to the transcendental argument, people use proper names in thought and in verbal communication to track, pick out and exchange valuable information about concrete particulars. Although they may lack information expressible by some definite description—let alone by a single definite description—for uniquely identifying many concrete particulars, still people manage to secure reference to them. Furthermore, as a person comes to learn more and more information about an object or a person, she comes to associate different definite descriptions to the referent of a proper name. If follows that no one definite description seems suitable to capture the content of a proper name.

According to the theory of direct reference, the function of such linguistic devices as proper names, indexicals and demonstratives is to introduce a concrete individual or particular into the proposition and/or belief expressed. To use David Kaplan’s (1979, 387) revealing word, a concrete individual is “trapped” within a singular proposition. The theory of direct reference seems like a useful antidote against the Frege/Russell tendency to minimize the contribution of concrete particulars to the individuation of human singular thoughts. Three trends of thoughts in recent philosophy of mind and language have built on the theory of direct reference. First, many of the insights of the theory of direct reference have been extended from thoughts about concrete individuals to thoughts about natural kinds by Kripke (1972) and Putnam (1974). This extension plays a crucial role in the externalist view of intentional mental states (about which see section 10). Secondly, neo-Fregeans have responded to the challenge of the theory of direct reference by providing a suitable notion of “object-dependent” or “de re” sense (see Evans, 1982 and McDowell, 1984). (For a response to Frege’s puzzle about how two distinct beliefs can be about the same object on behalf of the theory of direct reference, see Salmon, 1986). Thirdly, the metaphysical and epistemological underpinnings of singular thoughts (and singular propositions) have given rise to a rich discussion of the contrast between two broad perspectives: descriptivism and singularism. According to descriptivism, we can only think about objects by thinking about the properties which they instantiate. But according to singularism, not all thoughts about objects are mediated by thoughts about their properties. For further discussion, see the papers collected in Jeshion (ed.) (2010), in particular Recanati (2010).

7. Are there intentional objects?

Sections 4, 5 and 6 described three moves made within the orthodox paradigm in analytic philosophy in response to puzzles raised by the intentionality of singular thoughts about concrete particulars. In particular, the dispute between the theory of direct reference and either the Fregean distinction between sense and reference or the Russellian assumption that ordinary proper names are disguised definite descriptions can be seen as internal to the orthodox paradigm according to which there are only existing objects, i.e., concrete particulars in space and time. Brentano, however, sketched the possibility of an alternative paradigm based on the acceptance of the view that intentional objects may be non-existent objects or abstract objects. (For a general survey of the role of Brentano in the emergence of the non-orthodox theory of intentional objects in Austrian philosophy, see Smith, 1994.)

To see how the theory of intentional objects flows from Brentano’s characterization of intentionality, recall (from section 2) that it follows from the nature of intentionality (as described by Brentano’s first thesis) that nothing could exhibit intentionality unless there were objects – intentional objects – that satisfied the property Brentano called “intentional inexistence.” Consider the following inference schema licensed by the rule of existential generalization and instantiated by the non-intentional relation expressed by the English verb “kiss” in (11):

11a. Cleopatra kissed Caesar.
11b. Cleopatra kissed something.

If (11a) is true, so is (11b). The question is: is this valid inference schema also instantiated by the following pairs (12)-(15) involving intentional relations?

12a. Cleopatra loved Caesar.
12b. Cleopatra loved something.

13a. The Ancient Greeks worshiped Zeus.
13b. The Ancient Greeks worshiped something.

14a. Ponce de Leon searched for the fountain of youth.
14b. Ponce de Leon searched for something.

15a. Modern criminologists admire Sherlock Holmes.
15b. Modern criminologists admire something.

On the one hand, unlike (11), (12)-(15) involve intentional relations. On the other hand, unlike the intentional relation in (12), the intentional relations in (13)-(15) seem to involve particulars which don’t exist (or haven’t existed) in space and time. Intentional-object theorists hold that the above inferences involving both non-intentional and intentional relations constitute data that call for a consistent explanation. In other words, the intentional-object theorist accepts, whereas his critic rejects, the validity of the rule of existential generalization for both intentional and non-intentional relations, whether the relata of the intentional relations are concrete particulars in space and time or not. On the non-orthodox assumption that the inference schema instantiated by (11) can be instantiated by (12)-(15) as well, then in logical notation, the second coordinate of every pair (11)-(15) should be symbolized thus:

11c. ∃x(Cleopatra kissed x)
12c. ∃x(Cleopatra loved x)
13c. ∃x(Ancient Greeks worshiped x)
14c. ∃x(Ponce de Leon searched for x)
15c. ∃x(Modern criminologists admire x)

Thus, the issue between the intentional-object theorist and his critic is whether the variable bound by the standard existential quantifier of first-order logic should range not merely over concrete particulars existing in space and time but also over all sorts of other entities as well. Note that the issue is orthogonal to the contrast between the objectual and the substitutional interpretation of the existential quantifier since the dispute over the admission of intentional objects is wholly internal to the objectual interpretation of the quantifier. The question that arises for the intentional-object theorist is: what is the best theory of the objects over which (13c)-(15c) seem to quantify?

Meinong (1904) supposed that objects like Zeus, the fountain of youth, Sherlock Holmes, etc., are non-existent objects which exemplify the properties attributed to them. On his view, the fountain of youth is an object that instantiates both the property of being a fountain and that of having waters which confer everlasting life. But it fails to instantiate the property of existence. Meinong seemed to suppose that for any group of properties, there is an object which instantiates those properties. Some of the resulting objects exist and others do not. Russell (1905) found this view of intentional objects ontologically unacceptable since it involves the acceptance of entities such as golden mountains (which are inconsistent with physical and chemical laws) and round squares (which are inconsistent with the laws of geometry). His theory of definite descriptions was precisely designed to avoid these ontological consequences (see section 5). However, by clarifying distinctions proposed by both Meinong and his student Ernst Mally, Parsons (1980) has recently offered a theory of non-existent objects, which is based on the assumption that existence is a special kind of property. This theory uses a quantifier “∃”, which does not imply existence. To assert existence, he uses the predicate “E!”. Thus, the assertion that there are non-existent objects can be represented in Parsons’ theory without contradiction by the logical formula “∃x(~E!x).” Furthermore, Parsons distinguishes between “nuclear” and “extranuclear” properties. Only the former, which are ordinary, non-intentional kinds of properties, contribute to individuating objects. The set of extranuclear properties involve intentional properties, modal properties and existence. Armed with this distinction among properties, Parsons (1980) has been able to avoid Russell’s objections to Meinong’s naive theory of intentional objects. (For further details, see Parsons, 1980.) An original account of the possibility of entertaining true thoughts about non-existent objects, based on the contrast between pleonastic (or representation-dependent) and non-pleonastic (natural or substantial) properties, has been developed by Crane (2013).

The theory of intentional objects has also been developed in a slightly different way. Meinong’s student Ernst Mally (1912) proposed that fictional and mythical objects, as well as objects like round squares, do not instantiate the properties attributed to them but “have” those properties in a different way. For Mally, the fountain of youth is “determined” by the properties of being a fountain and having waters which confer everlasting life, but this object doesn’t instantiate those properties in the traditional sense. Given Mally’s distinction, the fact that there is an object which is determined by the properties of being golden and of being a mountain does not contradict the contingent fact that nothing instantiates these two properties, nor does Mally have to think of intentional objects as non-existent. Rather, he treats them as existing abstract objects. Thus, whereas Parsons uses two kinds of properties to develop a theory of non-existent objects, a neo-Mallyan such as Zalta (1988) uses two kinds of predication – exemplification (which corresponds to instantiation) and encoding (which corresponds to Mally’s notion of determination) – to develop a theory of abstract objects. These abstract objects are part of the explanations of both the truths expressed by (13a)-(15a) and the validity of the inferences in (13a,b)-(15a,b). As such, abstract objects may well exist. Nonetheless, some abstract objects (e.g., Sherlock Holmes and Zeus) may be said “not to exist” in the sense that nothing exemplifies the properties which they encode.

Though Quine’s (1948) well-known paper “On what there is,” raises serious ontological questions for intentional-object theories, both Parsons and Zalta have provided answers to Quine’s queries, in their respective work. Nonetheless, to this day, many contemporary philosophers have been reluctant to embrace intentional-object theories for two related reasons. First of all, they have been eager to avoid what they see as the heavy ontological commitments incurred by intentional-object theories. Secondly, the ontology of non-existent and abstract objects has seemed difficult to square with the ontology of the contemporary natural sciences according to which the world contains only concrete objects that exist in space and time. (See Section 9 for further discussion.)

The theory of intentional objects, however, may derive support from the following, arguably counterintuitive, consequences of Frege’s and Russell’s views, respectively. Frege’s theory faces two problems. First (13a)-(15a) would appear to express truths. But on Frege’s view, they lack a truth-value, since they involve singular terms devoid of reference and, according to Frege, if part of a sentence lacks a reference, then the sentence itself fails to have a truth-value (see section 4). Secondly, the inferences in (13)-(15) appear to be valid. But on Frege’s view, one cannot validly infer (13b) from (13a) if (13a) has no truth-value. Similarly for the other pair of sentences (14) and (15). Russell’s view faces two analogous problems. First, as noted above, (13a)-(15a) appear to be true. But on Russell’s analysis, proper names such as “Zeus” in (13a) and “Sherlock Holmes” in (15a) are abbreviated definite descriptions and, given his analysis of definite descriptions, both (13a) and (15a) turn out to express false existentially quantified propositions (see section 5). Secondly, if (13a)-(15a) are indeed false, as Russell’s view would have it, then one cannot validly infer (13b)-(15b), respectively, from their corresponding premisses. For a recent novel account of the distinction between true and false thoughts about non-existent objects, cf. Crane (2013) and for further discussion of the general topic of existence, see the SEP entry on existence.

8. Is intensionality a criterion of intentionality?

Within the orthodox paradigm, an entirely different reaction to the puzzles of intentional inexistence has been to try to clarify the ontological difficulties by ascending to a higher semantic level that can, as Willard Van Orman Quine (1960, 272) says, “carry the discussion into a domain where both parties are better agreed on the objects (viz., words).” Semantic ascent allows one to rise from talk about things to talk about talk about things, i.e., words. In contemporary analytic philosophy, Roderick Chisholm (1957, 298) was the first to contemplate the formulation of “a working criterion by means of which we can distinguish sentences that are intentional, or are used intentionally, in a certain language from sentences that are not.” The idea is to examine sentences that report intentionality rather than intentionality itself.

Intensionality (with an s) is non-extensionality. Two features are characteristic of extensionality. First, if a linguistic context is extensional, two coreferential terms can be substituted one for the other salva veritate as illustrated by (16) and (17):

  1. Hesperus shines.
  2. Phosphorus shines.

If (16) is true, so is (17). Secondly, the law of existential generalization applies to either (16) or (17) to yield ‘∃x(x shines).’ Not so with intensionality. As illustrated by examples (3) and (4) repeated here, the truth of (3) does not always entail the truth of (4):

  1. Ava believes that Hesperus is shining.
  2. Ava believes that Phosphorus is shining.

Nor can existential generalization always be validly applied to sentences reporting beliefs, since from the fact that John believes that angels have wings, it does not follow that there are things such that John believes of them that they have wings.

Chisholm’s criterion of intensionality is threefold. First, a sentence reports an intentional phenomenon if it contains a singular term that purports to refer to some object and it is such that neither it nor its negation implies that the purported reference of the singular term does or does not exist. The first criterion amounts to the recognition that if a sentence containing a singular term reports an intentional phenomenon, then it fails to satisfy the law of existential generalization (from ‘Fa’ infer ‘∃xFx’). Secondly, a true sentence reports an intentional phenomenon if it contains a singular term ‘a’ and if replacement of ‘a’ by coreferential term ‘b’ results in transforming the true sentence into a false sentence that differs only from the former in that ‘b’ replaces ‘a’. The second criterion amounts to recognition that if a sentence containing a singular term reports an intentional phenomenon, then it fails the test of the substitutivity of coreferential terms salva veritate. Finally, if a complex sentence containing an embedded ‘that’-clause reports an intentional phenomenon, then neither it nor its negation entail the truth of the proposition expressed by the embedded ‘that’-clause.

Chisholm (1957) argued that reports or descriptions of intentional or psychological phenomena cannot be reduced to (or eliminated in favor of) descriptions of behavior. The intensionality or non-extensionality of reports of intentionality was taken to show that descriptions and explanations of psychological phenomena cannot be described nor explained in terms of a vocabulary describing non-intentional phenomena. As Quine (1960, 220) put it, “there is no breaking out of the intentional vocabulary by explaining its members in other terms”. Chisholm (1957) took this conclusion to show the correctness of Brentano’s third thesis that intentionality is the mark of the mental.

The question can be decomposed into two questions. On the one hand, acceptance of intensionality as the criterion of intentionality seems to reflect the endorsement of a general linguistic view of intentionality in the following sense: what matters to the mental (i.e. non-linguistic) state reported are the properties of the linguistic report. There are at least two reasons for scepticism about the linguistic view of intentionality. On the other hand, there are some specific reasons for questioning two of Chisholm’s criteria. I start with the latter. It seems hard to deny that states of knowledge are states with intentionality. At least, reports of knowledge states satisfy Chisholm’s second non-substitutivity criterion. From the fact that knowledge ascription (18) is true, it does not follow that (19) is, even though ‘Cicero’ and ‘Tully’ are coreferential:

  1. Tom knows that Cicero denounced Catiline.
  2. Tom knows that Tully denounced Catiline.
  3. Cicero denounced Catiline.

However, unlike belief reports, reports of knowledge are factive: (18) could not be true unless (20) was true and Cicero did in fact denounce Catiline. Thus, unlike belief reports, reports of knowledge fail Chisholm’s third criterion. Given that (20) is extensional, it obeys the law of existential generalization. If the truth of (20) follows from the truth of (18) and if (20) satisfies the law of existential generalization, then so does (18). If so, then knowledge reports also fail to satisfy Chisholm’s first criterion.

One way to deal with this objection might be to argue that knowledge reports fail the test of existential generalization precisely because, unlike belief states, states of knowledge fail to exhibit Brentano’s intentional inexistence: only beliefs, not states of knowledge, can be directed towards states of affairs that fail to obtain and towards non-existent entities. Alternatively, one might make a distinction between states with a stronger and states with a weaker intentionality. Reports of the former (like beliefs) satisfy Chisholm’s three criteria. Reports of the latter (like states of knowledge) only fail the substitutivity test.

The problem with this strategy is that there are sentences that seem to describe intentional relations and that, unlike knowledge reports, are not intensional at all, for they pass the substitutivity test. This is the case of sentences about what Fred Dretske (1969) calls nonepistemic perception. If, when he was alive, someone saw the French writer Romain Gary, then she ipso facto saw Ajar, for Ajar was no other than Romain Gary. However, if she failed to know that ‘Ajar’ was another name for Romain Gary, while seeing Romain Gary, she may have failed to see that the man in front of her was Ajar. A fortiori, in this nonepistemic sense, one cannot see an individual unless there is an individual to be seen. One possible response might be to bite the bullet and deny that nonepistemic perception is an intentional state at all. If so, then, as Zalta (1988, 13) notes, linguistic reports of intentional phenomena do satisfy at least one of Chisholm’s criteria of intensionality.

If seeing is intentional, then not all reports of intentionality are intensional. That not all reports of intentionality are intensional is a problem for the linguistic view according to which intensionality is the criterion of intentionality. A second problem is that intensionality is also a feature of sentences that are about phenomena other than intentionality. Sentences that involve or are about modalities such as necessity, about natural laws, about causation all exhibit intensionality. So, for example, the truth of (21) does not entail the truth of (22) even though everything that happens to exemplify property Q happens to exemplify property R:

  1. It is a natural law that all Ps are Q.
  2. It is a natural law that all Ps are R.

But necessity, natural laws or causation do not, on the face of it, exhibit what Brentano took to be the defining characteristics of intentionality. So it seems as if the intensionality of the report of a phenomenon is neither necessary nor sufficient for the intentionality of the reported phenomenon. Arguably, ‘P’, ‘Q’ and ‘R’ in (21)-(22) are not singular terms at all. If they are treated as such, then, even though they may be true of the same set of individuals, they do not refer or express one and the same property. Still, the point illustrated by nomicity is that the intensionality of a linguistic report is not sufficient for the intentionality of the reported phenomenon.

9. Can intentionality be naturalized?

As we saw in section 8, Quine (1960, 220), a leading critic of intentional objects (in the sense of section 7), agrees with Chisholm (1957) that the intentional vocabulary cannot be reduced to some non-intentional vocabulary. Chisholm (1957) took this conclusion to show the correctness of Brentano’s third thesis that intentionality is the mark of the mental. From the same conclusion, Quine (1960, 221) presented an influential dilemma with both epistemological and ontological implications. The first horn of the dilemma is to accept the “indispensability of intentional idioms and the importance of an autonomous science of intention” and to reject a physicalist ontology. The second horn of the same dilemma is to accept physicalism and renounce the “baselessness” of the intentional idioms and the “emptiness” of a science of intention. This dilemma has been influential in contemporary philosophy of mind.

The common legacy of Chisholm (1957) and Quine (1960) is the linguistic view of intentionality (accepted by e.g., Dennett 1969). Whether intensionality is indeed the defining criterion of intentionality, one can certainly question Brentano’s thesis that only mental phenomena exhibit intentionality by noticing that some non-mental things exhibit something very much like Brentano’s intentional inexistence, namely sentences of natural languages. Sentences of natural languages have meaning and by virtue of having meaning, they can be, just like states of mind, directed towards things other than themselves, some of which need not exist in space and time. Sentences of natural languages, however, are non-mental things.

One influential response to this objection to this part of Brentano’s third thesis has been to grant a second-rate, i.e., a degraded and dependent, intentional status to sentences (see Haugeland 1981, Searle 1980, 1983, 1992, Fodor 1987). On this view, sentences of natural languages have no intrinsic meaning of and by themselves. Nor do utterances of sentences have an intrinsic content. Sentences of natural languages would fail to have any meaning unless it was conferred to them by people who use them to express their thoughts and communicate them to others. Utterances borrow whatever ‘derived’ intentionality they have from the ‘original’ (or ‘primitive’) intentionality of human beings with minds that use them for their purposes (see Dennett 1987 for dissent). If, as Jerry Fodor (1975, 1987, 1994, 1998, 2008) has argued, there exists a “language of thought” consisting of mental symbols with syntactic and semantic properties, then possibly the semantic properties of mental symbols are the primary bearers of ‘original’ intentionality. (See the entry on the language of thought hypothesis.)

So the question is: does any non-mental thing exhibit ‘original’ intentionality? The question is made more pressing by Quine’s dilemma, according to which one must choose between Brentano’s third thesis and a physicalist ontology. So-called ‘eliminative materialists’ (see Churchland 1989) resolutely opt for the second horn of Quine’s dilemma and deny purely and simply the reality of human beliefs and desires. As a consequence of their denial of the reality of beliefs and desires, the eliminative materialists must face the challenge raised by the existence of physical objects whose existence depends on the intentions, beliefs and desires of their designers, i.e., human artifacts. Others, like Daniel Dennett (1971, 1978, 1987, 2017), who rejects any sharp distinction between original and derived intentionality on the grounds that original intentionality itself is the output of natural selection, take a so-called ‘instrumentalist’ position. On Dennett’s view, the intentional idiom fails to describe or explain any real phenomenon. However, in the absence of detailed knowledge of the physical laws that govern the behavior of a physical system, the intentional idiom (the ‘intentional stance’ as Dennett calls it) is a useful stance for predicting a system’s behavior. Among philosophers attracted to a physicalist ontology, few have accepted the outright eliminativist materialist denial of the reality of beliefs and desires. Nor have many of them found it easy to answer the puzzling question raised by the instrumentalist position: how can the intentional idiom make useful predictions if it fails to describe and explain anything real?

A significant number of physicalist philosophers subscribe to the task of reconciling the existence of intentionality with a physicalist ontology (for a forceful exposition see Field 1978, 78–79). On the assumption that intentionality is central to the mental, the task is to show, in Dennett’s (1969, 21) terms, that there is not an “unbridgeable gulf between the mental and the physical” or that one can subscribe to both physicalism and intentional realism. Because intentional states are of or about things other than themselves, for a state to have intentionality is for it to have semantic properties. As Jerry Fodor (1984) put it, the naturalistic worry of intentional realists who are physicalists is that “the semantic proves permanently recalcitrant to integration to the natural order”. Given that on a physicalist ontology, intentionality or semantic properties cannot be “fundamental features of the world,” the task is to show “how an entirely physical system could nevertheless exhibit intentional states” (Fodor, 1987). As Dretske (1981) puts it, the task is to show how to “bake a mental cake using only physical yeast and flour”. Notice that Brentano’s own view that ‘no physical phenomenon manifests’ intentionality is simply unacceptable to a physicalist. If physicalism is true, then some physical things are also mental things. The question for a physicalist is: does any non-mental thing manifest intentionality?

Clearly, one way to relieve the tension between physicalism and intentional realism is to argue that intentionality can be, and in fact is, exhibited by non-mental things. There have been several proposals in analytic philosophy in the past twenty years to suggest ways of accomplishing this program, which has been called ‘the naturalization of intentionality.’ The common strategy is to show that Brentano was wrong in claiming that only mental things can exhibit intentionality. This strategy is related to the assumption that intentional relations whose relata are concrete particulars should have primacy over intentional relations whose relata are not (see section 7). I shall illustrate two distinct proposals for implementing this common goal.

One influential strategy for showing that non-mental things can exhibit intentionality has been Fred Dretske’s (1980, 1981, 1994) information-theoretic proposal that a device that carries information does exhibit some degree of intentionality. The view is an extension of Paul Grice’s (1957) notion of natural meaning: unlike the English word ‘fire,’ which non-naturally means fire, smoke naturally means fire. The word ‘fire’ can be tokened in the absence of any fire either for the purpose of expressing a thought about what to do if there was one or perhaps to mislead somebody else into falsely thinking that there is one. But there cannot be any smoke unless there is a fire. As we shall see momentarily, it is a feature of both the original intentionality of beliefs and the derived intentionality of utterances that they can be misrepresentations.

In essence, the information-theoretic proposal is that device S carries information about instantiations of property G if and only if S’s being F is nomically correlated with instantiations of G. If S would not be F unless property G were instantiated, then S’s being F carries information about, or as Dretske likes to say, indicates G-ness. A fingerprint carries information about the identity of the human being whose finger was imprinted. Spots on a human face carry information about a disease. The height of the column of mercury in a thermometer carries information about the temperature. A gas-gauge on the dashboard of a car carries information about the amount of fuel in the car tank. The position of a needle in a galvanometer carries information about the flow of electric current. A compass carries information about the location of the North pole. In all such cases, a property of a physical device nomically covaries with some physical property instantiated in its environment (for critical discussion of the informational program, see Kistler 2000, Loewer 1987, 1998 and Putnam 1986).

Now, insofar as it is not a law that polar bears live at the North pole, even though they happen to live there, a compass will fail to carry information about where polar bears happen to live in spite of the fact that it does carry information about the North pole. If so, then reports of what a compass indicates exhibit one of Chisholm’s features of intensionality, namely coextensive terms are not freely substitutable salva veritate in such reports. By contrast, if it is law that variations of temperature covary with variations in atmospheric pressure, then by virtue of indicating the temperature, the height of the column of mercury in a thermometer will also indicate atmospheric pressure. If there is a law relating current flow to voltage differences, then by indicating the former, a galvanometer will indicate the latter. One can, however, believe and even know that there is a current flow between two points without believing, let alone knowing, that there is a voltage difference between the two points, if one fails to know that it is a law that if there is flow of electric current between two points, then there is a voltage difference between these two points (see Jacob 1997 for discussion).

So although reports of the information carried by such physical devices exhibit some of the intensionality exhibited by reports of intentional mental states, the intensionality exhibited by the latter is clearly stronger than the intensionality exhibited by the former. On the one hand, it is difficult to generate the strong intentionality of mental states from the information-theoretic account of the weak intentionality of non-mental things. On the other hand, given that the information relation is the converse of a nomic correlation, it is difficult for informational semantics to account for misrepresentation as well as for the normativity of the contents of mental states. See the entry on causal theories of mental content..

A second influential proposal for dealing with the difficulties left pending by the information-theoretic approach and for showing that some non-mental things can exhibit intentionality has been Ruth Millikan’s (1984, 1993, 2000, 2004) teleosemantic approach. Millikan’s teleosemantic approach rests on two basic assumptions, the first of which is that (unlike a natural sign) an intentional representation is a relatum in a three-place relation involving two mechanisms: a producer of the representation and a consumer, both of which are cooperative devices whose activities are beneficial to both. Millikan’s second assumption is that Brentano’s relation of intentional inexistence is exhibited by biological functions. Given any sort of biological purpose or design, it might fail to be fulfilled. For example, if it is the function or purpose of a mammal’s heart to pump blood, then a mammal’s heart ought to pump blood even though it might fail to do so. Notice, however, that whereas biological organs have functions that may fail to be fulfilled, they do not ipso facto exhibit intentionality in Brentano’s full sense: neither a heart nor a stomach are of or about anything. Millikan’s claim, however, is not that having a function is sufficient for aboutness, but that it is necessary. Arguably, a device cannot be about or represent anything unless it can misrepresent what it is about. Presumably, for a device to misrepresent what it is about is for it to misfunction. But unless the device had some function, it could simply not misfunction. If this is correct, then nothing could be a representational system—nothing could have content or intentionality—unless it had what Millikan (1984) calls a ‘proper’ function.

The relevant notion of a function here is the biological teleological, not the dispositional one: the function of an organ is not what the organ is disposed to do, but what it was selected to do (see Millikan 1984 and Neander 1995). Arguably, nothing can have a function unless it results from some historical process of selection or other. Selection processes are design processes. Most advocates of teleosemantics accept the etiological account of functions according to which the function of a device is a selected effect, i.e. an effect produced by the device that explains the continued proliferation of tokens of this type of device. Thus, according to “teleosemantic” theories, design is the main source of function, which in turn is the source of content or intentionality. Such theories are called “teleosemantic” theories in virtue of the connection between design or teleology and content. One contentious issue is whether the teleological approach championed by Millikan can be combined with informational semantics so that S can be said to represent instances of property F if and only if it is S’s function to carry information about F. On the one hand, against this proposal, Millikan (2004) has argued that the information carried by a sign depends on its causes, not its effects: according to teleosemantics and the etiological approach to functions, the function of a device is one of its effects: it does not depend on its causes. On the other hand, Millikan (2017) proposes to redefine the border between concepts and percepts by deepening her semiotic approach to perception based on the related twin notions of unicepts and unitrackers. Neander (2017) and Shea (2018) have further explored the possibility of combining informational semantics and a teleological approach. For further discussion of teleosemantics, see the SEP entry on teleological theories of mental content and the papers collected in Ryder, Kinsbury and Williford (eds.)(2011).

Now, selection processes can be intentional or non-intentional. Artifacts (including words and other symbols of natural languages) derive their functions from some intentional process. While psychological mechanisms (e.g., belief-forming mechanisms) derive their proper functions from a non-intentional selection process, particular belief states have derived proper functions. The paradigmatic non-intentional process is the process of natural selection by which Charles Darwin explained the phylogenetic evolution of biological species: natural selection sorts organisms that survive. But no intentional agent is responsible for the sorting. Millikan (1984, 2004, 2005) has also extended her teleosemantic approach to the contents of intentional conventional signs (i.e. linguistic symbols). If this sort of teleosemantic proposal could be fully worked out, then it would kill two birds with one stone. On the one hand, it would point a way in which the intentionality of minds derives from the intentionality of biological things (see Rowlands 1999 for discussion). On the other hand, it would show that some of the normativity of mental states is already exhibited by biological functions (see Neander, 1995). Both questions are currently topics of much discussion in the philosophy of mind. Many philosophers such as Davidson (1980), Kripke (1982), McDowell (1994) and Putnam (1988, 1994), for example, have either expressed serious reservations about the program or provided reasons for scepticism. For further discussion, see the essays in MacDonald and Papineau (eds.) 2006, and also the entries on teleological theories of mental content and teleological notions in biology. Subsequently Burge (2010) criticized attempts to naturalize intentionality by appeal to the notion of biological function on the grounds that it is, according to him, a deep mistake to identify representational success (truth or accuracy) with fulfillment of biological function and representational failure (falsity or inaccuracy) with failure of biological function. Unlike representational (or semantic) success or failure, fulfillment or failure of a biological function is, according to Burge, practical success or failure.

10. Is intentionality exhibited by all mental phenomena?

Perceptions, beliefs, desires and intentions and many other “propositional attitudes” are mental states with intentionality. They are about or represent objects and states of affairs under a particular psychological mode or format. Perceptions, beliefs, desires and intentions illustrate a basic duality of the intentionality of the mental: the duality between mind-to-world and world-to-mind directions of fit. In order to clarify this duality, Elizabeth Anscombe (1957, 56) considers a mere “shopping list”. The list may either be used as a set of instructions (or a blueprint) for action by a customer in a store or it can be used as an inventory by a detective whose purpose is to draw a record of what the customer is buying. In the former case, the list is not to be revised in the light of what lies in the customer’s grocery bag. But in the latter case, it is. If a mismatch should occur between the content of the grocery bag and the list used by the customer, then the blame should be put on the customer, not on the list. In the case of a mismatch between the content of the bag and the list drawn by the detective, the detective should correct his list.

Building on Anscombe’s insight, Searle (1983) argues that there are two opposite “directions of fit” that either speech acts or mental states can exemplify: just as the speech act of assertion has a word-to-world direction of fit, beliefs and perceptions have a mind-to-world direction of fit. It is the function of an assertion to state a fact or an actual state of affairs. Similarly, it is the function of a belief and a perception to match a fact. Unlike assertions, orders have a world-to-word direction of fit. Unlike beliefs and perceptions, desires and intentions have a world-to-mind direction of fit. It is the function of an order to represent a non-actual possible or impossible state of affairs. Similarly, it is the function of a desire and an intention to represent a non-actual possible or impossible state of affairs.

Now the following questions arise: are Brentano and the phenomenological tradition right? Do all mental states exhibit intentionality? Is intentionality a feature of every aspect of human experience? Are all forms of consciousness consciousness of something? Does every mental state possess one or the other direction of fit? Do sensations (e.g., pains), feelings, emotions (e.g., depression) all exhibit intentionality? These questions are very controversial in contemporary philosophy of mind. Before examining various contradictory answers to these questions, a preliminary question is relevant. Whether Brentano was right or not, why should we want a mark or a criterion of the mental at all?

The question of why we should seek a criterion of the mental at all has been made pressing by some recent remarks of the linguist Noam Chomsky (2000, 75, 106), according to whom methodological naturalism mandates that we use terms like ‘mind’ and ‘mental’ on a par with terms like ‘chemical’, ‘optical’ or ‘electrical.’ Since we do not seek to determine the true criterion of the electrical or the mark of the chemical, by naturalistic parity of reasoning, Chomsky argues, we should no more seek a criterion of the mental. Whether we need criteria respectively for the chemical and for the optical, it is a genuine issue whether the English word ‘mental’ can justifiably apply to things as diverse as e.g., a pain and the belief that 5 is a prime number. As Richard Rorty (1979, 22) has put it, “the attempt to hitch pains and beliefs together seems ad hoc—they don’t seem to have anything in common except our refusal to call them ‘physical’”. His conclusion is that the word ‘mental’ expresses no single property, let alone a ‘natural kind.’ On Rorty’s irrealist view, the word ‘mental’ is just part of an academic language-game with no scientific explanatory import.

Thus, Rorty’s radical irrealist picture of the mind relies on the observation that pains and arithmetical beliefs seem to have nothing in common. Not many contemporary philosophers of mind would accept Rorty’s irrealist picture of the mind. But most do recognize that if minds are real, then two problems arise: the problem of intentionality and the problem of consciousness or conscious phenomenal experience. Most would claim that a solution to the problem of intentionality is not ipso facto a solution to the problem of consciousness. Why is that so?

Human beings can experience the world in various ways by means of several distinct sensory modalities (vision, audition, touch, olfaction). They are also aware of parts of their bodies as when they suffer pains. The problem of consciousness is often called “the problem of qualia” because states with a strong phenomenal character—like pains, visual or olfactory sensations—are states that introspectively seem endowed with a strong intrinsic subjective quality. The general problem of consciousness is to explain, in Thomas Nagel’s (1974) famous phrase, “what it is like” to be a certain creature with a phenomenal experience. What is the phenomenal character—the phenomenology—of the various forms of human experience? Few if any philosophers—physicalist or otherwise—are inclined to assume that, unlike intentionality, phenomenal consciousness can be exemplified by non-mental things. Not many would deny that, although pains, visual sensations, olfactory sensations, auditive sensations are very different experiences, nonetheless they all exhibit a common property called “phenomenal consciousness”. From both a scientific and a physicalist perspective, the questions arise whether phenomenal consciousness is physical and whether it can be explained in physical terms, i.e., as a result of processes happening in the brain.

As many philosophers are willing to recognize, the concept expressed by the word ‘consciousness’ is much in need of clarification. Three such clarifications are worth mentioning. Two of them consist in a pair of distinctions drawn by David Rosenthal (1986). One distinction is between creature consciousness and state consciousness. The other distinction is between transitive and intransitive consciousness. A creature can be said to be ‘intransitively’ conscious if she is alive and normally responsive to ongoing stimuli. She stops being intransitively conscious while in a dreamless sleep, if she is knocked out, drugged or comatose. A creature can be said to be ‘transitively’ conscious if she is conscious of things, properties and relations in her environment. Whereas a creature can be both intransitively conscious and transitively conscious of something, a mental state can only be intransitively conscious. One important aspect of the problem of consciousness is the problem of how to draw the line between conscious and unconscious mental states. A third clarification has been Ned Block’s (1995) distinction between access consciousness (or A-consciousness) and phenomenal consciousness (or P-consciousness). Whereas a state is said to be A-conscious if it is poised for free use in reasoning and for direct rational control of action and speech (i.e. available or accessible to several cognitive mechanisms), the P-consciousness of a state is what it is like to be in that state (whether or not it has A-consciousness). In recent work, Block (2007) has argued that much evidence from the cognitive scientific investigation of the visual system corroborates his distinction between P- and A-consciousness. For example, on his interpretation, experiments on change blindness and also the neuropsychological investigation of brain-lesioned human patients with neglect show that attention and working memory are necessary parts of A-consciousness, but not of P-consciousness. What makes a state A-conscious is that its content is made available to various cognitive systems (e.g., attention and memory). Furthermore, not unless a visual stimulus is attended and stored in working memory can an individual report having seen it. But Block (2007) takes the evidence to show that an individual can be P-conscious of the content of an unreportable stimulus, i.e. a stimulus whose content has not been either attended or stored in working memory. For supporting arguments, see Dretske (2004, 2007). Block’s interpretation of the cognitive scientific data has been criticized by scientific advocates of the so-called “global neuronal workspace model” of consciousness: see e.g., Dehaene et al. (2006) and Naccache and Dehaene (2007), which is a commentary to Block (2007). The global neuronal workspace model of consciousness nicely fits with Dennett’s (1991, 2005) position on intentionality and consciousness (which he has himself dubbed the “fame (in the brain) theory of consciousness.” (For further discussion of these issues, see the SEP entry on attention.)

On the one hand, the notion of transitive creature consciousness seems like a close cousin to the notion of intentionality. On the other hand, what makes a person’s mental state A-conscious is that the person may have access to it. Presumably, a person may have conscious access to one of her A-conscious mental states in virtue of having some other mental state (e.g., a thought or belief) directed to it. So having states with intentionality seems like a condition for any mental state to be A-conscious. It follows that if the problem of consciousness is to be clearly distinguished from the problem of intentionality, the key question is that of explaining how a mental state can be P-conscious.

Many philosophers do not accept Brentano’s third thesis that intentionality is the mark of all mental states. They do not reject Brentano’s second thesis on the grounds that intentionality can be exhibited by some non-mental things. They reject it because, like Block (1996) and Peacocke (1983), they subscribe to a view that can be called ‘anti-intentionalism,’ according to which a person’s conscious mental state has a phenomenal character that cannot be accounted either by its own intentionality (if it has any) or by the intentionality of some other of his or her mental states. Nor do they embrace Rorty’s irrealist attitude towards the mental. Some of the philosophers, who fall under the label ‘anti-intentionalism,’ may accept the thesis that intentionality and the mental happen to coincide. But since they claim that intentionality in turn derives from phenomenal consciousness, they are not quite faithful to the spirit of Brentano’s thesis that intentionality is the constitutive feature of the mental.

The anti-intentionalists, who reject both Rorty’s irrealism and Brentano’s thesis that intentionality is the true mark of the mental, can be divided into two groups. Some, like Ned Block (1995, 1996), would accept a dual view according to which mental states fall into a division between intentional states and phenomenal states. As we shall see momentarily, this division is denied by the intentionalists. In between the intentionalists and the phenomenal realists, who accept the dual view, lies the intermediate view of philosophers such as Colin McGinn (1989), Sydney Shoemaker (1996) and Charles Siewert (1998), who see an intimate connection between intentional and phenomenal states.

Other anti-intentionalists, like John Searle (1990, 1992) and Galen Strawson (1994), go one step further and reject both Brentano’s thesis and the dual view of the mind. They hold consciousness to be the true criterion of the mental. Arguably, as noted above, they might accept the thesis that intentionality coincides with the mental, but they hold the view that intentionality derives from consciousness. On the one hand, Strawson (1994) clearly holds phenomenal consciousness to be the true criterion of the mental. On the other hand, Searle (1992) embraces what he calls “the Connection principle,” according to which unless a mental state is available to consciousness, it does not qualify as genuinely mental. As a result, Searle (1992) seems to endorse the view that availability to consciousness is the criterion of the mental. Now, the view that availability to consciousness is the true criterion of the mental entails that states and processes that are investigated by cognitive science and that are unavailable to consciousness will fail to qualify as genuine mental states. This view has been vigorously disputed by Chomsky (2000). On the natural assumption that beliefs are paradigmatic mental states, the view that phenomenal consciousness is the true criterion of the mental further entails that there is something it is like to have such a propositional attitude as believing that 5 is a prime number—a consequence some find doubtful. If there was nothing it is like to believe that 5 is a prime number, then, according to the view that phenomenal consciousness is the criterion of the mental, many propositional attitudes would fail to qualify as genuine mental states. However, much recent work in the philosophy of mind has been recently devoted to the defense of so-called "cognitive phenomenology," according to which there is something it is like to believe that e.g., 5 is a prime number. See the SEP entry on consciousness and the papers collected in Bayne and Montague (eds.) (2011).

Many of the philosophers who accept a version of Brentano’s thesis that all mental states exhibit intentionality try to show that the mysteries of phenomenal consciousness can either be explained away (i.e., dissolved) or that phenomenal consciousness derives from intentionality. Daniel Dennett (1988, 1991, 2001) has been the most consistent advocate of the view that the distinction between phenomenal consciousness and access consciousness has been overrated and that qualia ought to be ‘quined,’ i.e., resolutely denied and dispensed with.

So-called “intentionalists” are philosophers who think that phenomenal consciousness can really be explained by intentionality because they think that phenomenal states are intentional states. On the intentionalist account, the phenomenal qualities of an experience are the properties that objects are represented as having in the experience. Some intentionalists, like Fred Dretske (1995) and Michael Tye (1995), think that whereas thoughts and propositional attitudes are mental representations with conceptual content, qualia or conscious experiences are mental representations with nonconceptual content (about which see Dretske 1981, Peacocke 1992, 2001 and the essays in Crane 1992). On their view, to have phenomenal features is to have a certain sort of nonconceptual content. On Tye’s (1995) view, for example, pains are mental representations of bodily parts and the phenomenal experience of a pain is the nonconceptual content of the bodily representation. Other intentionalists such as Elizabeth Anscombe (1965) and especially John McDowell (1994), who are skeptical of the distinction between conceptual and nonconceptual content, will appeal to other criteria, e.g., functional role, to account for phenomenal states (see the SEP entry on Nonconceptual mental content). For example, McDowell (1994) argues that the phenomenal content of experience can be explained in terms of a suitable notion of demonstrative conceptual content.

There are currently two outstanding issues facing an intentionalist approach to phenomenal experiences. The first is whether the intentionalist account can be extended to the phenomenal character of all sensory and bodily experiences. This is at present an open question (cf. Crane, 2007). The second issue is whether the nonconceptual content of perceptual experiences can be objective in representing and referring to particular objects, or whether only conceptual thoughts can be objective and represent or refer to particular objects. On the one hand, Evans (1982), Dretske (1981, 1995) and Peacocke (1992) assume that propositional thought or conceptual content is required to achieve reference to particulars. On the other hand, Burge (2010) has offered powerful considerations (mostly derived from perceptual psychology) in favor of the objectivity of purely perceptual representations. On Burge’s view, perceptual representations are both sensory and objective representations of the environment. Their nonconceptual content need not be supplemented by intellectualized (higher-order) representations of what makes a representation objective in order to provide objective representations of particulars.

Finally, according to David Rosenthal’s “higher-order thought” theory of consciousness, what makes a person’s mental state conscious is that the person is conscious of it by virtue of having formed a higher-order thought (or HOT) about it. Furthermore, the phenomenal character of a person’s sensory experience—what it is like for the person to be in that state—arises from the fact that the person has formed a HOT about it. The problem with the HOT theory of phenomenal consciousness is that the theory entails that creatures who, like non-human animals and human babies, lack the ability to form HOTs will be deprived of phenomenal consciousness—a consequence many will find implausible (cf. Rosenthal, 1986, 2005). For further discussion, see the SEP entries on consciousness and intentionality and higher-order theories of consciousness.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


Thanks to David Chalmers, Steven Davis and Edward N. Zalta for penetrating comments.

Copyright © 2023 by
Pierre Jacob <>

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