Supplement to John of Salisbury

Practical Moderate Skepticism

John of Salisbury’s intellectual adherence to the tenets of a Ciceronian moderate skepticism was not limited to matters philosophical. It was also a useful praxis, particularly on display in the Historia Pontificalis where, as John relates in the preface, his most important source is

what I myself have seen and heard and know to be true, or else what credible men (probabilium virorum) have written and on supported authority. (HP: 4)

This deployment of the language of probability directly echoes the references to probable knowledge and the doctrines of the New Academy that appear in the prefaces to both the Policraticus and Metalogicon (Ray 1985: 77). Since much of his information, John admits, is based on “probable” witnesses, he would be remiss in claiming as true knowledge what may only logically be supposed, a stance that Margaret Chibnall describes as “not detached” but “impartial”, yet infused by a “meticulous sense of justice” (HP: xxxvi). Thus, in describing the method that Bernard of Clairvaux attempted to use to secure a heresy conviction against Gilbert of Poitiers (at the 1148 Council of Rheims), John reports that “the more thoughtful men did not approve of it” and that the conclave ought not to render “a hasty judgment on so weighty a [theological] matter”, especially as renowned teachers of the day had not reached agreement on this point of faith (HP: 18–19).

Adopting an Abelardian “sic et non” approach, John generally defers final judgment on various people and events, even as he leaves a distinct impression of his own views. This leads John, for example, to present an implicitly positive assessment of the otherwise problematic Arnold of Brescia, who was “reputed to be factious and a leader of schism”, yet who also was “of keen intelligence, … eloquent in speech, and a vehement preacher against the vanities of the world” (HP: 63). These “vanities”, which John proceeds to outline, coincide with the sorts of clerical abuses against which John himself had inveigled in the Policraticus (see Nederman and Bollermann 2011). Likewise, in relating Pope Eugenius III’s refusal to consider Bishop Henry of Winchester’s several requests for special grants of authority, John proposes competing explanations:

either because [the Pope] had dark suspicions of him and believed him responsible for the corruption of all England, or because [the Pope] recognized that the church of Canterbury was in the right. (HP: 78)

John characterizes the possible motivations of those who urged Bernard of Clairvaux to prosecute Gilbert of Poitiers in similar “sic et non” fashion (HP: 16).

John’s practical application of a moderate skeptical stance finds expression in his correspondence as well. In a long letter to Henry, count of Champagne, regarding the number and authors of the Bible’s books, John succinctly enunciates the central tenet of this (Christian-inflected) philosophical approach (which he then applies):

…[O]ur faith is in question more in a case in which we announce a very definite conclusion on a point on which there is no agreement, than if we abstain from a rash conclusion, and leave unsettled a point on which we see that the [F]athers disagree and which we cannot fully investigate. On the other hand, one’s opinion can and should tilt towards one side or the other: what seems right to all or many or the best known and the eminent or to every proved expert according to his own lights should be more easily accepted, unless manifest or cogent reason, in cases which are subject to reason, establish that the opposite is true (JL2: 318–21).

Faced not with such scriptural questions, but with the very real problem of papal schism, John likewise evinces a moderate skeptical disposition, advising his colleague Ralph of Sarre that, as

there may be some doubt with whom the authority of the Roman Church resides, far the wisest policy seems to be to postpone a definite choice until the day when the just judgement of God shall be revealed … When the true merits of the case are not clearly or fully understood, human justice is constantly subverted by some cloud of error …. (JL1: 213)

For John, moderate skepticism was clearly a mental habitus, useful not only for examining philosophical precepts, but also for evaluating matters of faith and real-world persons, events, conflicts, and dilemmas.

Consonant with this moderate skeptical approach is a concern for moderation in temperament, behavior, and speech. John makes frequent reference, whether when counseling or critiquing others, to due considerations of time and place (see, for example, JL1: 144; JL2: 70–71, 190–91, 324–25). Employing a spiced-wine metaphor, John contrasts “the sobriety of wisdom [that] … achieved by a happy moderation … orders all things sweetly” (JL2: 70–71) to the “excess [that] passes the bounds of sobriety when pleasant sweetness lets in an enemy against whom no precaution is taken, just because it is sweet” (JL1: 175). Lack of moderation extends to examples of extreme religious zeal. In the fairly lengthy section of the Historia Pontificalis wherein John relates the circumstances, events, and aftermath of Gilbert of Poitiers’ heresy trial, John’s frequent references to the zeal with which Bernard of Clairvaux pursued the matter, and the master, leave little doubt that this was more zealotry than proper zeal (HP: 15–25; see also the discussion in Bollermann and Nederman 2014). In the case that John relates of a young Bec monk, “ill-advised zeal” led him to foreswear all contact with his genitals, resulting in a serious infirmity requiring Anselm’s intervention (A&B: 26–27). John reports that Anselm himself was later given reason to “moderate his humility”, and, when Anselm was unjustly criticized for “vainglor[ious]” fasting, the accuser’s “reckless … [and] immoderate language” proved nearly fatal (A&B: 49–50, 60). Archbishop Thomas Becket, too, was attacked—wrongly, John argues—by his ecclesiastical and secular enemies for various alleged excessive displays of piety (A&B: 82, but compare, 79–81, the language of John’s praise for Becket’s character and conduct, which could suggest exactly the sorts of excess of which Becket was accused; on John’s varying portrayals of Becket, with special attention to his Life of Thomas Becket, see Bollermann and Nederman 2015).

Far more common than the excessive pursuit of virtue are John’s very many examples of, critiques of, and exhortations against non-virtuous immoderation of all sorts. Though instances abound, the crucible in which immoderation is refined lies in the seven-year conflict between King Henry II and Archbishop Thomas Becket, catalogued in John’s capacious second letter collection and distilled in his Life of Thomas Becket. What emerges is an important distinction between immoderate behavior on the part of an ecclesiastical prince and on the part of a secular prince, such that the immoderation of the latter is qualitatively different and consequentially worse than that of the former.

Copyright © 2022 by
Karen Bollermann <>
Cary Nederman <>

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