Climate Justice

First published Thu Jun 4, 2020

There is overwhelming evidence that human activities are changing the climate system.[1] The emission of greenhouse gases is resulting in increased temperatures, rising sea-levels, and severe weather events (such as storm surges). These climatic changes raise a number of issues of justice. These include (but are not limited to) the following

  • How do we assess the impacts of climate change?
  • What climate responsibilities do current generations have to future generations?
  • How should political actors take into account the risks and uncertainties involved in climate projections?
  • Who has what responsibilities to address climate change?
  • Given that there is a limited “greenhouse gas budget” how should it be distributed?
  • What constraints should regulate and constrain climate policies?
  • Given high levels of noncompliance with climate responsibilities how should we make trade-offs between competing principles of climate justice?

Before considering these normative issues, it is important to introduce some scientific terms. Climate scientists often refer to “mitigation” and “adaptation”. Mitigation involves either reducing the emission of greenhouse gases or creating greenhouse gas sinks (which absorb greenhouse gases), or both. Adaptation involves making changes to people’s context so that they can cope better with a world undergoing climatic changes. Examples of adaptation might be constructing buildings that can cope better with extreme heat, or building seawalls that can cope with storm surges. It is arguable that this typology is incomplete. Suppose that humans do not mitigate by enough so the climate system continues to change; and suppose that human societies also fail to implement the necessary adaptation policies and so people are unable to enjoy the kinds of lives to which they are entitled. Then, many would argue, they are entitled to compensation.

1. Isolationism and Integrationism

It is helpful to draw attention to a distinction between two different ways in which one might approach issues of climate justice.

One approach—Isolationism—holds that it is best to treat the ethical issues posed by climate change in isolation from other issues (such as poverty, migration, trade and so forth). The isolationist seeks to bracket these other considerations and treat climate change on its own. A second approach—Integrationism—holds that it is best to treat the ethical issues posed by climate change in light of a general theory of justice and in conjunction with other issues (such as poverty, development and so on).

Some philosophers have adopted an isolationist approach. Some, for example, propose principles for allocating rights to emit greenhouse gases that treat greenhouse gases in isolation from other issues (Section 6.2). Two related reasons are given for this approach. First, some argue that there is value in simplifying the issue, and since introducing these other concerns would complicate the question it is worth bracketing them out. Second, some make a related pragmatic argument about the implications of adopting an integrationist approach for reaching agreement in climate negotiations. They argue that insisting that climate justice be pursued in light of a general theory, and in conjunction with other issues, would be a recipe for deadlock because there is often deep disagreement about what theory of justice is correct. For this reason, they propose bracketing out other phenomena and treating climate change in isolation (Blomfield 2019: 24; Gosseries 2005: 283; L. Meyer & Roser 2006: 239).

In reply, those who favour an integrationist approach tend to offer the following considerations. First, they argue that in order to treat climate change in isolation there would need to be something special about it that warranted separate treatment. However, they argue, climate change is not special in this way. For example, it impacts on the same interests (people’s interests in food and water; their health; their access to land and so on) as other phenomena (such as the distribution of economic resources, poverty and poverty alleviation, migration, and trade). Furthermore, they claim that the same distributive principles seem to be salient for climate change as they are for other phenomena. If, for example, one thinks that individuals have human rights to meet their socio-economic needs then this should surely also bear on questions of climate justice too since it provides a reason to combat climate change and a reason to distribute responsibilities so that they do not burden the poor and vulnerable. Another way of putting this point is that when people engage in deliberation about, say, how the costs of tackling climate change should be distributed then—so Integrationists claim—they inescapably end up drawing on more general values (such as “people have a right to a decent standard of living” or “people should be accountable for their choices”) (Caney 2005: 763 & 765–766). If philosophers eschew Integrationism and they try to answer questions such as “who should bear the burdens of combating climate change?” in an isolationist fashion—bracketing out, for example, what economic rights persons have—then, so the argument runs, we end up with very counter-intuitive conclusions (Caney 2018b: 682–684).

Whether this is true or not cannot be fully resolved in advance. Rather it can only be decided by engaging in a normative analysis of climate change and seeing whether it is borne out.

A second point that those who favour an Integrationist approach might make is that climate change is causally interconnected with a wide variety of other phenomena—such as economic growth, poverty reduction, migration, health, trade, natural resource ownership, and cultural rights—such that it is artificial to treat it on its own. Climate change does not present itself to us as a discrete problem that can be treated separately. Rather it is part and parcel of a larger process. It is an upshot of people’s activity (primarily through the use of energy) and, as such, it is causally intertwined with economic growth, poverty alleviation, urban design, and land use. Furthermore, the effects of climatic change are often mediated through other factors such as poverty, existing infrastructures, and the responsiveness of political authorities. They interact with existing inequalities and vulnerability, producing what Leichenko and O’Brien (2008) term “double exposures”. In addition to this, the extraction of fossil fuels and the industry built around it often directly harm the same interests (such as health and access to land) that are harmed by the emission of greenhouse gases. So, from this point of view, it seems artificial to focus on the effect of the emissions rather than the whole phenomenon. Finally, the policies proposed to tackle climate change themselves affect a wide range of other phenomena (impacting on land use, access to food, health, poverty alleviation, biodiversity loss, individual liberty, and so on). Given this any attempt to cordon off climate change and apply principles of justice to it in isolation seems misguided and quixotic.

As we shall see—especially when we consider the distribution of responsibilities and the application of principles of distributive justice to the greenhouse gas budget—it matters a great deal whether one takes an Isolationist or Integrationist perspective.

With this point duly noted, we can turn to the substantive issues.

2. Assessing Climate Impacts

One question of justice that arises is “What account of persons” interests should be employed to evaluate the impacts of climate change?’ Such an account is needed for several reasons. First, we need it to design adaptation policies for we need to know what kind of protection people are entitled to and what interests ought to be protected. In addition to this, when we are considering proposed temperature targets we need to be able to evaluate them, and to do this we need to have some account of persons’ interests by which to compare the different possibilities. For many years the appropriate temperature target was assumed by many to be that of keeping the increase in global mean temperatures from pre-industrial times to below 2°C. However, some have campaigned for lower targets. This is reflected in the Paris Agreement (2015, Other Internet Resources) which specified that the target should be

[h]olding the increase in the global average temperature to well below 2°C above pre-industrial levels and pursuing efforts to limit the temperature increase to 1.5°C above pre-industrial levels. (Article 2.1(a))

Others, by contrast, have argued that higher temperatures are permissible. For example, William Nordhaus, a leading climate economist, has argued that if we implement what he deems to be the “optimal” climate policy the temperature increase would be 3.5°C in 2100 (when compared to a 1900 baseline) (Nordhaus 2018: 348 Fig 4).

Theories of distributive justice concern the just distribution of burdens and benefits. We therefore need to know how we should conceive of “burdens” and “benefits”. Different theories of distributive justice have put forward different accounts of what it is that persons should have fair shares of (the distribuendum) (see entries on distributive justice and egalitarianism).

When we consider climate change, different accounts of the distribuendum are highly likely to converge in very many cases. Climate change results in many dying (because of severe weather events, such as extreme heatwaves, flooding, and storm surges). It leads to droughts and crop failure and thus threatens people’s interests in food and water. It leads to an increase in certain diseases. These impacts—threats to life, food and water, and to health—would be condemned by many, if not all, theories of distributive justice. (For a detailed discussion of the implications of different accounts of the distribuenda of distributive justice for the evaluation of climatic impacts see Page [2006: 50–77].)

Some, however, would argue that to limit our focus to these interests (in life, health, food and water) is too narrow. They hold that some persons have deep attachments to certain places, such as the land that they have traditionally inhabited, and that being rooted in a particular place is an integral part of what makes their life go well. On this view, forcible displacement results in a non-substitutable loss. This is highly pertinent in the case of climate change since many indigenous peoples will be forcibly displaced from traditional homelands. This is true both of those in small island states and coastal settlements, as well as of inland communities forced to move because of environmental degradation to their traditional lands. Many argue, on this basis, that climate change constitutes a form of cultural injustice (de Shalit 2011, Heyward 2014, Whyte 2016). An adequate theory of climate justice must then consider whether persons’ have such cultural rights.

This last example also helps to underscore another important point, namely that which account of persons’ interests is adopted can have considerable practical implications, affecting what temperature target to employ and what form adaptation should take.

The key issue here concerns the relationship between persons’ interests, on the one hand, and changes in the climate system, on the other. On some views people’s interests are such that a change in the climate system might—at least in principle—be made up for through adaptation and/or through the provision of other goods. If, for example, one thinks that distributive justice is concerned solely with persons’ wealth and income, then the loss of a good (such as one’s house) because of climatic changes can be compensated for by a transfer of wealth and/or income.

Other accounts of persons’ interests will not, however, sanction this kind of “compensation”. Those who think that some persons’ good is bound up with a certain place or territory will think that climate change inflicts on such people a loss that cannot be compensated for. Protecting their interests necessarily requires the environment to be a certain way (de Shalit 2011; Heyward 2014 esp. 156–157; Whyte 2016).

To put the point in other words, the key concern is about “substitutability” (Neumayer 2003: 37–40). The question is whether one can substitute the loss of nature with the provision of other goods. Different accounts of justice will yield different answers to this. This take us to a long-standing debate in ecological economics and ethics between proponents of what has been termed “weak sustainability” (which permits the substitution of capital for the loss of nature) and proponents of “strong sustainability” (which denies the possibility of such substitution) (Neumayer 2003).

Four further points are in order.

First, it would be a mistake simply to employ an account of the distribuendum and then apply that to evaluate climatic impacts without considering whether that account adequately reflects the values and ethical orientations of affected communities. See, in this context, Krushil Watene’s (2016) evaluation of the extent to which the “capability” approach can accommodate the insights of Maori philosophy concerning the value of nature. (See entry on capability approach for information on the capability approach and relevant sources.)

Second, it is worth noting that once one has an account of the relevant interests a further question is how one incorporates them into a theory of justice. For example, some have argued that many of the adverse impacts described above can accurately be described as threatening people’s human rights (Caney 2010b). This view maintains that persons have certain human rights—to life, health, water, food, not to be displaced—and that climate change is unjust because it violates these human rights. Others are sceptical of the applicability of human rights, arguing that they are too inflexible and are unable to provide guidance when trade-offs are necessary (Moellendorf 2014: 24–26 & 230–235).

Moellendorf suggests that we should instead adopt what he terms an “Antipoverty Principle”: this judges climate impacts (and climate policies) in terms of their impact on poverty (Moellendorf 2014: 22–24). This, however, will be vulnerable to the objection that it is unduly narrow in its focus, for climate change has harmful effects that cannot simply be reduced to its effect on poverty levels (such as its effects on political self-determination, people’s ability to practise their traditional ways of life, and their right not to be displaced) (Gardiner 2017: 441–443).

Another approach would be to follow the practice of many climate economists. They employ what they term the “social cost of carbon” where this calculates “a monetized value of the present and future damages caused by the emission of a ton of CO2” (Fleurbaey et al. 2019: 84). What stance one adopts here will, then, depend on one’s more general theory of justice and normative public policy.

Third, the focus so far has been on the entitlements of individuals. However, some will argue that this is too restrictive and that a comprehensive account would include the rights of collective units to be self-determining. The clearest and starkest (but not, of course, the only) illustration of this is the destruction of small island states.

Fourth, the focus, so far, has been on the impacts on human beings. On some accounts, this is incomplete for it excludes nonhuman animals (Cripps 2013: chapter 4). Clearly, evaluating such claims raises questions that go beyond this entry. The point here is just that if the interests of other creatures are included then this will have implications for the evaluation of climatic impacts.

3. Intergenerational Justice

The question of what climate target to aim for will also depend on what responsibilities members of one generation have to future generations. The emission of some greenhouse gases can have an impact far into the future. For example, CO2 lasts in the atmosphere for “hundreds of thousands of years” (Allen, Dube, & Solecki 2019: 64). So while climate change affects large numbers of people alive now, many of the impacts of climate change will fall on future generations. To know what temperature target is appropriate it is necessary, then, to have an account of our responsibilities to future generations and to know how much weight, if any, to attribute to their interests.

Such an account is also needed for two further reasons. First, the question of who should bear the burdens of climate change has an intergenerational dimension. Some, for example, have argued that it would be fair to impose some of the costs of mitigating (and adapting to) climate change on future generations (Rendall 2011).

Finally, there is a fixed quantity of greenhouse gases which can be emitted.[2] Considering how this should be shared also raises questions of intergenerational justice for if there is a fixed greenhouse gas budget we need to consider what claims, if any, future people have to emit greenhouse gases.

3.1 Principles of Intergenerational Justice

A number of different principles of intergenerational justice have been proposed. Many for example, adopt a sufficientarian position and hold that justice requires merely that all persons be above a certain specified threshold. (For sophisticated analyses see L. Meyer & Roser 2009 and Page 2006: 90–95; 2007.)

One challenge for this view will, of course, be determining how to specify this threshold. Many, however, will grant that a sufficiency condition is necessary even if it is hard to specify. Some may though query whether it is sufficient. For example, a sufficientarian view would allow members of one generation to leave future generations worse off than them just so long as they are above a certain threshold. This will strike many as too weak. Consider a case where one generation could leave future people much better off than the sufficientarian threshold at no (or little) cost. Here it would seem inadequate to say that current generations need only ensure that future people do not fall beneath the sufficientarian’s designated threshold.

Some adopt more demanding accounts of intertemporal justice which avoid these problems. For example, in their book Sustainability for a Warming Planet (2015) Humberto Llavador, John E. Roemer, and Joaquim Silvestre defend what they term “growth sustainability”. They explain it as follows:

Growth sustainability (say, at 25% per generation) means to find that path of economic activity that maximizes the welfare of the present generation, subject to guaranteeing that welfare grows at least at 25% per generation, forever after. (Llavador, Roemer & Silvestre 2015: 4)

The key idea is to maximise the standard of living of current generations but also commit to leaving future people better off by a certain proportion. Their argument comes in two steps. First, they think—along luck egalitarian lines—that there is a case for intergenerational equality. But then they add that current generations often desire to benefit the future and so there is a case for building in a commitment to bettering the condition of future people (Llavador, Roemer & Silvestre 2015: 4 & 35–36).

Others might query this second step, and, in particular, the claim that a “preference” to benefit others can ground an (enforceable) duty to do so. In general, whether people have a duty to others cannot be vindicated on the basis of a preference that some have to benefit others. This notwithstanding, some might still argue that where current generations can leave future generations better off than themselves at no cost, or at reasonable cost, then there is a duty to do so.

There is one other aspect that bears mentioning. So far the focus has been on what might term a vertical dimension (how well off the members of generations in the future [at, say, t10] are when compared to earlier generations [at, say, t1]). This does not, however, exhaust questions of intergenerational justice for one might think that members of one generation should also be concerned about the likely distribution within any future generation (so, what we might term a horizontal dimension). Those who adopt an egalitarian perspective, for example, might think that current generations have a duty to act in such a way that they do not create stark inequalities within future generations (Caney 2018a: 161–162 & 168; see also Fleurbaey et al. 2019: 93). This is relevant in this context because climate change tends to exacerbate existing inequalities (Hoegh-Guldberg, Jacob, & Taylor 2019: 244).

3.2 Intertemporal Discounting

The focus of the previous subsection was on principles of intergenerational justice. Much of the literature on intergenerational justice and climate change has, however, engaged with economic analyses of the impacts of climate change, and economic analyses tend to employ the concept of a social discount rate to specify how people should treat future generations. Given this a comprehensive treatment of climate justice and future generations needs to discuss the concept of discounting (see entry on Frank Ramsey and intergenerational welfare economics).

Roughly stated, social discount rates specify the extent to which persons should “discount” the future and should allocate resources to the current time as opposed to the future. The social discount rate has several component parts.

Time Discounting. One important component is “time discounting”: this involves allocating less moral weight to a person’s well-being the further into the future it is. Many philosophers have been highly critical of this approach, arguing that it is objectionable to discriminate against people on the basis of when they are alive. That, it is argued, penalises people for a property that lacks any moral significance (Caney 2014b: 323–327; Parfit 1984: 480–486; Rawls 1999: 259–262). Others would demur, and some have offered communitarian defences of special obligations to those who are temporally near (de Shalit 1995).

Growth Discounting. A second important component is what Nordhaus calls “growth discounting” (1997: 317). The idea here is clearly stated by the economist Nicholas Stern, who writes that we

should discount the consumption of future generations on the basis that they are likely to be richer than ourselves. This reason for discounting is, and should be, part of most models. (Stern 2008: 14)

Clearly what position one takes on this will depend on whether one adopts a broadly egalitarian position on intergenerational justice or not. If one thinks that egalitarian commitments should inform our policies towards future generations, and, if one thinks that those alive in the future will be wealthier (a crucial assumption that one might at least query) then there is a case for growth discounting. So one’s verdict on growth discounting will depend on the nature of one’s principle of intergenerational justice (sufficiency, equality, priority, Llavador et al.’s formulation and so on) as well as empirical assumptions about future growth (and one’s attitude to risk and uncertainty).

3.3 Objections and Concerns

The previous subsections proceeded on the basis that there are duties of justice to future generations. It is worth noting here then that some dispute that. The reasons they do so are not peculiar to the case of climate change, and are familiar from general debates about intergenerational justice (see entry on intergenerational justice).

For example, some have invoked Derek Parfit’s Non Identity Problem (Parfit 1984: chapter 16) to call into question claims that there are duties of justice to (remote) future generations (Broome 2012: 61–64). They argue that since the decisions made now affect who gets born in the future they do not harm future generations for they do not make them worse off than they would otherwise be (Broome 2012: 61–64; Parfit 1984: chapter 16).

This is not the place to discuss the Non Identity Problem in depth (see entry on nonidentity problem). It is, however, perhaps worth noting that many are not persuaded that this argument shows that current generations lack duties of (climate) justice to future people. The nub of the issue is whether theories of justice are committed to a “narrow person-affecting” point of view (Parfit 1984: 393–395). Broome appears to assume that they are. However, many others maintain that justice to future generations should not be conceived of in such narrow person-affecting terms (e.g., Reiman 2007: esp. 83–86 & 88–92). Consider, for example, sufficientarian accounts of our responsibilities to the future. They maintain that there is a duty of justice to act in such a way that the standard of living of those who live in the future is above a certain threshold. They are not committed to the thought that persons act unjustly only if they render someone (future or present) worse off than they would otherwise have been. Their claim is simply that persons of one generation act unjustly if, other things being equal, the outcome of their actions is that those who are alive in the future have a lower-than-sufficiency standard of living (see the entry on intergenerational justice, sections 3 & 4). The same point could be made about other accounts, whether egalitarian, prioritarian or Llavador et al.’s view.

4. Risk and Uncertainty

Another set of normative issues arises from the fact that climate projections are characterised by risk and uncertainty. A comprehensive analysis of climate justice needs, then, to consider the just way to respond to risk and uncertainty. To underscore why this matters it is salutary to consider the IPCC’s Fifth Assessment Report. Suppose that we take the appropriate target to be avoiding an increase in global mean temperatures of more than 1.5°C when compared with pre-industrial times. The quantity of greenhouse gases that can be permissibly emitted varies enormously depending on how risk-averse we think that our approach should be. According to the IPCC a 33% probability of meeting the 1.5°C target results in a greenhouse gas budget of 840 GtCO2 whereas a 66% probability of meeting the same target results in a greenhouse budget of 420 GtCO2 (Rogelj, Shindell, & Jiang 2019: 108). If we opt for the more risk averse approach, then, the volume of greenhouse gases than can be permissibly emitted is half the size that the budget would be if we opt for the less risk averse approach. One question that arises then is: How risk-averse should we be? How should policy-makers treat risk and uncertainty?

Two approaches have been adopted.

First, some employ traditional cost-benefit analysis and seek to derive the “expected value” of different scenarios by combining the probability of each state of affairs and its value and then choosing that policy with the greatest expected value (Broome 2012: 120–132). Fleurbaey et al. (2019: 97–100) provide an excellent short analysis of this approach and variants of it. Some query the validity of the “expected value” approach on the basis that our understanding of the future is so imperfect that we lack reliable probabilities (Gardiner 2011: 261–263; though see Broome 2012: 127–129).

Second, some adopt a version of the “precautionary principle”. To introduce this principle it is helpful to turn to Neil Manson’s excellent analysis of the precautionary principle (Manson 2002). Manson argues that all formulations of the precautionary principle contain three elements. In particular they include what he terms “a damage condition” (this states what kinds of bad outcomes are relevant), a “knowledge condition” (this states what kind of epistemic conditions are required—is it uncertainty or a certain level of risk?) and a “remedy” (this states the right response) (Manson 2002: 265). The central idea is that when people are engaged in a certain kind of action in which there is a prospect of harms of the relevant kind, and when our understanding of whether the harms will materialise satisfies the knowledge condition, then it is appropriate to adopt a precautionary policy (Manson 2002: esp. 265). Clearly, however, a great deal of work is needed to specify the three core features—how much harm and what kind of harm is relevant?; what epistemic conditions must hold?; what course of action is required (Manson 2002: 267)?

In his illuminating analysis of the precautionary principle Gardiner also identifies three essential features. There is a “threat of harm”; there is “[u]ncertainty of impact and causality”; and third there is a “precautionary response” (Gardiner 2006: 36).

Now some interpretations of the basic idea will be unduly risk averse (Gardiner 2006: 37). Gardiner himself draws on Rawls’s use of maximin, and argues that we should prioritise avoiding very bad outcomes when the following conditions are all satisfied: (1) people face options with a variety of different outcomes (including some potentially dire ones) but cannot ascertain the probabilities of these outcomes so are in a state of uncertainty, (2) people do not care greatly about how much they are better off than “the minimum that can be guaranteed by the maximin approach”, and (3) people care greatly about not falling beneath that minimum (Gardiner 2006: 47 & more generally 45–49). Under such circumstances, Gardiner argues, it would not make sense to take the risk of a dire outcome.

A related (though not identical) approach is adopted by Shue, who draws on Gardiner and Manson. Shue, like Gardiner, invokes three conditions. These are as follows:

(1) massive loss: the magnitude of the possible losses is massive; (2) threshold likelihood: the likelihood of the losses is significant, even if no precise probability can be specified, because (a) the mechanism by which the losses would occur is well understood, and (b) the conditions for the functioning of the mechanism are accumulating; and (3) non-excessive costs: the costs of prevention are not excessive (a) in light of the magnitude of the possible losses and (b) even considering the other important demands on our resources. (Shue 2014: 265; footnote omitted)

Shue’s claim, then, is that

[w]here these three features are all present, one ought to try urgently to make the outcome progressively more unlikely until the marginal costs of further efforts become excessive, irrespective of the outcome’s precise prior probability, which may not be known in any case. (Shue 2014: 265)[3]

Note that the “expected value” and the “precautionary” approaches disagree, at a fundamental level, about the relevance of probabilities. The first one relies on them to derive expected values, whereas the second does not rely on precise probabilities. (Indeed, Gardiner’s approach is intended to apply to cases of “uncertainty” [which is when we cannot specify probabilities] Gardiner [2006: 50].) This said, it seems likely that in practice they will converge, at least to some extent, in calling for aggressive mitigation policies.

5. Responsibilities

Suppose that we have identified what kinds of interests should be included in a theory of justice, what responsibilities persons owe to future people, and how to treat risk and uncertainty. These can guide us in determining what goals we should aim for. The next question to ask is ‘Who has what responsibilities to meet these goals?’ It is helpful to break this question down into several parts. We can identify four further questions, which together would enable us to answer this question and tell us what would be a just distribution of climate responsibilities.

First, it is important to be clear on the content of the responsibilities. As noted at the start, climate scientists and policy-makers focus primarily (though not exclusively) on two kinds of policies—mitigation and adaptation. The first question, then, is “Who should engage in mitigation and adaptation, and to what extent?” Let us call this the Climate Action Question.

A second question is “Who should bear the costs of mitigation and adaptation?” Mitigation will often involve economic (and other) types of cost. For example, if a carbon tax is levied on goods then purchasers of those goods will be financially worse off. Sometimes mitigation policies come with benefits (for example, regulations discouraging car use are likely to improve air quality; encouraging people to cycle rather than drive may improve physical fitness). In many cases, however, the policies come with a cost. Likewise adaptation policies (such as designing cities to cope better with heatwaves) will come at a cost. Who should pay for these? Let us call this the Burden-Sharing Question.

A third question is Who has the responsibility to ensure that (a) those designated to engage in mitigation and adaptation do so and (b) those designated to bear any financial burdens discharge their responsibilities? Let us call this the Political Action Question.

The fourth question is rather different in kind. It asks, for all of the previous questions, what kinds of entities are the duty-bearers? Many will assume that governments have such responsibilities, but what about other actors? Are individuals duty-bearers? For example, do individuals have duties to engage in mitigation? Or does that duty fall exclusively on other actors?

5.1 The Climate Action Question

Consider the first two questions. Very often these are treated together, but they are not necessarily the same. One might think, for example, that one agent has a responsibility to mitigate (on the grounds that doing so would be an effective way of making a significant reduction of greenhouse gas emissions) but that others have a duty to bear some, or all, of the costs. In such a case, then, our answer to the Climate Action Question might be that X should mitigate, but our answer to the Burden-Sharing Question might be that Y should bear the cost involved in X’s mitigating. To illustrate: one might think that developing countries should mitigate and should use clean technology instead of fossil fuels, but one might also think that the cost of the clean technology should be shouldered by others.

To give another illustration: one might think that current generations should mitigate climate change aggressively but that they can pass on some of the costs of doing so to future generations (Rendall 2011). (A version of this position is defended by Broome [2012: 47–48], and is introduced below—Section 8.)

Of course, even though the questions are distinct this does not entail that they should be treated wholly separately. One might think, for example, that X should mitigate but only if others pay at least some (or even all) of the costs, and that if sufficient financial support is not forthcoming then X is not obligated. With this in mind, it is appropriate to turn to the Burden-Sharing Question. A considerable literature has developed around the question of who should bear the costs of combating climate change.

5.2 The Burden-Sharing Question

Three principles, in particular, have emerged.

5.2.1 The Polluter Pays Principle

One principle commonly referred to as the Polluter Pays Principle holds that burdens should be borne in proportion to how much an agent has emitted (Shue 2014: 182–186). This is an intuitively plausible approach. It reflects a widely held principle about responsibility, namely that we can, subject to certain conditions, hold agents responsible for their actions.

This noted, there are several complications. First, some argue that it is unfair to hold agents responsible for the harms resulting from their emission of greenhouse gases if they were excusably ignorant of the impact of their actions. They then argue that many of those who have emitted greenhouse gases in the past were excusably ignorant and so cannot be held liable.

Several replies have been given to this line of argument. First, on an empirical note, we can respond that for several decades now people could not plausibly claim to be excusably ignorant about the effects of greenhouse gas emissions. Of course, specifying precisely when one could no longer claim to be excusably ignorant will be hard, but the salient point is that there are limits to the extent to which one can plead excusable ignorance (Singer 2002: 34).[4] Second, some argue that it can be fair to ascribe burdens to those who were excusably ignorant of the harms of their emissions if those who emitted benefited sufficiently from the emissions. The rough thought here is that while someone might reasonably complain that it is unfair to penalise them for non-culpably contributing to harm, their case is considerably weakened if it is also the case that the harmful activity also created benefits for them. If they have benefited then making them pay would not be so onerous and might even leave them no worse off than if they had they not emitted. (For discussion of the “excusable ignorance” objection and responses to it see Gosseries [2004: 39–41].)

A second challenge draws attention to the fact that many emitters are no longer alive. Why, the objection goes, should those alive now foot the bill for the acts of previous generations? Again responses have been forthcoming. Some may adopt a collectivist approach and hold that the relevant agents are collective bodies like states, and so they hold that since country X emitted in the past country X should pay now. Some, by contrast, respond by appealing again to the idea of benefiting. They hold that individuals alive today (and in the future) enjoy benefits that result from previous emissions-generating activities and so have a duty to pay at least some of the costs incurred in their production. (For discussion see Neumayer [2000: 189], Shue [2014: 186] and Gosseries [2004: 41–55].)

There is a third challenge. What if persons need to engage in activities which emit greenhouse gases in order to enjoy a decent minimum standard of living? Many hold that it is unfair to make extremely poor people pay the cost of emitting greenhouse gases where doing so would push them beneath a decent standard of living. More generally, one might argue that if people are entitled to a certain standard of living (which need not be specified according to sufficientarian criteria, but could also be specified according to egalitarian or prioritarian or some other criteria) then it would be wrong to make them pay if doing so entails that they cannot enjoy that standard of living.

It is worth noting here that if one does think that the existing global poor should not be required to bear the costs of their emissions then this might also be relevant for one’s assessment of rich countries’ past emissions. For if developing countries now should not be financially penalised for the emissions that they incur when seeking to develop then should not the same be said of the emissions incurred by (now affluent) countries when they were also poor?

5.2.2 The Beneficiary Pays Principle

In light of these kinds of challenges many hold that the Polluter Pays Principle should be supplemented by other principles. As we have seen in the previous subsection some appeal to what has been termed the Beneficiary Pays Principle. This holds that agents should pay because, and to the extent that, they have benefited from the activities that involve the emission of greenhouse gases (Page 2012).

This approach faces a number of questions. One concerns which emissions come under its remit. Does it just cover cases that the Polluter Pays Principle cannot deal with (e.g., the emissions of the previous generations) (Duus-Otterström 2014)? Or does it have wider applicability?

Second, one might query whether benefiting is always sufficient to render someone liable to pay. Someone may, for example, benefit from emissions and yet remain very poor. If one thinks that the Polluter Pays Principle should not be applied in cases where it would push someone beneath a decent standard of living then one might, for the same reason, think that the Beneficiary Pays Principle is similarly constrained.

Note that if this reasoning is correct it supports the Integrationist approach outlined in Section 1, for it suggests that when answering who should pay one should not bracket out more general considerations such as what rights, if any, persons have to enjoy a certain standard of living (such as an “equal standard of living” or a “minimum standard of living”).

5.2.3 The Ability to Pay Principle

This takes us to a third proposed principle. Some have argued that any burdens incurred by mitigation and adaptation should be distributed according to agents’ ability to pay. This principle is widely interpreted to mean that the greater an agent’s ability to pay the greater the proportion of the cost that they should be expected to pay (Shue 2014: 186–189; Moellendorf 2014: esp. 173–180).

One criticism of this principle is that it wholly divorces the question of who pays from questions about who caused the problem or who benefited from causing the problem. In addition to this, some argue that it relies on controversial moral assumptions, namely that the wealthy have a positive duty of assistance (Duus-Otterström 2014: 451–452).

Where one stands on the Ability to Pay Principle is likely to depend on one’s overall account of (global) distributive justice. For example, those who think that global justice requires a more equal world will, other things being equal, endorse a proposal that the costs should be borne primarily by the most advantaged and not by the world’s poorest.

(For further discussion of these three principles and the above objections to them, see Caney 2005, 2010a.)

5.3 The Political Action Question and First-Order and Second-Order Responsibilities

Although much of the literature has focused on who should pay, there is another set of questions concerning responsibilities. To approach it, it is useful to distinguish between first-order and second-order responsibilities, where a first-order responsibility in this context is a responsibility either (a) to mitigate climate change or facilitate adaptation or (b) to bear the costs of mitigation or adaptation or both. A second-order responsibility, in this context, is a responsibility to take action that ensures that others comply with their first-order (climate) responsibilities. (The distinction between first- and second-order responsibilities is made by Onora O’Neill [2005: 428 & 433–436] and is applied to the case of climate change by Caney [2014a: 134–147].) Second-order responsibilities are responsibilities to change the social, economic and political environment so that agents comply with their first-order responsibilities. They can include, for example, disincentivising carbon-intensive options (through, say, carbon taxes or quotas or mandatory regulations) thereby inducing agents to comply with a first-order responsibility to mitigate. Or they can involve incentivising others to discharge their mitigation responsibilities by, for example, subsidising clean sources of energy or by designing the urban environment so that people are more likely to walk or cycle or use public transport rather than drive.

A similar idea is advanced by Elizabeth Cripps who refers to what she terms “promotional duties” (2013: 116 & chapter 6 [esp. 140–150]). These are “[d]uties to attempt to bring about the necessary collective action” (2013: 116). What actions might these involve? Cripps considers the promotional duties of individuals and suggests that these involve campaigning, running for election, signing petitions, sending letters to politicians, giving money to environmental organisations, and going on marches (2013: 143). Walter Sinnott-Armstrong also suggests that citizens have a duty to campaign for their governments to implement climate legislation (2010: 344). One might also add to this list of second-order responsibilities, duties to engage in civil disobedience and resistance against laws that result in unjustified emissions or inadequate levels of adaptation.

Two further points are worth noting. First, much of the focus has been on what we might term “positive” second-order responsibilities. They are “positive” because they require agents to take action. Given the arguments above, however, we also have good reason to think that there are “negative” second-order responsibilities as well. Whereas a positive second-order duty is a duty to take steps to ensure that others comply with their first-order responsibilities, a negative second-order duty would be a duty not to thwart or undermine initiatives to tackle climate change. This is relevant given the argument that some organisations—most notably fossil fuel companies and electric utilities companies, as well as some labour organisations—have gone to considerable lengths to undermine attempts to combat climate change (Mildenberger 2020; Oreskes & Conway 2010: chapter 6; Stokes 2020).

Second, the focus of many of those philosophers mentioned above has been on political institutions. While institutions are necessary they are likely to be insufficient. To arrive at a systematic and comprehensive account of agents’ second-order responsibilities it is worth starting with a political, social and economic analysis of why agents are not discharging responsibilities to mitigate and adapt. If we start with this we can then work back from it and identify what needs to be done by whom to bring about the necessary change. This is highly likely to involve changing ideologies (for example, those that foster fossil-fuel-driven growth), cultural practices, and social norms, as well as institutions.

5.4 Who are the Duty Bearers?

We can turn now to the fourth question. What kind of agent is the duty-bearer?

It is helpful here to focus on responsibilities to mitigate since there has been considerable debate among philosophers as to whether individuals have responsibilities to limit their own personal emissions or not. Some, like Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, are sceptical of the proposition that individuals have duties to limit their own emissions. He considers a large number of separate commonsense moral principles and argues that none of these can be marshalled to show that individuals have a duty to limit their own emissions. One central theme in his argument is that individuals’ personal emissions make no difference (Sinnott-Armstrong 2010).

Two kinds of response have been made to these kinds of arguments. The first disputes the claim that individuals make no difference. Avram Hiller argues that

it is prima facie wrong to perform an act which has an expected amount of harm greater than another easily available alternative (Hiller 2011: 352)

and argues that individual emissions, while small, violate this principle. Similarly, Broome argues that individuals’ emissions create “expected harm” and they have a duty not to do so (Broome 2019). John Nolt argues in the same vein, and calculates the impact of a North Americans’ emissions over their lifetime (Nolt 2011).

A second response would be to appeal to a different kind of principle. For example, one might argue that we have a duty not to participate in collective processes which generate unjust outcomes. To do so would be stand in the wrong kind of relationship to such collective processes. Such a reply might seek to build on the work on “complicity” by Christopher Kutz (2000). In addition to a negative duty not to participate in such destructive processes one might also argue, as Tracy Isaacs has done, for a duty of individuals in “collective contexts” to form associations and create social forces for change (Isaacs 2011: chapter 5 esp. 144–155).

One further comment is in order. As noted above, while Sinnott-Armstrong believes that individuals do not have a moral responsibility to limit their emissions he does believe that individuals have political responsibilities to vote and to pressurise their representatives to pass climate legislation. As Hiller notes, this position this position may be unstable. The reasons Sinnott-Armstrong gives as to why individuals do not have mitigation responsibilities (their actions are inconsequential) would, if correct, also seem to establish that they do not have political responsibilities either. For one person’s vote is also almost certainly inconsequential (Hiller 2011: 364–365).

To sum up, then, if we consider who has what responsibilities to address climate change, it is helpful to distinguish between four questions. First, who should engage in mitigation and adaptation? Second, who should bear any cost involved in mitigation and adaptation? Third, who has the responsibility to ensure that the relevant duty bearers for questions 1 and 2 discharge their responsibilities? Finally, for each of the above we need to know “what kind of agent is being ascribed duties?”

6. Justice and the Greenhouse Gas Budget

One critical responsibility is to limit the emission of greenhouse gases. Many hold that, at the moment, some greenhouse gases can nonetheless be permissibly emitted. There is, then, a question about how the use of the remaining “greenhouse gas budget” can be distributed and among whom. As we have seen the size of the budget depends in part on what temperature target is selected and how risk averse we think we should be. To illustrate: the Fifth Assessment Report of the IPCC reported that if we want to have a probability of at least 67% of avoiding a more than 1.5°C increase in global mean temperatures then there is a budget of approximately 420 GtCO2 (Rogelj, Shindell, & Jiang 2019: 108). (If we operate with a less ambitious target then the budget is quite different. See table 2.2 in Rogelj, Shindell, & Jiang [2019: 108].)

One key question then is, “How should this budget be shared?” What principles of distributive justice should be applied to this “good”?

6.1 Subsistence

One approach put forward by Henry Shue argues that rights to emit greenhouse gases should be distributed so as to meet peoples’ “subsistence” needs, and that such emissions should take priority over “luxury” emissions (Shue 2014: chapter 2). The focus on meeting basic needs here seems hard to dispute. Many philosophers and environmental campaigners have, however, argued that equality should be the guiding principle—and not subsistence (or not merely subsistence).

6.2 Equality

Many, that is, have endorsed what we might call the “equal per capita” view. This holds that rights to emit greenhouse gases should be distributed equally. An important and influential statement of this position was affirmed by Anil Agarwal and Sunita Narain in Global Warming in an Unequal World (1991). They start from the premise that the atmosphere is part of the “global commons” (see also Shiva 2016). They infer from this that it should be divided equally among all human beings. As they put it:

The question is how should this global common—the global carbon dioxide and methane sinks—be shared amongst the people of the world? … [I]n a world that aspires to such lofty ideals like global justice, equity and sustainability, this vital global common should be shared equally on a per capita basis. (Agarwal & Narain 1991: 9)

Similar positions have been taken by Dale Jamieson (2010: 272–273), and Steve Vanderheiden (2008: 107–109 & chapter 7 [esp. 226–227]). Peter Singer (2002: 43–44) has also argued for it for partly moral and partly pragmatic reasons.

Before noting objections, it is worth observing that that the “equal per capita view” encompasses a family of views and that one might distinguish between many different versions of this view. For example, one version holds that countries should be ascribed rights to emit greenhouse gases and that the size of their quota should vary in line with the number of people in their society (Agarwal & Narain 1991: 9–10). However, one might interpret it in a more individualistic way, and ascribe equal rights to emit to each individual.

In addition to this, there are different ways of treating past (and current) emissions. Some, for example, hold that countries have emission rights and that a country’s past emissions should be debited from its quota (Neumayer 2000: esp. 186). Others suggest disregarding past emissions and favour applying the equal per capita emissions approach to the remaining budget (Singer 2002: 43–44; Vanderheiden 2008: 229–230). Still others argue that we should phase in the equal per capita view gradually over time, and hence high emitters now will have more-than-equal emission rights at the start of the transition period, with their share decreasing until it reaches equality (A. Meyer 2000).

A number of different objections might be levelled against the equal per capita view (in all versions). First, some query why it is appropriate to treat this good in isolation. The equal per capita view is a paradigm case of an isolationist position. However, theories of distributive justice tend to focus on the fair distribution of a total package of goods (Bell 2008: esp. 250; Caney 2012: 265–271; Miller 2008: 142–143). Of course, sometimes, in special cases, we do treat goods (e.g., rights to vote) in isolation, but it is not at all clear why that reasoning should apply to this case and it is arguable that in these other cases they are grounded in a more general integrationist theory.

Second, it is worth asking why we should care about emissions at all. In themselves they do not matter to the people who generate them or who enjoy the goods and services whose production involves greenhouse gas emissions. They matter because they are a by-product of activities that people engage in to serve important human interests. More specifically they largely arise because of energy use (for building, heating, cooling, transporting, manufacturing, lighting and so on) and because of agriculture and land use change. Given this it makes sense to focus on protecting and promoting these interests (bearing in mind, of course, limits to emissions) not the distribution of emissions in themselves. Suppose, for example, that we compare two people, and let us suppose that both enjoy whatever one takes to be the fair distribution of goods overall. Suppose, for simplicity’s sake, that that is an equal standard of living. Suppose, however, that one meets her interests through fossil fuels and the other through solar energy, it is hard to see why that is necessarily unfair to the second person. True they emit less. But that is irrelevant given that they enjoy what is, ex hypothesi, the fair standard of living (Hayward 2007: 432–433 & 440–444; Caney 2012: 285–291). In short: to care about emissions is not to care about what really matters from the point of view of justice.

It is worth noting that this objection tells not only against the equal per capita view. It has force against all theories of distributive justice that treat the right to emit as a distribuendum. It would, for example, be an objection to the “subsistence emissions” approach originally pioneered by Shue (Hayward 2007).

There is a third problem with treating emissions as an appropriate distribuendum. The problem is that a dilemma arises when we consider our responsibilities to future generations. There seem to be several options. Option 1 would be to deny that there are duties of justice to future generations to ensure that they too have rights to emit greenhouse gases. Perhaps someone might hold that there are no duties of justice at all to them (1a). Or they might hold that there are but that they do not include leaving them rights to emit (1b). (1a) seems implausible in light of the points made in Section 3; and (1b) adopts a discriminatory attitude to future people that stands in need of moral justification.

A second option is to think that future people have rights and hence that, on the view under consideration, they too have an equal right to emit greenhouse gases. If, however, one thinks that all current and future persons are entitled to equal per capita emissions then we face two severe problems. (i) It will be exceptionally difficult, if not impossible, to calculate how much everyone is entitled to. Furthermore, (ii), given the number of future and present people included the equal per capita share would surely be close to zero.

In light of these problems a better way forward would be not to focus on emissions per se, but rather to focus on meeting people’s interests in food and energy and so on, and to draw on other safe sources to meet these needs. What is imperative is to transition away from a carbon-based economy towards one not dependent on fossil fuels. Only in this way we can avoid the dilemma set out above.

7. Justice and Climate Policies

A further set of normative questions arises when we turn to consider what policies might be adopted to mitigate (and adapt to) climate change. Many policies that have been recommended or adopted themselves raise questions of justice. We can see this by considering three policy areas.

7.1 Mitigation and Alternative Energy Sources

The first concerns other energy sources. In practice these can raise questions of justice. For example, the construction of hydroelectric plants can lead to the displacement of peoples from their homes and indigenous peoples from their traditional homelands. The use of biofuels can lead to increased food prices as crops are devoted to producing fuel. The use of nuclear energy can lead to health risks. The salient point here is that mitigation (and adaptation) policies may raise ethical questions.

How should one address these? One suggestion would be that we should draw on the same principles and values that one employs to evaluate climate impacts. So, if, for example, one thinks that climate change is unjust in part because it undermines the. enjoyment of individual human rights then it would seem to follow that one should seek to implement mitigation (and adaptation) policies that honour these individual human rights. And, if one thinks climate change is unjust, in part, because it undermines the cultural rights of indigenous peoples then, again, it would seem to follow one should seek to implement mitigation (and adaptation) policies that honour these. One’s answer to the challenges posed by the harmful side-effects of some mitigation policies would then be part of one’s overall theory.

7.2 Population

Some philosophers have argued that a commitment to preventing dangerous climate change requires adopting policies designed to limit or reduce world population size (Cafaro 2012; Cripps 2015). Their argument is that population growth is one of the main factors contributing to climate change. Other things being equal, more people result in more emissions, so, given the direness of the situation policies need to be implemented which will sufficiently lower world population size. Some—like Sarah Conly—argue, on this basis, each couple has a right to no more than one child (Conly 2016).

Assessing such arguments requires a combination of empirical, normative and political analysis. A first step would be to consider all the determinants of climatic harms and to have a quantitative analysis of their effects and the extent to which their ecological footprint could be reduced. Such an analysis would include not simply the number of people, but also (1) the levels of consumption, (2) the extent of waste, (3) the nature of the energy system (does it use renewables or not?), (4) the distribution of access to clean technology, (5) the extent to which energy efficiency programmes are in place, (6) the extent to which fossil fuels are being subsidised, (7) the nature of the public transport system, (8) the urban infrastructure and the spatial organisation of cities, (9) building design, (10) the extent to which deforestation is reversed, and programmes of afforestation and reforestation are pursued, and so on (Caney 2020). To make a case for a Conly-style conclusion one would then have to show that either:

  1. the above are insufficient, or
  2. the above are (singly or in combination) sufficient but constitute a less desirable kind of response than limiting procreative choice, or, perhaps
  3. the above may be sufficient and more desirable than Conly’s response but they are less politically feasible.

Another challenge facing Conly’s conclusion is that it needs to show that the optimal response turns out to be 1 child per couple and that the same constraint applies equally to all irrespective of the size of their ecological footprint.

Ethical concerns about attempts to limit world population have long been expressed. For example, Maria Mies and Vandana Shiva argued in Ecofeminism (1993 [2014]) that programmes to limit world population reinforce control of women’s bodies. Furthermore, they object to proposals to curb world population growth that do not call into question the high consumption lifestyles of affluent countries, and instead convey the morally misleading message that responsibility for the environmental crisis lies with low-emitting developing countries (Mies & Vandana 1993 [2014: chapter 19]).

7.3 Geoengineering

One additional climate policy needs also be mentioned, namely “geoengineering” the climate system, either by extracting carbon dioxide from the atmosphere (Carbon Dioxide Removal) or by seeking to block the sun’s rays (Solar Radiation Management). These raise a host of ethical issues.

One concern is that some forms of geoengineering can have harmful side-effects, ones that can harm already vulnerable people (a point which takes us back to Section 7.1). For example, some forms of solar radiation management may affect the monsoon season in India (Jamieson 2014: 220).

A second challenge is that while they may constitute a response to climate change in some sense, some geoengineering policies (like Solar Radiation Management), do not tackle other greenhouse-gas related problems like ocean acidification, whereas mitigation policies would (Jamieson 2014: 220).

A related concern is that geoengineering policies are unnecessary because other less risky policies (like mitigation) should be adopted.

A fourth problem concerns the political legitimacy of decisions to go ahead with geoengineering. Geoengineering policies can have wide-ranging impacts on many countries and so it would be problematic for some to engage in it unilaterally (Jamieson 2014: 222–224). If they are to be legitimate such world-shaping policies would stand in need of an inclusive decision-making process that is global in scope.

(For rich discussions of the ethical issues surrounding geoengineering see further Gardiner [2010; 2011: chapter 10], Jamieson [2014: 219–227] and, from a Confucian perspective, Wong [2015].)

8. Climate Justice in a Nonideal World

The preceding sections have discussed different questions of justice that arise when considering how to respond to climate change, and they have explored different answers that can be given. One persistent feature of global and domestic climate policies is that there has been a high level of noncompliance with principles of climate justice. Given this, it is appropriate to ask: “What principles of justice should apply in the context of noncompliance?”

Different responses have been given. To locate them it may be helpful to set out the possibilities (Caney 2016).

  1. One response might be “duty-reallocation”. That is, one might propose a solution in which some bear some of the responsibilities that should, ideally, be borne by others.
  2. A second response might be to relax the moral constraints on mitigation policies, the aim being to make it more likely that non-complying agents will discharge their duties to mitigate.
  3. A third (related) response might be to adopt other extreme responses that one might think are normally unacceptable but permissible in an emergency.
  4. A fourth response might be to take a more proactive stance and seek to tackle the underlying structures which lead to noncompliance (for example, by designing institutions which reduce such noncompliance and undermining organisations which are thwarting successful climate action).
  5. A fifth response might be “target modification”. That is, one might lower one’s ambition, so whereas one might think that justice ideally requires a 1.5°C target one might accept a less ambitious target.

A number of philosophers have argued for a type (1)-like response. One version maintains that some (the advantaged) should take on more than their fair share of responsibilities. A second version is defended by Broome. He argues that current generations ought to reduce their emissions to tackle climate change and that they ought to absorb the costs of doing so. However, he also thinks that implementing an effective climate treaty is of paramount significance and that parties will not agree to one if they have to pay. In light of this he suggests that they should mitigate but pass on the costs to future generations (Broome 2012: 47–48). Broome thinks this involves an unjust distribution of costs but that it is nonetheless, all things considered, justified because it helps prevent dangerous climate change. Broome’s solution involves some (current people) making others (future people) bear an unjust burden. A third related position is defended by Eric Posner and David Weisbach (2010). They argue that a climate treaty is imperative but will not be feasible unless it leaves signatories to the climate treaty no worse off. They assume that the benefits from such a treaty will be such that there is a “surplus” and so no one need be worse off. However, if this assumption does not hold then their commitment to leaving high emitters no worse off might also entail that others bear an unjust burden (making it a type (1) response). As they recognise, even if there is a surplus some powerful states may agree to a treaty only if they receive such extensive compensation that it leaves others with more than their fair share of responsibilities or burdens (Posner and Weisbach 2010: 181).

Consider now (2): some might think that normally one should not convert a place of great natural beauty into giant fields of solar panels, but they might also think that, in dire circumstances, this prohibition can be overturned. If we now consider (3): many would see geoengineering as a version of this kind of response. And if we turn to (4): This is a corollary of some of the views discussed in Section 5.3, which generally held that agents have political responsibilities to create just and effective institutions and responsibilities to combat ongoing campaigns to thwart effective climate action.

What response (or combination of responses) one thinks to be the least bad here will depend on one’s overall theory of justice. Sufficientarians, for example, may think that the affluent—those above the specified sufficiency threshold—should take on more than their fair share of burdens, but will reject the idea that any of the world’s poorest should be required to adopt response (1) (unless perhaps it is absolutely necessary for very large numbers of future people to enjoy what they are entitled to).

9. Concluding Remarks

It is time to conclude. This entry has provided an overview of eight questions of justice that arise in the context of climate change. It is salutary to end by noting two points

First, it is worth noting that the focus has been on climate justice and that justice is not the only relevant value. When confronting the challenges of climate change (and the Anthropocene more generally) justice clearly plays a large role, but many would argue for the relevance of other kinds of moral consideration, including a recognition of the intrinsic value of the natural world. Climate ethics, one might say, includes more than justice.

Second, it is also worth noting that taking climate justice seriously may have major implications for existing economic institutions and ideologies (such as the valorisation of economic growth), as well as for political institutions (Gardiner 2011; Jamieson 2014). Some critics of the status quo believe that capitalism cannot cope with climate change. Some doubt the ability of our contemporary institutional architecture to address the current challenges facing humanity. Evaluating such claims clearly requires extensive empirical analysis. Only with the help of climate science, history, politics, economics, anthropology, political economy, sociology, science and technology studies, and law can we begin to address such claims. But philosophical analysis has its part to play and without an understanding of climate justice we lack a compass to guide us.

Bibliography

  • Agarwal, Anil and Sunita Narain, 1991, Global Warming in an Unequal World: A Case of Environmental Colonialism, New Delhi: Centre for Science and Environment.
  • Allen, Myles, Opha Dube, and William Solecki, 2019, “Chapter 1: Framing and Context”, in IPCC 2019: 49–91.
  • Bell, Derek R., 2008, “Carbon Justice? The Case Against a Universal Right to Equal Carbon Emissions”, in Seeking Environmental Justice, Sarah Wilks (ed.), Amsterdam: Brill | Rodopi, 239–257. doi:10.1163/9789401205689_014
  • Blomfield, Megan, 2019, Global Justice, Natural Resources, and Climate Change, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/oso/9780198791737.001.0001
  • Broome, John, 2012, Climate Matters: Ethics in a Warming World, New York and London, W. W. Norton and Company.
  • –––, 2019, “Against Denialism”, The Monist, 102(1): 110–129. doi:10.1093/monist/ony024
  • Cafaro, Philip, 2012, “Climate Ethics and Population Policy”, Wiley Interdisciplinary Reviews: Climate Change, 3(1): 45–61. doi:10.1002/wcc.153
  • Caney, Simon, 2005, “Cosmopolitan Justice, Responsibility, and Global Climate Change”, Leiden Journal of International Law, 18(4): 747–775. doi:10.1017/S0922156505002992
  • –––, 2010a, “Climate Change and the Duties of the Advantaged”, Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy, 13(1): 203–228. doi:10.1080/13698230903326331
  • –––, 2010b, “Climate Change, Human Rights and Moral Thresholds”, in Human Rights and Climate Change, Stephen Humphreys (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 69–90. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511770722.004
  • –––, 2012, “Just Emissions”, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 40(4): 255–300. doi:10.1111/papa.12005
  • –––, 2014a, “Two Kinds of Climate Justice: Avoiding Harm and Sharing Burdens”, Journal of Political Philosophy, 22(2): 125–149. doi:10.1111/jopp.12030
  • –––, 2014b, “Climate Change, Intergenerational Equity and the Social Discount Rate”, Politics, Philosophy & Economics, 13(4): 320–342. doi:10.1177/1470594X14542566
  • –––, 2016, “Climate Change and Non-Ideal Theory: Six Ways of Responding to Non-Compliance”, in Climate Justice in a Non-Ideal World, Clare Heyward and Dominic Roser (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 21–42. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198744047.003.0002
  • –––, 2018a, “Justice and Posterity” in Climate Justice: Integrating Economics and Philosophy, Ravi Kanbur and Henry Shue (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 157–174.
  • –––, 2018b, “Climate Change”, in The Oxford Handbook of Distributive Justice, Serena Olsaretti (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 664–688.
  • –––, 2020 “Human Rights, Population, and Climate Change” in Human Rights and 21st Century Challenges: Poverty, Conflict, and the Environment, Dapo Akande, Jaakko Kuosmanen, Helen Mcdermott, and Dominic Roser (eds), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 348–369.
  • Conly, Sarah, 2016, One Child: Do We have a Right to More, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Cripps, Elizabeth, 2013, Climate Change and the Moral Agent: Individual Duties in an Interdependent World, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199665655.001.0001
  • –––, 2015, “Climate Change, Population, and Justice: Hard Choices to Avoid Tragic Choices”, Global Justice: Theory Practice Rhetoric, 8(2): 1–22. doi:10.21248/GJN.8.2.96
  • de Shalit, Avner, 1995, Why Posterity Matters: Environmental Policies and Future Generations, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2011, “Climate Change Refugees, Compensation, and Rectification”, The Monist, 94(3): 310–328. doi:10.5840/monist201194316
  • Duus-Otterström, Göran, 2014, “The Problem of Past Emissions and Intergenerational Debts”, Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy, 17(4): 448–469. doi:10.1080/13698230.2013.810395
  • Fleurbaey, Marc, Maddalena Ferranna, Mark Budolfson, Francis Dennig, Kian Mintz-Woo, Robert Socolow, Dean Spears, and Stéphane Zuber, 2019, “The Social Cost of Carbon: Valuing Inequality, Risk, and Population for Climate Policy”, The Monist, 102(1): 84–109. doi:10.1093/monist/ony023
  • Gardiner, Stephen M., 2006, “A Core Precautionary Principle”, Journal of Political Philosophy, 14(1): 33–60. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9760.2006.00237.x
  • –––, 2010, “Is ‘Arming the Future’ with Geoengineering Really the Lesser Evil? Some Doubts About the Ethics of Intentionally Manipulating the Climate System” in Gardiner et al. 2010: 284–312.
  • –––, 2011, A Perfect Moral Storm: The Ethical Tragedy of Climate Change, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195379440.001.0001
  • –––, 2017, “Climate Ethics in a Dark and Dangerous Time”, Ethics, 127(2): 430–465. doi:10.1086/688746
  • Gardiner, Stephen M., Simon Caney, Dale Jamieson, and Henry Shue (eds), 2010, Climate Ethics: Essential Readings, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Gosseries, Axel, 2004, “Historical Emissions and Free-Riding”, Ethical Perspectives, 11(1): 36–60. doi:10.2143/EP.11.1.504779
  • –––, 2005, “Cosmopolitan Luck Egalitarianism and the Greenhouse Effect”, Canadian Journal of Philosophy Supplementary Volume 31 on “Global Justice, Global Institutions” edited by Daniel Weinstock, 279–309. doi:10.1080/00455091.2005.10716857
  • Hartzell-Nicholas, Lauren, 2017, A Climate of Risk: Precautionary Principles, Catastrophes, and Climate Change, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Hayward, Tim, 2007, “Human Rights Versus Emissions Rights: Climate Justice and the Equitable Distribution of Ecological Space”, Ethics & International Affairs, 21(4): 431–450. doi:10.1111/j.1747-7093.2007.00117.x
  • Heyward, Clare, 2014, “Climate Change as Cultural Injustice”, in New Waves in Global Justice, Thom Brooks (ed.), London: Palgrave Macmillan UK, 149–169. doi:10.1057/9781137286406_8
  • Hiller, Avram, 2011, “Climate Change and Individual Responsibility”, The Monist, 94(3): 349–368. doi:10.5840/monist201194318
  • Hoegh-Guldberg, Ove, Daniela Jacob, and Michael Taylor, 2019, “Chapter 3: Impacts of 1.5°C of Global Warming on Natural and Human Systems” in IPCC 2019: 175–311.
  • IPCC, 2019, Global Warming of 1.5ºC: An IPCC Special Report on the Impacts of Global Warming of 1.5 °C above Pre-Industrial Levels and Related Global Greenhouse Gas Emission Pathways, in the Context of Strengthening the Global Response to the Threat of Climate Change, Sustainable Development, and Efforts to Eradicate Poverty, Valérie Masson-Delmotte, Panmao Zhai, Hans-Otto Pörtner, Debra Roberts, Jim Skea, Priyadarshi R. Shukla, Anna Pirani, Wilfran Moufouma-Okia, Clotilde Péan, Roz Pidcock, Sarah Connors, J. B. Robin Matthews, Yang Chen, Xiao Zhou, Melissa I. Gomis, Elisabeth Lonnoy, Tom Maycock, Melinda Tignor, and Tim Waterfield (eds.), Intergovernmental Panel on Climate Change. [IPCC 2019 available online]
  • Isaacs, Tracy, 2011, Moral Responsibility in Collective Contexts, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199782963.001.0001
  • Jamieson, Dale, 2010, “Adaptation, Mitigation, and Justice”, in Gardiner et al. 2010: 263–283.
  • –––, 2014, Reason in a Dark Time: Why the Struggle Against Climate Change Failed—and What it Means for Our Future, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199337668.001.0001
  • Kutz, Christopher, 2000, Complicity: Ethics and Law for a Collective Age, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511663758
  • Leichenko, Robin and Karen O’Brien, 2008, Environmental Change and Globalization: Double Exposures, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195177329.001.0001
  • Llavador, Humberto, John E. Roemer, and Joaquim Silvestre, 2015, Sustainability for a Warming Planet, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Manson, Neil A., 2002, “Formulating the Precautionary Principle”:, Environmental Ethics, 24(3): 263–274. doi:10.5840/enviroethics200224315
  • McKinnon, Catriona, 2012, Climate Change and Future Justice: Precaution, Compensation, and Triage, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Meyer, Aubrey, 2000, Contraction and Convergence: The Global Solution to Climate Change, Foxhole, Devon: Green Books.
  • Meyer, Lukas H. and Dominic Roser, 2006, “Distributive Justice and Climate Change. The Allocation of Emission Rights”, Analyse & Kritik, 28(2). doi:10.1515/auk-2006-0207
  • –––, 2009, “Enough for the Future”, in Intergenerational Justice, Axel Gosseries and Lukas H. Meyer (eds.), New York: Oxford University Press, 219–248. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199282951.003.0009
  • Mies, Maria and Vandana Shiva, 1993 [2014], Ecofeminism, with a foreword by Ariel Salleh, London and New York: Zed Books.
  • Mildenberger, Matto, 2020, Carbon Captured: How Business and Labor Control Climate Politics, Cambridge, MA and London, England: MIT Press.
  • Miller, David, 2008, “Global Justice and Climate Change: How Should Responsibilities Be Distributed?”, The Tanner Lectures on Human Values, Delivered at Tsinghua University, Beijing, 24–25 March 2008. [Miller 2008 available online]
  • Moellendorf, Darrel, 2014, The Moral Challenge of Dangerous Climate Change: Values, Poverty, and Policy, New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139083652
  • Neumayer, Eric, 2000, “In Defence of Historical Accountability for Greenhouse Gas Emissions”, Ecological Economics, 33(2): 185–192. doi:10.1016/S0921-8009(00)00135-X
  • –––, 2003, Weak versus Strong Sustainability: Exploring the Limits of Two Opposing Paradigms, Cheltenham: Edward Elgar, second edition.
  • Nolt, John, 2011, “How Harmful Are the Average American’s Greenhouse Gas Emissions?”, Ethics, Policy & Environment, 14(1): 3–10. doi:10.1080/21550085.2011.561584
  • Nordhaus, William D., 1997, “Discounting In Economics and Climate Change; An Editorial Comment”, Climatic Change, 37(2): 315–328. doi:10.1023/A:1005347001731
  • –––, 2018, “Projections and Uncertainties about Climate Change in an Era of Minimal Climate Policies”, American Economic Journal: Economic Policy, 10(3): 333–360. doi:10.1257/pol.20170046
  • Oreskes, Naomi and Erik M. Conway, 2010, Merchants of Doubt: How a Handful of Scientists Obscured the Truth on Issues from Tobacco Smoke to Global Warming, New York: Bloomsbury Press.
  • O’Neill, Onora, 2005, “The Dark Side of Human Rights”, International Affairs, 81(2): 427–439. doi:10.1111/j.1468-2346.2005.00459.x
  • Page, Edward A., 2006, Climate Change, Justice and Future Generations, Cheltenham: Edward Elgar.
  • –––, 2007, “Justice Between Generations: Investigating a Sufficientarian Approach”, Journal of Global Ethics, 3(1): 3–20. doi:10.1080/17449620600991960
  • –––, 2012, “Give It up for Climate Change: A Defence of the Beneficiary Pays Principle”, International Theory, 4(2): 300–330. doi:10.1017/S175297191200005X
  • Parfit, Derek, 1984, Reasons and Persons, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Posner, Eric A. and David Weisbach, 2010, Climate Change Justice, Princeton and Oxford, Princeton University Press.
  • Rawls, John, 1999, A Theory of Justice, Revised Edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Reiman, Jeffrey, 2007, “Being Fair to Future People: The Non-Identity Problem in the Original Position”, Philosophy & Public Affairs, 35(1): 69–92. doi:10.1111/j.1088-4963.2007.00099.x
  • Rendall, Matthew, 2011, “Climate Change and the Threat of Disaster: The Moral Case for Taking Out Insurance at Our Grandchildren’s Expense”, Political Studies, 59(4): 884–899. doi:10.1111/j.1467-9248.2010.00877.x
  • Rogelj, Joeri, Drew Shindell, and Kejun Jiang, 2019, “Chapter 2: Mitigation Pathways Compatible with 1.5°C in the Context of Sustainable Development” in IPCC 2019: 93–174.
  • Shiva, Vandana, 2016, Earth Democracy: Justice, Sustainability and Peace, London: Zed Books.
  • Shue, Henry, 2014, Climate Justice: Vulnerability and Protection, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Singer, Peter, 2002, One World: The Ethics of Globalization, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, Walter, 2010, “It’s Not My Fault: Global Warming and Individual Moral Obligations”, in Gardiner et al. 2010: 332–346.
  • Stern, Nicholas, 2008, “The Economics of Climate Change”, American Economic Review, 98(2): 1–37. doi:10.1257/aer.98.2.1
  • Stokes, Leah Cardamore, 2020, Short Circuiting Policy: Interest Groups and the Battle Over Clean Energy and Climate Policy in the American States, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Vanderheiden, Steve, 2008, Atmospheric Justice: A Political Theory of Climate Change, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Watene, Krushil, 2016, “Valuing Nature: Māori Philosophy and the Capability Approach”, Oxford Development Studies, 44(3): 287–296. doi:10.1080/13600818.2015.1124077
  • Whyte, Kyle Powys, 2016, “Is it Colonial Déjà Vu? Indigenous Peoples and Climate Injustice” in Humanities for the Environment: Integrating Knowledge, Forging New Constellations of Practice, Joni Adamson and Michael Davis (eds), London, Routledge, 88–105.
  • Wong, Pak-Hang, 2015, “Confucian Environmental Ethics, Climate Engineering, and the ‘Playing God’ Argument”, Zygon, 50(1): 28–41. doi:10.1111/zygo.12151

Copyright © 2020 by
Simon Caney <s.caney@warwick.ac.uk>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free