Public Justification

First published Tue Feb 27, 1996; substantive revision Thu Mar 1, 2018

Some political philosophers and theorists place a requirement of public justification on the permissible use of state coercion or political power. According to these theorists the recognition of citizens as free and equal moral persons requires that coercion be justified for or to others by their own lights, or with reasons that they could recognize as valid. On this view, a public justification is achieved when members of the relevant public have adequate or sufficient reason to endorse a particular coercive proposal, law or policy. Those who endorse this requirement are often called public reason liberals as they hold that the coercive power of the state must be justified for or to all members of the public on the basis of good reasons.

Coercion is taken to be the object of public justification because it is the characteristic feature of political life. Charles Larmore remarks that public justification has “to do with the sort of respect we owe one another in the political realm — that is, in relationships where the possibility of coercion is involved” (Larmore 2008, 86). Rawls’s principle of public justification holds that it is political power that must be justified (Rawls 2005, 12) since, as he remarks, “political power is always coercive power” (Rawls 2005, 68). Jonathan Quong holds that public justification concerns the imposition of coercive laws (Quong 2011, 233–250). And, as Christopher Eberle puts it, (2002, 54) “the clarion call of justificatory liberalism is the public justification of coercion.” In recent years, some public reason liberals have wondered whether legal coercion is all that requires public justification (2.7), but they nonetheless agree that coercion generally, if not always, requires public justification.

Notwithstanding the characteristic association between public reason liberalism and the requirement of public justification, public justification is the genus and public reason the species. The idea of public justification is, at its root, an idea about what justifies coercion. Although we can arrive at a state in which some social arrangement is publicly justified by an explicit course of reasoning leading to the legitimation of that social state, this is not intrinsic to the more general idea of public justification, as will be seen below. In particular, we can arrive at a social state in which some arrangement is publicly justified by non-deliberative, indeed non-discursive means, and it is for this reason that public reason is a narrower notion than public justification.

John Rawls was the foremost advocate of the idea of public justification, though its importance is also stressed in the works of Jürgen Habermas, David Gauthier, Gerald Gaus, Stephen Macedo, Charles Larmore, Seyla Benhabib, and many others. There is considerable disagreement about how to understand the idea. For instance, some hold that all public justifications must occur via shared or accessible reasons (often called consensus theorists), whereas others (often called convergence theorists) hold that public justification can be obtained if different points of view each provide good grounds for a particular policy (see Section 2.3 below). Public justification theorists also disagree about the right level of idealization or how to attribute reasons to citizens, which often involves imagining them as possessing superior information and cognitive abilities. This entry explicates the idea of public justification in terms of a Public Justification Principle (PJP) that provides a classificatory system for these competing conceptions.

The entry begins by situating the idea of public justification in the history of political philosophy and examining the motivations for employing it. The PJP is then stated and explained, along with its relevant variables, including the conceptions of justificatory reasons, idealization, modalities of public justification, and whether coercion alone requires public justification. Different foundations for the PJP are then discussed. The entry also discusses concepts closely tied to public justification, such as the ideas of stability and publicity. Various objections to the PJP are then reviewed and the entry ends with a brief discussion of how the idea of public justification is employed in various applied issues.

1. Origins

The idea of public justification has been refined over the last several decades from materials drawn from the social contract tradition. The great social contract theorists – Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau and Kant – all held that for a political order to be legitimate it had to be agreed upon by or justified for each person. Of course, these theorists differed substantially about how such a demonstration should proceed. Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau developed consent theories of legitimacy, but these three theorists seemed to oscillate between an empirical standard of consent and a normative standard of consent. On the empirical standard, we have public justification for some arrangement when what each party actually believes, desires, and values is effectual in motivating her consent to the implementation of that arrangement. On the normative account, we have public justification for some arrangement when what each party ideally would believe, desire, and value gives her reason to consent to the implementation of that arrangement. In the latter case, we sometimes speak of hypothetical consent. One reason these theorists may have had for transitioning from actual to hypothetical consent is that they hoped to identify a rational justification of a political order that was not based on a sectarian theology or ideology, which might happen to enjoy widespread, but probably not universal support within the relevant community. Instead, they wanted to show that each person, given their diverse interests and reasons, still had sufficient reason to comply with some form of political regime even if that regime did not permit them to act as they would like. On this understanding of the social contract, it makes sense that, by Kant’s time, the standard of actual consent had disappeared, replaced with a standard of hypothetical consent. This appears to be a move away from actual consent and towards a normative standard of legitimacy.

Notice that all four theorists were aware of and concerned about the diversity of private judgments about justice and right action, which might systematically diverge for any number of reasons. All of these theorists concluded therefore that the private judgment of a few could not serve as the basis for legitimacy for a diverse people. As Rawls (2005, xvii) would eventually put it, these theorists recognized, however dimly, the fact of reasonable pluralism—that citizens who freely exercise their powers of reasoning will tend to pervasively and persistently disagree about their fundamental values and principles. The contract theorists concluded that the justification of coercive social arrangements had to respect, with some limits, this diversity of judgments and, hence, that justification could not be tied, either empirically or normatively, to some one specific set of beliefs, desires, and values. Such a justification had to be impartial among at least the normatively respectable diversity of points of view.

The idea of justifiability to all had just surfaced in Kant’s work when it was laid to rest for over a century. As time progressed, social contract theory was displaced by utilitarianism, Hegelianism and Marxism. These three schools of political thought criticized the idea of a social contract, though for different reasons. The social contract tradition would be revived only during the post-war period in the United States. One of the first four forms of social contract theory to arise was contractarianism, which attempts to justify coercive institutions in terms of pure instrumental rationality through rational bargains among parties dividing social resources. The first 20th century contract theorists were economists, especially John Harsanyi and James Buchanan, though attempts to work out such a theory later spread to neo-Hobbesian philosophers, especially David Gauthier, Jean Hampton and Gregory Kavka. But the dominant strand of the contract tradition is the Kantian version articulated by John Rawls, from his early work (1951, 1958) to A Theory of Justice and finally in Political Liberalism where the idea of public justification plays an explicit and central role. Rawls initially understood public justification entirely in terms of a hypothetical contract where principles of justice were justified for all members of the public. It would not be until Political Liberalism that Rawls would explicitly articulate the challenge that reasonable pluralism poses to political philosophy. For Rawls, members of the public must live according to principles that are justified for all despite the deep differences among them. Political power can only be legitimate when it is exercised in ways compatible with publicly justified norms. (It is important to note that “justified” and “publicly justified” are synonyms only for some theorists and that, on some accounts, a principle might be publicly justified because it is separately justified for each relevant individual, though perhaps in different ways. See 2.3 below.)

Thus, while public justification was a theme in neo-Hobbesian and neo-Kantian political theory (and later deliberative democratic political theory), it only came to full light in the early 1990s. Afterwards, many works on public reason and justification were published in rapid succession, the result of which is a new tradition of political thought that flourishes today. The idea of public justification is thus a core social and political concept in contemporary political philosophy. However, public justification admits of considerable variation. Each strand in the tradition resolves core ambiguities differently. These strands are examined in what follows.

2. The Public Justification Principle

The family of public reason liberal political theories (and others, such as Gaus, who sever the typical connection between public reasoning and public justification) can be categorized in accord with a master principle, the Public Justification Principle (PJP). This principle is a formal representation of this family of theories and it is used throughout the entry to classify variations on the idea of public justification. Define the PJP as follows:

The Public Justification Principle (PJP): A coercive law L is justified in a public P if and only if each member i of P has sufficient reason(s) Ri to endorse L.

The generality of the principle, which permits individuals 1 and 2, for example, to have different reasons to endorse L, means that, on some accounts, it is not the reasons which are public, in the sense of shared among all members of P. Even in this case, however, the justification of L may be public in the sense that there is, for every member of P, a reason why she endorses L and, hence, L is, subject to some other provisos, justified for the public P. The justification is “public” because it is a justification that encompasses a public, though it does so severally and individually. It is not necessarily public in another important sense, i.e., the kind of publicity associated with common knowledge. So an individual’s reason is Ri need not be commonly known to others who are members of the same public P. This would be an additional condition which is not imposed here.

PJP can be analyzed in terms of the answers to the following six questions:

  1. What makes a reason “sufficient”?
  2. How fine-grained is the specification by L of the conduct which is permitted or prohibited for members of the public?
  3. What types of justificatory reasons R do we recognize?
  4. How are the parties to public justificatory arguments idealized?
  5. What is the scope of the public?
  6. What are the modalities of public justification? Or: by which process is public justification achieved?
  7. Must we publicly justify anything other than coercion?

Before continuing, it is necessary to reiterate that public justification is not limited to those cases where reasons are successfully presented to others in justification of some claim. As indicated above, that is not the most general specification of the idea of public justification. Instead, it is simply one way to understand how the PJP is satisfied or how a public justification is brought about. Public justifications may be brought about in other ways as well (see 2.7). Notwithstanding this point, a key idea requires some further elucidation here, namely the idea of a reason and, in particular, a sufficient reason to endorse some law L. (One account of the point just made is that a justifying reason may be one that an individual i has without its being one that is presented by or to her discursively in an explicit course of reasoning. Notice also that one individual’s sufficient reason to endorse L might differ from other individuals’ reasons to endorse L.)

2.1 “Sufficient” Reasons

Notwithstanding the complexities already mentioned (one person’s reason may not be another’s; a reason R doesn’t have to be presented by or to an individual i in order for R to be i’s reason to endorse L; etc.), the PJP requires that individual members of a public P have reason to endorse a principle L if that principle is to be considered legitimate. What counts as i’s “having reason to endorse L” therefore needs to be specified.

A common approach to reasons in normative ethics is to take the idea of a reason as a primitive. A reason to Φ is simply a consideration that counts in favor of Φ-ing (Scanlon 1998, 17). But the idea of a reason in public justification political theory is more specific. While many leave the idea under-discussed, we do not need a complex ontology of reasons, only a standard for what public reason liberals should count as a justificatory reason. Gaus has provided a conception of reasons he thinks is most appropriate to the project of public justification. In Justificatory Liberalism, he holds that one has a justificatory reason when the reason is openly justified or when it is “stable in the face of acute and sustained criticism by others and of new information” (Gaus 1996, 31). This means that a reason is sufficient for a single member of the public when it is both justifiably affirmed by that person and when the member has no other reason that overrides or defeats it in the relevant circumstances. However, simply because a reason is sufficient for one member of the public does not mean it is sufficient to justify the coercion in question for all members of the public. A coercive law is only justified when each person has a sufficient reason to endorse the law. Thus, a law is justified based on sufficient reasons when each person has a sufficient reason in this sense to endorse the law.

A core assumption of public reason liberalism, the political theory associated with the idea of public justification, is that people’s reasons for action and belief can differ substantially. Consequently, a reason must in some sense be relative to an agent’s beliefs, values and other commitments. While public reason liberals need not share Gaus’s epistemology of justificatory reasons, the right account cannot be too far off, for any public reason liberal must accept that citizens can be rational to comply with reasons that others systematically reject and so, in some way or another, different individuals must be epistemically justified in affirming very different reasons. Note that this does not mean that members of the public must acknowledge the validity of a particular conception of justificatory reasons, rather that the public reason liberal theorist must accept an epistemology of justificatory reasons that allows that different reasons can be epistemically justified for different persons.

We can now see what it means to “endorse” law L. As we have seen, public justification theory has moved away from actual endorsement, where to endorse law L is to accept it through some deliberate act of will. The present idea of endorsement is understood either in terms of counterfactual endorsement (under the relevant circumstances, an agent would have accepted the law through some deliberate act of will) or rationally required endorsement. In the latter case, an agent is said to endorse the law when she is rationally committed to affirming it. That is, when rationality requires that she endorse it through some deliberate act of will.

2.2 Granularity

A principle of association A (such as a law or policy or constitution) is publicly justified for members of P if each i in P has a sufficient reason to endorse A. This leaves open the question of the “granularity” of A: how specific is A in relation to the conduct of members of P? Does it require specific forms of behavior? or does it function at some more abstract level, for instance by specifying the sorts of institutions (legislature, court, bureau) that might develop, through their own processes, subsidiary principles requiring specific forms of behavior?

Rawls held (2005, 140) that the requirement of public justification applies merely to “constitutional essentials” and that public justification is required when “basic questions of justice” are at stake. Jonathan Quong has argued (2004, 233–250) that the requirement of public justification applies first and foremost to laws, a more finely grained kind of principle justifying coercion. Gaus (2011, 495) holds that the requirement of justification applies to laws that lack “strong interactive effects” with other laws. For instance, a law banning smoking lacks strong interactive effects with a law that provides a corn subsidy. His argument for this level of granularity is that the unit of public justification must be narrow enough to identify specific forms of behavior as permitted or prohibited but general enough that it can rightly be understood and internalized as governing classes of behavior (Gaus 2011, 122–125). We focus on law L as the relevant principle of association for purposes of brevity, acknowledging that some public reason liberals work with other principles of association.

2.3 Types of Justificatory Reason

We turn now to one of the most important sources of disagreement among public reason liberals, the disagreement concerning the nature of justificatory reasons described by variable Ri in the PJP. The mainstream view within public reason liberalism is that justificatory reasons are public reasons in the sense that they can be shared by all members of the public (or, at least, be “accessible” to them in a sense to be elucidated below (see 2.3.2)). In general, variable Ri is indexed to members of the public, R1, …, Rn, but on some (consensus) interpretations of PJP, Ri is the same for each individual i. But on another (convergence) interpretation, justificatory reasons need merely be reasons that all citizens can see as justified according to reasonable evaluative standards, even if they do not accept those standards themselves. For instance, on a convergence view, a religious reason can be justificatory if it is based on reasonable religious evaluative standards that a non-religious citizen might reasonably reject for herself but that she can still acknowledge as reasonable for others. In this case, one individual’s reasons for considering some arrangement legitimate might differ from another individual’s reasons; each has reasons, but these reasons aren’t the same in the two cases. (See D’Agostino 1996, 30.)

This is a difficult concept, admittedly, and we consider it further below. It ought to be familiar, though, given that it is the sort of convergence which underwrites, for example, the legitimacy of market transactions. So, for example, antecedently A has apples and B has bananas. Because A wants bananas and B wants apples (two different reasons for action), we may find, subject to other conditions being fulfilled, that, later, after a trade, A has bananas and B has apples. This later state of affairs is “justified” for A and B because each has a reason for preferring this state to the antecedent state, even though their reasons are different reasons. And indeed, though this would be stretching the analogy to public justification too far, A’s reasons for wanting bananas might be quite unintelligible to B (perhaps he wants them for some religious ritual and she is an atheist) without that undermining the “justification” of the posterior state of affairs. Indeed, A and B need neither share, endorse, or even know what the other’s reason is; none of this undermines the “justification” of the post-trade situation.

In other words, a convergence conception of reasons requires only that individuals have their own individual reasons Ri (R1, R2, … , Rn) to support a coercive law L, whereas the consensus conception requires, in the limit, that all members of the public share a (set of) reason(s) R to endorse L. Of course, even unshared reasons have to be subject to some discipline before we can speak even of convergence rather than consensus based public justification. A’s reasons for endorsing some principle L might be so repugnant that the fact that they count in favor of L might actually undermine L’s claims to public justification (and might do so even if there were other and in her fellow citizens’ view, better reasons for endorsing L).

The consensus approach, understood as requiring that reasons be somehow mutually shared or accessible, is by far the dominant conception of public justification. The convergence view is in the minority, both in earlier works (Gaus 1990, 256; Stout 2004; Klosko 1993; Rawls 2005) and more contemporary work (Gaus 2011; Vallier 2014).

Rawls’s view helps to illustrate the complexities involved in the distinction, as he seems to have combined the two approaches. In the first “freestanding” conception of political justification, Rawls (2005, 12) requires that citizens reason on shared terms in order to converge on a political conception of justice. But in the second “overlapping consensus” conception, Rawls leaves it “to each person” to render the political conception compatible with her distinct, unshared comprehensive doctrine. Rawls included these two conceptions of justificatory reasons in a single account of political justification due to the need to identify a common, political conception of justice that all reasonable persons could share as regulative of their actions while simultaneously justifying the conception for each reasonable point of view. However, while a combination may be attractive, several writers have identified a tension between the two forms of justification and resolve it in favor of one conception of justificatory reasons or the other. Habermas (1995) provides the most well-known illustration of the tension.

We’ve mentioned that there are, plausibly, some limits to how relaxed we can be about the diversity of different reasons for endorsing L that can be entertained by the advocate of a convergence approach. Of course, some discipline is implicit in the concept of “a reason”. A factual claim, for example, does not count as a reason for (or against) endorsing some proposed principle L if there is evidence available to relevant individuals which would, in conjunction with reasonable rules of inference, imply its falsity. And a normative claim does not count as a reason in respect of L if it is utterly lacking in legitimacy, however that might be determined. But this still leaves a great variety of potential reasons available and some theorists, in seeking to organize this variety have proposed some additional tests that it might be appropriate to place on potential reasons. These are, in order of increasing stringency, intelligibility, accessibility, and shareability.

2.3.1 Intelligibility

Define intelligibility and the intelligibility requirement as follows:

Intelligibility: A’s reason RA is intelligible to members of the public if and only if members of the public regard RA as justified for A according to A’s evaluative standards.

Intelligibility Requirement: A’s reason RA can figure in a justification for (or rejection of) a coercive law L only if it is intelligible to all members of the public.

Intelligible reasons are those that members of the public can see as reasons for those who advance (or rely upon) them, as opposed to mere utterances, expressions of emotions, irrational demands or other irrelevant considerations. They see the grounds identified by as reasons in A’s understanding of what counts as a reason; RA is therefore intelligible to them as something that would count for A as a reason.

Defenders of intelligibility (Vallier 2016b) argue that reasonable pluralism applies to evaluative standards just as it applies to reasons (Vallier 2011). That is to say, reasonable people can disagree on their standards of inference and epistemic justification. For instance, some might regard theological discourse as intelligible by holding that one can reason well with respect to Biblical exegesis. Others may disagree, holding that most religions’ sacred texts are too indeterminate to effectively interpret. More abstractly, members of the public may differ as to what constitutes a good cognitive process. The intelligibility requirement is generous enough to recognize these differences but still puts some pressure on a purely empirical approach, especially in demanding that an individual’s reason for endorsing a principle must be justifiable as such according to her own standards of justification.

Not all intelligible reasons will, by that very fact, be eligible to figure in a justification of some specific principle L. Some, for example, while intelligible, are not relevant, or at least do not seem to be the sort of reason that should count towards the justification for a law. For example, suppose one favors a law making tennis part of school curriculum because one thinks tennis is good for my health, while recognizing that it is necessarily beneficial for the health of others. In this case, the reason may be intelligible but should not figure in the public justification for a law. Further, intelligible reasons may not be sufficient to justify a law in the sense specified in 2.1. Instead, intelligibility is an additional requirement, apart from bare logical sufficiency, that recognizes that, while A might not share reasons with others, the reasons he has should, in some sense, be available to others to consider and endorse as reasons at least for A (even if not for them). Intelligibility is one interpretation of how this availability might be demonstrated.

2.3.2 Accessibility

The accessibility requirement is more stringent than intelligibility. Rather than requiring that a reason for A to accept L be justified according to A’s reasonable standards (even if these are not shared by others), accessibility requires that reasons be justified according to shared evaluative standards. (In particular, that members of the public believe that RA justifies L for A according to common evaluative standards, not that RA is accepted by A as justifying L.) While accessibility permits reasons to differ (A might and B might not endorse RA), it requires that they be evaluated as reasons according to evaluative standards that are shared. Thus, accessibility lies between intelligibility and shareability, which is considered next, in section 2.4.3, because intelligibility permits differing reasons and evaluative standards, whereas shareability permits neither. Accessibility is perhaps the most common standard in the literature, with no less than eight available interpretations (Eberle 2002, 252–286; for a recent defense, see Boettcher 2015). Define accessibility and the accessibility requirement as follows:

Accessibility: A’s reason RA is accessible to the public if and only if all members of the public regard RA as justified for A according to common evaluative standards

Accessibility Requirement: A’s reason RA can figure in a justification for (or rejection of) a coercive law only if RA is accessible to all members of the public.

2.3.3 Shareability

Shareability is the strongest of the three requirements, as it combines the requirement of shared evaluative standards with the requirement of shared reasons (Bowman and Richardson 2009; Hartley and Watson 2009; Watson and Hartley 2018). (This results in a version of the familiar consensus interpretation of public justification.) Public reason liberals often argue that reasons should be shared but say little about what it means to share reasons. They presumably hold that reasons must be shareable, meaning that citizens will all have the reasons in question at the right level of idealization.

The shareability requirement, like intelligibility and accessibility, possesses two components—a requirement concerning the appropriate evaluative standards and a requirement concerning the range of permitted reasons. Define shareability and the shareability requirement as follows:

Shareability: A’s reason RA is shareable with the public if and only if members of the public regard RA as justified for each member of the public, including A, according to common standards.

Shareability Requirement: A’s reason RA can figure in a justification for (or rejection of) coercion only if RA is shared with all (suitably idealized) members of the public.

If shareability is imposed, then convergence approaches to public justification are, of course, ruled out. This is so because citizens’ public uses of reasons are restricted to shareable reasons (Some may claim that any good reason is shared by members of the public at high levels of idealization, where people would share their comprehensive doctrines; this point bleeds into the matter of idealization, addressed below).

2.3.4 A Diagram

Intelligibility, Accessibility, and Shareability are the three core requirements on justificatory reasons on offer within the public justification literature. They can be grouped together in a diagram:

Unshared Standards Shared Standards
Unshared Reasons Intelligibility Accessibility
Shared Reasons X Shareability

The bottom left quadrant is left open because public reason liberals never advocate shared reasons and unshared evaluative standards at the same time. There are perhaps two reasons for this. First, it is usually thought that sharing evaluative standards is more common than sharing reasons, and so if reasons are shared, evaluative standards should be too. Second, evaluative standards help to individuate and distinguish between reasons, so it’s not clear we could determine which reasons are shared if evaluative standards are not shared.

2.4 Idealization

Once the outer bounds of the public are set (see Section 2.5 below), and we know which individuals have to have reason(s) for some arrangement for that arrangement to be legitimate, public reason liberals need to specify how reasons are to be ascribed to the members of this group. Specifically, public reason liberals, unless they are empirical consent theorists, engage in idealization in order to understand how the beliefs, desires and values of citizens enter into the process of public justification. Idealization is the practice of considering citizens’ beliefs, desires and values as they would be given good information and good reasoning. It is typically employed on the grounds that an individual’s morally significant reasons may not be the same as the reasons she actually affirms, which are frequently based on poor information, poor reasoning or incoherent beliefs and desires. Views that determine citizens’ reasons by their actual commitments are typically described as forms of justificatory “populism” (Eberle 2002, 200).

Rawls’s primary model of idealization (1971, 118) is the veil of ignorance which models parties as reasonable by withholding from their deliberations information that would undermine their impartiality. (It is important to note that the veil device models reasonableness and that the reasoning of the parties behind the veil models (instrumental) rationality.) Jürgen Habermas (1999, 198) prefers deliberative conditions without such abstract idealization, instead favoring constraining the form of discourse among actual individuals. David Gauthier (1986, 245) prefers a bargaining scenario where individuals know the characteristics of persons but are unaware of which person they are.

Idealization should be understood in terms of citizens’ belief-value sets. A citizen’s belief-value set is the set of all her beliefs, desires, goals and plans, i.e., everything she thinks and wants. (This idea derives from Bernard Williams’s (1981, 102) conception of a subjective motivational set.) A citizen is idealized when we consider her belief-value set as it might be altered by changing one or more of her beliefs, desires, goals and/or plans according to some criteria. Theorists may imagine her having more or different information or values or require that she be fully rational, both of which will alter her belief-value set. And the appropriate level of idealization might vary with context depending of the epistemic quality of reasoning demanded by the situation (say between the reasoning required to design institutions vs. planning a family vacation).

To motivate idealization, consider how public justification fares without idealization. Populist views “take citizens as they are: the default populist position is that a rationale R counts as a public justification only if the members of the public find R acceptable in light of their existing [subjective motivational sets], irrespective of their epistemic pockmarks and doxastic defects” (Eberle 2002, 200). Populist conceptions of idealization are widely regarded as subject to enormous problems, since people can “withhold their assent because of obstinacy, selfishness, laziness, perversity, or confusion” (Gaus 1996, 121). Populism has the further problem of requiring that we ask everyone about their reasons before deciding whether a coercive law is justified.

2.4.1 Radical Idealization

Public justification theorists typically radically idealize in response to the weaknesses of justificatory populism, that is, they alter belief-value sets to rid them of inconsistencies and ignorance. Radical idealization thus contains two primary dimensions—rationality and information—that are pushed to their upper-bound. Rationality

The distinction between theories of full rationality and less-than-full rationality is central to the project of idealization, though, as will emerge, full rationality is elusive. To attribute reasons to citizens on the basis of poor reasoning would arguably corrupt the process of public justification. A theory of full rationality idealizes agents by giving parties flawless cognitive powers. (See Rawls (1971, 12) and Gauthier (1986, 234) for explicit attributions of full rationality to their agents.)

The assumption of full rationality initially seems irresistible. If we can discern the reasons citizens would affirm were they perfectly rational, then surely those would be the morally relevant reasons of citizens. The public reason liberal wants to justify demands and coercion for all rational beings in her society. How could she do better than full rationality? Another motivation for embracing full rationality is to generate agreement; many public reason liberals tacitly assume that when suitably idealized, rational and reasonable individuals will agree about many things they otherwise would not. For instance, in order to induce agreement, Rawls assumes that parties to the original position are fully rational. Were they less than fully rational, the parties might reach different conclusions.

But problems with full rationality abound. First of all, the notion of full rationality is incoherent when applied to finite and fallible beings (see Cherniak 1986); it requires adjustments to a dense web of beliefs and values that are not computable in real time and given limited resources. Secondly, the notion of full rationality, were it coherent, would leave us with justifications of arrangements that could not be reflexively endorsed by the individuals whose behavior they govern, so different are these individuals’ actual beliefs and values from those which provide the reasons justifying the arrangements. (This is one way in which the problem of stability might arise. See below 5.2.) Information

Again, public reason liberals add information to the belief-value set of ordinary citizens (and, indeed, remove misinformation) in order to avoid holding public justification captive to ignorance. Rawls, Gauthier and Habermas all pursue this strategy. Their models take for granted that idealized agents possess all (and only) the general facts required to determine what reasons they have. In general, then, public reason liberals remove beliefs and desires that interfere with the individual’s ability to adopt an impartial perspective and to add such general and specific information as is necessary for her to reason well about the issues before her. Public reason liberals disagree about what sets of information interfere with impartiality, but all theorists subtract misinformation and biasing information.

Informational idealization ranges between full information and a weaker standard of adequate or relevant information. The motivations for embracing and rejecting full information conceptions of idealization are similar to those for full rationality. A full information account is attractive since it will attribute reasons to citizens based on the maximal quantity of true propositions and no false ones. Further, full information might be thought to guarantee determinacy. If agents have all the information, then they will be more likely to have the same information and hence to converge on similar conclusions. However, full information may seem to model citizens in an implausibly abstract fashion and attributes to them powers which no finite and fallible being actually has.

2.4.2 Moderate Idealization

Public reason liberals are only beginning to take criticisms of radical idealization seriously. (See Gaus 2011, 232–260 and Vallier 2014, 145–180.) If these criticisms are successful, then one might reconsider returning to justificatory populism. However, there may be a third option: moderate idealization, where one attributes to citizens reasons based on some reasonable standard of adequate information and reasoning that nonetheless falls short of full information and perfect reasoning. The moderate idealization theorist can insist that we can go too far in separating idealized belief-value sets from the dingy, real-world belief-value sets of citizens, eventually arriving at a point where the tie is severed and indeed, as Wolterstorff insists (2007, 153), the person being idealized has no reason to care about his counterpart’s recommendations (also see Enoch 2013, 164–170; for a reply, see Gaus 2015). The pull toward radical idealization must be balanced showing respect for citizens as they actually are (this latter element will be crucial for maintaining stability; see 5.2.) While radical idealization may test the “strains of commitment” (Rawls 1971, 155–9), some moderate idealization is acceptable to most ordinary citizens as an appropriate acknowledgment of the demands of the impartial perspective.

2.4.3 Reasonableness

When public reason liberals idealize, they circumscribe the set of reasons to a set that can be recognized from a particular point of view as legitimately playing a role in public justification. This circumscription also occurs in “normative” conceptions of idealization that represent members of the public as being reasonable. In one way, reasonableness may seem to be a redundant category since figures like Rawls, Gauthier, and Habermas model reasonableness largely in terms of the information dimension by considering members of the public as deprived of partializing information that might lead them to select unfair principles. But reasonableness is not redundant, for it attributes cognitive dispositions to agents that are not explicitly captured by idealization over beliefs, desires, and values. Note that Rawls’s conception of the reasonable plays two roles in his theory of justice. First, reasonableness is modeled by the veil of ignorance, but a citizen of the well-ordered society is also reasonable because she possesses the following four dispositions (Rawls 2005, 49–52, 53–58, 60, 76, 119, 162–3, 229). (1) A disposition to engage in public justification, or to offer justifications for her own preferred principles and abide by the justified principles proposed by others. (2) A disposition to recognize the “burdens of judgment” which imply reasonable pluralism. (3) A disposition to reject the repression of other reasonable points of view. (4) A disposition to rely on methods of reasoning that others can share or access.

All genuine versions of public reason liberalism share something like the standard conception of reasonableness. On the other hand, idealizing members of the public as reasonable runs into two problems. First, such idealization runs the risk of ruling too many citizens out of the justificatory public in an illiberal fashion. Second, representing members of the public as reasonable might abandon the objective (e.g. Nagel 1987) to justify coercive social arrangements in a way that makes them voluntary.

2.5 Scope of the Public

The scope of the public determines which persons are idealized, not how the idealization should proceed. By and large, public justification theorists consider the public to include all members of a traditional nation-state. This is largely due to the need to simplify but also due to what some have called an implicit nationalism about public reason liberalism. For instance, Rawls is well-known for having confined his theory of justice to members of a nation to which no one could be added or subtracted, though he later developed an account of public justification for global matters (2002). This matter is left to debates about nationalism and cosmopolitanism (see the entries on nationalism and cosmopolitanism).

There is also some controversy concerning whether future generations should be parties to public justification and if so how they should be built into the relevant deliberative model (see the entry on intergenerational justice). Similarly, some public justification theorists, such as Gauthier, have confined public justification to those who contribute to the cooperative surplus, though others have thought that the ideal of public justification applies to all citizens, regardless of their contributions.

2.6 Modalities of Public Justification

The final dimension relevant to specifying the PJP is the structure of justificatory argumentation. The variation among conceptions of argumentation within public reason liberalism can be sorted into four groups: discursive, universalizing, bargaining, and evolutionary. Discursive theories hold public justification is achieved when an agreement has been reached among the relevant class of public discussants, whereas universalizing approaches hold that public justification has been achieved when we have located a set of moral rules or principles that can be seen as reflecting fair and reciprocal relations among persons. Bargaining theories hold that public justification is achieved when individual interests are advanced as far as possible. Evolutionary approaches are the most distinctive, and they mark the distinction between public reason theorists and the more general notion of public justification most vividly. According to evolutionists, a coercive principle L is justified for members of a public P when that principle is a stable and evolved equilibrium for P. These four theories each have a prominent representative. In order they are Jürgen Habermas, John Rawls, David Gauthier and Gerald Gaus.

2.6.1 Discursive

Discursive theories, broadly speaking, hold that the aim of public justification is to generate agreement and resolution among disputants through the process of real discourse secured by just and fair social institutions. They come in different forms, primarily either Habermasian or pragmatist theories, such as those of Robert Talisse (2005) and Cheryl Misak (2000). For our purposes, the key features of the discursive view can be examined by briefly reviewing Habermas’s theory, as he is the most prominent discourse theorist (see the entry on Jürgen Habermas).

Habermas holds (1999, 68) that “the justification of norms and commands requires that a real discourse be carried out.” The only way to achieve public justification is through free argumentation that convinces citizens to recognize the claims others make on them. For A to make a legitimate claim on B, the claim must be submitted to B’s critique.

For Habermas, one point of a discourse-focused conception of practical reason is that an individual’s conception of her interests and commitments is formed in the discursive process. He often refers to this process as “will formation” where individual opinions can change and ultimately produce a rational consensus. He idealizes in this way in order to develop a conception of the reasonable where citizens take up a discursive, moral point of view aimed at a rational consensus concerning the interests of all. (For details concerning how idealized discourse proceeds, see Habermas 1999, 65–6.)

2.6.2 Universalizing

Universalizing views hold that the point of public justification is to arrive at a regime that fairly advances the interests of all as seen from those individuals’ perspectives. The universalizing conception suggests a discourse among parties in search of an ideal that each can endorse as a public ideal for the community of which they are members. Rawls is the exemplar of such a view. For Rawls, the aim of a theory of justice is to provide a justification for the claims that citizens make on one another’s conduct. Rawls realizes, however, that gaining traction on the problem of justification is difficult, and responds by converting it into a social choice problem: “the question of justification [can be] settled by working out a problem of deliberation” (Rawls 1971, 16). Principles of justice are justified if they are selected by all parties to a properly specified choice situation, which Rawls argues will lead them to select principles of justice that will apply to all persons.

2.6.3 Bargaining

The bargaining conception of public justification holds that a regime is legitimate for an individual because it maximally advances her interests. The bargaining conception suggests a negotiation among parties in search of a stable equilibrium of opposed forces; that is, each has been assigned, by a regime, as much as she can be assigned consistent with the need to assign enough to every other party to secure their compliance. The most prominent example of a bargaining theory is David Gauthier’s contractarianism. In Morals by Agreement, he argues that citizens require a social morality in order to secure the benefits of social cooperation. But for Gauthier, unlike Rawls, moral and political norms are justified by showing that instrumental rationality requires that persons embrace a scheme of social rules. Individuals, “faced with the costs of natural or market interaction in the face of externalities agree to a different, cooperative mode of interaction”; rational individuals do so in order to “maximize their own utility” (Gauthier 1986, 145–6). Gauthier’s main concern is to show why anyone should accept the restraints morality places on individual behavior. His proposal, in short, is to show that even a very thin notion of rationality—instrumental rationality—can justify moral constraints to all. A citizen can properly be subject to state coercion in certain respects, on this account, because it is in his interests that he be so. It is important to stress that Gauthier does not base the public justification of a rule or law on the aggregate utility it will produce across persons. Instead, bargains are reached when each person provides the minimum relative concession of rents needed to get a bargain off the ground. To put it roughly, publicly justified rules are those that maximize the share of each person relative to and constrained by a similar maximization of shares on the part of others. Each side seeks the best bargain they can get.

2.6.4 Evolutionary

Evolutionary views of public justification, such as those advanced by Bryan Skyrms (1996) and Gerald Gaus (2011) are late-comers to public reason liberalism. The reason for this is that they are partly reactions to the perceived failures of the other three, more familiar approaches to public justification. In light of these failures, Gaus argues that parties to the process of public justification must be understood as intrinsically rule-following in ways that sometimes frustrates their own goals, rejecting the bargaining view, and that the parties acknowledge that discourse will not resolve their disagreements, rejecting the discursive view. Gaus also argues that parties to a universalizing form of justification will find themselves with multiple eligible social arrangements, which shows that the universalization procedure itself is insufficient to produce a determinate set of justified social arrangements. It is here that Gaus appeals to social evolutionary processes in order to produce justification. Gaus argues that evolutionary forces can select a member of the eligible set of social arrangements for implementation because each party will recognize there is no other way to secure the benefits of social cooperation. Thus, public reason is mixed with a sociological thesis about the ability of spontaneous order processes to generate convergence on a single member of an (optimal) eligible set. No one person foresees or constructs the actually justified set of moral principles or rules, but all have reason to accept the outcome of such a process.

The evolutionary approach to public justification can be understood in terms of what James March (1978) calls “adaptive” rationality rather than “calculated” rationality, where rationality is achieved when an agent adapts effectively to her environment regardless of how she does so. An agent might be adaptively rational without realizing it. However, there is a specific manner of adapting to an environment by using explicit, deliberative calculation. Calculated rationality obtains when an individual responds effectively to her environment via deliberative calculation. Many public justification theorists assume that the PJP is essentially a principle of calculated, rather than a principle of adaptive reason. This accounts for the fact that it is sometimes hard to understand Skyrms and Gaus as engaged in the project of public justification. They are so engaged but are rejecting a common presupposition—namely, that public justification has some specific forms (discourse, negotiation, deliberation) in favor of the broader conception of justification associated with equilibrium reasoning. On this account, L is publicly justified for P if each member has a sufficient reason for endorsing L even if (a) the reasons of some individuals are different from those of others, and (b) the fact that each does have a reason is a consequence of an equilibrium process, rather than an actual course of reasoning or explicit deliberation.

2.7 Coercion Alone?

Typically public justification is said to concern the use of political coercion, either regarding matters of constitutional essentials and basic justice (Rawls 2005) or coercive law as well (Gaus 2011, Quong 2011). However, in recent years, a number of theorists have argued that coercion does not always require public justification. Gaus (2011) and Chad Van Schoelandt (2015) have argued that public justification is aimed, primarily, at the justification of relations of moral authority, that is, of our capacity to issue genuinely binding moral demands of others. We have to justify our demands that others follow shared moral rules that are not coercive, such as rules requiring that we keep our promises. Colin Bird (2014) has argued that the foundation for public justification is grounded in the standing that democratic citizens have as co-authors of legislation. On Bird’s view, we may have to justify non-coercive legislation if it affects the standing of citizens, such as communicative legislation that, say, defines an optionally sworn national pledge of allegiance.

3. The Liberty Principle

One concern about defenses of the PJP is that the PJP only specifies how coercion is justified. It does not include in its content any further normative principle about why coercion is undesirable or about how coercion is to be handled if it is not publicly justified. For instance, one might combine the PJP with a consequentialist norm that unjustified coercion is to be minimized or a deontological principle that morality requires not engaging in unjustified coercion. Again the PJP is silent on these matters.

However, a number of public justification theorists and others in the liberal tradition have worked out a version of this additional norm called the Liberty Principle. The Liberty Principle takes the form of a presumption in favor of liberty or against coercion. Stanley Benn (1988, 87) defends a presumption against interference in politics and morality, claiming that “the burden of justification falls on the interferer, not on the person interfered with.” Joel Feinberg (1987, 9) is another prominent defender of the “presumption in favor of liberty” which he defines as follows: “liberty should be the norm, coercion always needs some special justification.” While Benn is concerned with interference and Feinberg with coercion, the presumption is quite similar. Rawls (2001, 44) endorses a presumption against legal coercion. He also appears to endorse a presumption in favor of liberty in his liberal principle of legitimacy: “Our exercise of political power is proper only when we sincerely believe that the reasons we offer for our political action may reasonably be accepted by other citizens as a justification of those actions” (Rawls 2005, xlvi). Rawls does not use the phrase “coercion” in this formulation, but for Rawls, “political power is always coercive power” (68). And on his view, the question of public justification for citizens is this: “When may citizens by their vote properly exercise their coercive political power over one another when fundamental questions are at stake?” (217). Given that political power is coercive power, we can understand Rawls as endorsing a presumption against the use of coercion.

When conjoined with the PJP, the Liberty Principle explains how the PJP can be applied to the justification of laws. Since there is a presumption against coercive law, the PJP, when satisfied, overcomes the presumption.

4. Foundations of the Public Justification Principle

In recent years, the number of different normative foundations for the Public Justification Principle has increased. Typically public justification has been grounded in (i) respect for persons as free and equal (Larmore 2008; for criticism, see Eberle 2002, Gaus 2011 and Van Schoelandt 2015), but we also find attempts to ground the PJP in (ii) an analysis of the nature of rationality and morality (Habermas 1996), (iii) the requirements of justice (Rawls 2005; Quong 2013), (iv) the value of civic friendship (Lister 2013; Ebels-Duggan 2010; Leland and Wietmarschen 2017; for criticism, see Billingham 2016), (v) the avoidance of authoritarianism and the preservation of moral relations between persons (Gaus 2011; for criticism, see Enoch 2013). For purposes of space, however, we omit a discussion of these foundations here, as it largely recapitulates the discussion in the entry on public reason.

A related foundational question concerns precisely to whom public justification is owed. Quong (2011, 137–160) has argued that public justification is owed exclusively to an idealized constituency of reasonable people, whereas Gaus (2011, 232–268) has argued that public justification is owed to real persons whose justificatory reasons are determined by what their moderately idealized counterparts accept as their reasons. Quong calls his view the “internal conception” and contrasts it with an “external conception” which directs public justification to real persons as they are, but the only developed alternative in the contemporary literature, the Gausian model, also appeals to idealization while directing public justification to real persons. The internal conception has been subject to a number of recent criticisms (Gaus 2012, Billingham 2017a, Vallier 2017), as has the Gausian approach (Enoch 2013, Quong 2014)

Different decisions about those to whom public justification is owed, however, traces to a deeper question about what the point of public justification is. For Quong and other defenders of the internal conception (Hartley and Watson 2018), the point of public justification is to render consistent some of our most fundamental political ideas, like the idea of society as a system of cooperation and a political conception of the person. Others following Gaus, like Vallier (2014), think the point of public justification is to establish some kind of respectful, equal, moral relations between real persons.

5. Sister Concepts

The PJP is tied to two important concepts within political theory: the ideas of publicity and stability. In some cases, public reason liberals understand public justification in terms of the capacity of laws to achieve both stability and publicity, whereas in other cases they see the ability of their conception of public justification to achieve publicity and/or stability as a merit of their conception over competitors. For instance, if a conception of the PJP is incompatible with a plausible principle of publicity or will fail to produce the right sort of stability, then that counts against the conception. Now it is true that many considerations can count against interpretations of the PJP other than problems with publicity or stability. But because public justification theorists see the concepts of publicity and stability as so central to fleshing out a conception of public justification, it seems appropriate to treat these connections here.

5.1 Publicity

In Political Liberalism, Rawls claims that “public justification” occurs when a well-ordered society achieves what he calls “full publicity” which contains or consists of three levels (see the entry on publicity). The first level “is achieved when society is effectively regulated by public principles of justice: citizens accept and know that others likewise accept those principles, and this in turn is publicly recognized” (Rawls 2005, 66). At the first level, each person grasps that a society’s basic structure is justified in terms of commonly accepted practices of inquiry and reasoning. The second level of publicity requires that citizens of a well-ordered society have shared beliefs “in the light of which first principles of justice themselves can be accepted, that is, the general beliefs about human nature and the way political social institutions generally work, and indeed all such beliefs relevant to political justice” (67). The third level of publicity concerns what Rawls calls “the full justification of the public conception of justice as it would be presented in its own terms” and must include all of the considerations we bring to the table when generating a conception of justice in the first place. The full justification must be “publicly known, or better, at least to be publicly available.”

Full publicity is achieved when all three levels of publicity obtain. And when full publicity is achieved, Rawls says that a political conception of justice is publicly justified. Public reason liberals generally hold that a law is public under a number of conditions, say when citizens know that each person has some reason to endorse their society’s laws, or when each person accepts the laws for reasons that are publicly available.

Importantly, full publicity comprises “public justification,” which is Rawls’s third stage of the justification of the political conception generally. The first two stages of justifying the political conception are the pro tanto and full justification stages, which occur only when citizens both construct a political conception of justice from shared considered judgments (the pro tanto stage) and accept the political conception from within their comprehensive doctrines (the full justification stage). Public justification occurs when each person knows that the political conception is fully justified (in the second stage’s sense) (Rawls 2005, 386–7). For Rawls (2005, 387), “public justification happens when all the reasonable members of political society carry out a justification of the shared political conception by embedding it in their several reasonable comprehensive views.” Thus, public justification is understood in terms of publicity.

Charles Larmore (2008, 203–7) traces Rawls’s idea of public reason as arising from his concerns about publicity and in his recent study of Rawls’s Political Liberalism, Paul Weithman (2011, 242) shows that publicity helps to educate a society about the basis of its political views that is crucial for maintaining a society as stable for the right reasons.

Rawls’s notion of publicity is the most common in the literature; Gaus (2011, 296–7) offers a less demanding standard of “weak” publicity.

While Rawls uses the term “public justification” to refer to the process of making an overlapping consensus public, in this entry the term is used to refer to the broader process of ensuring that all uses of coercive power are justified for each person given their reasons. Thus, publicity may be conceived of as a part of public justification but is not the primary goal that the public justification of coercion is meant to achieve. The PJP does not require that public justifications achieve publicity in order for coercion to be compatible with respect for persons. Nonetheless, publicity is a “sister concept” to the idea of public justification because it realizes the ideal of public justification.

The idea of publicity is frequently understood in terms of the publicity of shared reasons (see Rawls 2002, 173 for a connection between shared reasons and publicity). One reason for adopting a consensus conception of reasons might be that it aids the public recognition of what is publicly justified because public justification appeals primarily to reasons that are shared (Hadfield & Macedo 2012; Watson and Hartley 2018). However, any public justification view (including convergence views) should appeal to some notion of publicity, since while public justification can, on some views, occur without public recognition, many make the public recognition of justification to all a constitutive condition of a polity’s coercive laws being fully publicly justified in the broad sense of the term employed in this entry. This is, in fact, the relevance of the ideas of intelligibility and accessibility which was discussed earlier.

5.2 Stability

Another sister concept to the ideal of public justification is the notion of the stability. Many public reason liberals think it crucial to public justification that publicly justified principles be stable in some sense. For Rawls (2005, 140–143), public justification helps a political conception of justice to be “stable for the right reasons.” Weithman (2011) has argued that the central motivation for Rawls’s development of the ideas of public reason and public justification was to ensure that the justification of political principles could be stable in a society that faces the fact of reasonable pluralism. In some ways, then, the search for stability is part of the motivation for caring about public justification as such. A society can only be stable for the right reasons when the use of coercive power within that society is justified to each person based on reasons they could recognize and endorse. Otherwise, a society is stable merely because of the use of power within it. Some public justification theorists see a looser connection between stability and public justification. Whether a norm or principle can be stable is simply a good-making feature of that norm or principle vis-à-vis others (Rawls sometimes talks this way in Theory). Stability can also be seen as a merit of a particular conception of public justification over others. For instance, if a convergence conception of reasons would facilitate the public justification of laws in ways that would in turn promote stability, then that may be one reason to prefer it to a consensus conception of reasons.

Rawls’s focus on stability raises another complex issue in debates about the nature of public justification. The present entry has already distinguished between idealizing persons as reasonable or not (2.4.3). Some conceptions of idealization attribute reasons to citizens based on what they actually endorse and others attribute reasons to citizens based on what they would reasonably endorse. Stability is sometimes moralized to mean that stability is only of the valuable sort when it is based on “the right reasons” or what reasonable citizens would endorse. Rawls exemplifies this view but also resists a merely prescriptive form of stability; that is, he does not want a society to be stable based on what should render it stable. Instead, while Rawls wants a society to be stable for the right reasons, the idea of stability has content independent of its normative status of being based on the right considerations. A society can be unstable even if its institutions are based on good reasons. So the idea of stability seems tied to both a prescriptive ideal of public justification and a descriptive ideal of actual stability for the right reasons. Thus the ideal of public justification itself has both a prescriptive and a descriptive element. Public justification theorists want public justification to be actually achieved and to be based on good reasons. Gaus has criticized Rawls (1996, 130–136) for having an excessively populist or actualist conception of stability and has developed his own conception of stability for the right reasons (2011, 389–408). In general, public justification theorists all feel the pull of the normative and the descriptive, though some are more inclined toward a purely normative interpretation (Quong 2011) and others toward a more descriptive interpretation (arguably Rawls 2005).

In recent years, especially following Weithman (2011), philosophers have started to explore the mechanisms by which a well-ordered society can become stable for the right reasons. Weithman argues that stability for the right reasons is generated by the use of public reasons; in fact, Weithman argues that this was Rawls’s view. Kevin Vallier and John Thrasher (2015) have argued that public reasons are inadequate assurance mechanisms due to problems associated with cheap talk and bad information that will be present even in a well-ordered society. Brian Kogelmann and Steven H. W. Stich (2016) have argued that convergence discourse, through allowing persons to use diverse reasons as signals, can help to generate stability.

6. Objections

The ideal of public justification has many critics whose concerns are often quite deep. Since the purpose of this entry is to explain the ideal, it simply offers a comprehensive list of criticisms with brief explanations. Some members of the list are drawn from a shorter list constructed by Jonathan Quong (2011, 259–60). In general, the objections are indexed to the conceptions of public justification to which they apply. In the absence of such statement, the objection is taken to apply to all versions discussed in the entry.

6.1 The Incompleteness Objection

Many critics of the ideal of public justification argue that it cannot address a number of important issues due to its restrictions on permissible reasoning in public life (De Marneffe 1994, Reidy 2000; Schwartzman 2004). This objection is typically lodged at the standard, consensus view as the consensus view restricts the set of justificatory reasons to the subset of shareable or accessible reasons. There will be many issues on which citizens have little common ground and thus should be able to appeal to private considerations. Notice that the convergence view renders this objection less pressing.

6.2 The Indeterminacy Objection

Some public reason liberals are criticized for developing conceptions of justice that are highly indeterminate. Instead of generating clear solutions to political problems, these critics claim, public reason liberals cannot use the ideal of public justification to make determinate recommendations. The most well-known version of the objection is pressed by Gaus (2011) against more standard Rawlsian conceptions of public justification. Gaus argues that we must appeal to real social processes and evolutionary mechanisms to resolve the problem (see above 2.7.4). This objection is related to a “normalization” objection which holds that public reason liberalism avoids indeterminacy only by building implausible theoretical assumptions into their models (D’Agostino 2003).

6.3 The Antidemocratic Objection

Deliberative democrats have sometimes criticized Rawlsian versions of public reason on the grounds that they “fix” the content of, say, principles of justice, in advance of real deliberation. Habermas famously (1995, 127–8) lodged this criticism against Rawls. But notice that on our broad conception of public justification, this objection is merely an objection to the Rawlsian form of public justification vis-à-vis a more deliberative conception.

6.4 The Integrity Objection

The integrity objection holds that public justification imposes excessive burdens on people of faith because it restricts the use of unshared, comprehensive reasons, frequently religious reasons. The argument here is that persons of faith have no reason to accept the constraints that public reason liberals would impose upon them (Eberle 2002, Wolterstorff 1997, Vallier 2012). The integrity objection is often tied to a fairness objection, which holds that public reason liberalism treats religious reasons and secular reasons unequally, giving arbitrary and unjustified preference to secular reasons (Perry 1993, Wolterstorff 1997). Note that the convergence view provokes this objection less forcefully, as it allows appeal to religious reasons (Eberle 2012), though convergence is thought to have its own problems (see below). This objection is also related to what Patrick Neal (2009) calls the “Denial of Truth” objection which complains that citizens subject to the ideal of public justification cannot in their political lives appeal to the whole truth as they see it. Andrew March (2013) offers a useful taxonomy of religiously-based arguments, and motivates the view that restricting some such arguments can be overly burdensome, but restricting others can be justified.

6.4.1 The Antidiscourse Objection

Still other critics claim that public justification is too burdensome because it implies an unrealistic and excessively high-minded view of democratic politics due to how it restricts public discourse. Real politics requires the use of private reasons in cases of coalition-building and forging compromise (Shapiro 1999). This objection is related to the integrity objection because of its focus on public reason’s burdensomeness. However, it is focused more on whether public reason is realistic, not whether it is unfair or burdensome. The antidiscourse objection is aimed primarily at discursive interpretations of the idea of practical reasoning in the PJP.

6.4.2 The Marginalization Objection

Some critics argue that the ideal of public justification privileges logical, calm, dispassionate forms of discourse that are uncommon among minority groups. (It is a matter of controversy who these minority groups are.) The objections here tend to mirror those of the integrity objection, though they apply to different social groups (Sanders 1997, Young 2000). Those who advance this criticism are most concerned about the standard, Rawlsian interpretations of the PJP.

6.5 The Unreasonableness Objection

Public reason liberals often appeal to the sometimes controversial idea of reasonableness when delineating the relevant members of the public, which some critics find objectionable because it is inegalitarian (Bohman 2003, Friedman 2000). This objection focuses on Rawlsian interpretations of PJP.

6.6 The Asymmetry Objection

Public reason liberalism acquires much of its intuitiveness from pointing out that reasonable people disagree about their conceptions of the good and then use this fact to help generate a common conception of justice. But critics argue that public reason liberalism denies reasonable pluralism about justice, and thus prefers agreement about rightness over agreement about goodness. They thereby point to an asymmetry. (For discussion and rebuttal, see Quong 2011, 192–220.) This objection can be taken to apply to a wide range of interpretations of the PJP. However, it does not apply to some convergence views, as convergence theorists typically accept justice pluralism (Gaus 2011, 276–279).

6.7 The Self-Refutation Objection

The PJP holds that all coercive actions or laws must be justified to each member of the public. But critics ask whether this treatment applies to the PJP itself. If it applies, then given that reasonable people disagree about the PJP, the PJP is self-refuting. If the PJP need not be publicly justified, then it looks as if public reason liberals are arbitrarily privileging their own principle (Wall 2002; Christiano 2010, 206–213; Estlund 2008; Wall 2013; Enoch 2013, 170–173). Some public reason liberals respond by trying to show that their version of the PJP can satisfy itself (Estlund 2008), whereas other public reason liberals attempt to show that the PJP is not arbitrarily excluded from the process of public justification (Gaus 2011; Vallier 2016a). This objection can be leveled against almost any interpretation of the PJP. (For an additional recent discussion, see Billingham 2017b.)

6.8 The Perfectionism Objection

Liberal perfectionists criticize public reason liberalisms on the grounds that they prevent states from promoting the good and flourishing of citizens. The forms of “neutrality” and “restraint” the PJP entails cannot be justified (Wall 1998, Chan 2000), though perfectionists substantiate this objection in many distinct ways. For some prominent replies, see Quong 2011. Perfectionists typically reject the PJP itself, not merely some interpretations of it.

6.9 The Empty Set Objection

A general objection to the PJP is that it provides too many defeater reasons for proposed laws, though such an objection is sometimes leveled specifically at convergence views (Eberle 2012). When the diversity of citizens’ reasons is brought to bear on the process of public justification, it may turn out that very few proposals can be publicly justified, so few that intuitively legitimate political orders could not permissibly engage in the forms of coercion required to maintain even a society’s basic structure. Public reason liberals like Rawls admit that a society may have a basic structure that cannot be publicly justified (Rawls 2005, pp, also see D’Agostino 1996), and they admit that it takes a certain degree of social development to reach a publicly justified polity (Rawls 2005). One might reply that persons’ interest in having shared moral and political norms excludes a priori the possibility of an empty “eligible set” of justified proposals. But the most prominent arguments against the debilitating presence of empty sets are sociological, arguing that our shared ideas and practices make empty sets unlikely. Both Rawls and Gaus give various sociological arguments to suspect that the set is not empty (Rawls 2002, 124–128, Gaus 2011, 303–333, 389–408, 424–447). One strategy for resolving the empty set objection is to provide a ranking of eligible laws or proposals in accord with what members of the public have reason to accept or reject. Given citizens’ interest in having at least some laws to generate public order, empty set problems may be manageable. Thus citizens have reason to accept non-optimal proposals so long as they are not defeated.

6.10 The Insincerity Objection

This objection is directed at convergence views. Quong has argued that by permitting private reasons into the process of public justification, convergence liberals permit citizens to be insincere with one another since those citizens can offer reasons to others that they do not think are good reasons (Quong 2011). This ignores the complexity which is introduced when we distinguish between shared reasons and shared standards. Certainly, there is no insincerity in A’s saying that, according to shared standards, it is appropriate that B has a reason R and that R is a reason to endorse some arrangement even though A herself does not have this reason.

It also appears to rule out reasoning by conjecture (Rawls 2002, Schwartzman 2012), where persons can appeal to the reasons of other comprehensive doctrines in certain cases. That said, there are nonetheless good reasons to adopt sincerity requirements (Schwartzman 2011).

6.11 Theoretical Indeterminacy

Fred D’Agostino (1996) has argued at length that the PJP admits of many variants (we have characterized these variants in terms of different values for the variables in the PJP). While there are reasons to favor different variants of the PJP, there will be many different desiderata for any adequate interpretation of the PJP. To give one example, public justification seeks some distance from people’s actual reasons, in search of genuine justification rather than specious rationalization. On the other hand, public justificatory arguments are meant to have an impact on the individuals whom they target and, in particular, to give them motives as well as reasons for conformity to the demands they are subject to (Macedo 1990 makes these points especially forcefully). Unfortunately, there is prima facie incompatibility between these dual demands. To the extent that a given course of reasoning satisfies the demands for normative distance, to that extent is it likely to fail to meet the demands for motivational impact.

Ordinarily, the fact that a principle admits of differing conceptions which we must weigh along a number of dimensions is not a problem. Even if no one conception is superior on all relevant dimensions, we may still be able to select a variant based on all things considered judgments. But D’Agostino worries that theorists lack the conceptual resources to generate a weighing algorithm to ground these all things considered judgments.

6.12 Concerns about Idealization

Public reason liberals, again, feel powerful pressure to idealize members of the public, but some critics of public reason worry that there is no way to idealize in a non-arbitrary fashion. Eberle (2002) has argued that any idealization will tend to reflect the biases and values of the theorists who engage in the idealization. Thus, public reason liberals often end up excluding religious reasons from their idealization in ways that the critics find arbitrary. Any version of the PJP that appeals to idealization is subject to this objection.

David Enoch (2013) has recently argued that Gaus’s attempt to use moderate idealization to show that the moral demands licensed by publicly justified social-moral rules does not reduce the threat of authoritarianism. Nicholas Wolterstorff (2007) has argued that coercing someone based on an idealization is disrespectful and patronizing.

7. Applied Issues

The idea of public justification is often applied in order to make progress on a number of important applied questions, in particular on issues surrounding the role of religion in liberal democratic politics, feminism, and marriage policy.

On the expansive religion in politics literature see the entry on religion and political theory and recent literature reviews in March 2013, Vallier 2014, and Bailey and Gentile 2014.

On feminist issues in public reason, see Okin 1994, Rawls 2002, Nussbaum 2003, Baehr 2008, Hartley and Watson 2009, Hartley and Watson 2010, Neufeld and Van Schoelandt 2014, and Watson and Hartley 2018.

Concerning how public justification applies to marriage policy, see Brake 2010, Macedo 2015, and Chambers 2017.


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Versions of this entry published from 1996 to mid-2012 were written and maintained by Fred D’Agostino. Kevin Vallier took responsibility for updating and maintaining the entry beginning with the version published in mid-2012. As of March 2018, no substantive content remains from D’Agostino and it is now solely the work of Kevin Vallier.

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