It is common in epistemology to distinguish among three kinds of knowledge. There's the kind of knowledge you have when it is truly said of you that you know how to do something—say, ride a bicycle. There's the kind of knowledge you have when it is truly said of you that you know a person—say, your best friend. And there's the kind of knowledge you have when it is truly said of you that you know that some fact is true—say, that the Red Sox won the 2004 World Series. Here we will be concerned with the first and last of these kinds. The first is usually called “knowledge-how” and the last is usually called “knowledge-that” or “propositional knowledge.”
Debates about knowledge-how revolve around two main issues. First, there are debates about the degree to which knowledge-how is independent of knowledge-that. Is to know how to do something just to know lots of facts (of the right sort)? To exercise knowledge-how, must an act be preceded by some implicit or explicit consideration of a fact about how to do it? Since Gilbert Ryle's seminal (1949) presentation of the issue, the majority opinion in academic philosophy is that there is a considerable degree of independence. Knowledge-how and knowledge-that are distinct kinds; to know how to do something is not just to know the right facts about how to do it, and to exercise knowledge-how you need not first implicitly or explicitly consider a fact about how to do it. The view that knowledge-how and knowledge-that are independent in this way is usually, following Ryle, called anti-intellectualism. The view that they are dependent—that to know how to do something is just to know the right sort of fact or that to exercise know-how requires a prior implicit or explicit consideration of a proposition—is called intellectualism. There is also a more radical form of anti-intellectualism according to which to know that something is the case is to have a certain kind of knowledge-how. I'll use the label “moderate anti-intellectualism” for the less radical version.
Second, there are debates about exactly what knowledge-how consists in. The intellectualist can provide one answer—knowledge-how consists in the knowledge that certain propositions are true. If not that, what? The main anti-intellectualist answers—sometimes not clearly enough distinguished—are that knowledge-how consists in some sort of ability and that knowledge-how consists in some sort of disposition. In this entry I will outline the main views about what knowledge-how might consist in, discuss how these views point us either toward intellectualism or anti-intellectualism, and present the main difficulties that have been offered against each account.
- 1. Related Distinctions
- 2. Moderate Anti-Intellectualism
- 3. Intellectualism
- 4. Radical Anti-intellectualism
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The distinction between knowledge-how and knowledge-that overlaps three other distinctions: the ancient distinction between technê and episteme, the distinction between practical and theoretical knowledge, and the distinction between procedural and declarative knowledge.
The ancient Greek philosophers had one word, epistêmê, that is usually translated as knowledge and another, technê, often translated as craft or art. This distinction, it might be thought, maps roughly onto the distinction between knowledge-that and knowledge-how, respectively. The relationship between epistêmê and technê is rather fraught, though, so whether to classify, say, Plato and Aristotle as intellectualists or anti-intellectualists is not easy. Because epistêmê and technê are discussed extensively elsewhere in this encyclopedia, the discussion is kept brief.
According to Plato, to live a good life we ultimately need knowledge of the forms of virtue. That knowledge—epistêmê—seems to be knowledge-that. As A. E. Taylor puts the point, for Plato,
virtue, moral excellence, is identical with knowledge… vice, bad moral conduct is therefore in all cases ignorance, intellectual error. (1933, 141)
So, it might be thought that, for Plato, technê is ultimately a matter of epistêmê. But John Gould (1955) argues, to the contrary, that this natural interpretation of Plato is only seductive because Plato was not as clear on the distinction as he should have been. Ultimately, argues Gould, for Plato, knowledge (epistêmê) is knowing how. To know the good is to know how to be moral. This, thinks Gould, makes sense of how Socrates can coherently say that virtue is knowledge. For this would be odd if knowledge were factual insight into the nature of right and wrong. It's much less odd if knowledge is an ability to do certain sorts of things. Gregory Vlastos (1957), however, argues that there is an unavoidable thread of irreducible knowledge-that in Plato. For one thing, Socratic questioning aims to make men better and by correcting false beliefs (or eliminating them). According to Vlastos, Socrates came to believe a paradoxical statement (virtue is knowledge), because he overlooked the distinction between knowing-how and knowing-that, not because he thought one was a kind of the other.
It is less tempting to deny that Aristotle had a sense of the distinction. In the Nicomachean Ethics, Aristotle defines epistêmê as (as it is usually translated) scientific knowledge, while technê is translated occasionally as skill, art, or craft, or even “general know-how, the possession of which enables a person to produce a certain product” (see p. 315 of the Ostwald translation of the Nicomachean Ethics cited in the Bibliography). The distinction may not perfectly map onto the distinction between knowledge-how and knowledge-that, especially if Aristotle is taken at his word that what distinguishes epistêmê is what it is knowledge of: what “cannot be otherwise than it is” (Nic. Eth. 1139b.20). However, the distinction seems good enough to count as a precursor to the knowledge-that/knowledge-how distinction, especially when we consider that Aristotle takes technê to be “identical with the characteristic of producing under the guidance of true reason” (Nic. Eth. 1140a.10). Such a conception of technê as skill guided by norms or rules anticipates Ryle's identity of know-how with a disposition whose “exercises are observances of rules or canons or the application of criteria” (Ryle 1949, 47). It also anticipates Katherine Hawley's (2003) “direct” analysis of knowing-how according to which know-how is a matter of successful action plus warrant.
That Aristotle makes a distinction among kinds of knowledge that maps onto the distinction between knowledge-how and knowledge-that is not to say that Aristotle is an anti-intellectualist. Hawley, for example, draws a related distinction to Aristotle's but does not “prejudge whether one form of knowledge is a sub-type of the other” (Hawley 2003, 20). It's the fact that Aristotle seems to regard technê and epistêmê as distinct fundamental categories that seems to be prima facie evidence that Aristotle is an early anti-intellectualist. However, that conclusion is complicated by the fact that there are things we would normally call objects of scientific knowledge that are hard to classify in Aristotle's scheme. How, for example, should we categorize our knowledge that penicillin cures bacterial infection? It's not obviously a skill, though clearly the knowledge is going to be relevant to a doctor's skill in healing the sick. But it's also not obviously epistêmê in Aristotle's strict sense: scientific knowledge of what cannot be otherwise than it is—what is necessarily so.
One intuitive way to distinguish between practical and theoretical knowledge is to distinguish between the objects of what's known. Some propositions, for example, concern practical matters—what road to take to Tulsa, for example, or the correct way to ride a bicycle. Other propositions concern purely theoretical matters: what the square root of 16 is, or what will happen if the minimum wage is lowered. Obviously, many theoretical propositions have bearing on practical propositions: what will happen if the minimum wage is lowered has consequences for the best way to decrease unemployment. But there's still a distinction between propositions that are about what to do or how to do something and propositions that are not about these things. Knowledge of the first is practical knowledge and knowledge of the second is theoretical. Even practical knowledge in this sense can be knowledge-that and can fail to be knowledge-how.
The same goes with a second intuitive way we might distinguish theoretical from practical knowledge—not in terms of what the knowledge is about, but in terms of how the knowledge was learned. We might think that someone who reads a book about how to run a restaurant and someone who learns how to run a restaurant by working in a restaurant have very different kinds of knowledge about how to run a restaurant. One learned by doing, and one learned by being told, and perhaps this difference is reflected in the kind of knowledge each has. The first has merely theoretical knowledge of how to run a restaurant, while the second has practical knowledge of how to run a restaurant. (The distinction between ways of learning might map roughly onto the distinction in psychology between “top-down” and “bottom up”, or implicit, learning. See, e.g., Sun and Zhang 2004.)
Learning in these two very different ways is bound to result in different things known. Those who champion learning by experience will likely point to all the little bits of knowledge that get left out by mere book-learning, and perhaps all the falsehoods that come to be believed when one limits one's learning to what one picks up in books. It's unlikely that a champion of learning through experience would claim that both learners learn the same things, but bear different epistemic relations to those things. So, it's not clear how much these first two intuitive ways of dividing practical from theoretical knowledge differ.
A third way to distinguish theoretical from practical knowledge is provided by Ephraim Glick (2011). Glick suggests that his way of distinguishing the two allows the distinction between practical and theoretical knowledge to be philosophically more important than the distinction between knowledge-how and knowledge-that, and perhaps to be the distinction that debates about knowledge-how are focusing on in any case. As he points out, we attribute lots of obviously propositional knowledge by using expressions like, “S knows how” and even “S knows how to”:
someone who is told that he should jog three times a week to get in shape may, in a sense, know how to get in shape…, but prima facie it should be an open question whether the sort of know-how here ought to be lumped into the same category as the cases that have motivated anti-Intellectualism, cases like the knowing-how-to possessed by the typical swimmer or by the chess grandmaster. (Glick 2011, 427)
What we might do instead is just lump together all the seemingly unified cases of interest to the anti-intellectualist—the “cases of a self-taught skier who is unable to provide a word of helpful instruction, a skillful bicyclist whose sincere claims about how to balance and turn are all false,” etc. (Glick 2011, 427)—and distinguish them from a set of seemingly unified distinct cases: “the aspiring golfer who has absorbed instructional videos and books about golfing but has never held a club”, etc. (Glick 2011, 428). The latter kinds of cases, it seems, though we can plausibly speak of their subjects as knowing “how to” do something, in at least some sense, involve knowledge that is more of kind with knowledge, say, “about the ways in which historical figures died” (Glick 2011, 428) than the knowledge present in the first kind of case.
If we call the knowledge present in the first kind of case “practical” and the knowledge present in the second kind of case “theoretical”, then we can see that the debate between intellectualism and anti-intellectualism about knowledge-how is ultimately a debate about practical and theoretical knowledge, rather than a debate about when we should say that some subject “knows how” to do something.
The third distinction—between procedural and declarative knowledge—has its origin in discussions of artificial intelligence and is often invoked in cognitive psychology. Roughly, procedural knowledge is knowledge that is manifested in the use of a skill, whereas declarative knowledge is explicit knowledge of a fact. But the literature is conflicted, even sometimes within the same article. For example, Pawel Lewicki, et al. (1987, 523) initially equate procedural knowledge with cognitive skills, but on the same page equate procedural knowledge, not with the skills themselves, but with “processing rules”. What is more, while equating procedural knowledge with skills would seem to require that procedural knowledge is non-propositional, some discussions of procedural knowledge make it explicitly propositional. For example, Bruce Kogut and Udo Zander say that
Procedural knowledge consists of statements that describe a process, such as the method by which inventory is minimized. (1992, 387, emphasis added)
It would be a mistake to simply define procedural knowledge either as statements or as non-propositional knowledge or even as non-declarative knowledge. That's because it's supposed to be a matter of empirical discovery whether procedural knowledge is propositional or not; more to the point, according to anti-intellectualists, that procedural knowledge is not declarative knowledge is something that has been empirically established (see, e.g., Devitt 2011 and Wallis 2008). Better, then, to define procedural knowledge as the knowledge that is manifested in the performance of a skill. Declarative knowledge, on the other hand, is explicit—consciously representable. But this only maps onto the knowledge-how/knowledge-that distinction if knowledge-that is also always consciously representable. As we shall see, below, this assumption has been questioned.
Moderate anti-intellectualism is the view that knowledge-how and knowledge-that are distinct kinds. Moderate anti-intellectualism has been thought (by, e.g., David Lewis 1990 and Laurence Nemirow 1990) to undercut the so-called “knowledge-argument” in the philosophy of mind (see Jackson 1986 for a classic formulation), though Yuri Cath (2009) argues that similar worries about the argument survive even on some prominent intellectualist views. For a nice survey of other consequences thought to follow from the various positions in the knowledge-how debate, see Bengson and Moffett (2012b, 44–54).
What is it to know how to ride a bicycle? One natural answer might be this: to know how to ride a bicycle is to have a certain ability—the ability to ride a bicycle. Suppose I am assigning tasks for our start-up pizza business. I ask you, “do you know how to ride a bike?” and, suppose, you say that you do. I might then assign you the task of biking the pizza to the relevant address. If, after the pizza fails to be delivered, you say, “I don't have the ability to ride a bicycle” it seems I can rightly challenge you: “You said you knew how to ride a bike!” This is evidence that knowing how to do something entails the ability to do it. Likewise, it seems that if you have the ability to do something, it follows that you know how to do it. If, when I ask you if you know how to ride a bike, you say, “I'm afraid not,” I can rightly be annoyed if later that day I see you tooling around the streets on a bicycle. I can rightly say, “I thought you said you didn't know how to ride!” It would be an odd answer indeed if you responded, “That's right, I don't know how. I'm just able to do so.”
This “ability account” of know-how is often attributed to Ryle (see, e.g., Stanley and Williamson 2001, 416), though see Hornsby (2012, 82) for convincing dissent. Whether Ryle endorsed the account, it has become influential and, thus, subject to counterexamples. The first kind of counterexample is directed at the claim that knowing how to do something entails having the ability to do it. Imagine cases in which some expert in a given task becomes physically incapacitated and so loses the ability to perform that task—Stanley and Williamson's (2001, 416) pianist who has lost her arms (a malady that also afflicts Paul Snowdon's (2003, 8) expert omelette maker) or Carl Ginet's (1975, 8) violinist with damaged fingers. Intuitively, these subjects can retain knowledge how to perform their tasks—play the piano or violin, or make an omelette. They just no longer have the ability to exercise their knowledge. (One option, employed by Alva Noë (2005), is to distinguish between having an ability to do something, and being able to do something. According to Noë, in the relevant examples, the subjects have the ability, but aren't able to perform the relevant actions. See Bengson, Moffett, and Wright (2009, 391–92) for a response to Noë.)
There are also counterexamples to the other direction—counterexamples to the claim that if you have an ability to do something, then you know how to do it. We can construct cases in which subjects seem to have the ability to perform some act even though they don't know how to do it. Some of these cases will involve lucky performances that aren't easily repeated. For example, David Carr points out that
a novitiate trampolinist, for example, might at his first attempt succeed in performing a difficult somersault, which although for an expert would be an exercise of knowing how, is in his case, merely the result of luck or chance. Since the novice actually performed the feat one can hardly deny that he was able to do it (in the sense of possessing the physical power) but one should, I think, deny that he knew how to perform it. (1981, 53)
Torin Alter (2001) questions this latter assumption, arguing that it is too quickly assumed in such cases that the subjects don't know how to do the relevant activity, but there is empirical data that the folk—and Ryle himself (1949, 40)—agree with Carr about cases like this: the relevant subjects have the ability but lack the know-how (see, again, Bengson, Moffett, and Wright (2009, 391–92)).
At least one difference between knowing how to do something and being able to do it has to do with the range of possible worlds in which one succeeds in doing it if one tries. In normal circumstances knowing how to do something requires that trying to do it will lead to success across some specified range of possible worlds. As Katherine Hawley points out, “To say that Sarah knows how to drive is to attribute success to Sarah under some but not all counterfactual circumstances” (Hawley 2003, 20). To say that Sarah is able to drive is to say something different. The difference has to do with which possible worlds you must succeed in driving in to count as able to drive vs. knowing how to drive. As Stanley (2011, esp. 126) argues, following Angelika Kratzer's (1977) discussion of modals, it's typically the case that to be able to drive, you must succeed in driving (when you try) in some possible worlds very close to the actual world, whereas to know how to ride a bike, you need only succeed in riding a bike in worlds close to worlds somewhat similar to the actual world. For example, if you lack legs, you can know how to ride a bike if you will succeed in riding a bike in worlds in which you have legs. But you still won't be able to ride a bike, because in worlds very much like the actual world—in worlds, that is, in which you lack legs—you will fail to ride a bike.
Which features of the actual world are relevant, and so which and how many worlds you must succeed in doing something in order to be able to do that thing are highly contextual. This, perhaps, is how Stanley might deal with examples like Carr's novitiate trampolinist, were he sympathetic to Carr's conclusion about the case. When we consider Carr's novitiate trampolinist in the context of asking whether the trampolinist was able to perform the difficult somersault, we are interested in whether the trampolinist would succeed in some possible worlds much like the actual world. In more restrictive contexts, we will be interested in whether the trampolinist would succeed in all possible worlds much like the actual world. Such a context is provided by Ephraim Glick when he considers a case in which
the novice trampolinist's new coach asks him which tricks he is already able to do. The correct answer would not be a massive list including every trick he could pull off given some incredible stroke of luck. (Glick 2012, 129)
Ryle himself did not emphasize abilities but, rather, an array of dispositions and capacities. Might we instead say that knowing how to do something entails a disposition to do it? This simple variant is obviously unsatisfactory, because there are many things we might know how to do but have a disposition to avoid. Bengson and Moffett note that
It is important that anti-intellectualism requires the corresponding ability; one need not be an anti-intellectualist to allow that some ability (e.g., the ability to breathe or think or apply concepts) might be required for know-how (2007, 33),
but it seems that knowing how to do something need not involve any simple entailment to a disposition or ability to do that very thing. Such is suggested by Weatherson (2006, Other Internet Resources), who cites Ryle's (1949) claim that
You exercise your knowledge of how to tie a clove-hitch not only in acts of tying clove-hitches and in correcting your mistakes, but also in imagining tying them correctly, in instructing pupils, in criticizing the incorrect or clumsy movements and applauding the correct movements that they make, in inferring from a faulty result to the error which produced it, in predicting the outcomes of observed lapses, and so on indefinitely. (Ryle 1949 55)
If exercises of knowledge how to tie a clove-hitch can involve these disparate activities, then we can well construe knowledge how to tie a clove-hitch as a disposition to engage in these activities in the appropriate circumstances. And this fits well with Ryle's further claim that
Knowing how, then, is a disposition, but not a single-track disposition like a reflex or a habit. Its exercises are observances of rules or canons or the applications of criteria… Further, its exercises can be overt or covert, deeds performed or deeds imagined, words spoken aloud or words heard in one's head, pictures painted on canvas or pictures in the mind's eye. Or they can be amalgamations of the two. (1949, 46 ff.)
For Ryle, then, to know how to do something is to be disposed to behave in certain ways, and it's going to be very hard to specify in advance what those ways are. It will depend on the situation and on what the goals of the knower are. Still, we can say at least this: to know how to do something is to be disposed to behave in accord with various rules. For example, according to Ryle,
the ability to give by rote the correct solutions of multiplication problems differs in certain important respects from the ability to solve them by calculating. (1949, 42)
Ryle is inclined only to call the exercise of the latter ability an exercise of knowledge-how.
Do dispositional analyses avoid the counterexamples to the ability account? Does a case in which a master omelette chef has lost his arms while retaining the knowledge how to make omelettes count as a counterexample to the dispositional account? Not obviously. For the master omelette chef lacks the ability to make omelettes, but still has other dispositions appropriate to one who knows how to make omelettes. Likewise, a novitiate trampolinist who doesn't know how to execute an extremely difficult jump will—though able in some minimal sense to execute it—lack the seemingly crucial dispositions associated with one who knows how to execute such a jump. Unless there are good arguments for other accounts of knowledge-how, the dispositional account remains a contender.
Are there, then, other accounts of knowledge-how that might replace either the ability or dispositional accounts? The standard alternative is what Ryle dubs “intellectualism”, because it makes knowledge how to do something a matter of having knowledge of some fact. In its most simple form, intellectualism says that to know how to ride a bike or speak a language or play a game is just to know a certain set of propositions (perhaps in a certain way). For example, to know how to play chess is just to know the rules of chess. And to exercise one's knowledge how to do any of these things is just for these bits of propositional knowledge to govern the actions one performs. (For a helpful discussion of the distinction between what knowledge-how is and what it is to exercise knowledge-how, and how the distinction manifests itself in both intellectualist and anti-intellectualist views, see Bengson and Moffett 2012b.)
With respect to some instances of knowledge-how, the suggestion that to know how to do something is just to know that something is the case might look absurd on its face. If to know how to do something is just to know a certain set of propositions, it might seem appropriate to require that the knower be able to say what those propositions are. For example, if to know how to ride a bicycle is to know a certain set of propositions about how to move, then one way to test the truth of this account might be to see if people who know how to ride bicycles know the relevant propositions. It does not, however, seem that such a result is in the offing. I, though I know how to ride a bike, can at most tell you things like, “I ride a bike by pedaling, by keeping balanced on the seat, by steering left if I want to turn left,” etc. But plenty of folks who don't know how to ride a bike can say as much. What I can do, that non-knowers can't, is do the things in that list. I can balance, and it seems that this ability is what distinguishes the knowers-how from the non-knowers-how. Of course, there might be further propositions I know that the non-knowers don't. Ultimately, though, it seems I will run out of answers when asked what those propositions are. This point is pressed by Stephen Schiffer (2002, 200 ff.). What is more, I (if I'm like most people) will tend to give incorrect answers when asked to report how I go about doing various tasks that I clearly know how to do. Summing up the relevant results from cognitive psychology, Charles Wallis says
(1) Cognizers often perform tasks without any conscious experiences of remembering that they know how to perform the task, perceiving that they are performing the task, identifying the task they are performing, or knowing that they can perform the task. (2) Cognizers often cannot articulate the information or indicate the complexes of dispositions which would constitute the content of their supposed beliefs when explicitly questioned about such information and dispositions. (3) Cognizers often exhibit no conscious awareness of environmental factors or information shown by analysis to have importantly influenced their responses, and hence exhibit no basis for supposing that they believe that the information is relevant to their performance. (4) Cognizers often offer demonstrably false or highly implausible accounts of the reasoning underlying their performance inconsistent with any beliefs regarding how they actually perform the task, and hence cannot be supposed to have true beliefs regarding how they, in fact, perform a task. (2008, 140)
A related charge is levelled by Michael Devitt (2011), Marcus Adams (2009), and, again, Wallis (2008). Their worry is not so much that the intellectualist requires subjects who know how to ride a bike to be able to explain in detail how they do it, but rather that the intellectualist requires knowledge how to ride a bike to be in principle explicitly linguistically represented when, in fact, the bulk of evidence from cognitive psychology has it that this is not the case. Intellectualism requires knowledge-that to identified with declarative knowledge, and knowledge-how with procedural knowledge. Because cognitive psychologists have convincing evidence that declarative and procedural knowledge are distinct, knowledge-that and knowledge-how are distinct.
The natural way for the intellectualist to resist this argument is by rejecting the claim that all knowledge-that is declarative—to reject the claim that when one knows a proposition about how to, say, ride a bike, then one is in a position to offer up that proposition when one is asked how one rides a bike. As Jerry Fodor says, in support of this move, “Certain of the anti-intellectualist arguments fail to go through because they confuse knowing that with being able to explain how” (1968, 634). Fodor, however, only allows for inexpressible knowledge of this sort when that knowledge is tacit. It is not clear whether tacit knowledge is itself a species of the ordinary kind of propositional knowledge that intellectualists think know-how is a species of. Still, the appeal to tacit knowledge would allow knowledge how to ride a bike to be constituted by an epistemic relation to a proposition, even if that epistemic relation isn't the full-fledged knowledge-that relation that might be desired by the most committed intellectualists.
Jason Stanley points out that the anti-intellectualist demand that propositional knowledge be verbalizable is not intuitively motivated. On the contrary, intuitively, a “punch-drunk boxer” who can at best demonstratively refer to his re-enactment of the way of boxing against southpaws, and says, “This is the way I fight against a southpaw” intuitively knows that this is the way he fights against southpaws (Stanley 2011, 161). Of course, this knowledge has an essential demonstrative or indexical component. But the same goes for much other propositional knowledge, for example the knowledge we express by saying, “This is to the left of that,” “This is the tool for the job,” and “That is going to be trouble.” Nor does epistemology demand of us that knowledge-that be verbalizable (see Stanley 2011, 163).
Still, the argument from the cognitive psychology literature is not simply that, when one knows how to ride a bike, one cannot verbalize any attendant propositional knowledge. It's not like a situation in which we feel like there's some knowledge there and are having trouble—like the punch-drunk boxer—putting it into words. As Wallis points out, we actively deny the facts about the ways we do things. This seems like prima facie evidence against intellectualism. On the other hand, there do seem to be cases in which you come to know how to do something precisely by consulting a manual and learning some propositions (see, e.g., Snowdon (2003, 12), Bengson and Moffett (2012b, 8), and Katzoff (1984, 65ff)). Both Bengson & Moffett and Katzoff go on to suggest (more or less explicitly), this evidence is only prima facie. Nonetheless, prima facie evidence for intellectualism is still evidence for intellectualism.
A different sort of argument against intellectualism is provided by David Carr. Though Carr, as we saw earlier, is no friend of the ability account of knowing how, he doesn't think that to know how to do something is to know that some proposition is true. That's because when you know how to do something, you have an attitude that essentially takes as its object an act. But when you know that something is the case, you have an attitude that essentially takes as its object a proposition. An attitude that takes one kind of thing essentially as its object cannot be the same kind of attitude as one that takes another kind of things essentially as its object. So, the attitudes of knowing-how and knowing-that cannot be the same.
One might worry that Carr's case cannot be successful, because it might be that in taking an intentional action as its object, an attitude might very well ipso facto take a proposition as its object, for example if the proposition is partly constituted by the intentional action in question. Glick, for example, thinks it's relatively easy to construe any attitude as a relation to a proposition. As he says,
Take, for instance, abilities. For any action of φing, we could map S's ability to φ onto the proposition that S φs, and instead of saying that S is able to φ, we could say that S ‘ables that he φs’. If we had this linguistic convention, we might note that ‘abling’ is a relation to a proposition, but of course, by hypothesis, we would be talking about the same thing we actually talk about with ability attributions. (2011, 413)
Furthermore, even if knowledge-how is an epistemic relation to a proposition—even a robust, interesting relation to a proposition—that need not be the knowledge-relation. We have already seen that Fodor seems to endorse the view that knowledge-how involves standing in the tacit-knowledge-relation to the appropriate proposition. We might also think that knowledge-how can involve merely justified belief in the relevant proposition, as long as knowledge-how can be Gettiered (as Poston (2009) argues). Or knowledge-how might require only a relation of believing-truly that the relevant propositions are true (Zardini forthcoming). Or knowledge-how might involve a relationship of “seeming” to the relevant propositions: you know how to ride a bike only if there is a way, w, such that w seems to be a way for you to ride a bike (Cath 2012, 133). All these views would be inconsistent with intellectualism, though they would still be views that made knowledge-how a matter of being in a robust relation to a proposition.
In any case, Carr's is not the most influential argument against intellectualism. That, of course, is due to Ryle, where the contemporary discussion of knowledge-how starts.
Ryle's discussions of knowledge-how appear both in the second chapter of his The Concept of Mind and in his (1946) self-contained article, “Knowing How and Knowing That” (reprinted in 1971). In these works he claims to be offering what is a single core argument, expressed in different ways. But it seems rather that he is offering a number of independent arguments. One argument is that it is possible to have lots of knowledge-that without possessing any knowledge-how. In an oft-quoted passage, Ryle says that an expert chess play might impart “to his stupid opponent so many rules, tactical maxims, ‘wrinkles’, etc. that he could think of no more to tell him” (1971 , 215) but that, despite knowing all these propositions, the stupid chess player might not know how to play chess well: “a fool might have all that knowledge without knowing how to perform” (1971 , 217 ff.).
But the central argument in both texts is a regress argument, and the fundamental statement of the argument is as follows:
The crucial objection to the intellectualist legend is this. The consideration of propositions is itself an operation the execution of which can be more or less intelligent, more or less stupid. But if, for any operation to be intelligently executed, a prior theoretical operation had first to be performed and performed intelligently, it would be a logical impossibility for anyone ever to break into the circle. (Ryle 1949, 30)
How is the argument supposed to go? If all exercise of knowledge-how is preceded by a prior consideration of a proposition, the prior consideration is an act. Therefore, it had better be something we know how to do. But the act will only count as an exercise of knowledge-how—will only count as an intelligent act—if our consideration of the proposition is something we know how to do and isn't itself non-intelligent. If our consideration of the proposition is somehow accidental or related in a haphazard way to the performance of the act, then the act won't count as intelligent or an exercise of knowledge-how. Therefore, the consideration of the act had itself better be an exercise of knowledge-how and so had better—if intellectualism is right—be preceded by another consideration of a proposition. The regress is generated and, once generated, seems vicious.
But as a number of authors, most significantly Carl Ginet (1975), have pointed out (see also Stanley & Williamson (2001) and Stanley (2011)), exercises of knowledge-how can be manifestations of knowing that something is the case even if they are not preceded by mental acts of contemplation. As Ginet says,
…all that [Ryle] actually brings out, as far as I can see, is that the exercise (or manifestation) of one's knowledge of how to do a certain sort of thing need not, and often does not, involve any separate mental operation of considering propositions and inferring from them instructions to oneself. But the same thing is as clearly true of one's manifestations of knowledge that certain propositions are true, especially one's knowledge of truths that answer questions of the form ‘How can one…?’ or ‘How should one…?” I exercise (or manifest) my knowledge that one can get the door open by turning the knob and pushing it (as well as my knowledge that there is a door there) by performing that operation quite automatically as I leave the room; and I may do this, of course, without formulating (in my mind or out loud) that proposition or any other relevant proposition. (Ginet 1975, 7)
Of course, Ryle's passage does not explicitly mention knowledge-how. Some scholars (e.g., Sax 2010 and Rosefeldt 2004) think that Ryle should only be taken as attempting to show the minimal conclusion that Ginet grants: that not all exercises of knowledge-how are preceded by intelligent consideration of propositions. However, taken to show the anti-intellectualism that most scholars attribute to Ryle, many authors have taken Ginet's worry to be an insuperable difficulty for the regress argument. The idea is that, while consideration of a proposition is an act, and therefore can fail to be performed intelligently—can fail to be manifestation of know-how—manifestation of a bit of knowledge-that is not an act. Therefore, the regress ends. On the other hand, if Ryle insists that manifestation of knowledge-that requires a prior act, it seems there is no principled reason why manifestations of knowledge-how wouldn't be subject to the same requirement. Therefore, it looks like any regress generated for the intellectualist is generated for Ryle as well (see Stanley (2011, esp. 16–17), though see Fantl (2012) for a possible principled difference between the regress generated for Ryle and the regress generated for the intellectualist).
Is there anything more positive to be said in favor of the view that what you know when you know how to do something is a proposition? The most influential recent argument is that of Stanley and Williamson (2001), much of which is inspired by Vendler (1972)—though Stanley (2011) promises to be similarly important. What impresses Stanley and Williamson (and Vendler) is the symmetry between ascriptions of knowledge-how and ascriptions involving other knowledge-wh expressions, like knowledge-where, knowledge-who, and knowledge-why. For instance, just as we will say
- Leslie knows how to ride a bicycle,
we'll also say
- Leslie knows where her bicycle is,
- Leslie knows who rode her bicycle last, and
- Leslie knows why her bicycle was stolen.
One strategy is to give separate accounts of all of these locutions and the states referred to. Knowledge-how is a different kind of thing from knowledge-that, which is a different kind of thing from knowledge-where, etc. But this disunified account seems unmotivated at best, and also out of keeping with the fact that
it is a stable cross-linguistic fact that most of the sentences [above] are translated with the same verb used in translations of sentences of the form ‘X knows that p’. (Stanley 2011, 36)
The fact that we do not employ different words for these notions suggests that they are at the very least intimately related concepts. (2011, 37)
Ian Rumfitt (2003) argues that the linguistic facts are overstated and that many languages, e.g., French and Russian, contain distinct terms and constructions for the kind of knowledge-how that Ryle was interested in (though see Stanley (2011, 138–41) for a more detailed discussion of the linguistic facts that also serves as a reply to Rumfitt).
An approach that unifies the various knowledge-wh constructions and states would seem to have an admirable theoretical simplicity. What is more, there is something approaching consensus in the linguistics literature that 2, 3, and 4 should all receive treatment in terms of knowledge-that. Relying heavily on Lauri Karttunen's (1977) treatment, Stanley and Williamson argue that we should construe statements like 2, 3, and 4 as follows:
- Leslie knows, of some place p, that p is the place her bicycle is located.
- Leslie knows, of some person x, that x rode her bicycle.
- Leslie knows, of some reason r, that r is the reason her bicycle was stolen.
It seems only natural, then, to give a similar account of know-how:
- Leslie knows, of some way, w, that w is a way to ride a bicycle.
This is, roughly, Stanley and Williamson's account. Stanley (2011, esp Ch. 2) complicates the account by drawing from Groenendijk and Stokhof (1982, 1997), but the important lesson is still that the semantics of knowledge-wh locutions are unified and, furthermore, pick out states that form a metaphysical kind (Stanley 2011, 143 ff.).
Ryle himself occasionally uses knowledge-how locutions in the way Stanley endorses. The question, Ryle might say, is not whether there are some “knowledge-how” attributions that actually attribute knowledge-that. The question is whether the kinds of knowledge-how he's interested in are reducible to knowledge-that. In the same vein, recall the earlier discussion of Glick's remarks on practical and theoretical knowledge. It should be clear even to anti-intellectualists that there are readings of knowledge-how ascriptions that obviously attribute propositional knowledge to the relevant subjects. But if w is just a way for some person or other to ride a bicycle, Leslie might know that fact, but still not know how to ride a bicycle in the important sense in which Ryle is interested if w isn't a way for Leslie to ride. Second, even if w is a way for Leslie to ride a bicycle, Leslie might not know that fact in the right way. Suppose that Leslie knows that one way for her to ride a bicycle is to balance on the seat while pedaling. Still, that dry description of the physical motions required won't suffice to know how to ride a bicycle. Ryle is interested in a sense of knowledge-how that doesn't allow for these kinds of gaps. It looks like propositional knowledge does. Can intellectualists overcome these difficulties?
Propositions can be presented to us under different modes. I might know, under one mode of presentation, that Jeremy Fantl is bald. But if I don't know that Jeremy Fantl is me, then it seems that the same fact I know under one mode of presentation I don't know under a different mode. I don't know that I am bald. Likewise, if I know that I am bald, but don't know that I am Jeremy Fantl. The knowledge I have will change its type when I know the fact under one mode of presentation rather than another. I will have first-personal knowledge when I know the fact under the mode of presentation “I am bald”. I will have third-personal knowledge when I know the fact under the mode of presentation, “Jeremy Fantl is bald.” But neither type of knowledge is any less propositional for the fact that I only have it when the fact is presented to me in a certain way.
The same can be said, it seems, for Leslie's knowledge that w is a way for her to ride a bicycle. That fact can be presented in the dry way described above, or it can be presented to her in a more demonstrative way—that this-thing-that-you-are-doing-right-now is a way for you to ride a bicycle. This latter way of presenting the fact is one way to instantiate what Stanley and Williamson call a “practical mode of presentation”. According to Stanley and Williamson, when Leslie knows that w is a way for her to ride a bike under the practical mode, then Leslie knows how to ride a bike. (See Koethe (2002, 327) for a worry about practical modes of presentation—that it smuggles in an antecedent notion of knowledge-how—and see Fantl (2009, 461) for a response.)
Stanley (2011) replaces the locution “practical mode of presentation” with the locution “practical way of thinking”. Though he thinks it is necessary for handling other worries (2011, 130), he does not think it is necessary for handling the primary worry it is designed to resolve in Stanley and Williamson (2001). Recall that the worry is that the intellectualist needs a way to say that Leslie can know that some way, w, is a way she could ride a bicycle, without knowing how to ride a bicycle. Stanley and Williamson explain the possibility by pointing out that Leslie can know that w is a way she could ride a bicycle under a non-practical mode of presentation. But Stanley (2011) instead appeals to the different modal parameters used to interpret the modals in the two sentences. To simplify Stanley's example (2011, 125), the idea is this:
When a trainer in a gym says, “You can lift 200 pounds,” it might mean very different things depending on various features of the context. If you have walked into the gym for the first time and are clearly out of shape, the trainer might mean that, with the proper training, 200 pounds is something to aspire to. In modal terms, in some possible worlds close to the one in which you have the proper training, you lift 200 pounds. Alternatively, if you have just lifted 200 pounds and the trainer says, “You can lift 200 pounds,” the trainer is saying that in some possible worlds close to the actual world, you lift 200 pounds. Which possible worlds matter for the truth of the sentence is a highly contextual matter, though it's usually not difficult to figure out what the speaker has in mind.
A similar approach can work for sentences like, “Leslie knows that w is a way she could ride a bike” and “Leslie knows how to ride a bike.” When the first is true and second is false, we can assume that, by uttering, “Leslie knows that w is a way she could ride a bike”, the speaker means that Leslie knows that in some possible worlds close to the world in which, for example, Leslie practices doing w properly for a long enough time, Leslie rides a bike by doing w. However, when the speaker then says, “Leslie does not know how to ride a bike,” she is saying that there is no world (or not sufficiently many worlds) close to the actual world in which Leslie rides a bike (see Stanley 2011, 126).
Bengson and Moffett (2012a) offer us a third way to explain the difference between Leslie's third-person knowledge that some heretofore untried way to ride a bike is a way for her to ride a bike, and the knowledge she has after she learns how to ride a bike. Bengson and Moffett argue that for Leslie to know how to ride a bike it is both necessary and sufficient that Leslie has “familiarity and acquaintance with a way of riding a bike” (what they call “objectual knowledge” of that way) while “grasping a correct and complete conception” of that way (2012, 187). To satisfy these conditions is to have certain kind of understanding about that way of riding a bike. The failure of this understanding need not be traceable to the absence of an ability because it's possible to have full understanding of a way of riding a bike without being able to perform it. Rather, failures of understanding will be traceable to various misguided propositional attitudes. In that sense, the account is an intellectualist one. But it is not intellectualist in the full sense we're discussing here: Leslie's knowing how to ride a bike is not simply for her to know a proposition. It's for her to understand a way.
Making knowledge-how a kind of knowledge-that is not the only way to unify knowledge-how and knowledge-that. An alternative is to make knowledge-that a kind of knowledge-how. This view—radical anti-intellectualism—has had fewer adherents than either intellectualism or moderate anti-intellectualism. Notable radical anti-intellectualists include Jane Roland (1958), John Hartland-Swann (1956), and Stephen Hetherington (2006). Ryle himself at some more extreme moments seems to offer arguments that point to a radical anti-intellectualism: “knowledge-how is a concept logically prior to the concept of knowledge-that” (1971 , 215).
One advantage that radical anti-intellectualism might have over its more moderate cousin is that it allows knowledge to be unified. For example, radical anti-intellectualism is consistent with the claim that all knowledge-wh locutions should be analyzed in terms of knowledge-that, just as Stanley and Williamson, Vendler, and others want to do. To know where to ride a bike is to know, of some place p, that p is a place to ride a bike. But radical anti-intellectualists will then insist that this bit of knowledge-that be then accounted for in terms of irreducible knowledge-how.
Hetherington, in fact, argues that the radical anti-intellectualist's account of knowledge allows for greater theoretical unity than the intellectualist's. That's because the intellectualist has to make knowledge-that essentially a relation to a proposition. Most traditional epistemologists think that the relation in question is belief. Knowledge-that, then, is identical to a kind of belief (a true, justified, unGettiered one). But Hetherington points out that there are a variety of ways to manifest knowledge-that, and belief is just one of them:
True acceptance is another, as is one's solving a theoretical problem to which p is the correct answer. There is also one's answering correctly—to oneself or others—when asked—by oneself or others—whether it is true that p. Arguably, there is even the phenomenon of performing actions which would not be appropriate unless p were true. (2006, 76)
All of these seem to be manifestations of a single common trait, feature, or state. But the commonality can't be the true belief, because the true belief is itself just a manifestation of the same thing that manifests answering correctly, accepting truly, etc. What all these things seem to manifest is, says Hetherington, an ability: the ability to “manifest various accurate representations of p” (2006, 75) or, put in a more detailed way, an ability
to respond, to reply, to represent, or to reason accurately that p. (For short: it is the ability—the knowledge-how—to register accurately that p.) (2006, 77)
Hetherington explicitly equates the ability to do this with the knowledge how to do this (2006, 77), an equation that we have seen to be troublesome. But that issue may not be so crucial here, because even if Hetherington's account won't get us all the way to the claim that knowledge-that is a kind of knowledge-how, it will get us all the way to the claim that knowledge-that is a kind of ability, rather than an intellectual relation to a proposition, and this may be close enough. (In Hetherington 2011 he argues that we have no reason to suppose that at least some kinds of knowledge-how, including the kind on offer here, might not be a kind of ability (2011, 73).)
Adams (2009) suggests that the results from cognitive psychology that present difficulties for intellectualism also undermine Hetherington's radical anti-intellectualism. A second difficulty for Hetherington's argument is that it may not take sufficient account of an alternative intellectualist-friendly approach to knowledge-that: not the traditional account according to which knowledge-that is identical to a belief, but the so-called “knowledge-first” account according to which knowledge-that is an irreducible mental state in terms of which all other epistemic states must be analyzed. This proposal, defended by Timothy Williamson most influentially in his Knowledge and Its Limits (2000), would allow Hetherington's manifestations of knowledge-that to all be explained by single, underlying unified factor. But that underlying factor would not itself be an ability. It might be that knowing that p entails that one has the ability to “register accurately that p.” Such claims of mere entailment are hinted at more or less explicitly by various philosophers: John Hyman (1999), Jeremy Fantl and Matthew McGrath (2009), and John Hawthorne and Jason Stanley (2008), among others. But Hetherington—and the other radical anti-intellectualists—need more than this. They needs knowing how to do something to be identical with the ability.
Does this equivalence get the order of explanation right? It's tempting to ask, when you are able to get the right answer to a question, “How were you able to pick the right answer?” The natural response seems to be this one: “I knew it was the right one.” We might then ask how you knew that, and you would presumably respond by talking about the experiences you had that gave you the knowledge. But it looks like the experiences gave you the ability to pick the right answer because they gave you the knowledge that the answer was right. On the radical anti-intellectualist explanation, the explanation goes the other way around. The experiences first give you the ability to pick the right answer. And you know that the answer is right because you have the ability to pick it. (Of course, you also have the ability to pick the wrong answer. As we have seen, for “ability” to play the role that anti-intellectualists want it to play, it needs to be restricted to those abilities that ensure success across a suitable range of possible worlds.) This may not be the most natural way to construe the order of explanation.
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- Weatherson, Brian, 2006, Ryle on Knowing How, blog post at Thoughts Arguments and Rants.
- Links in Phil Papers to recent work on knowledge-how, edited by John Bengson.