Confucianism, Daoism (Taoism), and Buddhism generally name the three main currents of Chinese thought, although it should be obvious that like any “ism,” they are abstractions—what they name are not monolithic but multifaceted traditions with fuzzy boundaries. In the case of “Daoism,” it designates both a philosophical tradition and an organized religion, which in modern Chinese are identified separately as daojia and daojiao, respectively. With their own rich histories and internal differences, the two are deeply intertwined. Laozi (or Lao-tzu, in the “Wade-Giles” system of transliteration favored by earlier generations of Western scholars) figures centrally in both.
Philosophical Daoism traces its origins to Laozi, an extraordinary thinker who flourished during the sixth century B.C.E., according to Chinese sources. According to some modern scholars, however, Laozi is entirely legendary; there was never a historical Laozi. In religious Daoism, Laozi is revered as a supreme deity.
The name “Laozi” is best taken to mean “Old (lao) Master (zi),” and Laozi the ancient philosopher is said to have written a short book, which has come to be called simply the Laozi, after its putative author, a common practice in early China.
When the Laozi was recognized as a “classic” (jing)—that is, accorded canonical status in the classification of Chinese literature, on account of its profound insight and significance—it acquired a more exalted and hermeneutically instructive title, Daodejing (Tao-te ching), commonly translated as the “Classic of the Way and Virtue.” Its influence on Chinese culture is pervasive, and it reaches beyond China. It is concerned with the Dao or “Way” and how it finds expression in “virtue” (de), especially through what the text calls “naturalness” (ziran) and “nonaction” (wuwei). These concepts, however, are open to interpretation. While some interpreters see them as evidence that the Laozi is a deeply spiritual work, others emphasize their contribution to ethics and/or political philosophy. Interpreting the Laozi demands careful hermeneutic reconstruction, which requires both analytic rigor and an informed historical imagination.
- 1. The Laozi Story
- 2. Date and Authorship of the Laozi
- 3. Textual Traditions
- 4. Commentaries
- 5. Approaches to the Laozi
- 6. Dao and Virtue
- 7. Naturalness and Nonaction
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Laozi Story
The Shiji (Records of the Historian) by the Han dynasty (206 B.C.E.–220 C.E.) court scribe and historian Sima Qian (ca. 145–86 B.C.E.) offers a “biography” of Laozi. Its reliability has been questioned, but it provides a point of departure for reconstructing the Laozi story.
Laozi was a native of Chu, according to the Shiji, a southern state in the Zhou dynasty (see map and discussion in Loewe and Shaughnessy 1999, 594 and 597). His surname was Li; his given name was Er, and he was also called Dan.
Laozi served as a keeper of archival records at the court of Zhou. Confucius (551–479 B.C.E.) had consulted him on certain ritual matters, we are told, and praised him lavishly afterward (Shiji 63). This establishes the traditional claim that Laozi was a senior contemporary of Confucius. A meeting, or meetings, between Confucius and Laozi, identified as “Lao Dan,” is reported also in the Zhuangzi and other early Chinese sources.
“Laozi cultivated Dao and virtue,” as Sima Qian goes on to relate, and “his learning was devoted to self-effacement and not having fame. He lived in Zhou for a long time; witnessing the decline of Zhou, he departed.” When he reached the northwest border then separating China from the outside world, he met Yin Xi, the official in charge of the border crossing, who asked him to put his teachings into writing. The result was a book consisting of some five thousand Chinese characters, divided into two parts, which discusses “the meaning of Dao and virtue.” Thereafter, Laozi left; no one knew where he had gone. This completes the main part of Sima Qian’s account. The remainder puts on record attempts to identify the legendary Laozi with certain known historical individuals and concludes with a list of Laozi’s purported descendants (see W. T. Chan 1963, Lau 1963, or Henricks 2000 for an English translation).
Few scholars today would subscribe fully to the Shiji report. Indeed, according to William Boltz, it “contains virtually nothing that is demonstrably factual; we are left no choice but to acknowledge the likely fictional nature of the traditional Lao tzu [Laozi] figure” (1993, 270). Disagreements abound on every front, including the name Laozi itself. Although the majority takes “Laozi” to mean “Old Master,” some scholars believe that “Lao” is a surname. The Zhuangzi and other early texts refer to “Lao Dan” consistently, but not “Li Er.” The name “Dan” is generally understood to depict the bearer’s “long ears,” a mark of longevity in Chinese physiognomy. According to Fung Yu-lan, Sima Qian had “confused” the legendary Lao Dan with Li Er, who flourished later during the “Warring States” period (480–221 B.C.E.) and was the “real” founder of the Daoist school (daojia) (1983, 171).
In an influential essay, A. C. Graham (1986) argues that the story of Laozi reflects a conflation of different legends. The earliest strand revolved around the meeting of Confucius with Lao Dan and was current by the fourth century B.C.E. During the first half of the third century, Lao Dan was recognized as a great thinker in his own right and as the founder of a distinct “Laoist” school of thought. It was not until the Han dynasty, when the teachings of Laozi, Zhuangzi, and others were seen to share certain insights centering on the concept of Dao, that they were classified together under the rubric of philosophical “Daoism.”
I cite these views here only to give a sense of the diversity and volume of research on the Laozi story. It is clear that by 100 B.C.E. if not earlier, Laozi was already shrouded in legends and that Sima Qian could only exercise his judgment as an historian to put together a report that made sense to him, based on the different and sometimes competing sources at his disposal.
The fact that Laozi appears favorably in both Confucian and Daoist sources seems to argue against the likelihood that the figure was fabricated for polemical purposes. It is conceivable that a philosopher known as Lao Dan attracted a following based on his novel reading of the Way and virtue. Deferentially, his followers would refer to him as “Laozi.”
Confucius had sought his advice presumably on mourning and funeral rites, given that the Confucian work Liji (Records of Rites) has Confucius citing Lao Dan four times specifically on these rites. Indeed, various dates have been proposed for the encounter—for example, 501 B.C.E., following the account in the Zhuangzi (ch. 14). In any case, testifying to its appeal, different accounts of the meeting circulated among the educated elite during the Warring States period. Other details then came to be associated with Lao Dan, which formed the basis of Sima Qian’s reconstruction.
Admittedly, this is conjecture. Though I find little reason not to accept the traditional claim that Laozi was a senior contemporary of Confucius, the identity of the “Old Master” no doubt will continue to attract and divide scholarly opinion. In many popular accounts, Laozi is described as the “founder” or “father” of “Daoism.” This begs a number of questions and therefore should not be taken uncritically, and this is the reason why a fairly extended discussion of the Shiji Laozi story is offered here.
The story of Laozi occupies a cherished place in the Daoist tradition. It is important also because it raises certain hermeneutic expectations and affects the way in which the Laozi is read. If the work was written by a single author, one might expect, for example, a high degree of consistency in style and content. If the Laozi was a work of the sixth or fifth century B.C.E., one might interpret certain sayings in the light of what we know of the period. There is little consensus among scholars, however, on the date or authorship of the Laozi, as we shall see below.
With the arrival of the “Way of the Celestial Masters” (tianshidao), the first organized religious Daoist establishment (daojiao) in the second century C.E., the story of Laozi gained an important hagiographic dimension.
The founding of “Celestial Master” or “Heavenly Master” Daoism was based on a new revelation of the Dao by Laozi (on which see Kohn 1998a and 1998b, Kleeman 2016, and the entry on religious Daoism). In the eyes of the faithful, the Dao is a divine reality, and Laozi is seen as the personification of the Dao. Lao Dan is but one manifestation of the divine Laozi, albeit a pivotal one because of the writing of the Daodejing, which in religious Daoism commands devotion as a foundational scripture that promises not only wisdom but also immortality and salvation to those who submit to its power. During the Tang dynasty (618–907 C.E.), the imperial Li family traced its ancestry to Laozi. Today, Laozi’s “birthday” is celebrated in many parts of Asia on the fifteenth day of the second lunar month.
The influence of the Laozi on Chinese culture is both deep and far-reaching. One indication of its enduring appeal and hermeneutical openness is the large number of commentaries devoted to it throughout Chinese history—some seven hundred, according to one count (W. T. Chan 1963, 77). The Laozi has inspired an intellectual movement known as xuanxue, “Learning in the Profound”—or “Neo-Daoism,” as some scholars prefer, emphasizing its roots in classical Daoism—that dominated the Chinese elite or high culture from the third to the sixth century C.E. (See the entry on “Neo-Daoism” in this Encyclopedia.) The Laozi played a significant role in informing not only philosophic thought but also the development of literature, calligraphy, painting, music, martial arts, and other cultural traditions.
Imperial patronage enhanced the prestige of the Laozi and enlarged its scope of influence. In 733 C.E., the emperor Xuanzong decreed that all officials should keep a copy of the Daodejing at home and placed the classic on the list of texts to be examined for the civil service examinations (see, e.g., the report in the official Tang history, Jiu Tang shu 8). In religious Daoism, recitation of the Daodejing is a prescribed devotional practice and features centrally in ritual performance. The Daodejing has been set to music from an early time. The term “Laozi learning” (Laoxue) has come to designate an important field of study. A useful work in Chinese that sketches the major landmarks in this development is Zhongguo Laoxue shi (A History of Laozi Learning in China) (Xiong Tieji, et al. 1995); a follow-up effort focusing on Laozi scholarship in the twentieth century by the same lead author was published in 2002.
The influence of the Laozi extends beyond China, as Daoism reaches across Asia and in the modern period, the Western world. In Hong Kong, Taiwan, and among the Chinese in Southeast Asia and beyond, Daoism is a living tradition. Daoist beliefs and practices have contributed also to the formation of Korean and Japanese culture, although here the process of cultural transmission, assimilation, and transformation is complex, especially given the close interaction among Daoism, Buddhism, and indigenous traditions such as Shintō (see Fukui, et al. 1983, vol. 3).
During the seventh century, the Laozi was translated into Sanskrit; in the eighteenth century a Latin translation was brought to England, after which there has been a steady supply of translations into Western languages, yielding a handsome harvest of some 250 (LaFargue and Pas 1998, 277), with new ones still hitting bookstores and internet sites almost every year. Some of the more notable recent translations in English are Roberts 2001, Ivanhoe 2002, Ames and Hall 2003, Wagner 2003, Moeller 2007, Ryden and Penny 2008, and Kim 2012. A forthcoming translation is Minford 2018.
Laozi is an “axial” philosopher whose insight helps shape the course of human development, according to Karl Jaspers (1974). The influence of the Laozi on Western thinkers is the subject of Clarke 2000. Memorable phrases from the Laozi such as “governing a large country is like cooking a small fish” (ch. 60) have found their way into global political rhetoric. At the popular level, several illustrated or “comic” versions of the Laozi reach out to a younger and wider readership (e.g., Tsai Chih Chung, et al. 1995, now available also on YouTube). Some may have come to learn about the Laozi through such best-selling works as The Tao of Physics (Capra 1975) or The Tao of Pooh (Hoff 1982); and there is also A Taoist Cookbook (Saso 1994), which comes with “meditations” from the Daodejing. From nature lovers to management gurus, a growing audience is discovering that the Laozi has something to offer to them. The reception of the Laozi in modern Asia and the West falls outside the scope of this article; nevertheless, it is important to note that the Laozi should be regarded not only as a work of early Chinese philosophy, but also in a larger context as a classic of world literature with keen contemporary relevance.
The next three sections are intended for readers who are interested in the textual history and commentarial tradition of the Laozi, including the major manuscripts recovered through archaeological excavations or from the antiquities market. They are important to understanding the Laozi, but one may go directly to section 5 on the main interpretive approaches to the text if one wishes to bypass them.
2. Date and Authorship of the Laozi
The date of composition refers to the time when the Laozi reached more or less its final form; it does not rule out later interpolations or corruptions. The traditional view, of course, is that the Laozi was written by Lao Dan in the sixth or early fifth century B.C.E. This seems unlikely, however, if it is assumed that the Laozi was written by a single author. As the archaeological evidence to be presented below will indicate, bodies of sayings attributed to Laozi were committed to writing probably from the second half of the fifth century B.C.E., resulting in different collections with overlapping contents. These collections grew, competed for attention, and gradually came to be consolidated during the fourth century B.C.E. By the middle of the third century B.C.E., the Laozi probably reached a relatively stable form.
It is possible, as A. C. Graham suggests, that the Laozi was ascribed to Lao Dan around 250 B.C.E. by the text’s author or “publiciser,” capitalizing on Lao Dan’s reputation (1986, 119; also see Graham 1989). It is also possible that the Laozi has “preserved” the ideas of Lao Dan. W. T. Chan, for example, believes that the text “embodied” the teachings of Laozi, although it was not written until the fourth century (1963, 74).
It seems reasonable to suppose that Laozi, whether or not his real name was Li Er, attracted a following and that some of his sayings entered the world of Chinese philosophical discourse during the fifth century B.C.E. A process of oral transmission may have preceded the appearance of these sayings in written form.
It is conceivable that a succession of editors or compilers brought together diverse bodies of Laozi sayings, resulting in the mature Laozi. D. C. Lau, for example, is of the view that the Laozi is an “anthology” (1963, 14). According to Bruce Brooks and Taeko Brooks, the Laozi contains different layers of material spanning the period between 340 and 249 B.C.E.—“its long timespan precludes a single author” (1998, 151). Indeed, Chad Hansen describes the “dominant current textual theory” of the Daodejing as one which “treats the text as an edited accumulation of fragments and bits drawn from a wide variety of sources … there was no single author, no Laozi” (1992, 201).
Although in this sense the Laozi may be regarded as a composite work, the product of many hands over a long period of time, it should not be assumed that the sayings that now inhabit the Laozi were put together at random. More likely, the final product reflects a process of intellectual distillation on the part of the compilers, who arranged and/or altered the material at their disposal (see also LaFargue 1992 and Mair 1990 on the composition of the Laozi).
The language of the Laozi does provide some clues to its date of composition. Much of the text is rhymed. Focusing on rhyme patterns, Liu Xiaogan (1994 and 1997) concludes that the poetic structure of the Laozi is closer to that of the Shijing (Classic of Poetry) than that of the later Chuci (Songs of Chu).
The dating of the Shijing and the Chuci is by no means precise, although generally the poems collected in the former should not be later than the early fifth century B.C.E., whereas those collected in the latter can be traced to no earlier than the middle of the Warring States period, around 300 B.C.E. For this reason, Liu Xiaogan argues, the traditional view first articulated by Sima Qian should be upheld. Examining a wider range of linguistic evidence, William Baxter agrees that the Laozi should be dated earlier than the Zhuangzi and the Chuci, but he traces “the bulk of the Lao-tzu to the mid or early fourth century” (1998, 249). Both Liu and Baxter provide a concise analysis of the different theories of the date of the Laozi.
Why is all this important? It may be argued that date and authorship are immaterial to and may detract from interpretation. The “truth” of the Laozi is “timeless,” according to this view, transcending historical and cultural specificities. Issues of provenance are important, however, if context has any role to play in the production of meaning.
Polemics among different schools of thought, for example, were far more pronounced during the Warring States period than in the earlier “Spring and Autumn” period (770–481 B.C.E.). (There are different ways to date the Spring and Autumn and Warring States periods, but they do not affect the discussion here.) The Zhou government had been in decline; warfare among the “feudal” states intensified both in scale and frequency from the fourth century B.C.E. onward. As the political conditions deteriorated, philosophers and strategists, who grew both in number and popularity as a social group or profession during this time, vied to convince the rulers of the various states of their program to bring order to the land. At the same time, perhaps with the increased displacement and disillusionment of the privileged elite, a stronger eremitic tradition also emerged. If the bulk of the Laozi had originated from the fourth century, it might reflect some of these concerns. From this perspective, the origin of the Laozi is as much a hermeneutical issue as it is a historical one.
3. Textual Traditions
The discovery of two Laozi silk manuscripts at Mawangdui, near Changsha, Hunan province in 1973 marks an important milestone in modern Laozi research. The manuscripts, identified simply as “A” (jia) and “B” (yi), were found in a tomb that was sealed in 168 B.C.E. The texts themselves can be dated earlier, the “A” manuscript being the older of the two, copied in all likelihood before 195 B.C.E. (see Lau 1982, Boltz 1984, and Henricks 1989). A documentary on the Mawangdui find was aired on Chinese CCTV-10 in June 2010, which can be viewed from its website. The Hunan Provincial Museum website also provides useful information.
Before this find, access to the Laozi was mainly through the received text of Wang Bi (226–249 C.E.) and Heshanggong, a legendary figure depicted as a teacher to Emperor Wen (r. 179–157 B.C.E.) of the Han dynasty. There are other manuscript versions, but by and large they play a secondary role in the history of the classic.
A more recent archaeological find in Guodian, the so-called “Bamboo-slip Laozi,” which predates the Mawangdui manuscripts, has rekindled debates on the origin and composition of the Laozi. But first, a note on the title and structure of the Daodejing.
The Laozi did not acquire its “classic” status until the Han dynasty. According to the Shiji (49.5b), the Empress Dowager Dou—wife of Emperor Wen and mother of Emperor Jing (r. 156–141 B.C.E.)—was a dedicated student of the Laozi. Later sources added that it was Emperor Jing who established the text officially as a classic. However, the title Daodejing appears not to have been widely used until later, toward the close of the Han era.
The Daodejing is also referred to as the Daode zhenjing (True Classic of the Way and Virtue), the Taishang xuanyuan daodejing (Classic of the Way and Virtue of the Highest Profound Origins), and less formally the “five-thousand character” text, on account of its approximate length. Most versions exceed five thousand characters by about five to ten percent, but it is interesting to note that numerological considerations later became an integral part of the history of the work. According to the seventh-century Daoist master Cheng Xuanying, it was Ge Xuan (fl. 200 C.E.), a revered Daoist adept, who shortened the Laozi text that accompanied the Heshanggong commentary to fit the magical number of five thousand. This claim cannot be verified, but a number of Laozi manuscripts discovered at Dunhuang contain 4,999 characters.
The current Daodejing is divided into two parts (pian) and 81 chapters or sections (zhang). Part one, comprising chapters 1–37, has come to be known as the Daojing (Classic of Dao), while chapters 38–81 make up the Dejing (Classic of Virtue).
This is understood to be a thematic division—chapter 1 begins with the word Dao, while chapter 38 begins with the phrase “superior virtue”—although the concepts of Dao and virtue (de) feature in both parts. As a rough heuristic guide, some commentators have suggested that the Daojing is more “metaphysical,” whereas the Dejing focuses more on sociopolitical issues.
In this context, it is easy to appreciate the tremendous interest occasioned by the discovery of the Mawangdui Laozi manuscripts. The two manuscripts contain all the chapters that are found in the current Laozi, although the chapters follow a different order in a few places. For example, in both manuscripts, the sections that appear as chapters 80 and 81 in the current Laozi come immediately after a section that corresponds to chapter 66 of the present text.
Both the Mawangdui “A” and “B” manuscripts are similarly divided into two parts, but in contrast with the current version, in reverse order; i.e., both manuscripts begin with the Dejing, corresponding to chapter 38 of the received text. “Part one” of the “B” manuscript ends with the editorial notation, “Virtue, 3,041 [characters],” while the last line of “Part two” reads: “Dao, 2,426.” Does this mean that the classic should be renamed, from Daodejing to “Dedaojing” (Classic of Virtue and the Way)? One scholar, in fact, has adopted the title Dedaojing (Te-Tao ching) for his translation of the Mawangdui Laozi (Henricks 1989).
It seems unlikely that the Mawangdui arrangement stems simply from scribal idiosyncrasy or happenstance—e.g., that the copyist, in writing out the Laozi on silk, had made use of an original text in bamboo slips and just happened to start with a bundle of slips containing the Dejing (Yan 1976, 12, explains how this is possible). If the order is deliberate, does it imply that the “original” Laozi gives priority to sociopolitical issues? This raises important questions for interpretation.
The division into 81 chapters reflects numerological interest and is associated particularly with the Heshanggong version, which also carries chapter titles. It was not universally accepted until much later, perhaps the Tang period, when the text was standardized under the patronage of Emperor Xuanzong (r. 712–756). Traditional sources report that some versions were divided into 64, 68, or 72 chapters; and some did not have chapter divisions (Henricks 1982).
The Mawangdui “A” manuscript contains in some places a dot or “period” that appears to signal the beginning of a chapter. The earlier Guodian texts (see below) are not divided into two parts, but in many places they employ a black square mark to indicate the end of a section. The sections or chapters so marked generally agree with the division in the present Laozi. Thus, although the 81-chapter formation may be relatively late, some attempt at chapter division seems evident from an early stage of the textual history of the Daodejing.
Until about two decades ago, the Mawangdui manuscripts held the pride of place as the oldest extant manuscripts of the Laozi. In late 1993, the excavation of a tomb (identified as M1) in Guodian, Jingmen city, Hubei province, yielded among other things some 800 bamboo slips, of which 730 are inscribed, containing over 13,000 Chinese characters. Some of these, amounting to about 2,000 characters, match the Laozi (see Allan and Williams 2000, and Henricks 2000). The tomb is located near the old capital of the state of Chu and is dated around 300 B.C.E. Robbers entered the tomb before it was excavated, although the extent of the damage is uncertain.
The bamboo texts, written in a Chu script, have been transcribed into standard Chinese and published under the title Guodian Chumu zhujian (Beijing: Wenwu, 1998), which on the basis of the size and shape of the slips, calligraphy, and other factors divides the Laozi material into three groups. Group A contains thirty-nine bamboo slips, which correspond in whole or in part to the following chapters of the present text: 19, 66, 46, 30, 15, 64, 37, 63, 2, 32, 25, 5, 16, 64, 56, 57, 55, 44, 40 and 9. Groups B and C are smaller, with eighteen (chs. 59, 48, 20, 13, 41, 52, 45, 54) and fourteen slips (chs. 17, 18, 35, 31, 64), respectively.
On the whole, the Guodian “bamboo-slip Laozi” is consistent with the received text, although the placement or sequence of the chapters is different and there are numerous variant and/or archaic characters. Particularly, whereas chapter 19 of the current Laozi contains what appears to be a strong attack on Confucian ideals—“Cut off benevolence (ren), discard rightness (yi)”—the Guodian “A” text directs its readers to “cut off artificiality, discard deceit.” This has been taken to suggest that in the course of its transmission, the Laozi has taken on a more “polemical” outlook. However, the Guodian “C” text indicates that ren and yi arose only after the “Great Dao” had gone into decline, which agrees with chapter 18 of the current Laozi. In other words, it would be a hasty assumption that the Guodian texts do not engage in a critique of some of the key ideas central to the “Ru” or Confucian tradition.
It is not clear whether the Guodian bamboo manuscripts were copied from one source and meant to be read as one text divided into three parts, whether they were “selections” from a longer original, or whether they were three different texts copied from different sources at different times (for a nuanced discussion, see Boltz 1999). There is one important clue, however. The “A” and “C” texts give two different versions of what is now part of chapter 64 of the Laozi, which suggests that they came from different sources. One scholar at least has suggested a chronology to the making of the Guodian Laozi bamboo slips, with the “A” group being the oldest of the three, copied around 400 B.C.E. (Ding 2000, 7–9).
Taking into account all the available evidence, it seems likely that different collections of sayings attributed to Laozi expanded and gained currency during the fourth century B.C.E. They would have been derived from earlier, oral or written sources. During the third century B.C.E., the Laozi settled more or less into its final form. It was then quoted extensively in such works as the Hanfeizi and the “outer” and “miscellaneous” chapters of the Zhuangzi, and began to attract commentarial attention.
Even more recently, the growing family of Laozi texts welcomed another new arrival. In January 2009, Peking University accepted a gift of a sizeable collection of inscribed bamboo slips, said to have been retrieved from overseas. Among them, we find a nearly complete version of the Laozi.
Although the published material to date did not mention any carbon dating of the slips, the consensus among the scholars who have worked with them is that they date to the Western Han dynasty. More precisely, based especially on the calligraphic form of the writing—a relatively mature form of the “clerical” script established during the Han period—they have been dated to the second half of the reign of Emperor Wu of the Han (141–87 B.C.E.).
Like the Mawangdui silk manuscripts, the Peking University text, now referred to as the “Beida Laozi,” is divided into two parts. They are titled “Laozi Classic, Part 1” (Laozi shang jing) and “Laozi Classic, Part 2” (Laozi xia jing). This indicates that not only the Laozi was divided into two parts during the Western Han period, but also it was accorded the status of a “classic” (jing), which may give some credence to the traditional claim that the Laozi achieved canonical status during the preceding reign of Emperor Jing (156–141 B.C.E.).
The Beida Laozi agrees with the Mawangdui manuscripts in another important respect; that is, Part 1 also corresponds to chapters 38–81 of the current 81-chapter version, or the Dejing, and Part 2, chapters 1–37, or Daojing. Although this cannot be taken to mean that the Laozi was “originally” written in that order, it may be the case that this was the dominant textual tradition during the Han period. Like the Mawangdui manuscripts, the Beida Laozi also records the number of characters at the end of each part.
In terms of wording, the Beida Laozi agrees with the Mawangdui manuscripts in many instances, although in some places it agrees rather with that of the received text. For example, whereas Chapter 22 of the received text describes the sage as a “model” (shi) for the world, the Beida Laozi agrees with the Mawangdui versions in likening the sage more concretely to a “shepherd” (mu). However, the Beida text agrees with the standard version at the beginning of Chapter 2, as opposed to the shorter formulation found in the Guodian and Mawangdui versions.
What is equally significant is that the sequence or order of the chapters is exactly the same as that in the received Laozi. The difference lies in the division of some of the chapters. Chapters 17–19 of the received text form one chapter in the Beida Laozi. The same is true for chapters 6–7, 32–33 and 78–79. However, the current chapter 64 appears as two chapters in the Beida slips. Altogether there are 77 chapters. Each chapter is clearly marked, with a round dot at the start, and each chapter starts on a separate bamboo slip.
The Beida Laozi is almost intact in its entirety, missing only some 60 characters when compared with the received text. While it offers fresh glimpses into the development of the text, it does not provide any significant new insight into the meaning of the Laozi. A series of articles on the Peking University bamboo slips were published in the journal Wenwu (2011, no. 6). The Beida Laozi was published in December 2012 and launched in February 2013. Although the majority of scholars accept the authenticity of the find, a notable critic is Xing Wen, who argues strongly that it is a forgery (Xing 2016; for a critical discussion in English, see Foster 2017).
In summary, two approaches to the making of the Laozi warrant consideration, for they bear directly on interpretation.
A linear “evolutionary” model of textual formation would suggest that the earliest sayings attributed to Laozi address principally issues of governance, reflecting a deep concern with the decline of Zhou rule. Some of these sayings were preserved in the Guodian bamboo texts.
On this view, the Laozi underwent substantial change and grew into a longer and more complex work during the third century B.C.E., becoming in this process more polemical against the Confucian and other schools of thought, and acquiring new material of stronger metaphysical or cosmological interest. The Mawangdui manuscripts were based on this mature version of the Laozi; the original emphasis on politics, however, can still be detected in the placement of the Dejing before the Daojing. Later versions reversed this order and in so doing subsumed politics under a broader philosophical vision of Dao as the beginning and end of all beings.
As distinguished from a linear evolutionary model, what is suggested here is that there were different collections of sayings attributed to Laozi, overlapping to some extent but each with its own emphases and predilections, inhabiting a particular interpretive context.
Although some key chapters in the current Laozi that deal with the nature of Dao (e.g., chs. 1, 14) are not found in the Guodian corpus, the idea that the Dao is “born before heaven and earth,” for example, which is found in chapter 25 of the received text is already present. The critical claim that “being [you] is born of nonbeing [wu]” in chapter 40 also figures in the Guodian “A” text. This seems to argue against the suggestion that the Laozi, and for that matter ancient Chinese philosophical works in general, were not interested or lacked the ability to engage in abstract philosophic thinking, an assumption that sometimes appears to underlie evolutionary approaches to the development of Chinese philosophy.
Another Guodian document, given the title “Taiyi shengshui” (“The Great One Gives Birth to the Waters,” translated in Ames and Hall 2003; also see Boltz 1999 and Allan 2003) and which may have formed an integral part of the Guodian Laozi “C” text, certainly reflects strong interest in cosmogony and cosmology. The text known as “Heng Xian,” one of the documents found in the corpus of bamboo slips recovered by the Shanghai Museum in 1994 and which I interpret in the sense of that which comes before and determines the created order, testifies further to the active engagement with cosmological and metaphysical questions in early China (Ma Chengyuan 2003; a special issue of the journal Dao 12.2, 2013 is devoted to this work).
The Guodian and Mawangdui finds are extremely valuable. They are syntactically clearer than the received text in some instances, thanks to the larger number of grammatical particles they employ. Nevertheless, they cannot resolve all the controversies and uncertainties surrounding the Laozi. In my view, the nature of Dao and the application of Daoist insight to ethics and governance probably formed the twin foci in collections of Laozi sayings from the start. They were then developed in several ways—e.g., some collections were combined; new sayings were added; and explanatory comments, illustrations, and elaboration on individual sayings were integrated into the text. The demand for textual uniformity rose when the Laozi gained recognition, and consequently the different textual traditions eventually gave way to the received text of the Laozi.
As mentioned, the current Laozi on which most reprints, studies and translations are based is the version that comes down to us along with the commentaries by Wang Bi and Heshanggong. Three points need to be made in this regard.
First, technically there are multiple versions of the Wang Bi and Heshanggong Laozi—over thirty Heshanggong versions are extant—but the differences are on the whole minor. Second, the Wang Bi and Heshanggong versions are not the same, but they are sufficiently similar to be classified as belonging to the same line of textual transmission. Third, the Wang Bi and Heshanggong versions that we see today have suffered change. Prior to the invention of printing, when each manuscript had to be copied by hand, editorial changes and scribal errors are to be expected. In particular, the Laozi text that now accompanies Wang Bi’s commentary bears the imprint of later alteration, mainly under the influence of the Heshanggong version, and cannot be regarded as the Laozi that Wang Bi himself had seen and commented on. Boltz (1985) and Wagner (1989) have examined this question in some detail.
The “current” version refers to the Sibu beiyao and the Sibu congkan editions of the Daodejing. (The Sibu beiyao and Sibu congkan are large-scale reproductions of traditional Chinese texts published in the early twentieth century.) The former contains the Wang Bi version and commentary, together with a colophon by the Song scholar Chao Yuezhi (1059–1129), a second note by Xiong Ke (ca. 1111–1184), and the Tang scholar Lu Deming’s (556–627) Laozi yinyi (Glosses on the Meaning and Pronunciation of the Laozi). It is a reproduction of the Qing dynasty “Wuying Palace” edition, which in turn is based on a Ming edition (see especially Hatano 1979).
The Heshanggong version preserved in the Sibu congkan series is taken from the library of the famous bibliophile Qu Yong (fl. 1850). According to Qu’s own catalogue, this is a Song dynasty version, published probably after the reign of the emperor Xiaozong (r. 1163–1189). Older extant Heshanggong versions include two incomplete Tang versions and fragments found in Dunhuang.
Besides the Guodian bamboo texts, the Mawangdui silk manuscripts, the Beida Laozi and the received text of Wang Bi and Heshanggong, there is an “ancient version” (guben) edited by the early Tang scholar Fu Yi (fl. 600). Reportedly, this version was recovered from a tomb in 574 C.E., whose occupant was a consort of the Chu general Xiang Yu (d. 202 B.C.E.), the rival of Liu Bang before the latter emerged victorious and founded the Han dynasty. A later redaction of the “ancient version” was made by Fan Yingyuan in the Song dynasty. There are some differences, but these two can be regarded as having stemmed from the same textual tradition.
Manuscript fragments discovered in the Dunhuang caves form another important source in Laozi research. Among them are several Heshanggong fragments (especially S. 477 and S. 3926 in the Stein collection, and P. 2639 in the Pelliot collection) and the important Xiang’er Laozi with commentary. Another Dunhuang manuscript that merits attention is the “Suo Dan” fragment, now at the University Art Museum, Princeton University, which contains the last thirty-one chapters of the Daodejing beginning with chapter 51 of the modern text. It is signed and dated at the end, bearing the name of the third-century scholar and diviner Suo Dan, who is said to have made the copy, written in ink on paper, in 270 C.E. According to Rao Zongyi (1955), the Suo Dan version belongs to the Heshanggong line of the Laozi text. William Boltz (1996), however, questions its third-century date and argues that the fragment in many instances also agrees with the Fu Yi “ancient version.”
While manuscript versions inform textual criticism of the Laozi, stone inscriptions provide further collaborating support. Over twenty steles, mainly of Tang and Song origins, are available to textual critics, although some are in poor condition (Yan 1957). Students of the Laozi today can work with several Chinese and Japanese studies that make use of a large number of manuscript versions and stone inscriptions (notably Ma 1965, Jiang 1980, Zhu 1980, and Shima 1973). Boltz (1993) offers an excellent introduction to the manuscript traditions of the Laozi. Wagner (2003) attempts to reconstruct the original face of Wang Bi’s Laozi (cf. Lou 1980 and Lynn 1999). A major contribution to Laozi studies in Chinese is Liu Xiaogan 2006, which compares the Guodian, Mawangdui, Fu Yi, Wang Bi, and Heshanggong versions of the Laozi and provides detailed textual and interpretive analysis for each chapter. In an article in English, Liu (2003) sets out some of his main findings.
Commentaries to the Laozi offer an invaluable guide to interpretation and are important also for their own contributions to Chinese philosophy and religion.
Two chapters in the current Hanfeizi (chs. 21 and 22) are entitled “Explaining (the Sayings of) Laozi” (Jie Lao) and “Illustrating (the Sayings of) Laozi” (Yu Lao), which can be regarded as the earliest extant commentary to the classic (for a detailed study and translation, see Sarah A. Queen 2013). The “bibliographical” section of the Hanshu (History of the Former or Western Han Dynasty) lists four commentaries to the Laozi, but they have not survived. Nevertheless, Laozi learning began to flourish from the Han period. The commentaries by Heshanggong, Yan Zun, Wang Bi, and the Xiang’er commentary will be introduced in what follows. Some mention will also be made of later developments in the history of the Daodejing. The late Isabelle Robinet has contributed an important pioneering study of the early Laozi commentaries (1977; see also Robinet 1998).
Traditionally, the Heshanggong commentary is regarded as a product of the early Han dynasty. The name Heshanggong means an old man who dwells by the side of a river, and some have identified the river in question to be the Yellow River. An expert on the Laozi, he caught the attention of Emperor Wen, who went personally to consult him. Heshanggong revealed to the emperor his true identity as a divine emissary sent by the “Supreme Lord of the Dao”—i.e., the divine Laozi—to teach him. The emperor proved a humble student, as the legend concludes, worthy of receiving the Daodejing with Heshanggong’s commentary (A. Chan 1991).
Recent Chinese studies generally place the commentary at the end of the Han period, although some Japanese scholars would date it to as late as the sixth century C.E. It is probably a second-century C.E. work and reflects the influence of the “Huang-Lao” (Yellow Emperor and Laozi) tradition, which flourished during the early Han dynasty (A. Chan 1991a). Called in early sources the Laozi zhangju, it belongs to the genre of zhangju literature, prevalent in Han times, which one may paraphrase as commentary by “chapter and sentence.” Its language is simple; its imagination, down-to-earth. The Heshanggong commentary shares with other Han works the cosmological belief that the universe is constituted by qi, the energy-like building blocks of life and the vital constituent of the cosmos, variously translated as “vital energy,” “life-force,” or “pneuma.” On this basis, interpreting the text in terms of yin-yang theory, the Laozi is seen to disclose not only the mystery of the origins of the universe but also the secret to personal well-being and sociopolitical order.
What the Laozi calls the “One,” according to Heshanggong, refers to the purest and most potent form of qi-energy that brings forth and continues to nourish all beings. This is the meaning of de, the “virtue” or power with which the “ten thousand things”—i.e., all beings—have been endowed and without which life would cease.
The maintenance of “virtue,” which the commentary also describes as “guarding the One,” is thus crucial to self-cultivation. A careful diet, exercise, and some form of meditation are implied, but generally the commentary focuses on the diminishing of selfish desires. The government of the “sage”—a term common to all schools of Chinese thought but which is given a distinctive Daoist meaning in the commentary—rests on the same premise. Policies that are harmful to the people such as heavy taxation and severe punishment are to be avoided, but the most fundamental point remains that the ruler himself must cherish what the Laozi calls “emptiness” and “nonaction.” Disorder stems from the dominance of desire, which reflects the unruly presence of confused and agitated qi-energy. In this way, self-cultivation and government are shown to form an integral whole.
A second major commentary is the Laozi zhigui (The Essential Meaning of the Laozi) attributed to the Han dynasty scholar Yan Zun (fl. 83 B.C.E.–10 C.E.). Styled Junping, Yan’s surname was originally Zhuang; it was changed in later written records to the semantically similar Yan to comply with the legal restriction not to use the name Zhuang, which was the personal name of Emperor Ming (r. 57–75) of the Later or Eastern Han dynasty. Yan Zun is well remembered in traditional sources as a recluse of great learning and integrity, a diviner of legendary ability, and an author of exceptional talent. The famous Han poet and philosopher Yang Xiong (53 B.C.E.–18 C.E.) studied under Yan and spoke glowingly of him.
The Laozi zhigui (abbreviated hereafter as Zhigui), as it now stands, is incomplete; only the commentary to the Dejing, chapters 38–81 of the current Laozi, remains. The best edition of the Zhigui is that contained in the Daozang (Daoist Canon, no. 693 in the Daozang zimu yinde, Harvard-Yenching Sinological Index Series, no. 25), which clearly indicates that the work had originally thirteen juan or books, the first six of which have been lost. Judging from the available evidence, it can be accepted as a Han product (A. Chan 1998a). The Laozi text that accompanies Yan Zun’s commentary agrees in many instances with the wording of the Mawangdui manuscripts.
Like Heshanggong, Yan Zun also subscribes to the yin-yang cosmological theory characteristic of Han thought. Unlike Heshanggong’s commentary, however, the Zhigui does not prescribe a program of nourishing one’s qi endowment or actively cultivating “long life.” This does not mean that it rejects the ideal of longevity. On the contrary, it recognizes that the Dao “lives forever and does not die” (8.9b), and that the man of Dao, correspondingly, “enjoys long life” (7.2a). Valuing one’s spirit and vital energy is important, but the Zhigui is concerned that self-cultivation must not violate the principle of “nonaction.” Any effort contrary to what the Laozi has termed “naturalness” (ziran) is counter-productive and doomed to failure.
The concept of ziran occupies a pivotal position in Yan Zun’s commentary. It describes the nature of the Dao and its manifestation in the world. It also points to an ethical ideal. The way in which natural phenomena operate reflects the workings of the Dao. The “sage” follows the Dao in that he, too, abides by naturalness. In practice this means attending to one’s “heart-mind” (xin) so that it will not be enslaved by desire. Significantly, the Zhigui suggests that just as the sage “responds” to the Dao in being simple and empty of desire, the common people would in turn respond to the sage and entrust the empire to him. In this way, the Laozi is seen to offer a comprehensive guide to order and harmony at all levels.
An early commentary that maximizes the religious import of the Laozi is the Xiang’er Commentary. Although it is mentioned in catalogues of Daoist works, there was no real knowledge of it until a copy was discovered among the Dunhuang manuscripts (S. 6825 in the Stein collection). The manuscript copy, now housed in the British Library, was probably made around 500 C.E. The original text, disagreement among scholars notwithstanding, is generally traced to around 200 C.E. It is closely linked to the “Way of the Celestial Masters” and has been ascribed to Zhang Daoling, the founder of the sect, or his grandson Zhang Lu, who was instrumental in ensuring the group’s survival after the collapse of the Han dynasty. A detailed study and translation of the work in English is now available (Bokenkamp 1997).
The Xiang’er manuscript is unfortunately incomplete; only the first part has survived, beginning with the middle of chapter 3 and ending with chapter 37 in the current chapter division of the Laozi. It is not clear what the title, Xiang’er, means. Following Rao Zongyi and Ōfuchi Ninji, Stephen Bokenkamp suggests that it is best understood in the literal sense that the Dao “thinks (xiang) of you (er)” (1997, 61). This underscores the central thesis of the commentary, that devotion to the Dao in terms of self-cultivation and compliance with its precepts would assure boundless blessing in this life and beyond.
The Xiang’er commentary accepts without question the divine status of Laozi. While Yan Zun and Heshanggong direct their commentary primarily to those in a position to effect political change, the Xiang’er invites a larger audience to participate in the quest for the Dao, to achieve union with the Dao through spiritual and moral discipline. It is possible to attain the “life-span of an undefiled, godlike being” (xianshou). Nourishing one’s vital qi-energy through meditation and other practices remains the key to attaining “long life” and ultimately to forming a spiritual body devoid of the blemishes of mundane existence (Rao 1991; see also Puett 2004).
Spiritual discipline, however, is insufficient; equally important is the accumulation of moral merit. Later Daoist sources refer to the “nine precepts” of the Xiang’er. There is also a longer set known as the “twenty-seven precepts” of the Xiang’er. These include general positive steps such as being tranquil and yielding, as well as specific injunctions against envy, killing, and other morally reprehensible acts. Likening the human body to the walls of a pond, the essential qi-energy to the water in it, and good deeds the source of the water, the Xiang’er commentary makes clear that deficiency in any one would lead to disastrous consequences (see Bokenkamp 1993).
Compared with the Xiang’er, Wang Bi’s Laozi commentary could not be more different. There is no reference to “immortals”; no deified Laozi. The Daodejing, as Wang Bi sees it, is fundamentally not concerned with the art of “long life” but offers profound insight into the radical otherness of Dao as the source of being, and the practical implications that follow from it.
Styled Fusi, Wang Bi (226–249) was one of the acknowledged leaders of the movement of “Learning in the Profound” (xuanxue) that came into prominence during the Wei period (220–265) and dominated the Chinese intellectual scene well into the sixth century. The word xuan denotes literally a shade of dark red and is used in the Laozi (esp. ch. 1) to suggest the mystery or profundity of Dao. The movement has been termed, perhaps not without ambiguity, “Neo-Daoism” in Western studies. It signifies a broad philosophical front united in its attempt to discern the “true” meaning of Dao but not a homogeneous or partisan school. Alarmed by what they saw as the decline of Dao, influential intellectuals of the day initiated a sweeping reinterpretation of the classical heritage. They did not neglect the Confucian classics but drew inspiration especially from the Yijing, the Laozi, and the Zhuangzi, which were then referred to as the “Three (Classics on the) Profound” (sanxuan); that is to say, the three key treatises unlocking the mystery of Dao. Wang Bi, despite his short life, distinguished himself as a brilliant interpreter of the Laozi and the Yijing (see A. Chan 1991a, Wagner 2000, Lynn 2015, and “Neo-Daoism” in this Encyclopedia).
According to Wang Bi, Dao is indeed the “beginning” of the “ten thousand things.” Unlike Heshanggong or the Xiang’er, however, he did not pursue a cosmological or religious interpretation of the process of creation. Rather, Wang seems more concerned with what may be called the logic of creation.
Dao constitutes the absolute “beginning” in that all beings have causes and conditions that derive logically from a necessary foundation. The ground of being, however, cannot be itself a being; otherwise, infinite regress would render the logic of the Laozi suspect. For this reason, the Laozi would only speak of Dao as “nonbeing” (wu). We will come back to this point later.
The transcendence of Dao must not be compromised. To do justice to the Laozi, it is also important to show how the function of Dao translates into basic “principles” (li) governing the universe. The regularity of the seasons, the plenitude of nature, and other expressions of “heaven and earth” all attest to the presence of Dao. Human beings also conform to these principles, and so are “modeled” ultimately after Dao.
Wang Bi is often praised in later sources for having given the concept of li, “principle,” its first extended philosophical treatment. In the realm of Dao, principles are characterized by “naturalness” (ziran) and “nonaction” (wuwei). Wang Bi defines ziran as “an expression of the ultimate.” In this regard, attention has been drawn to Yan Zun’s influence. Nonaction helps explain the practical meaning of naturalness. In ethical terms, Wang Bi takes nonaction to mean freedom from the dictates of desire. This defines not only the goal of self-cultivation but also that of government. The concepts of naturalness and nonaction will be discussed further below. Wang Bi’s Laozi commentary has exerted a strong influence on modern interpretations of the Laozi in both Asia and the West. There are four English translations available (Lin 1977, Rump 1979, Lynn 1999, and Wagner 2003).
Among these four commentaries, Heshanggong’s Laozi zhangju occupied the position of preeminence in traditional China, at least until the Song dynasty. For a long period, Wang Bi’s work was relatively neglected. The authority of the Heshanggong commentary can be traced to its place in the Daoist religion, where it ranks second only to the Daodejing itself. Besides Heshanggong’s work and the Xiang’er, there are two other commentaries, the Laozi jiejie (Sectional Explanation) and the Laozi neijie (Inner Explanation), that are closely associated with religious Daoism. Both have been ascribed to Yin Xi, the keeper of the pass who “persuaded” Laozi to write the Daodejing and who, according to Daoist hagiographic records, later studied under the divine Laozi and became an “immortal.” These texts, however, only survive in citations (see Kusuyama 1979).
From the Tang period, one begins to find serious attempts to collect and classify the growing number of Laozi commentaries. An early pioneer is the eighth-century Daoist master Zhang Junxiang, who cited some thirty commentaries in his study of the Daodejing (Wang 1981). Du Guangting (850–933) provided a larger collection, involving some sixty commentaries (Daode zhenjing guangshengyi, Daozang no. 725). According to Du, there were those who saw the Laozi as a political text, while others focused on spiritual self-cultivation. There were Buddhist interpreters (e.g., Kumārajīva and Sengzhao), and there were those who explained the “Twofold Mystery” (chongxuan). This latter represents an important development in the history of interpretation of the Daodejing (Assandri 2009).
The term “Twofold Mystery” comes from chapter 1 of the Laozi, where Dao is said to be the mystery of all mysteries, in the sense of an incomparably profound reality beyond ordinary comprehension (xuan zhi you xuan). As a school of Daoist learning, “Twofold Mystery” seizes this to be the key to understanding the Laozi. Daoist sources relate that the school goes back to the fourth-century master Sun Deng. Through Gu Huan (fifth century) and others, the school reached its height during the Tang period, represented by such thinkers as Cheng Xuanying and Li Rong in the seventh century. The school reflects the growing interaction between Daoist and Buddhist thought, particularly Mādhyamika philosophy. Unlike Wang Bi, it sees “nonbeing” as equally one-sided as “being” when applied to the transcendence of Dao. Nonbeing may highlight the profundity or mystery of Dao, but it does not yet reach the highest truth, which according to Cheng Xuanying can be called the “Dao of Middle Oneness” (Kohn 1992, 144; Assandri 2009, chs. 4 and 6). Like other polar opposites, the distinction between being and nonbeing must also be “forgotten” before one can achieve union with Dao.
The Laozi has been viewed in still other ways. For example, a Tang commentary by Wang Zhen, the Daodejing lunbing yaoyishu (Daozang no. 713), presented to Emperor Xianzong (r. 806–820) in 809, sees the text as a treatise on military strategy (Rand 1979–80; see also Wang Ming 1984 and Mukai 1994). The diversity of interpretation is truly remarkable (see Robinet 1998 for a typological analysis). The Daodejing was given considerable imperial attention, with no fewer than eight emperors having composed or at least commissioned a commentary on the work. These include Emperor Wu and Emperor Jianwen of the Liang dynasty, Xuanzong of the Tang, Huizong of the Song, and Taizu of the Ming dynasty (see Liu Cunren 1969 for a discussion of the last three).
By the thirteenth century, students of the Daodejing were already blessed, as it were, with an embarrassment of riches, so much so that Du Daojian (1237–1318) could not but observe that the coming of the Dao to the world takes on a different form each time. That is to say, different commentators were shaped by the spirit of their age in their approach to the classic, so that it would be appropriate to speak of a “Han Laozi,” “Tang Laozi,” or “Song Laozi,” each with its own agenda (Xuanjing yuanzhi fahui, Daozang no. 703).
5. Approaches to the Laozi
Is the Laozi a manual of self-cultivation and government? Is it a metaphysical treatise, or does it harbor deep mystical insights?
Chapter 1 of the current Laozi begins with the famous words: “The Way that can be spoken of is not the constant Way.” Chapter 10 speaks of nourishing one’s “soul” and embracing the “One.” Chapter 80 depicts the ideal polity as a small country with few inhabitants.
The Laozi is a difficult text. Its language is often cryptic; the sense or reference of the many symbols it employs remains unclear, and there seems to be conceptual inconsistencies. For example, whereas chapter 2 refers to the “mutual production of being and nonbeing,” chapter 40 declares, “Being originates in nonbeing” (Henricks, trans. 1989). Is it more meaningful to speak of the “worldviews” of the Daodejing, instead of a unified vision?
If the Laozi were an “anthology” put together at random by different compilers over a long period of time, occasional inconsistencies need not be an issue. Traditionally, however, this was never a serious option. Most modern studies are equally concerned to disclose the “deeper” unity and meaning of the classic. While some seek to recover the “original” meaning of the Laozi, others celebrate its contemporary relevance. Consider, first of all, some of the main modern approaches to the Daodejing (cf. Hardy 1998).
One view is that the Laozi reflects a deep mythological consciousness at its core. The myth of “chaos,” in particular, helps shape the Daoist understanding of the cosmos and the place of human beings in it (Girardot 1983). Chapter 25, for example, likens the Dao to an undifferentiated oneness. The myth of a great mother earth goddess may also have informed the worldview of the Laozi (Erkes 1935; Chen 1969), which explains its emphasis on nature and the feminine (Chen 1989). Chapter 6, for example, refers to the “spirit of the valley,” which is also called the “mysterious female.”
A second view is that the Laozi gives voice to a profound mysticism. According to Victor Mair (1990), it is indebted to Indian mysticism (see also Waley 1958). According to Benjamin Schwartz (1985), the mysticism of the Daodejing is sui generis, uniquely Chinese and has nothing to do with India. Indeed, as one scholar suggests, it is unlike other mystical writings in that ecstatic vision does not play a role in the ascent of the Daoist sage (Welch 1965, 60). According to another interpretation, however, there is every indication that ecstasy forms a part of the world of the Laozi, although it is difficult to gauge the “degree” of its mystical leanings (Kaltenmark 1969, 65). A more recent champion of the mystical view is Harold Roth, who argues that Daoist “inner cultivation” and Indian yoga may be similar, but “they are parallel developments in different cultures at different times.” (Roth 1999, 137).
It is possible to combine the mystical and mythological approaches. Although the presence of ancient religious beliefs can still be detected, they have been raised to a “higher” mystical plane in the Laozi (e.g., Ching 1997). Broadly, one could carve out a third category of interpretations that highlights the religious significance of the Laozi, whether in general terms or aligned with the tenets of religious Daoism.
A fourth view sees the Laozi mainly as a work of philosophy, which gives a metaphysical account of reality and insight into Daoist self-cultivation and government; but fundamentally it is not a work of mysticism (W. T. Chan 1963). The strong practical interest of the Laozi distinguishes it from any mystical doctrine that eschews worldly involvement. In H. G. Creel’s (1977) words, it is “purposive” and not purely “contemplative.”
Fifth, to many readers the Laozi offers essentially a philosophy of life. Remnants of an older religious thinking may have found their way into the text, but they have been transformed into a naturalistic philosophy. The emphasis on naturalness translates into a way of life characterized by simplicity, calmness, and freedom from the tyranny of desire (e.g., Liu Xiaogan 1997). For Roger Ames and David Hall (2003), indeed, the essence of the Laozi is “making this life significant.” Unlike the claim that the Laozi espouses a mystical or esoteric teaching directed at a restricted audience, this view tends to highlight its universal appeal and contemporary relevance.
Sixth, the Laozi is above all concerned with realizing peace and sociopolitical order. It is an ethical and political masterpiece intended for the ruling class, with concrete strategic suggestions aimed at remedying the moral and political turmoil engulfing late Zhou China. Self-cultivation is important, but the ultimate goal extends beyond personal fulfillment (Lau 1963, LaFargue 1992, Moeller 2006). The Laozi criticizes the Confucian school not only for being ineffectual in restoring order but more damagingly as a culprit in worsening the ills of society at that time. The ideal seems to be a kind of “primitive” society, in the non-pejorative sense where people would dwell in simplicity, harmony and contentment, not fettered by ambition or desire (e.g., Needham 1956).
This list is far from exhaustive; there are other views of the Laozi. Chad Hansen (1992), for example, focuses on the “anti-language” philosophy of the text. Different combinations are also possible. A. C. Graham, for example, emphasizes both the mystical and political elements, arguing that the Laozi was probably targeted at the ruler of a small state (1989, 234). For Hans-Georg Moeller (2006), though a work of political philosophy in its original context, the Laozi offers a powerful critique of “humanism” that is ethically as relevant then as it is now. The Laozi could be seen as encompassing all of the above—such categories as the metaphysical, ethical, political, mystical, and religious form a unified whole in Daoist thinking and are deemed separate and distinct only in modern Western thought. Alternatively, coming back to the question of multiple authorship and coherence, it could be argued that the Laozi contains “layers” of material put together by different people at different times (Emerson 1995).
Is it fair to say that the Laozi is inherently “polysemic” (Robinet 1998), open to diverse interpretations? This concerns not only the difficulty of the Laozi but also the interplay between reader and text in any act of interpretation.
Polysemy challenges the assertion that the “intended” meaning of the Laozi can be recovered fully. But, it is important to emphasize, it does not follow that context is unimportant, that parameters do not exist, or that there are no checks against particular interpretations. While hermeneutic reconstruction remains an open process, it cannot disregard the rules of evidence. Questions of provenance, textual variants, as well as the entire tradition of commentaries and modern scholarship are important for this reason. And it is for this same reason that the present article leaves the discussion of the Laozi itself till the end. The following presents some of the main concepts and symbols in the Laozi based on the current text, focusing on the key conceptual cluster of Dao, de (virtue), ziran (naturalness), and wuwei (nonaction). I propose that the two readings represented by the Heshanggong and Wang Bi commentaries both bring out important insight from the Laozi.
6. Dao and Virtue
To begin with Dao, the etymology of the Chinese graph or character suggests a pathway, or heading in a certain direction along a path. Most commentators agree in translating dao as “way.” In early Chinese literature, dao generally depicts a relatively wide thoroughfare or carriage way, and in some contexts waterways, but it is used also to convey what is deemed the right or proper course, and by extension the doctrines or teachings that set forth such a course, or the means and methods that would bring it about. Laozi 53, for example, states, “The great dao is very even (flat, easy to travel on), but people like (to take) by-ways (jing).” The literal sense of dao as a path, contrasted in this instance with jing, a small trail off the main road, is clearly preserved here, but it is also easy to see how it can be used as a metaphor, how the extended ethical and spiritual sense of dao comes into the picture.
As a verb, perhaps on account of the directionality involved, dao also conveys the sense of “speaking.” Thus, the opening phrase of chapter 1, dao ke dao, literally “Dao that can be dao-ed,” is often rendered, “The Way that can be spoken of.” Because dao is paired with “name” (ming) in the next line—“ming ke ming,” “the name that can be named”—forming a parallel couplet construction, there is thus reason to interpret the verbal usage in the sense of something verbalized, as opposed to a pathway that is travelled on, trodden, or followed. This is also how most commentators in traditional China have understood it: the many normative discourses that clamor to represent the right way are seen to be fickle, partial and misleading. In most English translations, the capitalized form—“Way” or “Dao” (or “Tao”)—is used, to distinguish it from other usages of the term.
The concept of dao is not unique to the Laozi. A key term in the philosophical vocabulary, it informs early Chinese philosophy as a whole. It is interpreted differently, signifying a means to a higher end in some writings and as an end in itself in others. The Laozi underscores both the ineffability and creative power of Dao. This is distinctive and if one accepts the early provenance of the text, charts a new course in the development of Chinese philosophy.
The ineffability of Dao is highlighted in chapter 1: the “constant” (chang, also translated as “eternal”—e.g., W. T. Chan 1963) Dao cannot be defined or described; it is “nameless.” Chapter 14 brings out clearly that Dao transcends sensory perception; it has neither shape nor form. Nameless and formless, Dao can only be described as utterly profound, and in this sense “dark” or “mysterious” (xuan), or as wu, literally “not having” any name, form, or other characteristics of things (see also chs. 21 and 32). Indeed, though suggestive, the term “Dao” itself is no more than a symbol—as the Laozi makes clear, “I do not know its name; I style it Dao” (ch. 25; see also ch. 34). This suggests a sense of radical transcendence, which explains why the Laozi has been approached so often as a mystical text.
The concept of wu is difficult and has been translated variously as “nothing,” “nothingness,” or “nonbeing.” It marks not only the mystery of Dao but also its limitlessness or inexhaustibility (e.g., ch. 4). Names serve to delimit, to set boundaries; in contrast, Dao is without limits and therefore cannot be captured fully by language. This suggests a positive dimension to transcendence, which brings into view the creative power of Dao: “All things under heaven are born of being (you); being is born of wu” (ch. 40). What does this mean?
Elsewhere in the Laozi, Dao is said to be the “beginning” of all things (chs. 1, 25). Daoist creation involves a process of differentiation from unity to multiplicity: “Dao gives birth to One; One gives birth to Two; Two gives birth to Three; Three gives birth to the ten thousand things” (ch. 42). The text does not indicate tense or spell out what the numbers refer to—is it saying that something called the “One” produced or produces the “Two” in the sense of two other things?
The “nothingness” of Dao helps impose certain constraints on interpretation. Specifically, the idea of a creator god with attributes, like the “Lord on High” (Shangdi) in ancient Chinese religion, does not seem to fit with the emphasis on transcendence.
The dominant interpretation in traditional China is that Dao represents the source of the original, undifferentiated, essential qi-energy, the “One,” which in turn produces the yin and yang cosmic forces. While the “lighter,” more rarefied yang energy-stuff rises to form heaven, the “heavier” yin solidifies to become earth. A further “blending” of the two generates a “harmonious” qi-energy that informs human beings.
This is essentially the reading of the Heshanggong commentary. Although the Laozi may not have entertained a fully developed yin-yang cosmological theory, which took shape during the Han period, it does suggest at one point that natural phenomena are constituted by yin and yang: the “ten thousand things” or myriad creatures, as it rather lyrically puts it, “carry yin on their backs and embrace yang with their arms” (ch. 42). That which gave rise to the original qi-energy, however, is indescribable. The Laozi calls it Dao, or perhaps more appropriately in this context, “the Dao,” with the definite article, to signal its presence as the source of the created order.
In modern terms, minus the language of yin-yang cosmology, this translates into an understanding of the Dao as “an absolute entity which is the source of the universe,” as the Oxford English Dictionary (online edition, under “Tao”) defines it. Not being anything in particular, the Dao may be described as “nothing” (wu). However, on this reading, wu does not mean “nothingness,” “negativity” or absence in the nihilistic sense, in view of the creative power of the Dao.
Alternatively, one could argue that Dao signifies a conceptually necessary ontological ground; it does not refer to any indescribable original substance or energy. “Beginning” is not a term of temporal reference but suggests ontological priority in the Laozi.
The process of creation does proceed from unity to multiplicity, but the Laozi is only concerned to show that “two” would be impossible without the idea of “one.” The assertion in Laozi 42, “One gives birth to Two,” affirms that duality presupposes unity; to render it as “The One gave birth to the Two” is to turn what is essentially a logical relation into a cosmological event.
As the source of being, Dao cannot be itself a being, no matter how powerful or perfect; otherwise, the problem of infinite regress cannot be overcome. For this reason, the Laozi makes use of the concept of wu, “nonbeing,” not to suggest a substance or something of which nothing can be said, but to signify the conceptual “otherness” and radical transcendence of the ground of being.
This agrees with Wang Bi’s interpretation. If wu points to a necessary ontological foundation, the distinction between “Dao” and “One” seems redundant. Commenting on chapter 42 of the Laozi, Wang Bi writes, “One can be said to be wu”; “One is the beginning of numbers and the ultimate of things” (commentary on ch. 39; see also Wang’s commentary on the Yijing, trans. in Lynn 1994, 60). The concept of “One” and the concept of wu thus complement each other in disclosing different aspects of the logic of creation—both unity and nonbeing are necessary for understanding the generation of beings.
Comparing the two interpretations, whereas the first, “cosmological” reading has to explain the sense in which the Dao can be said to be “nothing,” the second emphasizes the centrality of wu, “nonbeing,” for which “Dao” is but one designation. For the latter, Dao is entirely conceptual, whereas the former envisages the Dao as referring to a mysterious substance or energy that brings about the cosmos and continues to sustain and regulate it. Depending on the interpretation, wu may be translated as “nothing” or “nonbeing” accordingly. The latter may be awkward, but it serves to alert the reader that the nothingness or emptiness of Dao may not be understood referentially or reduced simply to the fullness of qi.
In light of the interest in cosmology during the Warring States period, the cosmological reading may be privileged, but the Laozi is also open to an ontological interpretation. Both are philosophically potent. At one level, the ontological reading may accommodate the qi-based yin-yang cosmology, although there is significant divergence in the interpretation of the ethics of the Laozi, as we shall see in the next section. In either case, the metaphor of “Dao” is apt. It shows that all things are derived ultimately from an absolute “beginning,” in either sense of the word, like the start of a pathway. It also suggests a direction to be followed, which brings out the ethical interest of the Laozi.
The Daodejing is concerned with both Dao and de. The graph de has also made it into the Oxford English Dictionary: “In Taoism, the essence of Tao inherent in all beings”; “in Confucianism and in extended use, moral virtue.” De has been translated variously as virtue, potency, efficacy, integrity, or power (for an etymological study, see Nivison 1978–79, and Hall and Ames 1987, 216).
Like Dao, de is a general concept open to diverse interpretation. The Confucian understanding of de is by no means uniform (A. Chan 2011). While some early Ru scholars emphasize in their interpretation of “virtue” the roles and responsibilities embedded in the network of kinship ties and sociopolitical relationships that constitute the ethical realm, others focus on the formation of individual moral character through self-cultivation. Confucius may have emphasized the latter, but there is ample evidence in the Analects and other Confucian works testifying to the importance of the former as well. The Laozi seems to be suggesting a “higher” de against any moral achievement attained through repeated effort (e.g., ch. 38). The different translations mentioned above aim at bringing out the perceived uniquely Daoist understanding of de.
Admittedly, “virtue” is ambiguous, and in Latin, as many scholars have noted, “virtus” has more to do with strength and capacity than moral virtues. Nevertheless, there are advantages to translating de as “virtue,” as it keeps in the foreground that the Laozi is giving new meaning to an established concept, as opposed to introducing a new concept not found in other schools of Chinese philosophy. From this perspective, both Laozi and Confucius are interpreters of de-virtue.
The marriage of Dao and de effectively bridges the gap between transcendence and immanence. Traditional commentaries beginning with the Hanfeizi often play on the homonymic relation between de (virtue) and another graph also pronounced de, which means to “acquire” or “obtain” something. De is thus what one has “obtained” from (the) Dao, a “latent power” by “virtue” of which any being becomes what it is (Waley 1958, 32). In this sense, the Laozi speaks of de as that which nourishes all beings (e.g., ch. 51).
Within these parameters, interpretations of de follow from the understanding of Dao and wu. On the one hand, for Heshanggong and other proponents of the cosmological view, what one has obtained from the Dao refers specifically to one’s qi endowment, which determines one’s physical, intellectual, affective, moral, and spiritual capacity. Read this way, the title Daodejing should be translated as the “Classic of the Way and Its Virtue,” given that de is understood to have emanated from the Dao.
On the other hand, for Wang Bi and others who do not subscribe to a substantive view of Dao, de represents what is “genuine” or “authentic” (zhen) in human beings (e.g., see Wang Bi’s commentary on Laozi chs. 3, 5, 16, 51). Because wu does not refer to any substance or cosmological power, what the Laozi means by de, the “virtue” that one has “obtained” from Dao, can only be understood as what is originally, naturally present in human beings.
In either case, the concept of de emerges as a Daoist response to the question of human nature, which was one of the most contested issues in early Chinese philosophy. The two readings of the Laozi, despite their differences, agree that it is an inherent de that enables a person to conform to the way in which Dao operates. “Virtue” may be corrupted easily, but when realized, it radiates the full embodiment of the Dao understood in terms of qi on Heshanggong’s view, or the flourishing of authenticity on Wang Bi’s interpretation. As such, Dao points to not only the “beginning” but also through de the “end” of all things.
7. Naturalness and Nonaction
The Laozi makes use of the concept of ziran, literally what is “self (zi) so (ran),” to describe the workings of Dao. As an abstract concept, ziran gives no specific information, except to say that Dao is not derived from or “modeled” (fa) after anything (ch. 25). However, since “heaven and earth”—interpreted as nature in most modern studies—are said to be born of Dao and come to be in virtue of their de, the Laozi is in effect saying that the ways of nature reflect the function of Dao.
In a cosmological reading, this suggests an understanding of nature as governed by the operation of qi energies in an ideal yin-yang system characterized by harmony and fecundity. As interpreted by Wang Bi, the Laozi means more generally that there are “principles” (li) inherent in nature.
Human beings are, in turn, born of heaven and earth and so are “modeled” after them, either in terms of their qi-constitution or in the sense that they are governed also by the same basic principles. Usually translated as “naturalness” or “spontaneity,” ziran thus builds on the concept of de in suggesting not only that the power of Dao finds expression in nature, but also at the practical level a mode of being and way of action in accordance with the ways of nature.
Nature in the Daoist sense, it is important to note, need not exclude the spiritual and the social. The existence of gods and spirits, which can be understood also as being constituted by qi energies, was hardly questioned in early China. The Laozi makes clear that they, too, stem from Dao and form a part of the order of ziran (e.g., chs. 39, 60).
Further, nature encompasses not only natural phenomena but also sociopolitical institutions. The king clearly occupies a central place in the realm of Dao (chs. 16, 25); the family also should be regarded as a “natural” institution (chs. 18, 54). As an ethical concept, ziran thus extends beyond the personal to the sociopolitical level. It is worth mentioning that ziran remains an influential idea today, especially in conceptions of love, beauty, and one’s attitude toward life and death in Chinese thinking.
The concept of wuwei, “nonaction,” serves to explain naturalness in practice. Like “nonbeing,” “nonaction” is awkward, and some translators prefer “non-assertive action,” “non-coercive action” or “effortless action”; but it identifies wuwei as a technical term. For this reason, I prefer “nonaction,” or better still, retaining wuwei in its transliterated form and explaining what it means in the Laozi.
Wuwei does not mean total inaction. Later Daoists often emphasize the close connection between wuwei and techniques of spiritual cultivation—the practice of “sitting in forgetfulness” (zuowang) and “fasting of the mind” (xinzhai) discussed in the Zhuangzi are singled out as prime examples in this regard. In the Laozi, while meditation and other forms of spiritual practice may be envisaged, the concept of wuwei seems to be used more broadly as a contrast against any form of action characterized by self-serving desire (e.g., chs. 3, 37).
It is useful to recall the late Zhou context, where disorder marched on every front. The Laozi, one assumes, is not indifferent to the forces of disintegration tearing the country asunder, although the remedy it proposes is subject to interpretation. The problems of political decline are traced to excessive desire, a violation of ziran. Naturalness encompasses basic human needs, of course, but these are to be distinguished from desire that fuels and inflates self-gratification, which knows no end. Nonaction entails at the personal level simplicity and quietude, which naturally follow from having few desires. At the political level, the Laozi condemns aggressive measures such as war (ch. 30), cruel punishment (ch. 74), and heavy taxation (ch. 75), which reflect but the ruler’s own desire for wealth and power. If the ruler could rid himself of desire, the Laozi boldly declares, the world would be at peace of its own accord (chs. 37, 57).
In this sense, the Laozi describes the ideal sage-ruler as someone who understands and follows ziran (e.g., chs. 2, 17, 64). In this same sense, it also opposes the Confucian program of benevolent intervention, which as the Laozi understands it, addresses at best the symptoms but not the root cause of the disease. The Confucian project is in fact symptomatic of the decline of the rule of Dao. Conscious efforts at cultivating moral virtues only accentuate the loss of natural goodness, which in its original state would have been entirely commonplace and would not have warranted distinction or special attention (chs. 18, 38). Worse, Confucian ethics assumes that learning and moral self-cultivation can bring about personal and social improvement. From the Daoist perspective, artificial effort to “change” people, “improve” things or to “correct” the order of ziran only perpetuates a false sense of self that alienates human beings from their inherent “virtue.”
The concept of nonaction is exceedingly rich. It brings into play a cutting discernment that value distinctions are ideological, that human striving and competitive strife spring from the same source. Nonaction entails also a critique of language and conventional knowledge, which to the Daoist sage has become impregnated with ideological contaminants.
The use of paradoxes in the Laozi especially heightens this point. For example, the person of Dao is depicted as “witless” or “dumb,” whereas people driven by desire appear intelligent and can scheme with cunning (ch. 20). The way of learning, as one would normally understand it, “increases” the store of knowledge and adds value to goods and services; in contrast, questioning the very meaning of such knowledge and value, the Laozi describes the pursuit of Dao as constantly “decreasing” or chipping away at the artifice built by desire (ch. 48).
Driving home the same point, to cite but one more example, the Laozi states, “The highest virtue is not virtuous; therefore it has virtue” (ch. 38). In other words, those who fully realize “virtue” in the Daoist sense do not act in the way that men and women of conventional morality typically act or are expected to act. Paradoxes of this kind function as a powerful rhetorical device, which forces the readers, so to speak, to move out of their “comfort zone,” to wake up from their dogmatic slumber, and to take note of the proposed higher truth of Dao (see also, e.g., chs. 41, 45, 56). In this context, one can also understand some of the provocative statements in the Laozi telling the ruler, for example, to keep the people in a state of “ignorance” (ch. 65).
Some scholars would object that this interpretation misses the religious import of the Daodejing, while others would question whether it is too eager to defend the philosophical coherence of the classic. Perhaps the Laozi in chapter 65 of the current text did mean to tell the ruler literally to keep the people ignorant or stupid for better control, which as a piece of political advice is not exactly extraordinary. The remarks offered here take nonaction as central to the Daoist view of life, recognizing that the concept of wuwei does not only initiate a critique of value but also points to a higher mode of knowledge, action, and being.
At the critical level, the Laozi emphasizes the relativity of knowledge and value. Things appear big or small, for example, only in relation to other things; knowledge and ignorance are meaningful only in relation to each other. Good and bad, being and nonbeing, and other opposites should be understood in the same light (ch. 2).
Distinctions as such are not necessarily problematic; for example, an object can be described as rare or difficult to find as compared with other objects. Problems arise, however, when objects that are rare are deemed more valuable than commonplace objects, when “big” is deemed superior to “small,” or in general terms when distinctions become a basis for value discrimination. When certain things or features (e.g., precious stones, reputation, being slim, skin color) are regarded as “beautiful” or “worthy”—i.e., desirable—other things will inevitably be deemed “ugly” and “unworthy,” with serious social, economic, and political consequences (ch. 3).
The recognition of the relativity of value does not end in a kind of moral relativism or ethical paralysis. The deconstruction of conventional beliefs and values opens the door to deeper reflection on the order of ziran. The Laozi also does not appear to be advocating the obliteration of all distinctions, and by extension civilization as a whole, in a state of mystical oneness. For example, while there is some concern that technology may bring a false sense of progress, the antidote does not lie in a deliberate rejection of technology but rather in a life of natural simplicity and contentment that stems from having few desires (ch. 80).
In this way, the apparent conceptual inconsistency in the Laozi can be resolved. On the one hand, there is little reason to equate, for example, “hardness” with strength and assign a higher value to it over “softness.” However, once such value discrimination is shown to be arbitrary, the Laozi can make use of qualities such as softness, weakness or yieldingness (e.g., ch. 78) to intimate the Daoist way of life as grounded in nonaction. In this same way, the Laozi can therefore also speak of Daoist virtue as the “highest good” (ch. 8) and “highest virtue” (ch. 38). Wuwei ultimately derives its meaning from wu, which as an ethical orientation privileges “not having” over the constant strivings of the mundane world. This constitutes a radical critique of a world given to the pursuit of wealth and power. More important, in being “empty,” the person of Dao is shown to be “full”; without desire, he or she is able to rediscover the riches of ziran and finds fulfillment.
The critique of value demonstrates the way in which desire (yu) perverts the mind—xin, literally, “heart,” but understood as the seat of both cognition and affectivity—and colors our judgment and experience of reality. Desire is a complex concept. Fundamentally, it depicts the movement of the mind as it is drawn to things it finds agreeable (e.g., pleasure) or away from things it dislikes (e.g., pain). Phenomenologically, the mind is always in motion. Calmness or tranquility of mind does not mean the cessation of all cognitive or affective movement. Rather, from this perspective, it is the act of desiring that transgresses the order of nature, resulting in a plethora of desires pulling the mind in different directions, that is seen to be at the heart of the problem. Nonaction contrasts sharply, according to the Laozi, with the way people typically act in a world in which the rule of Dao no longer prevails, with profit motives, calculated steps, expectations, longings, regrets, and other expressions of desire. Put differently, nonaction would be “normal” action in the pristine order of nature, in which the mind is at peace, free from the incessant stirring of desire.
As a philosophical concept, wuwei intimates a mode of being that governs existential engagement at all levels, transforming the way in which we think, feel, and experience the world. It does not stipulate what one ought to do or ought not to do in particular cases. Terms such as quietude, emptiness, and simplicity favored by the Laozi describe a general ethical orientation rather than specific practices. Although in following wuwei there are things that a person of Dao naturally would not do (e.g., wage a war of aggression), and there is a sense in which doing less may be more productive than self-conscious over-exertion, philosophically wuwei is not about not doing certain things (thus, military engagement is not ruled out entirely—e.g., see chs. 67, 68, 69) but suggests a reorientation of perception and value that ideally would bring an end to the dominance of desire and a return to the order of ziran.
Again, nonaction need not exclude spiritual practice—ethics and spirituality generally form an integral whole in the Daoist frame—rather, the point is that once realized, the transformative power of nonaction would ensure not only personal fulfillment but also sociopolitical order. This seems to weigh against a strictly mystical reading of the Laozi, if mysticism is understood to entail a kind of personal union with the Dao transcending all political interests. The concept of “virtue,” whether interpreted in terms of authenticity or the purity and fullness of qi-energy, depicts a pristine natural and sociopolitical order in which naturalness and nonaction are the norm. The ethics of wuwei rests on this insight.
To elaborate, wuwei as an ethical-spiritual ideal entails that the man of Dao, the sage, would be free from the disquieting movement of desire. This would naturally find expression in a mode of being and action characterized by not doing certain things (e.g., binge drinking) or doing less of certain things (e.g., consumption of alcohol). This is different from the argument that wuwei prescribes not doing or doing less of certain things, if such prescription requires deliberate effort. As a guide to recovering or attaining that ideal, there may be room for the ruler to impose conditions that would lead to a diminishing of desire-driven action; but this is not quite ideal wuwei. Similarly, although it may be said that nonaction points to a state of mind in which one does everything that one does, it is on the understanding that in that ideal state certain actions simply would not occur as a matter of course, as the mind would not be aroused and move in their direction. For example, to argue that there is a qualitatively different wuwei way of stealing or gambling would not be meaningful in the world of the Laozi, because such action would not arise in the ideal realm of naturalness.
To elaborate further, consider the ideal ethical situation in the cosmological reading of the Laozi as represented by the Heshanggong commentary. The dispensation of qi gives rise to a pristine hierarchical order in which those who are blessed with a perfect qi endowment, the rare sages, would govern the majority. It can be assumed that the sages are naturally predisposed to quietude, whereas the common people are driven by desire in varying degree. Indeed, at one point, the Laozi seems to distinguish three different grades of human beings (ch. 41), which on this view would be the result of their unequal qi endowment. The role of the sage-ruler, then, would be to guide the people to abide by simplicity through personal charisma and example, and also by means of policies designed to cultivate an environment in which desire would not run rampant. In the absence of a true sage-ruler, the Laozi is saying, according to this interpretation, those in power should emulate the Daoist sage, cultivate their internal qi energies, and bring about peace and harmony through naturalness and nonaction.
An ontological reading can accommodate the theory that heaven and earth and the “ten thousand things” are all constituted by qi. The decisive difference is that on this account, human beings all share the same essential nature, as distinguished from their qi-constituted capacities. For example, some people may be better endowed and therefore could live to a ripe old age, while others with a poorer endowment may die prematurely; but this does not detract from the fundamental assertion that they share the same inherent de, which defines their nature.
Sages are not a different kind of being, god-like, with a radically different nature; rather, they are individuals who manage to realize their authentic de to the full. Unlike the cosmological interpretation which essentially traces “sagehood” to a special inborn sage-nature, the idea of an authentic ontological core assures the possibility of attaining sagehood. Being one with Dao does not describe any mystical union with a divine source or sacred power, but reflects a mode of being that accords with the assumed original nature marked by natural goodness and the absence of excessive desire. Because the world is in a state of decline, the Laozi therefore speaks of a “return” to Dao, to naturalness and nonaction.
Regardless of the position one takes, in this general interpretive framework a number of symbols which both delight and puzzle readers of the Laozi can be highlighted. Suggestive of its creativity and nurturance, Dao is likened to a mother (e.g., chs. 1, 25). This complements the paradigm of the feminine (e.g., chs. 6, 28), whose “virtue” is seen to yield fecundity and to find expression in yieldingness and non-contention. The infant (e.g., chs. 52, 55) serves as a fitting symbol on two counts. First, it brings out the relationship between Dao and world; second, the kind of innocence and wholesome spontaneity represented by the infant exemplifies the pristine fullness of de in the ideal Daoist world.
Natural symbols such as water (e.g., chs. 8, 78) further reinforce the sense of yielding and deep strength that characterizes nonaction. The low-lying and fertile valley (e.g., chs. 28, 39) accentuates both the creative fecundity of Dao and the gentle nurturance of its power. Carefully crafted and ornately decorated objects are treasured by the world, and as such can be used as a powerful symbol for it. In contrast, the utterly simple, unaffected, and seemingly valueless pu, a plain uncarved block of wood, brings into sharp relief the integrity of Daoist virtue and of the person who embodies it (e.g., chs. 28, 32). Finally, one may mention the notion of reversal (e.g., chs. 40, 65), which suggests not only the need to “return” to Dao, but also that the Daoist way of life would inevitably appear the very opposite of “normal” existence, and that it involves a complete revaluation of values.
In sum, any interpretation of the current Laozi as a whole must take into account (a) the “nothingness” of Dao and (b) the way in which wuwei and ziran provide a guide to the good life.
With respect to the latter, it is true that in many chapters the text seems to be addressing the ruler or the ruling elite, explaining to them the ideal government of the Daoist sage. This is not surprising given the Zhou context and given that the production of written documents and the access to them were generally the preserve of the ruling class in ancient China. However, this need not restrict interpretation to politics in the narrow sense of statecraft or political strategies. In the light of the emphasis on ziran and wuwei, there is sufficient evidence that the Laozi views politics in a larger ethical-spiritual context, in which the flourishing of sociopolitical order is rooted in self-cultivation.
In the final analysis, naturalness and nonaction are seen to reflect the function of the nameless and formless Dao. As such, Daoist ethical ideals are anchored in a non-empirical, idealized view of nature. Specifically, the ethics of the Laozi rests on the understanding that de is inherent in nature, or better, the Daoist world. It is on this basis that the concept of de is raised to a higher level than “virtues” in the sense of moral attainments. Perhaps for this reason, the Laozi did not resort to the language of “human nature” (xing) commonly employed in early Chinese philosophy.
The understanding of de, however, is dependent on that of Dao, which in turn hinges on the interpretation of wu as either original substance or nonbeing. Both readings are plausible and are within the semantic range of the Laozi. Whereas the former subscribes to the prevalent qi theory that underlies much of Chinese philosophy and on that basis provides an integrated view of the cosmos, self-cultivation and government, the latter focuses on the fundamental unity of being characterized by natural simplicity and quietude that ideally should define the ethical course for both the individual and society.
The Laozi should be recognized as a seminal work. It is profoundly insightful; but it is the task of the interpreter to work out the full implications of its often provocative insight. It seems reasonable to assume that while the Laozi has something new to offer, it nonetheless shares certain background ideas and assumptions with other early Chinese philosophical texts. As such, the cosmological interpretation should be given due consideration. However, in bringing into view the nothingness of Dao and the order of ziran, the Laozi invites reflection on the very core of being beyond any cosmological assumptions. While the production of meaning is context dependent, new horizons do emerge from great works of philosophy. The two lines of interpretation outlined here have different ethical implications regarding the nature of the ideal sage, but neither can be said to have transgressed the hermeneutic boundaries of the Daodejing. The suggestion that they both arise from the Laozi is not a matter of equivocation but an acknowledgement of its hermeneutical depth (for a good set of essays incorporating the latest scholarship on the Laozi, see Liu 2015).
The power of the Daodejing does not lie in a clearly laid out set of doctrines, but in its seminal insights. The concept of qi may be culture specific, and the prospects of realizing universal Daoist order may seem remote, but the recognition of the fundamental problem of desire should still give us pause. The ills of discrimination, exploitation and intellectual hubris, so deeply embedded in language and value systems, remain as serious today as they were in early China. The healing power of nonaction still strikes a chord and commands continuing reflection and engagement. Although in working out these insights differences will no doubt arise, they unite all interpreters of the Laozi and draw new generations of readers into the mystery of Dao and (its) virtue.
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This site focuses on the Laozi, including the Guodian find, and the Zhuangzi.
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English Translations of the Laozi
Transliteration of Chinese terms in this article follows the hanyu pinyin romanization system, except for a few proper names and quotations. Some of the material presented above first appeared in “The Daodejing and Its Tradition,” Daoism Handbook, edited by Livia Kohn [Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1999], pp. 1–29; permission by the publisher to rework them here is gratefully acknowledged.