# Logicism and Neologicism

*First published Wed Aug 21, 2013; substantive revision Sat Dec 2, 2023*

Logicism is a philosophical, foundational, and
*foundationalist* doctrine that can be advanced with respect to
any branch of mathematics. Traditionally, logicism has concerned
itself especially with arithmetic and real analysis. It comes in a
stronger and a weaker version.

The *strong* version of logicism maintains that all
mathematical *truths* in the chosen branch(es) form a species
of logical truth. The weak version of logicism, by contrast, maintains
only that all the *theorems* do. (By ‘theorems’ we
mean results that are *provable* within the branch of
mathematics in question.) The foundationalism is with respect to those
parts of mathematics that the logicist reconstructs. Success in this
regard is compatible, however, with a non-foundationalist (e.g.,
coherentist) view of the parts of mathematics that cannot be so
reconstructed.

Both versions of logicism—strong and weak—maintain that

*All*the objects forming the subject matter of those branches of mathematics are logical objects; and- Logic—in some suitably general and powerful sense that the
logicist will have to define—is capable of furnishing
definitions of the primitive concepts of these branches of
mathematics, allowing one to derive the mathematician’s
‘first principles’ therein as results within Logic itself.
(The branch of mathematics in question is thereby said to have been
*reduced*to Logic.)

For the foundationalist who accepts Kant’s distinction between
analytic and synthetic truth, the truths of logic are paradigm cases
of analytic truths. They are true *solely by virtue of the meanings
of the linguistic expressions involved* in expressing them; or, as
Kant might have preferred it, by virtue of internal relations among
the concepts involved. A successful logicist reduction of any branch
of mathematics will therefore show that its truths (strong version) or
its theorems (weak version) are analytic.

Another consequence of successful logicist reduction of a given branch
of mathematics is that mathematical certainty (within that branch) is
of a piece with certainty about logical truth. The same holds for
necessity; and for the *a priori* character of the knowledge
concerned.

Logicist doctrines were espoused in two main forms—Fregean and
Russellian—until around 1930, at which point logicism went into
decline, largely because of the discovery of Gödelian
incompleteness, and the ascendancy of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory,
which displaced the Russellian theory of types as the most promising
foundational theory for mathematics. The doctrine of
*neo-logicism* subsequently revived some of the core ideas of
logicism, with its first hints appearing in the mid-1960s, and its
more substantive contributions beginning in the 1980s.

The main technical and philosophical innovation of the
*neo*-logicists is their use of *abstraction principles*
in order to secure the existence of such things as numbers,
understood, with Frege, as *logical* objects. One favored kind
of abstraction principle typically effects the reification of
equivalence classes of an equivalence
relation.^{[1]}
One of Frege’s favorite examples involved the equivalence
relation of parallelism among lines. The relevant abstraction would be
that of the *direction* of a line. Thus, two lines \(l_1\) and
\(l_2\) have *the same direction* just in case they are
parallel:

The function denoted by the abstraction operator \(d(\,)\) is here
applied to lines, and produces *directions* (new abstract
objects) as its values. Note that the abstraction operator can take
variables as arguments.

The neo-logicists characterize abstraction operators that produce
*numbers* as their values. Details of notation and method will
be provided in due course.

There has not been any historical trend discernible as an
*evolution* of the doctrine of logicism, with incremental
adjustments to deal with occasional problems as they arose, while
maintaining a reasonably stable trajectory towards an ideal
formulation. Rather, the doctrine has been characterized by abrupt
shifts as far as methods and materials are concerned, even if the goal
has remained relatively constant through such
changes.^{[2]}
We shall allow the pattern of change to become evident as the
different phases of logicism are recounted below.

- 1. Historical background
- 2. Neo-Fregeanism
- 3. Second-order logic with Hume’s Principle
- 4. Constructive Logicism
- 5. Modal Neo-Logicism
- 6. Recent Work Inspired by the
*Grundgesetze*, or Departing From It - 7. Summary of Problems for Logicism
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Historical background

Kant had held that both arithmetic and (Euclidean) geometry were
synthetic *a priori*, just as—for him—metaphysics
was. Indeed, this was to explain the special status of both
mathematics and metaphysics, so that the latter could enjoy the
exalted status of the former. For Kant, both mathematics and
metaphysics afforded informative insights into the nature of reality
(they were synthetic); yet, for all that, the rational intellect
needed no sensory experience in order to attain such insights (they
were *a priori*). On Kant’s account, even a simple
computational statement of arithmetic—let alone a statement
involving quantification over the natural numbers—is synthetic.
Here is how he put the matter in his *Critique of Pure Reason*,
at B16:

We might, indeed, at first suppose that the proposition \(7 + 5 = 12\) is a merely analytical proposition, and follows by the principle of contradiction from the concept of a sum of \(7\) and \(5\). But if we look more closely we find that the concept of the sum of \(7\) and \(5\) contains nothing save the union of the two numbers into one, and in this no thought is being taken as to what that single number may be which combines both. The concept of \(12\) is by no means already thought in merely thinking this union of \(7\) and \(5\); and I may analyze my concept of such a possible sum as long as I please, still I shall never find the \(12\) in it. (Translation by Norman Kemp Smith)

Kant’s search for conceptual containments is confined to those
that he might be able to find among just the explicit constituents of
the proposition concerned, unmediated by any connections with related
concepts that do not themselves occur within the proposition. (We note
this in anticipation of a contrast to be made in due course with
Frege’s modification of Kant’s conception of analytic
truth.)^{[3]}
For Kant, the *a priori* character of arithmetical truth
derives not from conceptual containments (within the proposition in
question), but from the *pure form of our intuition of time*,
as affording an unbounded series of successive moments. According to
Michael Friedman, Kant held that

only the general features of succession and iteration in time can guarantee the existence and uniqueness of the sum of \(7\) and \(5\) …; only the unboundedness of temporal succession can guarantee the infinity of the number series, and so on ….

^{[4]}

Likewise, on Kant’s account, the *a priori* character of
Euclidean geometry derives from the *pure form of our intuition of
space*, which enables the thinker, correctly one may presume, to
intuit straight lines in space as continuous.

These two pure forms of intuition—time and
space—delivered, for Kant, the theories of arithmetic and
Euclidean geometry respectively, and endowed them both with their
*a priori* character. And they made possible the
spatio-temporal manifold of intuitions (*Anschauungen*) which
would then in turn, upon structuring by the exercise of concepts of
the understanding (especially the concepts of *substance* and
*cause*) make possible objective knowledge of things and events
in the external world.

The logicists, then, could be seen as adopting Kant’s
distinction, but applying it to radically different effect. Their
first move was to argue that *arithmetic*, at least, is
*analytic*, not synthetic.

The doctrine of logicism had its first glimmerings in the writings of Dedekind, but it really only came to full flowering in the work of Frege. In Dedekind’s work, the ideas were presented in a form accessible to his contemporaries in the mathematical community. Precise and rigorous though those ideas were, they nevertheless enjoyed a relatively informal presentation. No one had yet come up with the idea of formal deductive systems of logic adequate for formalizing the mathematical reasoning of their day; so no logicist thesis in Dedekind’s day could be formulated in the way that is now familiar to us. Matters were different, of course, with Frege, for his crowning achievement was a formal deductive system of logic by reference to which a logicist thesis could at last be expressed.

Now, when crediting Frege also with the pioneering of a detailed
execution of a logicist program, one cannot ignore his continuing
insistence that the truths of Euclidean geometry were *synthetic a
priori*, and founded in a completely different way from the truths
of
arithmetic.^{[5]}
Hence they were not subject to his doctrine of logicism. This is why
we have exercised care in our introductory characterization of the
doctrine of logicism, as concerned first and foremost with the truths
of arithmetic and of real analysis.

The combined contributions of Dedekind and Frege represented a
culmination of the trend, by their time well under way among leading
mathematicians, towards the *arithmetization* of real (and
complex) analysis. This trend had its beginnings in the even earlier
works of Gauss and Bolzano. It came to maturity in the works of Cauchy
and Weierstraß, and became the dominant paradigm in Western
thought about the nature of mathematics. The leading idea of the
arithmetizers was that the concepts and first principles of arithmetic
and analysis are to be found in the concepts of the understanding (as
a Kantian might put it), independently of one’s geometric
intuitions concerning any spatial or temporal continua. Arithmetic and
analysis are completely *conceptual* and *logical* in
their axiomatic sources and in their deductive development.

We proceed now to consider Dedekind and Frege in turn.

### 1.1 Dedekind

It is fair to say that Dedekind enabled the trend of arithmetization
to culminate in the doctrine of logicism. The recommendation (or
statement of the methodological maxim) that one *ought* to
avoid all matters geometric when providing a foundation for real
analysis goes back at least to Dedekind, *Stetigkeit und
Irrationale Zahlen* (1872). This work was published late. Its
breakthrough idea had come fourteen years earlier, in
1858.^{[6]}
At pages 3–4 Dedekind writes in an engaging and revelatory way
of his earlier struggle in the autumn of 1858 to furnish
“*eine wirklich wissenschaftliche Begründung der
Arithmetik*” (a really scientific foundation for Arithmetic
[i.e., real
analysis]).^{[7]}

It is clear that Dedekind is writing on the
*presumption*—assumed to be so widespread as not to call
for any justificatory argument—that one should have *no
recourse at all* to geometric intuitions or first principles when
founding the theory of the real numbers. This presumption, said
Dedekind, ‘no one will deny’. Dedekind wanted “a
*purely arithmetical* and perfectly rigorous foundation for the
principles of infinitesimal analysis” [Emphases
added].^{[8]}

The presumption receives further emphatic statement in
Dedekind’s later work (1888) *Was sind und was sollen die
Zahlen?*, which, like the earlier work, was published much later
than it could (or should) have been. In the preface to the first
edition (Dedekind 1996b: 790–1) Dedekind writes

In speaking of arithmetic (algebra, analysis) as merely part of logic I mean to imply that I consider the number-concept

entirely independent of the notions or intuitions of space and time—that I rather consider it an immediate product of the pure laws of thought.… It is only through the purely logical process of building up the science of numbers and by thus acquiring the continuous number-domain that we are enabled accurately to investigate our notions of space and time by bringing them into relation with this number-domain created in our mind.[fn] [Emphasis added]

Once again we see the presumption at work: in laying a foundation for
the theory of real numbers, one *must avoid* any recourse to
geometrical intuition. To inquire how such a presumption become so
widespread, and in whose works it originated, is a topic outside the
scope of the present study.

### 1.2 Frege

It is clear from Frege’s Preface to his *Begriffsschrift*
(at pp. IX–X) that he shared Dedekind’s methodological
concerns, and that he had an eventual logicist treatment of arithmetic
in his sights when devising his concept script. Frege distinguished
two kinds of truths that require a *Begründung*
(justification): those whose proofs could proceed purely logically;
and those which had to be supported by experiential facts
(*Erfahrungsthatsachen*). And he sought to inquire how far one
could succeed in capturing arithmetic by means only of inferences
based on the laws of thought that transcend all particularities
(“*durch Schlüsse allein …, nur gestützt auf
die Gesetze des Denkens, die über allen Besonderheiten erhaben
sind*”). He made it clear that he wished to get at the root
concept of *ordering in a series*, and to advance from there to
the concept of number. Then comes this unmistakeable echo of
Dedekind:

In order that, in doing this, nothing intuitive could intrude unnoticed, everything would turn on there being no gaps in the chain of inferences.

Damit sich hierbei nicht unbemerkt etwas Anschauliches eindrängen könnte, musste Alles auf die Lückenlosigkeit der Schlusskette ankommen.

Frege stressed that he was concerned to reveal how the analyticity of
arithmetical truths derived from their justifications. In §3 of
Frege 1884 (*Grundlagen der Arithmetik*) he wrote

… these distinctions between a priori and a posteriori, synthetic and analytic, concern … the justification for making the judgement. … When a proposition is called … analytic in my sense, … it is a judgement about the ultimate ground upon which rests the justification for holding it to be true.

… The problem becomes … that of finding the proof of the proposition, and of following it up right back to the primitive truths.

If, in carrying out this process, we come only on general logical laws and on definitions, then the truth is an analytic one, bearing in mind that we must take account also of all propositions upon which the admissibility of any of the definitions depends. [Emphasis added]

We see, then, that Frege’s conception of the analytic was
suitably broader than Kant’s. Kant required that conceptual
containments be evident within the sentence, rather than that the
sentence be displayed as a conclusion following logically from axioms
whose own logical or conceptual truth was self-evident, and which
might contain expressions not occurring in the sentence in question.
As we saw from the quote from B16, Kant did not regard ‘\(7 + 5
= 12\)’ as an analytic truth. The Fregean, by contrast, is able
to exploit the internal structure of the numerals, and to invoke the
recursion axioms for addition (which themselves would have to have
been derived in logicist
fashion).^{[9]}
So, for the Fregean, even if not for Kant, ‘\(7 + 5 =
12\)’ is an analytic truth. Where \(s\) is the successor
function, Kant’s example takes the more detailed form
\[sssssss0 + sssss0 = ssssssssssss0,\]
which is provable using the recursion axioms

The latter axiom justifies each of the transitions below:

\[\begin{align} sssssss0 + sssss0 &= s(sssssss0 + ssss0) \\ &= s(s(sssssss0 + sss0)) \\ &= s(s(s(sssssss0 + ss0))) \\ &= s(s(s(s(sssssss0 + s0)))) \\ &= s(s(s(s(s(sssssss0 + 0)))) \end{align}\]At this point the former axiom secures

\[ s(s(s(s(s(sssssss0 + 0))))) = s(s(s(s(s(sssssss0))))) \]Hence (suppressing parentheses) we have

\[ sssssss0 + sssss0 = ssssssssssss0, \]
as
foreshadowed.^{[10]}

Frege went on in this work to give his famous elucidation of
‘number of’ as a concept of concepts, along with
devastating critiques of rival accounts of number by contemporaries in
the grip of psychologism, empiricism, or formalism. He kept
technicalities to a minimum, in a *tour de force* of
philosophical elucidation.

#### 1.2.1 Numbers as higher-level concepts

Frege’s key insight, which he never abandoned, was first expressed in §46: “… the content of a statement about number is an assertion about a concept”. By way of illustration: Suppose one states that

- \((\nu)\)
- The number of apples in the basket is (i.e.,
*is identical to*) the number 2.

\((\nu)\) is definitely a statement ‘about number’. Yet all one is saying, when asserting \((\nu)\), is that

- \((\gamma)\)
- There are exactly two apples in the basket.

For Frege, \((\gamma)\) is an assertion about the *concept*
“___is an apple in the basket”. It is not an assertion
about the number 2, since the *adjectival* occurrence of
‘two’ in \((\gamma)\) can be avoided. One could re-phrase
\((\gamma)\) as

- \((\gamma')\)
- There is an apple in the basket, and another apple in the basket, and they are the only apples in the basket.

We shall show how Frege’s point here can be made watertight, and general, after providing a few words of explanation about notation for number-abstraction.

In the simple example above about line-directions, the abstraction
operator \(d(\,)\) is a function sign, and does not bind any
variables. But with *numerical* abstractions, matters are
subtly different. Here, the abstraction operator \(\#\), meaning
“the number of …”, can be deployed in two different
ways. On the one hand, it can be a function symbol: if \(F\) is a
predicate (resp., a second-level variable), then \(\#F\) is a singular
term denoting the number of things falling under \(F\) (resp., in the
extension assigned to the second-level
variable).^{[11]}
On the other hand, the operator \(\#x\) can be applied to the open
sentence \(\Phi(x)\) with \(x\) free, thereby binding the variable
\(x\). The complex term thus formed is read as “the number of
\(\Phi\)s”.^{[12]}

With that explanation of notation in place, suppose one makes a statement about number of the following form, where \(\#xFx\) is the formal rendering of “the number of \(F\)s”:

\[\# xFx = 2.\]Then one is thereby (says Frege) making the assertion that

\[\exists x\exists y(x\ne y \wedge Fx \wedge Fy \wedge \forall z(Fz \rightarrow(z = x \vee z = y))).\]
The concept \(F\) is the only one finding expression in this last
assertion, apart from standard logical operators. Therefore the
assertion is about the concept \(F\). It is in the general form of a
*numerosity assertion*, which does not necessarily refer to, or
generalize about, numbers. For arbitrary \(n\), the logical form in
question will be

Of course (returning to our example where \(n = 2\)), one can consider matters in the converse logical direction. If one makes the numerosity assertion first, then one can regard that as a justifying ground for the subsequent statement that the number of \(F\)s is identical to 2.

If, with Frege, we countenance these two different ways of ‘carving’ one and the same propositional content, then we shall require, in whatever language is rich enough to provide the two forms of expression in question, the following logical equivalence, indicated by the two-way deducibility sign \(\dashv \vdash\):

\[ \#xFx = 2 \dashv \vdash \exists x\exists y(x \ne y \wedge Fx \wedge Fy \wedge \forall z(Fz \rightarrow(z = x \vee z = y))). \]As Frege put it, the propositional content on the right-hand side has been ‘re-carved’ as the identity statement on the left-hand side. One and the same thought has been presented in two very different ways. They have the same truth conditions, but different logico-grammatical forms.

The form on the right, within a language devoid of the operator \(\#\), is completely innocent of any commitment to numbers as objects. If such a language is extended, however, by adding \(\#\) to its stock of logical expressions, then one is thereby able to express the form on the left, which is number-committal.

By being aware that the concept-numerosity thought on the right can be rendered equivalently (in the extended language) as the number-committal thought on the left, one comes to recognize numbers as abstract, logical objects. In the extended language, their existence can be established on purely logical grounds.

#### 1.2.2 Hume’s Principle and the Caesar Problem

In the *Grundlagen*, Frege considered the following
equivalence, known as *Hume’s Principle*:

There are two important features to note.

First, HP is explicitly *second order* on the right-hand side,
involving, as it does, a second-order quantification over relations
\(R\); and HP is *purely logical* on the right-hand side. Here,
the notion to be defined (the *definiendum*) is that of a
relation \(R\) mapping the \(F\)s 1-1 onto the \(G\)s. This can be
spelled out in purely logical terms: every \(F\) bears \(R\) to
exactly one \(G\), and every \(G\) is borne \(R\) by exactly one
\(F\). In symbols, this *definiens* reads as follows:

which we shall abbreviate
as^{[13]}

Secondly, HP involves two predicates, \(F\) and \(G\). It does so in
order to state an important *criterion of identity* for numbers
denoted, respectively, as \(\# xFx\) and as \(\# xGx\). Note that both
terms in the identity-statement on the left-hand side are abstractive
terms.

Let us call (neo-)Fregean abstraction principles (like HP) that seek
to specify the truth conditions of identities involving *two*
distinct abstractive terms (involving the same abstraction operator @)
*double-barreled abstraction principles*. (Contrasting
single-barreled abstraction principles for identities will be
discussed
shortly.)^{[14]}
Double-barreled abstraction principles have the general form

where the right-hand side expresses a second-order equivalence relation \(\Psi\) between \(F\) and \(G\), and is stated without use of \( @\). But that does not preclude instances of such a principle where either \(F\) or \(G\), or both, contain occurrences of \(@\).

Typically these double-barreled abstraction principles are laid down as postulates, or axioms (or axiom schemes). But that is not absolutely necessary. All that is important is whether the theory in question contains such a principle as a theorem (or theorem-scheme). Like the earlier abstraction principle for directions, HP is a double-barreled abstraction principle. So too is Frege’s ill-fated Basic Law V, which we shall discuss in due course.

HP tells us that the numbers \(\#xFx\) and \(\# xGx\) will be
identical *if and only if* the predicate-extensions that they
respectively number are in one-one correspondence (under some
two-place relation \(R)\). Another way of expressing this latter
condition is to say that \(F\) and \(G\) are
*equinumerous*.

The basic idea of this equivalence is owed to Hume (whence the current
name of the principle); and it had of course been exploited to great
effect by Cantor, well before Frege wrote the
*Grundlagen*.^{[15]}
Without the use of one-one correspondences in this way, Cantor would
not have been able to motivate his later groundbreaking idea that
there are distinct infinite numbers (see Cantor 1891).

Frege considered whether HP might be laid down as a constitutive
definition of numbers—a definition that would give a full and
exact characterization of their nature. But he concluded that HP could
not meet this more exigent, yet reasonable, demand. The reason is what
has now become known as the *Julius Caesar Problem*. Frege
insisted (*Grundlagen*, §56), that our definition of
number should enable us to decide that Julius Caesar is *not* a
number. His conclusion was that HP could not enable us to do this.

For, suppose we say that if there are exactly two apples in the basket, then the number of apples in the basket is Julius Caesar. For the sake of consistency, it would be enough (in conformity with HP) simply to make sure that one assigns the same number (i.e., Julius Caesar) to any other concept that is in one-one correspondence with the concept “…is an apple in the basket”. Thus, for example, the number of prime numbers strictly between 4 and 8 is Julius Caesar. Indeed, the number of prime numbers strictly between 1 and 4 is Julius Caesar, one of those prime numbers being Julius Caesar himself!

On the one hand, HP is, to be sure, a necessary condition on number.
It must be satisfied by any licit interpretation of the abstraction
operator \(\#\). HP is not, however, *sufficient* to ensure
that the things denoted by terms of the form \(\# xFx\) *really are
numbers!*

On the other hand—as revealed in Frege’s painstaking deductive work—HP suffices for a logicist derivation of the Dedekind-Peano postulates for the arithmetic of natural numbers. This is what accounts for the vaunted status of HP in certain subsequent neo-logicist accounts (see §2).

But Frege wanted more than just a logically powerful enough source for
arithmetic; he wanted, in addition, a principle that would account for
the *metaphysical* nature of numbers. They must, surely, at
least be *abstract*? Numbers are also eternal and necessary.
They are not located in space, and they do not enter into any causal
interactions. Frege therefore sought a deeper logical theory that
might be able to vouchsafe for numbers these latter characteristics,
and thereby solve the Caesar Problem.

Unfortunately, in this regard he arguably failed (and did so quite
independently of Russell’s Paradox, of which more in due
course). Frege thought (mistakenly, according to Dummett (1998)) that
he could avoid the Julius Caesar problem by identifying numbers as
special kinds of *classes*, or *extensions* (of
concepts). In the *Grundlagen*, at §68, he wrote

My definition [of Number] is … as follows:

the Number which belongs to the concept \(F\) is the extension [

Umfang][fn.] of the concept “equal [gleichzahlig] to the concept \(F\)”.

And the footnote to “*Umfang*” ends with the
sentence “I assume that it is known what the extension of a
concept is.” For those who nevertheless needed some instruction
in this regard, the *Grundgesetze* were intended to supply
it.

The Julius Caesar problem would, in principle, bedevil any
double-barreled abstraction principle. (It is not a problem
specifically for *logicism*; it is a problem for abstraction
principles of a specific
form.)^{[16]}
The problem can be avoided by using single-barreled abstraction
principles.

The general form of a single-barreled abstraction principle, when expressed by a sentence rather than by rules of inference, is

\[ t = @xFx \leftrightarrow \ldots t \ldots F\ldots, \]
where \(t\) is a placeholder for *singular terms in general*
(including parameters), and not just for \(@\)-terms. The right-hand
side may contain occurrences of \(@\); moreover, when taking
instances, expressions substituted for either \(F\) or \(t\) may
contain occurrences of \(@\). And all that is important with a
single-barreled abstraction principle is whether the theory in
question contains it as a theorem (or theorem-scheme).

Some examples of single-barreled abstraction principles are the following. Here, \(\exists !t\) is short for \(\exists x x = t\). It may be read as “\(t\) exists”.

For definite descriptions (on Smiley’s treatment, Smiley 1970):

\[ t = \iota xFx \leftrightarrow(\exists !t \wedge \forall x(x = t \leftrightarrow Fx)). \]
For set
abstracts:^{[17]}

For number-abstracts (on Tennant’s treatment—see §4):

\[ t = \# xFx \leftrightarrow \exists R\exists G(Rxy[Fx 1\text{–}1 Gy] \wedge t = \# xGx).\]
For number-abstracts (on Zalta’s treatment—see
§5):^{[18]}

The important feature of single-barreled abstraction principles of the
kind on which we are focusing is that they are free of ontological
commitment. Theories that postulate or prove them need to be
supplemented with specific further ontologically committal postulates
before incurring commitment to the sort of entities whose broad
logical behavior is captured by a single-barreled abstraction
principle. For example, the set-abstraction principle above merely
places constraints on how sets, membership (‘\(\in\)’) and
set-defining conditions \(F\) interrelate. It logically implies both
extensionality and the conversion schemata (“If \(u\) is a
member of the set of all and only \(F\)s, then \(u\) is an
\(F\)”, and “If \(u\) is an \(F\), and the set of all and
only \(F\)s exists, then \(u\) is a member of it”), but does not
guarantee the existence of any *sets*—not even that of
the empty set.

#### 1.2.3 The *Grundgesetze*

The heart of Frege’s logicist achievement was deferred to the
*Grundgesetze der Arithmetik*, the first volume of which
appeared in 1893. This almost decade-long delay after the
*Grundlagen* he explained in his foreword as being occasioned
by some re-thinking of his *Begriffsschrift* (Frege
1879)—the most important innovation being the introduction of
the notion of, and notation for, the *Werthverlauf*
(value-range, or extension) of a concept. Frege had also, by the time
of publication of the *Grundgesetze*, formulated his
distinction between sense and reference, and decided to treat
truth-values as objects, and indeed as referents of sentences.

He confessed that he expected his symbolism to be a *grosses
Hemmniss* (great obstacle) standing in the way of the spread and
impact of his ideas (Frege 1893: x). On the one hand, the exacting
notation and absolutely rigorous and logically watertight proofs were
essential to his logicist project. On the other hand, he feared,
mathematicians would think *metaphysica sunt, non leguntur!*
(it’s metaphysics, and is not [to be] read!), and philosophers
would think *mathematica sunt, non leguntur!* (it’s
mathematics, and is not [to be] read!); (Frege 1893: xii). Poor Frege
might have been right. But the reason why the beef of his
*Grundgesetze* was never properly digested can be read off the
sandwiching. His foreword to Volume I ends with the confident
words

The only refutation I would acknowledge would be if someone actually showed that a better and more sustainable edifice could be erected on other foundational convictions, or if someone were to show that my axioms led to obviously false consequences. But no one will succeed in doing that. (Frege 1893: xxvi; author’s translation)

This confident statement belies somewhat his own prescient misgiving expressed a few pages earlier, over his Basic Law V:

As far as I can see, controversy could arise only over my Basic Law of Value-ranges (V), which perhaps has not been given special expression by logicians, even though one thinks of it, for example, when one talks of extensions of concepts. I hold it to be purely logical. Anyway, this marks the place where the decision must fall. (Frege 1893: vii; author’s translation)

And fall it did. Frege, it turned out, had gone in for overkill with
the formal system that was to vindicate his logicism. He sought to
unify all of arithmetic and analysis within a general theory of
*classes*, or extensions (of concepts). Classes were supposed
to be logical objects *par excellence*. The strategy was to
define the natural numbers, say, as particular classes within a much
more capacious universe of abstract, logical objects. Using the
definitions, one would then derive the first principles of arithmetic
(the Dedekind-Peano axioms, say) as theorems within the theory of
classes. To that end one would exploit, ultimately, only the deeper
underlying axioms (or basic laws) governing classes themselves. For
more details on this strategy, see
§1.2.4.

Among these deeper axioms was Frege’s ill-fated Basic Law V.
This, like HP, is a double-barreled abstraction principle. Basic Law
V, however, allows for the abstraction of *classes*, and the
equivalence relation by which this is effected is the relation of
coextensiveness among defining predicates. Frege never raised the
Julius Caesar objection against his Basic Law V. Using modern
notation, Basic Law V can be stated as the following axiom schema, in
which \(\Phi\) and \(\Psi\) are placeholders for formulas:

Frege was assuming a ‘logically perfect’ language, in
which every well-formed term—including any class-abstractive
term of the form \(\{x\mid \Phi x\}\)—denotes. If, by contrast,
one countenances the possibility that certain well-formed singular
terms in one’s language might *not* denote objects, then
one has to employ a different kind of logic—a so-called
*free* logic. (It is ‘free’ of the background
assumption that all singular terms denote.) Such a logic qualifies the
quantifier rules with ‘existential presuppositions’
concerning the terms involved. For example, instead of being able to
infer directly from “for all \(x, F(x)\)” to
“\(F(t)\)”, as one may, when using the *un*free
logic of a logically perfect language:

one needs, in the case of a free logic dealing with possibly non-denoting terms, to ensure that the singular term \(t\) denotes:

\[ \frac{\forall xF(x) \qquad \exists !t}{ F(t)} \]The reader is reminded that \(\exists !t\), to be read “\(t\) exists”, is short for \(\exists x\, x = t\). Similar modifications are required for the other quantifier rules.

Even if Frege had *not* been assuming a logically perfect
language, and had instead been using a free logic, Basic Law V would
still have committed him to the existence of the class of all
\(\Phi\)s, whatever the defining formula \(\Phi\) might be. The proof
proceeds as follows.

**Proof.** Note, first, that it is a logical truth
that

By Basic Law V in the right-to-left direction, taking \(\Phi\) for \(\Psi\), it follows that

\[ \{x \mid \Phi x\} = \{x \mid \Phi x\}. \]But in free logic, an identity holds only if its terms denote. Hence

\[ \exists y(y = \{x \mid \Phi x\}). \]\(\Box\)

This schema is known nowadays as ‘Naïve
Comprehension’. (Comprehension is the abstraction of sets or
classes.) Basic Law V committed Frege to claiming that, corresponding
to *any* defining predicate \(\Phi\), there exists the class of
all and only those things that satisfy \(\Phi\).

Note that *any* double-barreled abstraction principle for an
abstraction operator \(@\), whose right-hand side

- adverts to concepts or predicates \(\Phi\) and \(\Psi\) and
- is logically true upon taking \(\Phi\) for \(\Psi\),

will generate existential commitment to a denotation for any
well-formed abstract term \(@x\Phi x\). This is because, in light of
(ii), the self-identity \(@x\Phi x = @x\Phi x\) will also be logically
true. And \(@x\Phi x = @x\Phi x\) is true only if \(\exists!@x\Phi
x\). This consideration holds for *any* defining predicate
\(\Phi\). This invites the objection, raised both by Tennant (1987:
236) and by Boolos (1987: 184) that in certain conspicuous cases there
is no *a priori* justification for commitment to the existence
of denotations for these terms, in the case of particularly
problematic concepts \(\Phi\) (such as self-identity). This was the
earliest form of the ‘Bad Company
objection’.^{[19]}

#### 1.2.4 Frege’s treatment of the natural numbers

We shall not dwell on the peculiarities of Frege’s class theory,
but shall try instead to set out the overall shape of the leading
ideas in Frege’s account, as they were set forth informally in
the *Grundlagen* and executed formally in the
*Grundgesetze*.

First Frege had to identify \(0\), which he defined as the number of
any empty concept. A necessarily empty concept is that of
*non-self-identity*:

Next Frege had to specify what it was for one natural number to be the
*successor* of another, or the *next largest* natural
number. How might one define what it is for \(m\) to *immediately
succeed* \(n\)? The answer is found by appeal to concepts \(F\)
and \(G\), say, that respectively enjoy \(m\) and \(n\) as their
(finite) cardinals. There must be exactly one more object falling
under the concept \(F\) than there are objects falling under the
concept \(G\). And *this* will consist in there being a one-one
correspondence \((R\), say) between all the \(G\)s and all but one of
the \(F\)s.
Formally:^{[20]}

It is easy to show that \(n\) has exactly one immediate successor. That is, if \(m\) immediately succeeds \(n\), and \(m'\) immediately succeeds \(n\), then \(m = m'\).

What, now, can we say about the extension of the concept
‘natural number’? It must consist of 0 along with any
number than can be reached from 0 by *finitely many* steps of
immediate succession. This characterization, however, threatens to be
circular: for, how is one to understand the adverb
‘finitely’ here, if not by appeal to the notion of natural
number itself?

Frege’s genius revealed itself in the solution he devised to
this circularity problem. He had already covered the necessary logical
and conceptual ground in his *Begriffsschrift* of 1879. For any
two-place relation \(R\), Frege had defined what it was for \(x\) to
be *an \(R\)-ancestor of \(y\)* (abbreviated here as \(R^*
xy)\). For this definition, he had employed two ancillary notions. The
first was that of a concept \(F\) being *\(R\)-hereditary*:

Let us abbreviate this as

\[ \mathcal{H}xy(Fx, Rxy). \]The second ancillary notion we shall express here as “\(x\) is \(R\)-barred by \(F\)”, or “\(F\) \(R\)-bars \(x\)”, and it is defined thus:

\[ \forall z(Rxz \rightarrow Fz). \]Let us abbreviate this as

\[ \mathcal{B}z(Rxz,Fz). \]Now we are in a position to give Frege’s definition of the ancestral relation \(R^* xy\) as follows:

\[ \forall G(\mathcal{H}vw(Gv, Rvw)\rightarrow (\mathcal{B}z(Rxz,Gz) \rightarrow Gy)). \]This tells us that \(y\) falls under any concept \(G\) that is \(R\)-hereditary and \(R\)-bars \(x\).

Still following Frege, one can then define \(Nx\) (“\(x\) is a natural number”) as short for

\[ 0 = x \vee \text{successor}^* 0x. \]
The relation \(Rxy\) on which Frege focuses is that of \(y\)
(immediately) succeeding \(x\). This has the further advantage of
being a *function*, i.e., a many-one relation. This enabled
Frege to prove that the ancestral of successor is *linear*:

This definition of \(Nx\) secures the desired result: every natural number is but finitely many steps of immediate succession away from 0. Ancestralization captures the notion ‘finitely many’ without invoking the notion of natural number, and indeed serves as an independent logico-conceptual basis for the definition of the notion of natural number itself. Note also that it is an essentially second-order notion.

Given the functional character of the relation of immediate
succession, one can write \(m = sn\) when \(m\) immediately succeeds
\(n\). One especially important consequence of Frege’s
definition of \(Nx\) is that it enables one to prove, as a *purely
logical result*, the Principle of Mathematical Induction:

So too could Frege derive, logically, all the other Dedekind-Peano postulates (involving the name 0 and the successor function-sign \(s\)) for the natural numbers.

The most important of these remaining postulates is the one saying that every natural number has a unique (immediate) successor. In order to prove this in full generality, Frege had of course to take into account the possibility that an arbitrarily given natural number might far exceed the size of any collection of physical objects in the universe. To what concept, then, could he turn (for a given natural number \(n)\), whose cardinality would be the successor of \(n\)?

His answer has earned the label ‘Frege’s trick’. The
sought concept would be none other than ‘successor\(^*
xn\)’, i.e., “\(x\) is a natural number preceding or
identical to \(n\)”. The natural numbers relentlessly generate
ever more of their kind, as soon as we try to count them.
*This* is why there are infinitely many of them. The idea that
each natural number tallies its predecessors in the series of natural
numbers was fully formed in the *Grundlagen*, at §82, and
rigorously executed in Volume I of the *Grundgesetze*, at
§§114–119.

By the time of the *Grundgesetze*, Frege had settled on an
explication of cardinal numbers in class-theoretic terms, which would
preserve the structure of the foregoing considerations. The number of
\(F\)s (i.e., the cardinal number of the class of all \(F\)s) was
identified as the class of all classes that are equinumerous with
(i.e., in 1–1 correspondence with) the class of all
\(F\)s.^{[21]}
Thus the class of all \(F\)s is a member of its own cardinal number.
So too is any class that is equinumerous with the class of all \(F\)s.
Thus the cardinal number of any one-membered class is the class of all
one-membered classes; the cardinal number of any two-membered class is
the class of all two-membered classes; … and so on. It is easy
to see that, on Frege’s class-theoretic definition of cardinal
number, any two equinumerous classes have the same cardinal number.
And numbers are not *sui generis*, but are rather classes of a
very special kind. See also the Encyclopedia article on
Frege’s Theorem and Foundations for Arithmetic.

#### 1.2.5 Russell’s Paradox

In the language of modern logic, supplied with the binary predicate
\(\in\) of membership, Frege’s principle of naïve
comprehension, to which he was committed by Basic Law V in the
*Grundgesetze*, can also be rendered as the following
schema:

Russell’s famous paradox ensues.

\[\exists x\forall y(y \in x \leftrightarrow y \not\in y).\]

Proof.For \(\Phi\)y in the foregoing expression of naïve comprehension, take \(y \not\in y\) (non-self-membership). One thereby obtainsLet \(r\) be such an \(x\). So

\[\forall y(y \in r \leftrightarrow y \not\in y).\]But \(r\) is an object within the scope of this generalization. Instantiating with respect to \(r\), one obtains

\[r \in r \leftrightarrow r \not\in r.\]But one can show in short order, within a very weak propositional logic, that any statement of the form

\[A \leftrightarrow \neg A\]is inconsistent.

^{[22]}So Frege’s Basic Law V is inconsistent. \(\Box\)

This simple formal discovery occasioned the ‘crisis in foundations’ early in the 20th century.

Frege’s Afterword to Volume II of his *Grundgesetze*,
written in October 1902, begins with the heart-breaking words

Hardly anything more undesirable can befall a scientific writer than to have, at the completion of his work, one of the foundation-stones of his edifice shattered. (Frege [1903], p. 253; author’s translation)

Russell’s paradox consigned the details of the
*Grundgesetze* to relative obscurity. The scholarly community
had to wait a long time for a complete English translation of the
work. And this was unfortunate, given its importance for the
neo-Fregean revival that began in the
1960s.^{[23]}

### 1.3 Logicism after Frege and up to Zermelo

#### 1.3.1 Russell’s type theory

Russell offered his own solution to the problem of his paradox, in the
form of his *theory of types* (both simple and
ramified).^{[24]}
By stratifying the universe of objects into types, Russell sought to
avoid the vicious circularity that he had diagnosed as the underlying
problem with Fregean class abstraction.

Individuals would form the lowest type. Attributes or properties of
individuals (or what Russell called *propositional functions*
that could be true or false of individuals) would form the next higher
type … and so on. In Russell’s type theory, the relation
of membership can hold only between objects of different types: if
\(\alpha\) is a member of \(\beta\), then \(\alpha\) is of lower type
than \(\beta\). In type theory, the variables are typed. That is, a
given variable is to be construed as ranging only over objects of a
certain type. Thus there will be ‘individual’ variables
(of type 0, say) ranging over just the individuals. At the next type
up—type 1—there will be ‘property’ and
‘relation’ variables ranging over such properties and
relations as hold of, or among, individuals. (0 and 1 here are serving
as *indices* of types.) The idea iterates to cover all types of
finite index. Moreover, in Russell’s theory, *only* the
finitely indexed types could be formed. These are the types that can
be indexed, from ‘outside’, so to speak, by natural
numbers \(n\). There are no transfinite types, i.e., no types that
would be indexed by transfinite ordinals such as
\(\omega\).^{[25]}

A *predicative* propositional function is one that involves no
quantifications over types higher than those of its arguments. Russell
stratifies not only the universe of discourse (the various types, and
objects of those types); he also stratifies the *language*.
Suppose that a Russellian class (or predicative propositional
function) \(\beta\) is first formed at a higher rank than is
\(\alpha\). Then it is supposed to be *meaningless* (in the
language of type theory) to say that \(\beta\) is a member of
\(\alpha\), where this is construed in the official sense of
supposedly attributing the attribute corresponding to \(\alpha\) to
the object \(\beta\). (By contrast, *in the language of set
theory*, it is *meaningful*—even if false—to
say that \(\beta \in \alpha\).) Thus it is
impossible, within Russell’s type theory, to deal with the
would-be predicate or property of non-self-membership. For that
requires that the predicate \(x \in x\) of
self-membership be meaningful (and well-formed); which it is not. So,
in his type theory, Russell blocked the kind of derivation of his own
paradox to which Frege’s class theory fell victim.

Russell, however, sought to *preserve* Frege’s approach
to defining cardinal numbers as classes of similar-sized classes:

The cardinal number of a class \(\alpha\) is defined as the class of all classes similar to \(\alpha\), two classes being similar when there is a one-one relation between them. (Russell 1908: 256)

This definition, and the problems it engenders, survived into
*Principia Mathematica.*

Because of Russell’s partitioning of the logical universe into
types, his ‘cardinal numbers’ became *typically
ambiguous*. (In the following quotation, the symbol \(\Lambda\)
stands for the null, or empty, class.) As Russell conceded (1908:
257),

… 0 and 1 and all the other cardinals, according to [our] definitions, are ambiguous symbols, like cls, and have as many meanings as there are types. To begin with 0: the meaning of 0 depends upon that of \(\Lambda\), and the meaning of \(\Lambda\) is different according to the type of which it is the null-class. Thus there are as many 0’s as there are types; and the same applies to all the other cardinals.

Russell does not, however, fully accept the strictures thus imposed. In more expansive mood he immediately adds

Nevertheless, if two classes \(\alpha , \beta\) are of different types, we can speak of them as having the same cardinal … because a one-one relation may hold between the members of \(\alpha\) and the members of \(\beta,\)

even when \(\alpha\) and \(\beta\) are of different types. [Emphasis added]

By giving in to this structuralist impulse, Russell in effect puts a
second construal of cardinal numbers into contention with his official
type-theoretic one. The new construal is of a cardinal number as
something that results from *abstracting* from classes on the
basis of their similarity, rather than from forming classes of similar
classes. Such abstraction takes the Humean form (famously exploited by
Cantor)

For the reasons internal to type theory explained above, a Card cannot
be an object within any type within the official ontology of type
theory. For its would-be domain of definition would not only have to
straddle distinct types, but also include classes of all types. But
that is not possible for any type-theoretically admissible function or
operation. This fact also precludes Russell from using Frege’s
trick to ensure an infinity of
numbers.^{[26]}
For Frege had each natural number \(n\) be the number of preceding
natural numbers. For the latter to be thus numbered, they have to be
objects in the official ontology—which, however, as just
observed, Russell’s Card(inal)s are not.

Partitioning the universe into types accordingly exacted a high price
for the ‘logicism’ that might result. It is not reassuring
to learn that the logicist reconstruction on offer for one’s
favorite mathematical structures is so generous as to be uniquely
re-presented within each type. One would wish to capture their
*commonalities* within *some one structure*. And that,
as we have just seen, is what Russell was trying to do, even though it
was doomed to failure from the start, on account of its being
committed to the existence of a different series of the
‘same’ numbers within each type.

The motivation for the typing that led to this *embarras de
richesses* was understandable at the time. Russell wished to avoid
any potentially vicious circularity that might result from
impredicative definitions. According to Russell, it should be illicit
to define a class \(C\) in a way that involves generalizing about any
range of individuals to which \(C\) itself would have to belong. Thus,
with partitioning into types, the notion of self-membership, along
with non-self-membership, could not even be deployed.

This Russellian constraint on class abstraction, however, had the
consequence that with impredicative ‘class abstracts’ of
the form “the class of all \(x\) such that \(\Phi(x)\)”,
the *existence* of such a class could not be guaranteed *as
a matter of logic*. So Russell had to *postulate* that such
classes existed. This came to be regarded as detracting from their
status as would-be logical objects, and revealing them instead as no
more than mathematical posits. Their existence was once again (at
best) a *synthetic a priori* matter, rather than one of
analytic necessity and certainty.

One might wonder why such classes would qualify as logical objects courtesy of a single immensely powerful postulate (had it been consistent), but would not so qualify if their existence has to be secured in a more piecemeal postulational fashion. But that was the Achilles heel of Russellian logicism. The existential postulation present in Russell’s Multiplicative Axiom (nowadays known as the Axiom of Choice) and in his Axiom of Infinity were seen as marks of the merely mathematical, albeit against the background of a much more capacious universe of abstract objects than just the natural numbers or the real numbers themselves.

Russellian types are *ramified*: that is, propositional
functions of one and the same type belong to different
*orders*, depending on their internal logical structures. The
*type* of a propositional function, as we have seen, is
determined by the types of its free variables. But two propositional
functions \(\phi\) and \(\phi '\) of the same type can involve
different kinds of quantifications. If \(\phi\) involves
quantifications whose (bound) variables range over higher types than
do the bound variables within \(\phi '\), then \(\phi\) is of
correspondingly higher order than \(\phi '\), even though \(\phi\) and
\(\phi '\) are of the same *type*. Recall that an impredicative
propositional function \(\phi\) is one that contains bound variables
ranging over types as high as or higher than the type of \(\phi\)
itself. Assigning an impredicative propositional function to a higher
order is the ramifier’s way of marking it as not kosher.

Russell ramified his theory of types in order to avoid explicitly
impredicative definitions (against which definitions Poincaré
influentially inveighed). Russell then found himself hamstrung, unable
to derive certain desired mathematical results. Among these results
were Cantor’s Theorem, and the theorem of real analysis which
states that every set \(X\) of real numbers that is bounded above has
a least upper bound *of the same order as the real numbers in
\(X\)*. Ramified type theory appeared powerless to prove these
results. So Russell, in pragmatist spirit, introduced the Axiom of
Reducibility simply in order to get things done.

Russell’s Axiom of Reducibility in type theory states that every
propositional function is coextensive with a predicative
one—that is, one whose quantifiers range only over types lower
than that of the propositional function itself. The non-trivial
content of this axiom is that every *impredicative*
propositional function is coextensive with a predicative one. A well
known example to illustrate this is the impredicative propositional
function \(\forall F(Fx \leftrightarrow Fy)\). The Axiom of
Reducibility could be vindicated on this example by adducing the
predicative propositional function \(x = y\)—provided that one
accepts Leibniz’s controversial principle of the identity of
indiscernibles. If, *contra* Leibniz, one believes it is
possible for indiscernibles to be distinct, then, in order to
vindicate the Axiom of Reducibility, it would be necessary to adduce
some other predicative propositional function, \(x \sim y\) say, for
which it is true that

The Axiom of Reducibility, however, is tantamount to conceding the admissibility of impredicative definitions after all. For it collapses the orders for propositional functions of type 1. Critics pointed out that it would be better to eschew ramification and embrace the procedure of impredicative definition as licit after all.

One was then left with simple type theory (and no need for the Axiom
of Reducibility). But even the simple theory of types eventually fell
out of favor as a foundational theory for mathematics—possibly
because in the wake of the Byzantine ramified theory, no version of
type theory could find favor among mathematicians themselves. Type
theory was displaced by the newly emerging *set theory* due to
Zermelo and Fraenkel, which mathematicians could recognize more easily
as a formal codification of Cantorian mathematical practice. A
definitive and richly detailed history of the reception and eventual
demise of Russellian logicism can be found in Grattan-Guinness (2000).
(The terminology of ‘sets’ was adopted in order to
contrast these ‘safer’, paradox-free objects with the
problematic *classes* of Frege’s inconsistent
theory.)

#### 1.3.2 Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory

With some justice ZFC (Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with the Axiom of Choice) can be construed as an intellectual descendant of Russellian type theory, even though both theories date from the same year, 1908.

The displacement of type theory by set theory took place during the
1920s. The aim was still to unify all of mathematics, and to provide a
capacious universe of abstract objects in order to do so. All the
different mathematical theories would be interpretable within set
theory, upon suitable identification of ‘set-theoretic
surrogates’ for the objects studied by those theories. So, for
example, the finite von Neumann ordinals can serve as set-theoretic
surrogates for the natural
numbers.^{[27]}
And \(\wp(\omega)\), the power set of the set of natural numbers, is
the set-theoretic surrogate for the real
continuum.^{[28]}

ZFC set theory is an account of a cumulative hierarchy \(V\) of pure
sets, built up, ultimately, from the empty set \(\varnothing\). Each
set within \(V\) is ‘formed’ by some ordinally indexed
rank. The ranks are cumulative, and are generated, at successor
ordinals, by application of the power-set operation. The erstwhile
types are born again as ranks, except that ranks are
*cumulative*—every rank contains all members of lower
ranks. Their members are put on all fours, so to speak, for they are
taken to occupy one single extensionalized, untyped universe \(V\) of
sets.

Quine (1969), chapters XI and XII, is a masterly tracing of a route
consisting of incremental theoretical adjustments that one could in
principle make, beginning with the type theory of *Principia
Mathematica* (PM), and ending with Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory.
The purpose behind postulating the Axiom of Reducibility in type
theory, as already observed, was to ensure that every propositional
function is coextensive with a predicative one. As Quine points out,
however (and as Ramsey had pointed out before him), the Axiom of
Reducibility really defeats the purpose behind its own postulation,
thereby motivating the adoption of a simple type theory in place of
PM’s ramified one. If one then reformulates simple type theory
with ‘general’, or untyped, variables, and lets the types
be cumulative (rather than remain stratified one from another without
overlap), one effects the segue to Zermelo set theory.
Fraenkel’s Axiom Scheme of Replacement finally allows one to
“[pierce] all type ceilings” (Quine 1969: 282), and reach
Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory. Replacement says that any function that
is defined on a set as its domain has a set as its range. This allows
one to form, for example, for any transfinite ordinal number
\(\kappa\), the set

of all infinite cardinals numbers \(\aleph_{\alpha}\), where \(\alpha = 0,1,2,\ldots \lt \kappa\). The ordinals \(\alpha\) less than \(\kappa\) form a set (indeed: \(\kappa\) itself). \(\aleph_{\alpha}\), better thought of as \(\aleph(\alpha)\), is the \(\alpha\)-th infinite cardinal number. So \(\aleph\) is a function with domain \(\kappa\), whose value on \(\alpha\) is the \(\alpha\)-th infinite cardinal number. By Replacement, the set \(\{\aleph_{\alpha} \mid \alpha \lt \kappa \}\) exists. Such a set resides at a rank way above \(\kappa\).

Quine’s account amplifies the slightly less detailed one that is
to be found in Gödel
(1993/1995).^{[29]}
As Gödel observed (pp. 45–6), the ‘theory of
aggregates’, or set theory,

… as presented by Zermelo, Fraenkel and von Neumann … is nothing else but a natural generalization of the theory of types, or rather, it is what becomes of the theory of types if certain superfluous restrictions are removed.

These removals are threefold: make the types cumulative; untype the variables; and allow type formation to extend into the transfinite.

ZFC avoids Russell’s Paradox, even though all its member-sets
are on all fours, within an untyped universe. This is because its
universe \(V\) itself is *not* a set. By not espousing any
powerful enough set-abstraction principle, the set theorist avoids
Russell’s paradox. Partitioning the universe of discourse into
types appears to have been a methodologically costly over-reaction to
the problem of Russell’s Paradox. The latter would of course be
re-instated if one were ever to treat the universe \(V\) as a set.
Simply apply the Axiom Scheme of Separation

using for \(\Phi(x)\) the Russellian formula-instance \(x \not\in x\), and instantiating \(\forall y\) with respect to \(V\).

Mathematicians have a well-established practice of treating
set-abstracts as well-formed terms. They are of the logico-grammatical
form \(\{x \mid
\Phi(x)\}\).^{[30]}
If one’s formalizing logic is to respect this practice, then it
must provide the *variable-binding term-forming operator*
(*v.b.t.o.*) of set-abstraction:

Such an operator may be applied to any formula \(\Phi\) to produce a
term. Among such formulae are the hazardous ones \(x = x\) and \(x
\not\in x\). The formalizing foundationalist will therefore be careful
to adopt a *free logic* in which it is *not* assumed, of
every well-formed term, that it enjoys a denotation. The proof of
Russell’s Paradox can then be deprived of its sting: it simply
becomes a proof of the negative existential \(\neg \exists x\, x = \{y
\mid y \not\in y\}\).

Adopting a free logic, however, brings with it the following
obligation: if one wishes to recognize that certain sorts of objects
exist, or that a particular object exists, then one will have to
postulate their existence explicitly. No longer does such existence
derive from a kind of built-in, or tacit, default assumption of the
underlying logic. Rather, it demands explicit expression as a
*theoretical commitment*.

*You want an empty set?* the ZFC-theorist asks. *By all
means! Here it is:*

*You want singletons? Sure thing!:*

*… Or, if you prefer, get them from the axiom of unordered
pairs, by taking the same instance twice over:*

*You want an infinite set? By all means! Here is a very useful
one:*

*where \(Ny\) means that \(y\) is a finite von Neumann ordinal (and
this concept can be explicitly defined in set-theoretic
terms).*

ZFC theorists wear their ontological commitments, either outright or
conditional, very much on their postulational sleeve. They are out to
characterize a very rich mathematical universe, to be sure—one
in which there are so many things, and of such great variety of
structure(s), that one should be able to find, therein, a
set-theoretic ‘surrogate’ for virtually any kind of
mathematical object or structure about which one may wish to make
conjectures and prove theorems. With only this over-riding concern to
unify all of mathematics within one overarching
domain,^{[31]}
the ZFC theorist is not particularly committed to a *logicist*
view of the objects and structures involved. If anything, logicism has
acquired a new challenge: show how *set theory
itself*—like arithmetic and analysis, say—is simply a
body of logical truths in definitional disguise; and show how *sets
themselves* can be (re-)construed as some kind of definitional
concoction from *purely logical
objects*!^{[32]}

## 2. Neo-Fregeanism

The neo-Fregean revival had its origin in an insight of Charles
Parsons (see Parsons 1965: 183 and 194). He pointed out that what he
called principle (A) below suffices, given the structure of
Frege’s argumentation in the *Grundlagen*, for the
derivation of the axioms of Peano arithmetic. Parsons uses the binary
quantifier ‘*Glz*’ to abbreviate
“*gleichzahlig*” (equinumerous), and uses \(N_x\)
to abbreviate “the number of”:

\[\tag{A} N_{x}Fx = N_{x}Gx \equiv Glz_x (Fx,Gx). \]… we can put [Frege’s procedure] in the form of defining Peano’s three primitives ‘0’, ‘natural number’ and ‘successor’, and proving Peano’s axioms. … it is not necessary to use any axioms of set existence except in introducing terms of the form ‘\(N_x Fx\)’ and in proving (A), so that the argument could be carried out by taking (A) as an axiom.

This is nowadays called ‘Frege’s
Theorem’.^{[33]}
Frege’s Theorem has Principle (A) as its hypothesis. Curiously,
the stress Frege places, in the *Grundlagen*, on the importance
of this principles (that two concepts have the same number just in
case they are *gleichzahlig*) is dissipated in the
*Grundgesetze*, where the two halves of the biconditional
appear widely separated: in §53 Frege proves that if two concepts
correspond 1–1, then their numbers are identical, and in
§69 he proves the converse. But nowhere in the
*Grundgesetze* does he re-assemble the biconditional and accord
it prime philosophical importance. Had he done so, he *might*
well have become the first neo-Fregean in response to Russell’s
Paradox. In order to do so, however, he would have had to overcome his
reluctance to view (A) as a logical
axiom.^{[34]}

The neo-Fregean movement seeks to reveal that a significant amount of
mathematics is analytic. This is a stronger claim than that it is
*a priori* and derives no part of its justification from
empirical science, or even from successful applications within the
empirical sciences. For that would hold of mathematics (or indeed any
other branch of knowledge) conceived of as synthetic *a
priori*. The neo-Fregean maintains in addition that significant
parts of mathematics flow logically from principles that are analytic
of (or definitional of) their central concepts or predicates, such as
‘natural number’ or ‘real number’. That is,
they flow from the very meanings of those central predicates. (We opt
here for the linguistic version of the analyticity claim). Note the
stress here on ‘significant
parts’.^{[35]}
We know from Gödel’s second incompleteness theorem that
any consistent and sufficiently strong theory of arithmetic is unable
to prove or refute (the formalized statement of) its own consistency.
The latter statement is true, but unprovable. In light of the
incompleteness phenomena, one would be hard pressed to make good on
the claim that *all* mathematical truths are true by virtue
only of such *logical* considerations as can be captured in
systems of formal
proof.^{[36]}
When the first principles of a mathematical theory, such as
arithmetic, form an essentially incomplete axiomatization, the
logicist will have to maintain that the justification of any
*new* first principle can be furnished in some strictly logical
sense.

Note that the foregoing remarks describe the general context for a neo-Fregean revival of logicism of any kind. They do not dictate the exact form of any such revival. In §3 we discuss the particular form of the revival that involves extending second-order logic with Hume’s Principle; and in §4, we discuss constructive logicism.

These two forms of neo-Fregean revival of logicism share the following three important features with Frege’s own treatment.

First, the number 0 (zero) is still defined as the number of any empty
concept: in particular, as *the number of non-self-identical
things* (formally: \(\# x \neg x = x\)).

Secondly, once the existence of any natural number \(n\) is secured,
that of its successor, \(s(n)\), is secured by taking \(s(n)\) to be
the number of *all natural numbers from* 0 *to \(n\),
inclusive* (Frege’s trick).

Thirdly, the definition of the concept of natural number exploits the
notion of the *ancestral* of the relation of succession: \(x\)
bears the succession-ancestral relation to \(y\) just in case \(y\) is
at most finitely many steps of succession away from \(x\). (As already
made clear, any apparent circularity in this definition, deriving from
the adverbial gloss ‘finitely’, turns out, upon closer
inspection of the definitions used, to be just that: merely apparent.)
The concept “\(z\) is a natural number” is then defined as
“either 0 is \(z\), or 0 bears the succession-ancestral relation
to \(z\)”. And this is what allows the neo-Fregean logicist to
derive the principle of mathematical induction for the natural
numbers. The reader of this survey article will be spared the formal
details. They can be found in Tennant (2022).

## 3. Second-order logic with Hume’s Principle

The neo-Fregean revival began in earnest with
Wright.^{[37]}
Wright (1983) sought to derive the Dedekind-Peano axioms for
successor arithmetic from what was called N\(^=\) and has since come
to be known as Hume’s Principle (that is, Parsons’s
principle (A) above):

Wright sketched a derivation of the Dedekind-Peano axioms from
Hume’s Principle. The deductions sketched would be carried out
in standard second-order logic—‘standard’ in the
sense that, in the presence of HP, all number-abstractive terms of the
form \(\# x\Phi(x)\) can be proved to denote. Such a system is
*unfree with respect to its number-abstractive terms.* This
point holds *even if* the second-order logic in question is a
free logic in the official sense of not being committed to the
theorem-scheme \(\exists !t\) (i.e., \(\exists x\, x = t\)) for any
well-formed singular term \(t\). The proof of this point is short and
easy, and is like the one given in
§1.2.3.
We shall given an informal version as follows.

Clearly, the identity relation is a one-one correspondence of the \(\Phi\)s onto the \(\Phi\)s. Therefore it is a theorem of second-order logic that

\[\exists R(R \text{ maps the \(\Phi\)s \(1\text{-}1\) onto the \(\Phi\)s}).\]This is the right-hand side of that instance of HP whose left-hand side is

\[\# x\Phi(x) = \# x\Phi(x).\]The latter has now been established as a theorem-scheme of second-order logic with HP. Hence in this system we have the theorem-scheme

\[\exists !\# x\Phi(x).\]

The overarching theme is that we can redeem Frege’s key philosophical insights concerning (natural and real) numbers and our knowledge of them, despite Russell’s discovery of paradox in Frege’s own theory of classes. That paradox notwithstanding, numbers are still logical objects, characterized by methods or principles of abstraction—which of course cannot be as ambitious as Frege’s Basic Law V. These principles afford a distinctive form of epistemic access to numbers. The usual mathematical axioms governing the two kinds of numbers are to be derived as results in (higher-order) logic—essentially following Frege’s deductive plan. These derivations will exploit appropriate definitions of the primitive constants, functions, and predicates of the brand of number theory concerned. (For example: 0, 1; \(s, +, \times\); \(\lt\); \(N(x)\); \(\mathbb{R}(x)\).)

The main difference is this: the neo-Fregean no longer accepts
Frege’s definition of numbers as classes of equinumerous
classes. Instead, the numbers are vouchsafed as *sui generis*,
courtesy of newly chosen abstraction principles. The Wrightian
neo-logicist (henceforth: the HP-er) opts for HP; the constructive
logicist opts, much more modestly, for rules permitting the
introduction of zero and of successors. Apart from this key
difference, however, the neo-Fregeans hew in other places quite
closely to Frege’s overall deductive strategy when deriving the
Dedekind-Peano postulates.

No supplementation by intuition or sensory experience will be needed
in the derivations of these postulates. The trains of reasoning
involved will depend only on our grasp of logical validities,
supplemented by appropriate definitions. Purported result (for the
HP-er): *because HP is analytic*, logicism is vindicated; and
the mathematical knowledge derived in this way is revealed to be
analytic, not synthetic.

For reservations about this claimed result, however, see Boolos
(1997). The main objection with which the HP-er needs to contend is
that Hume’s Principle is neither a logical nor an analytic
truth. It cannot be logical, so the objection would go, because it has
such a huge ledger of ontological commitments: for *every*
concept, its alleged number. And it cannot be analytic, because the
two sides of the biconditional have *different* ontological
commitments: the right-hand side has *no* commitments to numbers,
while the left-hand side is brimming with such commitments. In order
to defend against these objections, the HP-er needs to do two things.
First—as any logicist needs to do—he needs to challenge
the dogma that no logical principle can carry any ontological
commitments. Secondly, he needs to provide an account of analyticity
according to which a biconditional can be analytic even when the
explicit ontological commitments of each side of the biconditional
differ. (These commitments are to be judged by considering each side
as a sentence in the restricted language whose vocabulary is just
sufficient to allow the sentence in question to be formed.)

The HP-er advocates Hume’s Principle in its unrestricted form, and is thereby committed, as we have seen, to the existence of a denotation for every term of the form \(\{x \mid \Phi(x)\}\). The HP-er is committed, not only to the number of all natural numbers, but also to the number of all self-identical things—or, at least, so Wright was in Wright (1983). This ‘universal number’ \(\# x(x = x\)) is sometimes called ‘anti-zero’. In n. 5 on p. 187 one reads

It is worth stressing that it is, of course, absolutely essential that there be such a number as \(Nx : x = x\); for it is impossible to imagine what sort of ground there could be for admitting \(Nx : x \ne x\) if that were in doubt.

Boolos (1987), after raising qualms about the universal number,
provided an ingenious model (which had been anticipated informally by
Geach (1975: 446–7)) to allay the misgiving about the
consistency of full second-order logic with HP (the system now known
as FA, for ‘Frege Arithmetic’). Simply take the natural
numbers along with the distinct object \(\omega\) as the elements of
the domain. The element \(\omega\) serves as the denotation of any
term of the form \(\# x\Phi(x)\) where \(\Phi\) is satisfied by
infinitely many elements. Note, however, that this consistency proof
works only when FA is taken on its
own.^{[38]}
The Geach–Boolos model cannot be relied upon to secure the
consistency of FA *in conjunction with* other theories, such as
set theory, that one might wish to extend with FA. Since, however,
counting finite extensions ought to be a universally applicable
intellectual operation, regardless of subject matter, it will be the
exception rather than the rule that FA is to be applied *only to
the natural numbers* (plus, perhaps, the unnatural factotum
\(\omega)\). Rather, FA should be applicable not only to concrete
objects, but also to abstract mathematical entities such as real
numbers and sets. Provided only that one has a criterion of identity
for the objects in question, one should be in a position to count any
finite collection of them.

Subsequently, in Hale and Wright 2001 (p. 315), Wright expressed
reservations over whether “\(x = x\)” counts as a sortal
predicate eligible to be prefixed by “the number of \(x\) such
that”. Now Wright was inquiring after what “is wanted for
the *exorcism* of anti-zero” (p. 314, emphasis added).
His considered answer is that a term of the form \(\# xFx\) will
denote a number only if the concept \(F\) is both sortal and not
indefinitely
extensible.^{[39]}
So Wright subsequently hoped to make actual what he had previously
alleged to be impossible to imagine. The technical proposal must
therefore be that Hume’s Principle is to be restricted to
predicates that (express concepts that) are both sortal and not
indefinitely extensible. But this, of course, raises the question
whether there is an effective method for determining, of any given
predicate \(F\), whether \(F\) (expresses a concept that) is both
sortal and not indefinitely extensible. In the absence of any such
effective method, the theory will not have been axiomatized.

This survey perforce confines itself, in the main, to (neo-)logicist
accounts of the *natural* numbers. But it is worth raising one
more question about the extension of a neo-Fregean account in an
attempt to cope with the *real* numbers. We shall call it the
*inclusion question*. How is one to appreciate that the natural
numbers *qua* reals *are* (in the non-punning sense of
numerical identity) the natural numbers vouchsafed by logicism about
the
naturals?^{[40]}
This question is not answered by the neo-Fregean abstractionist
account of the reals in Shapiro (2000). In that account, the various
new abstracta are abstracted from quite varying equivalence relations,
and no attempt is made to leave it open as a possibility that the
natural number \(n\) *is* the integer \(n\), *is* the
rational number \(n\), and *is* the real number \(n\).
(Although on p. 339 Shapiro writes that he proposes “to avoid
the issue [of *identity* under inclusion] here”, his
proposed treatment nevertheless answers the inclusion question
negatively.)

One issue that is not satisfactorily disposed of, is this: in what
sense can Wright’s neo-Fregean logicist claim to be furnishing
an *epistemic foundation* for, let us say, first-order Peano
arithmetic, if their axiomatic principle HP, along with the
second-order logic employed (\(=\text{FA}\)), puts the supposed
‘foundation’ much higher in the hierarchy of
consistency-strengths than the weaker theory being
‘founded’? (This is to raise once again the worry
expressed by Boolos (1997:
248–9).)^{[41]}

It is an age-old tradition in foundational investigations to provide a foundation that is not only obviously consistent, but obviously true, and from which all the results in the branch(es) of mathematics being founded will follow logically. Moreover, this following logically is itself something that must be epistemically accessible—hence the importance of checkable proof. A foundational effort can be directed at many different branches of mathematics simultaneously, or just at some particular branch, such as arithmetic. In the former case, it is understandable if the foundational theory chosen (such as ZFC) has a higher consistency strength in relation to any one branch of mathematics being founded. But if the effort is directed at just that one branch (say, arithmetic), then the foundation provided should be of a consistency-strength that is as low as possible, in relation to that branch.

The consistency-strength of FA is that of second-order arithmetic
\(Z_2\) (i.e., real analysis), which is equal to that of
Zermelo–Fraenkel set theory without the Axiom of Power Sets. The
consistency-strength of first-order Peano arithmetic is much weaker,
namely that of Zermelo–Fraenkel set theory without the Axiom of
Power Sets *and* without the Axiom of Infinity.

By adopting second-order logic along with Hume’s Principle in an
unrestricted form, Wright incurred commitment (as a matter of
analyticity) not only to each natural number, *seriatim*, but
also to the cardinal number of *any* concept whatsoever. We
know now, however, that Gödel’s prescient
‘completionary’ insight has long since been fully borne
out. The insight in question was that the set-theorist’s key to
proving stronger and stronger results in mathematics—and in
particular the consistency of each newly attained system—is to
postulate the existence of ever-larger cardinal numbers. If all these
cardinals were available across the board courtesy of Hume’s
Principle applied to appropriately expressed concepts, then Wright
would be proposing a foundational theory of enormous strength. The
only reason why FA is not even more powerful than \(Z_2\) is that the
former system’s ontology is being generated solely by the
abstractions. There is no other source of existential postulation, as
there would be if one were to add, say, set theory to the theoretical
mix.

Upon such addition further care would be needed when considering the
nature of Wright’s transfinite cardinals begotten by
Hume’s Principle. As the investigations of Kit Fine (1998: 515;
2002) have revealed, any attempt to combine such an abstractive
account of transfinite cardinals with set theory must resort to
treating the abstracted cardinals as *Urelemente* rather than
as sets. Set theory cannot, by itself, provide a set-surrogate for
every transfinite cardinal that would be generated by Hume’s
Principle.

Another and rather different line of criticism of the claim that HP is
analytic can be found in Mancosu (2016: Chapter 4). Ironically,
Mancosu advances what he calls a *Good Company* objection to
HP. HP jostles for primacy with at least infinitely many ‘Good
Companion’ abstraction principles. They are good because, like
HP, they permit the logical derivation of the Dedekind-Peano axioms.
They do so via their respective ‘number’-abstraction
operators with predicates whose extensions are
(Dedekind-)*finite*. They assign such extensions the right
natural numbers as their cardinal numbers. When that operator is
applied to a predicate whose extension is
(Dedekind-)*infinite*, however, these other principles give
results arbitrarily different from what one would expect from the more
Cantorian principle HP. HP and these Good Companions get matters right
on all finite extensions. But the Good Companions give rise to a
confusing variety of ‘number’-assignments to infinite
extensions. The problem for the HP-er, as Mancosu sees it, is how to
maintain the case for the analyticity of HP in light of all this good
company. We see here another manifestation of the epistemological
worry that HP is of excessive consistency strength when the logicist
project is simply to furnish a deeper but analytic foundation for
Dedekind-Peano arithmetic. All that such a foundation requires is what
HP *and* these competing Good Companion principles *agree
upon*—namely, that predicates with
(Dedekind-)*finite* extensions should get the right numbers
assigned to them (i.e., the natural numbers). There is no need for the
logicist about Dedekind-Peano arithmetic to make pronouncements about
any infinite numbers.

Mancosu’s Good Companions to HP arise only because he shares
with the HP-er a fundamental logical commitment: *every*
singular term of the language must denote. This means that the logic
furnishing the supposed logicist foundation for arithmetic is not a
*free* logic. Every singular term formed by applying the
number-abstraction operator to a predicate is taken to stand for some
object. This refusal to adopt a free logic complicates matters unduly
if ones sees as part of the logicist project the task of generating
only epistemically *justifiable* commitment to numbers as
abstract existents. We want, as it were, to be able to recognize only
those numbers whose existential credentials are absolutely compelling.
In particular, the logicist should be able to deliver *only*
the natural numbers, when furnishing deeper logical derivations of the
Dedekind-Peano postulates.

## 4. Constructive Logicism

### 4.1 Motivation for a different kind of neo-logicism

We begin this section with some remarks about Gentzenian proof theory. This is not because it played any direct role in the development of logicism—far from it—but because we seek in this section to describe in broad terms a different kind of neo-logicism that draws more heavily on proof-theoretic resources.

It was only with the work of Gerhard Gentzen in the early 1930s (see
Gentzen 1934, 1935) that researchers in foundations were equipped with
formal calculi of deduction that could do real justice to the actual
structure of inferential dependencies within mathematical proofs. What
we have in mind here are the dependencies of conclusions upon both
premises and assumptions that may have been made only “for the
sake of argument”. A good example of assumptions of the latter
kind are *reductio* assumptions (assume \(\phi\); derive
absurdity; conclude \(\neg \phi\), now independently of \(\phi)\).

It is extraordinary that the community of mathematical logicians took
so long to discover the calculi of natural deduction (and the
*sequent calculi*), once Frege, in 1879, had cracked the
previously hidden grammatical code of multiply quantified sentences.
It is remarkable that Gödel, in 1929, could have demonstrated the
completeness of first-order logic *before* Gentzen’s
natural formulation of it, when that logic was available only in the
forms of the highly unnatural deductive calculi devised by Frege, by
Hilbert, and by Russell and Whitehead.

The essential breakthrough of Gentzen’s treatment was to
characterize each logical operator in isolation, with rules of its
own, rules in which *only* that operator would explicitly
feature. Moreover, the rules in question would deal only with a
*single occurrence* (in dominant position) of the operator in
question. The rule for reasoning to a conclusion with the operator
dominant was called the operator’s *introduction* rule;
while the rule for reasoning *from* a premise with the operator
dominant was called its *elimination* rule.

The introduction and elimination rules for any logical operator have
to be in a certain kind of *equilibrium*, an equilibrium that
lends itself to an interpretation of the rules as matching the
inferential obligations of any responsible, rational and sincere
speaker to the inferential entitlements of any responsible, rational
and trusting
listener.^{[42]}

The equilibrium in question is explicated by the so-called
*reduction procedures* for the logical operators. These
procedures enable one to remove from a proof any sentence occurrence
that stands both as the conclusion of an application of an
introduction rule and as the major premise of an application of the
corresponding elimination rule. Repeated application of the procedures
will eventually turn the proof into one that is in *normal
form*—essentially, one that is not eligible for any further
application of the
procedures.^{[43]}
The significance of proofs in normal form is that they represent
*direct* deductive routes from their premises to their
conclusions.

Powerful, incisive and revolutionary though Gentzen’s approach
has since proved to be, it was, in its turn, curiously limited. It was
restricted to just the universally acknowledged *logical*
operators of first-order logic: \(\neg , \wedge , \vee , \rightarrow ,
\exists\) and \(\forall\).

At exactly the same time there appeared Carnap (1934), *Logische
Syntax der Sprache*, which offered an account of analyticity for
languages in which all logico-*mathematical* operators could
make similar contributions to the status of a sentence as analytically
true (or analytically false). Carnap, however, did this by employing
axiomatizations involving all the various logico-mathematical
operators, co-functioning in grammatically complex axioms. His
approach was therefore quite unlike the more ‘natural’ one
of Gentzen, which was *single-operator focused*. Moreover, the
unnatural approach was still Carnap’s preferred choice in work
as late as his *Foundations of Logic and Mathematics* (Carnap
1939).^{[44]}
We mention Carnap in contrast with Gentzen here because of
Gentzen’s tragic early death at the end of the Second World War.
Who knows how Gentzen might have extended his exquisitely conceived
inferentialist techniques to items on the broad logicist agenda? His
writings appeared in English translation only in 1969 (see Gentzen
1934/1935 [1969]). Carnap, however, did survive to exert considerable
influence on the thinking of a new generation of philosophers of
mathematics on the problems and prospects for logicism; and he was
able to do so from the mid-1930s, in the USA, writing in English.

After the early 1940s, proof theory did not broaden and diversify so
as to address a potentially fertile agenda: an investigation of the
various forms that introduction and elimination rules might take, as
it examines rule-governed expressions whose rules are not quite so
neatly classifiable as introduction and elimination rules. This is the
case, for example, with families of ‘coeval’ and
interdependent concepts of a nevertheless logico-mathematical kind. An
example of such a family is that of the *ordered pair* of any
two things; the *first member* of any ordered pair; and the
*second member* of the same. An important feature of this
example, and of other examples that could be given, is that the
operators in question are *term-forming operators*. Gentzen had
confined his study to sentence-forming operators. Perhaps it was
Tarski’s theory of truth for formalized languages (see Tarski
1956 [1933]) that deflected interest away from further development of
this essentially *inferentialist* approach to the meanings of
logical and mathematical operators.

### 4.2 Anti-realism and an inferentialist approach to logicism

An inferentialist approach holds special appeal for the semantic
anti-realist. According to Michael Dummett’s influential
characterization of semantic realism, the realist is one who believes
that every declarative sentence of one’s language is
determinately true or false, independently of our means of coming to
know which. This is what is supposed to justify the realist’s
use of strictly classical logical principles such as the Law of
Excluded Middle. The anti-realist, by contrast, insists that all
truths are *knowable*; and is quick to point out that we do not
have any effective method for deciding the truth or falsity of
statements in mathematics. Anti-realists, accordingly, reject the Law
of Excluded Middle (and all other strictly classical rules that are
intuitionistically equivalent to it), and advocate the use of
intuitionistic or constructive logic, rather than classical logic.

An anti-realist concerned to demonstrate the analyticity of the basic laws of arithmetic would inquire whether one can eschew strictly classical passages of inference when deriving the Peano postulates. For, if those postulates are analytically true, then the anti-realist would expect to attain them by means of rules justifiable by appeal only to the constructive contents involved (see Rumfitt 1999). And indeed the anti-realist can. She can avoid recourse to the full power of Hume’s Principle. The innocuous ingredients of the conceptual content of Hume’s Principle, insofar as finite numbers are concerned, will find expression in the inferential rules that the anti-realist lays down for zero, #, and successor. Heyting arithmetic, after all, has exactly the same axioms as Peano arithmetic, and is the logical closure of those axioms under intuitionistic, rather than classical, logic. The two systems PA and HA differ only in respect of the logic used for closure. It would be rather odd if the intuitionist were debarred from being a logicist in the sense at issue here.

The pursuit of analyticity in the foundations of arithmetic is one that could be very well served by the proof-theoretic methods favored by the Dummettian anti-realist’s theory of meaning. Central to such a proof-theoretic approach is the formulation of inferential rules governing all the expression-forming operators in question—rules that come, preferably, in introduction-elimination pairs. The rules are constitutive of the respective operators’ meanings; whence results proved solely by means of those rules qualify as analytic. A question that will be raised by any alert meaning-theorist, therefore, is the following: Might there not be some anti-realist (constructive, or intuitionistic) derivation, in Fregean spirit, of the basic laws of arithmetic by appeal to suitable meaning-constituting rules of inference that conform to the general requirements of an anti-realist theory of meaning? Anti-realist doctrine invites such extension to the mathematical expressions in fundamental theories such as arithmetic. It could give Fregean logicists what they are seeking: fundamental derivations of the Dedekind-Peano postulates from more basic logical principles, logical principles that are at least as secure, epistemically, as the mathematical postulates they are seeking to derive.

### 4.3 Execution

A theory of this kind, called *constructive logicism*, was
presented in Tennant (1987). Its distinguishing features may be
summarized as follows.

**Finitude:**It proves the existence of numbers of concepts with at most*finite*extensions;**Logical weakness:**it uses only*free intuitionistic relevant*logic;**Conceptual Adequacy:**It proves all instances of Schema N (for which, see below);**Rigor:**It provides a ‘fully rigorous deduction of the Peano postulates’ (Burgess 2005: 147).^{[45]}**Single-barreled abstraction:**Its basic principles are rules of inference effecting ‘single-barreled’ abstraction.

Constructive logicism departs altogether from both the formal method
of the *Grundgesetze*, with its double-barreled abstraction
principle Basic Law V, and from the use of use Hume’s Principle,
which is many neo-logicists’ choice of starting point—but
double-barreled once again. It is essential (and prophylactically
sufficient) to make this departure in a *free* logic, that is,
a logic free of the dogmatic (and straitjacketing) Fregean assumption
that every well-formed singular term of one’s language must
denote some object. Single-barreled abstraction principles can be
formulated in free logic as introduction and elimination rules for any
variable-binding abstraction operator \(\alpha\), governing its
occurrences in *canonical identity statements* of the form \(t
= @ xA(x)\). The constructive logicist, of course, seeks to take
\(\#\) for \(@\).

Details of this alternative approach, in pursuit of neologicist
derivation of the theories not only of natural numbers, but also of
rational and real numbers, are to be found in Tennant 2022. The
approach can also be applied to set theory itself; see Tennant
forthcoming. There, the revealed ‘logic of sets’ is what
Quine called virtual set theory: the body of doctrine that *we*
would call analytic, concerning the interconnections among
set-abstraction, predication, and membership, without making any
ontological commitments. Zermelo’s Axiom of Extensionality is
derivable as a logical theorem on this approach.

Constructive logicism is based on rules of natural deduction that are
arguably analytic of the central notions zero (0), successor \((s)\),
and ‘number of’ (\(\#\)). The rules pin down the meaning
of the number-term-forming operator \(\# x\Phi(x)\) (the number of
\(\Phi\)s). In the terminology introduced above, the rules for \(\#
x\) amount to a *single-barreled abstraction* principle. The
remaining rules are allowed to carry only very local and modest
ontological commitment, on the grounds that it is part of the very
meaning of a term such as ‘0’ that its use in the language
commits one to the existence of the number 0. Here, for example, are
the natural-deduction rules governing zero. ‘\(\bot\)’ is
the symbol for absurdity.

\[\text{0-Introduction }\frac{ \begin{array}{c} \underbrace{{\scriptsize (i)}\dfrac{\ }{F(a)}\ \ \dfrac{\ }{\exists!a}{\scriptsize (i)}} \\ \vdots \\ \bot \end{array} } { 0 = \# xF(x) }{\scriptsize{(i)}}\] | \[\text{0-Elimination }\frac{0= \# xF(x) \quad \exists !t F(t)}{\bot } \] |

(where the parameter \(a\) may occur only in the assumptions) |

In order to temper the modest commitment just mentioned, all
derivations are constructed within a *free* logic, so that all
existential commitments other than those incurred by the rules
themselves would have to be made
explicit.^{[46]}
All of the existential commitments that the constructive logicist
incurs in this way will be incurred, anyway, by the HP-er who
advocates Hume’s Principle in its unrestricted form. Recall that
the HP-er is committed, not only to the number of all natural numbers,
but also to the number of all self-identical things.

The ontological bill for the constructive logicist is much more
modest, compared to that of the HP-er. The constructive logicist is
not even committed (by the rules he lays down) to the existence of the
number of all natural numbers. Commitment is incurred (by employing
Frege’s trick) to the natural numbers *seriatim*, as
necessary existents. No commitment is incurred, however, to any other
cardinal numbers.

Chapter 25 of Tennant (1987), titled “On deriving the basic laws of arithmetic: Or, how to Frege–Wright a Dedekind-Peano”, provides detailed formal derivations of the Dedekind-Peano axioms, within a free, intuitionistic relevant logic. All the derivations given are intuitionistic, in conformity with the anti-realist aspirations explained above, and in order to warrant the adjective ‘constructive’ in the phrase ‘constructive logicism’.

Heck (1997b) dealt with so-called ‘finite Frege
arithmetic’. His treatment was classical. But Heck was
concerned, as constructive logicism had been, to derive the basic laws
of arithmetic while incurring ontological commitment only to the
natural numbers. To this end Heck restricted Hume’s Principle to
predicates with finite extensions. It is therefore natural to
conjecture that constructive logicism is the *intuitionistic
(relevant) fragment* of Heck’s finite Frege arithmetic.

Tennant (1987) argues that a condition of adequacy for any logicist theory is to explain the applicability of the finite cardinals (see p. 234). Let \(\exists_n xFx\) be the formula of first-order logic with identity, defined inductively in the usual way, that says that there are exactly \(n F\)s. Let \(\underline{n}\) be the numeral denoting the natural number \(n\), that is, “\(s\ldots s0\)”, with \(n\) occurrences of the successor symbol \(s\). Schema N is the following biconditional, an instance of which is obtained by fixing on a particular natural number \(n\) and open formula \(\Phi\).

\[ \tag{Schema N} \# x\Phi x = \underline{n} \leftrightarrow \exists_n x\Phi x. \]
An adequate theory of number would allow one to derive every instance
of Schema
N;^{[47]}
and the theory of constructive logicism does that. Tennant suggests
that this constitutes a solution to the problem of the applicability
of natural numbers in counting finite collections.

All the logicist accounts discussed so far dealt only with zero, successor, and “…is a natural number”. But there are important differences among them. It is not at all clear that constructive logicism has the same high consistency-strength of Frege Arithmetic. There appears to be no way to derive, within the constructive logicist system, an existence claim of the form

\[ \exists y(y = \# xF(x)), \]where the extension of \(F\) is an infinite set (such as the set of all natural numbers). Contrast this with the fact that FA proves

\[\exists y(y = \# x(x \text{ is a natural number})).\]The present author therefore conjectures that the consistency-strength of this system is lower than that of FA.

In Tennant (2009), the constructive logicist treatment is extended to deal with both addition and multiplication. The key innovation is a ‘logic of orderly pairing’: a system of natural-deduction rules of inference governing the formation of the ordered pair \(\pi(t,u)\) from existing objects \(t\) and \(u\), and the projections \(\lambda(u)\) of the left, and \(\varrho(u)\) of the right, member of any ordered pair \(u\).

## 5. Modal Neo-Logicism

Zalta (1999) proposes an interestingly different, because
*modal-logical*, route to the natural numbers. Although Zalta
does not himself classify it as such, his approach would appear to
warrant the adjective ‘neo-logicist’. (We prescind from
questions about the logical status of modal logic.)

Zalta employs a classical second-order modal logic (S5) with identity, and with both the first-order Barcan ‘formula’, or axiom-scheme

\[\Diamond \exists x\psi(x) \rightarrow \exists x\Diamond \psi(x).\]and its second-order correlate

\[\Diamond \exists F\psi(F) \rightarrow \exists F\Diamond \psi(F).\]The first-order Barcan formula forces one to interpret quantifiers as ranging over all possible individuals, whatever world one is ‘in’—no ‘expansion’ or ‘contraction’ of the domain can be involved as one traverses the accessibility relation from possible world to possible world.

The logic is free, and descriptive terms (the description operator \(\iota\) is primitive) are interpreted rigidly—that is, the denotation of a descriptive term in the actual world, if it has one there, is its denotation in any other possible world.

There are the usual alethic modalities \(\Box\) and \(\Diamond\) of
necessity and possibility (as interpreted by S5, of course), and the
actuality operator \(\mathcal{A}\). The relation \(xF\) of
*encoding* can hold between an *abstract* object \(x\)
and a property \(F\).

\(Ax\) will mean that \(x\) is an abstract object. The properties that an abstract object encodes are constitutive of its nature, and as such, are essential to its identity as an object. (Zalta 1993: 396)

For example, Plato’s Form of a Triangle encodes the property of being a triangle, but does not exemplify it.

Among Zalta’s fundamental principles are the following.

- Ordinary objects cannot encode any properties.
- Given any condition on properties, some abstract object encodes just those properties meeting that condition.
- Identical individuals are intersubstitutable
*salva veritate*. - Identical properties are intersubstitutable
*salva veritate*. - Particular encodings are necessary if possible.

Zalta defines an equinumerosity relation \(\approx\) among properties
with respect to *ordinary* objects—that is, the
*possibly concrete* ones. With \(\approx\) in hand, Zalta
offers the notion of a (cardinal) number (Zalta 1993: 630):

It follows that \(x\) numbers \(G\) just in case \(x\) is an abstract
object that encodes exactly the properties equinumerous to \(G\)
(where, *nota bene*, equinumerosity is judged only with respect
to the *ordinary* objects). And it follows easily from
Zalta’s first principles that “for every property \(G\),
there is a unique object which numbers \(G\)”.

Zalta’s system delivers Hume’s Principle:

\[\# F = \# G \leftrightarrow F \approx G,\]and the following obvious corollary:

\[\forall G\exists y(y = \# G).\]In this regard Zalta’s system is as powerful as Wright’s: they both guarantee for every property its number. Wright, however, begins with Hume’s Principle as a first principle, whereas Zalta derives Hume’s Principle (as Frege originally did) from his own ‘more basic’ (and possibly more powerful) principles.

We note the following three points, in concluding our exposition of Zalta’s system. In his sense of ‘concrete’ and ‘abstract’,

- Properties holding of
*ordinary*objects can be assigned numbers. - Properties holding of
*abstract*objects (including numbers themselves), cannot be assigned numbers. - The existence of all infinitely many natural numbers depends on the possible existence of unboundedly (but finitely) many concrete objects.

In points (2) and (3), Zalta departs explicitly from Frege and all other (neo-)logicists discussed above.

## 6. Recent Work Inspired by the *Grundgesetze*, or Departing From It

We have seen that there has been a revival of interest in neologicism
since the early 1980s. One of the ways in which work in this period
has sought to rescue logicism from Fregean disaster (without
sacrificing Basic Law V altogether, and without invoking HP as a
starting point) has been the study of various ‘fragments of
*Grundgesetze*’. The collectively shared idea of this
company of scholars, deriving from Parsons 1987, is as follows:
*Frege’s Grundgesetze succumbed to Russell’s Paradox.
But Frege’s system is a big one. Let us see if we can extract a
fragment of it that is (a) consistent, and (b) strong enough to afford
a decent amount of
Arithmetik*.^{[48]}
This is typical of standard consistency-restoring revisions of
theories troubled by inconsistency, but whose main goal(s) one is
trying to salvage from the wreckage. The progress that has been made
in this direction thus far is worth reporting. We shall call these
theoretical efforts ‘fragmenting’.

The fragmenting scholars just mentioned all take as primitive a
term-forming variable-binding abstraction operator that applies to
predicates to form singular terms. Their notational choices for this
operator vary. Here we shall speak generically of terms of the form
\(@xA(x)\). For \(@\), Parsons follows Frege in using a breath mark
(like a comma) placed *above* the variable \(x\). Heck uses a
caret (circumflex) placed immediately *before* \(x\), and
places a period immediately after \(x\) in the variable-binding
prefix. Wehmeier uses the caret placed immediately *above*
\(x\). Boccuni (not exactly a fragmenter—see below) uses the
formulation \(\{x:A(x)\}\) with a colon where contemporary set
theorists would have a solidus: \(\{x \mid A(x)\}\). Each of these
authors is therefore using some form of set- or class-abstraction
terms, formed by means of a variable-binding abstraction operator.

Returning to our use of \(@\) as a generic symbol covering each of
these idiosyncratic variants, we remind the reader that Basic Law V,
in *schematic* form (where \(A(x)\) and \(B(x)\) are
placeholders for formulae), would be expressed as

Basic Law V in *axiomatic* form would be second-order:

Parsons 1987 gives a model-theoretic proof that *schema* V is
consistent with first-order logic. (This had been conjectured by
Schroeder-Heister 1987.) J. Burgess 1998 gives a proof-theoretic and
constructive proof of the same result. Heck 1996 extends
Parsons’ argument to prove that both the simple and the ramified
*predicative* fragments of Frege’s system are consistent.
Wehmeier 1999 provides a consistency proof for a theory in monadic
second-order logic, consisting of *axiom* V and a higher-order
comprehension principle. Ferreira and Wehmeier 2002 proves the
consistency of *schema* V and the same comprehension
principle. The higher-order principle in question is known as
\(\Delta^{1}_1\)-comprehension.^{[49]}

Another recent innovation akin to the study of proper fragments of
*Grundgesetze* involves use of the resources of the logic of
plural quantification.
This of course takes us out of the realm of genuine
*fragments* of *Grundgesetze*. But the ideas are closely
related to those of the foregoing fragmenters.

Boccuni 2011 provides an interpretation for a language admitting
plural quantification, an interpretation that Boccuni argues makes
true every instance of the principles constituting the system she
calls PG (short for ‘Plural *Grundgesetze*’). These
are a Plural Comprehension Principle, a Predicative Comprehension
Principle, and Schema V. Boccuni 2013 presents PG as ‘a
consistent second-order system which is aimed [at deriving]
second-order Peano
arithmetic’.^{[50]}

Another recent innovation in the quest for a workable neologicist understanding of Fregean (double-barreled) abstraction that is worthy of mention was by Studd 2016. As he points out,

The key drawback with existing responses in this style [i.e., avoiding ‘full second-order logic with an impredicative comprehension principle for Concepts’] is that they undermine the neologicist recovery of mathematics. Frege’s theorem relies on full second-order logic. The predicative theory, and its ramified variants, are too weak to interpret second-order arithmetic, PA\(_2\) (see John P. Burgess 2005, ch. 2).

In his exposition Studd eschews the use of plural logic, but makes remarks along the way to the effect that one could use plural-logical language to express his claims, if one so wished. He reverts to consideration of abstractive terms. He diagnoses the problem of finding an “adequacy criterion … to sift the ‘good’ [double-barreled—NT] abstraction principles like Hume’s principle from the ‘bad’ ones like Basic Law V.” He concludes that this approach to the bad company problem

is on the wrong track … if neologicists are to retain the ambition of extending their success with arithmetic to other branches of mathematics, including standard Zermelo–Fraenkel set theory.

Studd diagnoses the problem with double-barreled abstraction
principles as arising from the fact that they are *static*.
They are taken to govern an all-inclusive domain that cannot itself be
extended with denotations for the abstractive terms featuring on the
left-hand side. Studd proposes that we should instead conceive of
abstraction as *dynamic*, in allowing for extension of the
domain by the newly abstracted abstracta. And he formulates a theory
of double-barreled abstraction that would permit this.

## 7. Summary of Problems for Logicism

We see from the foregoing discussion that there are various problems to be faced by extant versions of logicism or neo-logicism in the literature. The reader who remains mindful of them will be in a position to examine the details of any proposed new neo-logicist account with a more critically focused eye.

Some of these problems confront any version of logicism, and their solutions might be required as ‘conditions of adequacy’ on the latter. Others among these problems arise only in response to the particular methods or posits employed by the version of logicism under consideration. The following problems appear to have loomed large in the foregoing discussion.

**Frege’s ‘conceptualization problem’**

How do we apprehend numbers, if we are persuaded that arithmetic is*not*grounded in Kant’s “pure form of intuition of time”? As Frege put it in*Grundlagen*§62: “How … are numbers to be given to us, if we cannot have any ideas or intuitions of them?”**Frege’s ‘Julius Caesar problem’**

How can one show that, given a would-be logicist account of the nature of numbers,*Julius Caesar is not a number?*More generally: how can one show, on such an account, that*no number is a concrete individual*?**The ‘applicability problem’**

Can the logicist account for (i) how*natural*numbers may be applied in counting finite collections, and (ii) how*real*numbers may be applied in measuring continuously varying magnitudes such as lengths, periods of time, etc.?**The ‘inclusion problem’**

How does one show that the*natural*number \(n\) is the very same abstract object as the*integer*\(n\), the*rational*number \(n\), and the*real*number \(n\)? (See footnote 40.)**The ‘abstraction problem’**

What is the correct form for number-abstraction principles (to be espoused by those who hold that numbers are logical*abstracta*)?**The ‘analyticity problem’**

Can one demonstrate that one’s chosen number-abstraction principles are analytic?**The ‘existence problem’**

Can Logic commit one to the existence of any thing, or kind of thing?^{[51]}**The ‘infinity problem’**

Is the logicist permitted to simply*postulate*an Axiom of Infinity, to the effect that there are infinitely many things (perhaps of a certain kind)?**The ‘demarcation problem’**

What makes something a logical constant? Which notions commonly held to be mathematical can actually be defined, implicitly or otherwise, in a properly formulated Logic for logicism?^{[52]}**‘Bad Company’,**^{[53]}or**‘Embarrassment of Riches’**

Some abstraction principles are inconsistent. Yet others, though individually consistent, are mutually inconsistent. How then can we know, of any proposed abstraction principle, whether we should accept it?**‘Theoretical Invariance’**

Natural numbers are universally applicable; they enjoy their arithmetical properties and enter into their arithmetical relations necessarily, independently of what other kinds of things there might be, and of how these things might be. So abstraction principles for natural numbers should be consistent with any consistent theory about any domain of discourse. Are they?

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### Acknowledgments

The author is grateful for helpful comments on various earlier drafts from Julian Cole, Mauro Corneli, Salvatore Florio, Teresa Kouri, Lisa Shabel, Stewart Shapiro, Matthew Souba and Ed Zalta. Thanks are owed especially to John MacFarlane, who provided detailed, insightful and helpful refereeing comments on later but still ancestral drafts. The author is solely responsible for any defects that remain.