# Non-Deductive Methods in Mathematics

*First published Mon Aug 17, 2009; substantive revision Tue Apr 21, 2020*

As it stands, there is no single, well-defined philosophical subfield devoted to the study of non-deductive methods in mathematics. As the term is being used here, it incorporates a cluster of different philosophical positions, approaches, and research programs whose common motivation is the view that (i) there are non-deductive aspects of mathematical methodology and that (ii) the identification and analysis of these aspects has the potential to be philosophically fruitful.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Non-deductive Aspects of the Deductive Method
- 3. Alternative Non-deductive Methods
- 4. Summary / Conclusions
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

Philosophical views concerning the ontology of mathematics run the
gamut from platonism (mathematics is about a realm of abstract
objects), to fictionalism (mathematics is a fiction whose subject
matter does not exist), to formalism (mathematical statements are
meaningless strings manipulated according to formal rules), with no
consensus about which is correct. By contrast, it seems fair to say
that there is a philosophically established received view of the basic
methodology of mathematics. Roughly, it is that mathematicians aim to
prove mathematical claims of various sorts, and that proof consists of
the logical derivation of a given claim from axioms. This view has a
long history; thus Descartes writes in his *Rules for the Direction
of the Mind* (1627–28) that a mathematical proposition must
be “deduced from true and known principles by the continuous and
uninterrupted action of a mind that has a clear vision of each step in
the process” (47). An important implication of this view is that
there is no room, at least ideally, in mathematics for non-deductive
methods. Frege, for example, states that “it is in the nature of
mathematics always to prefer proof, where proof is possible, to any
confirmation by induction” (1884, 2). Berry (2016) offers a more
recent defense of proof as promoting key virtues of shared enquiry
within the mathematical community.

In the philosophical literature, perhaps the most famous challenge to
this received view has come from Imre Lakatos, in his influential
(posthumously published) 1976 book, *Proofs and
Refutations*:

Euclidean Methodology has developed a certain obligatory style of presentation. I shall refer to this as ‘deductivist style’. This style starts with a painstakingly stated list ofaxioms, lemmasand/ordefinitions. The axioms and definitions frequently look artificial and mystifyingly complicated. One is never told how these complications arose. The list of axioms and definitions is followed by the carefully wordedtheorems. These are loaded with heavy-going conditions; it seems impossible that anyone should ever have guessed them. The theorem is followed by theproof.

In deductivist style, all propositions are true and all inferences valid. Mathematics is presented as an ever-increasing set of eternal, immutable truths.

Deductivist style hides the struggle, hides the adventure. The whole story vanishes, the successive tentative formulations of the theorem in the course of the proof-procedure are doomed to oblivion while the end result is exalted into sacred infallibility (Lakatos 1976, 142).

Before proceeding, it will be worthwhile to make a few distinctions in order to focus the topics of subsequent discussion.

### 1.1 Discovery versus Justification

The broad claim that there are some non-deductive aspects of
mathematical *activity* seems relatively uncontroversial. For
this merely amounts to the claim that not everything that
mathematicians do when they do mathematics consists of deriving
statements from other statements. As James Franklin puts it:

Mathematics cannot consist just of conjectures, refutations and proofs. Anyone can generate conjectures, but which ones are worth investigating? … Which might be capable of proof by a method in the mathematician’s repertoire? … Which are unlikely to yield answer until after the next review of tenure? The mathematician must answer these questions to allocate his time and effort. (Franklin 1987, 2)

One way to narrow the general claim so as to make it more substantive is make use of the familiar (though not entirely unproblematic) distinction between ‘context of discovery’ and ‘context of justification’. On the one hand, this distinction may allow the traditional deductivist view to be maintained in the face of Lakatos’s critique, by arguing that what Lakatos is pointing to concerns the context of discovery in mathematics. Within the context of justification, derivation of results from axioms may still be the correct and complete story. Some of the reactions of mathematicians to Lakatos’s views have this character, for example the following remark by Morris Kline in a letter written to Lakatos:

I do believe we need much more literature emphasizing the discovery side of mathematics. All the emphasis, as you know and as you imply, is on the deductive structure of mathematics and the impression being given to students is that one deduces new conclusions from old ones.^{[1]}

It is also possible to find passages along similar lines in the work of Pólya, who was a major influence on Lakatos:

Studying the methods ofsolving problems, we perceive another face of mathematics. Yes, mathematics has two faces; it is the rigorous science of Euclid, but it is also something else. Mathematics presented in the Euclidean way appears as a systematic, deductive science, butmathematics in the makingappears anexperimental, inductive science. (Pólya 1945, vii) [italics in original]

Conversely, in order to pose a genuine challenge to the familiar
deductivist position, the counterclaim needs to be that non-deductive
methods play a role in the *justification* of mathematical
results (Paseau 2015). It will therefore be primarily justificatory
contexts which will be focused on in the remainder of this
survey.^{[2]}

### 1.2 Deduction and Formalization

This is not the place for a detailed analysis of deduction. For present purposes, this notion will be presumed to be fairly straightforward, at least in principle. A deduction is any sequence of statements each of which is derived from some initial set of statements (the premises) or from a prior statement in the sequence. However, one issue that does need to be addressed is the relationship between deduction and formalization (see, e.g., Azzouni 2013).

An argument may be deductive without being formal. Although the
paradigm cases of deduction do tend to occur in highly formalized
systems, this is not necessary. “All even numbers greater than 2
are composite; 1058 is greater than 2; 1058 is even; hence 1058 is
composite” is a perfectly good deduction, despite not being
formalized. Hence, contrary to what is sometimes assumed in
discussions of these issues, it is not true that all informal aspects
of mathematical practice are *thereby* non-deductive.

On the other hand, the development of formal logic has been closely
bound up with providing a clear language for presenting (and
evaluating) deductive mathematical reasoning. Indeed, as John Burgess
argues in his (1992), modern classical logic largely developed as a
basis for mathematical reasoning, especially proof. The increase in
rigor within mathematics during the 19^{th} Century is
properly viewed as a cause, not an effect, of the logical revolution
set off by Frege’s work. Logic, in Burgess’s view, is
descriptive: its goal is to construct mathematical models of
reasoning. Classical logic constitutes an idealized description of
classical mathematical proof.

It may also be important to distinguish *informal* elements of
a given mathematical proof from *unformalizable* elements (if
there are any such
things).^{[3]}
In Section 4, this issue will be taken up in connection with the use
of diagrams in mathematical reasoning.

### 1.3 Deductivism and Foundations

In addition to the development of formal logic, another aspect of deductivism is its emphasis on ‘foundations’. The reason for this is that the passage from axioms to theorem is straightforward, in principle, since it is a matter of logical derivation. Indeed there is nothing distinctively mathematical involved in this transition. Hence attention is shifted to the starting point of the deductive process, namely the axioms. And if these axioms are themselves theorems of some more basic theory, then this pursuit of a secure starting point can be pursued down through a hierarchy of ever more foundational mathematical theories.

It is undeniable that issues in the foundations of mathematics have
been the central preoccupation of philosophers of mathematics through
most of the 20^{th} Century. This is not, of course, because
foundational areas such as set theory are the only areas of
mathematics where philosophers think that deduction takes place, but
rather because—as pointed out above—focusing on deduction
puts particular emphasis on the starting points of proofs. Even those
sympathetic with this focus on foundational issues are likely to
acknowledge that many areas of mathematical practice are thereby
ignored. The question is what—if anything—of philosophical
interest is lost in the process.

## 2. Non-deductive Aspects of the Deductive Method

### 2.1 Aspects of Informality

#### 2.1.1 Semi-Formal Proofs

As mentioned in 1.2 above, one feature of the deductivist style is that paradigmatic mathematical proofs are expressed entirely in some appropriate formal language (for example, first-order predicate logic with identity). This allows the validity of a given proof to be easily, indeed mechanically, ascertained. But of course few, if any, of the proofs circulated and published by mathematicians have this form. What qualifies as a proof for working mathematicians ranges from the completely informal to the detailed and precise, with every (or almost every) gap filled in. However, even detailed and precise proofs are rarely expressed purely in the language of logic; rather, they are a mixture of ordinary language, mathematical, and logical symbols and terminology.

Sometimes philosophers writing in the deductivist tradition make it
sound as if this is a fairly trivial point; it is just a matter of
mathematicians having a ‘translation scheme’ to hand, but
not writing out the proof in pure logic to make it more accessible and
easier to read. In point of fact, it is often far from obvious how to
translate a given proof into formal logic. Furthermore, it is not
clear that the notion of ‘translating’ an informal proof
into a formal language is necessarily the right way of looking at the
situation. Stewart Shapiro presents essentially this view at the
beginning of his 1991 book, *Foundations Without
Foundationalism*, writing that:

The languages of full logics are, at least in part, mathematical models of fragments of ordinary natural languages, like English, or perhaps ordinary languages augmented with expressions used in mathematics. The latter may be called ‘natural languages of mathematics’. For emphasis, or to avoid confusion, the language of a full logic is sometimes called a ‘formal language’.

As a mathematical model, there is always a gap between the language of a logic and its natural language counterpart. The fit between model and modelled can be good or bad, useful or misleading, for whatever purpose at hand. (Shapiro 1991, 3)

An alternative picture is that the formal and informal languages offer different ways of expressing mathematical theorems and proofs. The formal language is not used to ‘translate’, and hence does not need to be measured against what is expressed in an informal proof. Rather it offers its own, arguably superior, resources for expressing the content of mathematical statements in a precise and rigorous setting that has been specifically designed for this purpose. Whichever picture is adopted of the relation between formal and informal presentations of mathematics, two points remain. First, deductive mathematical arguments—arguments that are produced, transmitted, and built upon by mathematicians—can be either formal or informal. Second, the evaluation of such arguments as being deductively valid or invalid is easier to carry out definitively in the context of a formal system of some sort.

It is also worth noting that Lakatos argues for a third category of proof, in addition to formal and informal, that he calls “quasi-formal”. Lakatos writes that:

to suggest that an informal proof is just an incomplete formal proof seems to me to make the same mistake as early educationalists did when, assuming that a child was merely a miniature grown-up, they neglected the direct study of child-behaviour in favour of theorizing based on simple analogies with adult behaviour. (Lakatos 1980, 63)

#### 2.1.2 Gaps in Proofs

The talk above of “every gap being filled in” in the transition to an ideal proof glosses over the fact that the notion of a “gap” in a proof is itself in need of further clarification. For one thing, the most straightforward way of defining a proof gap—as given below—is only applicable to fully formal systems.

Agapis any point in a proof where the line written does not follow from some subset of the previous lines (together with axioms) by the application of a formally valid—and explicitly stated—rule of inference for the system.

The reason for the condition that any rule be an explicitly stated
rule of inference for the system is because we want to make room for
gappy yet valid proofs. For example, “2 + 2 = 4, hence there are
infinitely many primes” is a valid argument, but clearly there
is a large gap between its premise and its conclusion. On the other
hand, despite the above definition only working for formal proofs,
gaplessness and formality do not always go together. Thus a
traditional syllogism such as, “All men are mortal; Socrates is
a man; hence Socrates is mortal” is an example of a gapless
informal proof. One way to extend the notion of gappiness (and
gaplessness) to informal proofs is via the notion of a *basic
mathematical inference*, in other words an inference that is
“accepted by the mathematical community as usable in proof
without any further need of argument” (Fallis 2003, 49).

However we end up characterizing gaps, it is undeniably the case that most actual proofs as presented by mathematicians have gaps. Don Fallis proposes a taxonomy of kinds of proof gaps in his (2003):

- Inferential Gaps

“A mathematician has left an inferential gap whenever the particular sequence of propositions that the mathematician has in mind (as being a proof) is not a proof” (Fallis 2003, 53). - Enthymematic Gaps

“A mathematician has left an enthymematic gap whenever he does not explicitly state the particular sequence of propositions that he has in mind” (Fallis 2003, 54).^{[4]} - Untraversed Gaps

“A mathematician has left an untraversed gap whenever he has not tried to verify directly that each proposition in the sequence of propositions that he has in mind (as being a proof) follows from previous propositions in the sequence by a basic mathematical inference” (Fallis 2003, 56–7).

In addition to this taxonomical work, Fallis also argues for the
philosophical thesis that gaps in proofs are not necessarily a bad
thing. Building on (iii) above, he introduces the notion of a
*universally untraversed gap*, in other words a gap that has
not been bridged by any member of the mathematical community. Fallis
claims that such gaps are not unusual and that at least some of the
time proofs containing them are accepted by mathematicians in a
justificatory context. This view is borne out in more recent work by
Andersen (2018).

One currently active area of work that has led to the uncovering of hitherto unrecognized gaps of various sorts is automated proof checking. Specially designed computer programs are used to check the validity of proofs that have been rendered in an appropriate formal language. The main focus thus far has not been on discovering new results but on checking the status of proofs of already established results. George Gonthier has used this approach to verify a proof of the four color theorem (Gonthier 2008) and a proof of the odd order theorem in group theory (Gonthier et al. 2013), and Thomas Hales has verified a proof of the Jordan curve theorem (Hales 2007). In each case, a number of gaps were found and then traversed. Formal verification of this sort can also reveal other information hidden in the content of ordinary mathematical arguments. Georg Kreisel has described this general process as “unwinding proofs”, while Ulrich Kohlenbach has more recently coined the term “proof mining.” In connection with the methods described above, Avigad writes that

… proof-theoretic methods and insights can be put to use … in the field of automated reasoning and formal verification. Since the early twentieth century, it has been understood that ordinary mathematical arguments can be represented in formal axiomatic theories, at least in principle. The complexity involved in even the most basic mathematical arguments, however, rendered most formalization infeasible in practice. The advent of computational proof assistants has begin to change this, making it possible to formalize increasingly complex mathematical proofs. … [T]he methods can also be used for the more traditional task of verifying ordinary mathematical proofs, and are especially pertinent to cases where proofs rely on computation that is too extensive to check by hand. (Avigad 2007, 7)

Delariviere and Van Kerkhove (2017) point out, however, that while computer methods may play an increasingly important rule in proof verification, it is much less clear that such methods can play a correspondingly central role in advancing mathematical understanding.

#### 2.1.3 Diagrams

Another aspect of informal proof that has been the subject of renewed
attention in the recent philosophical literature is the role of
diagrams (Giaquinto 2007; Shin & Lemon 2008). What is not in
dispute is that proofs—especially in geometry but also in other
areas ranging from analysis to group theory—are often
accompanied by diagrams. One issue concerns whether such diagrams play
an indispensable role in the chain of reasoning leading from the
premises of a given proof to its conclusion. *Prima facie*,
there would seem to be three possible situations:

- The diagrams play no substantive role in the proof and serve merely as ‘illustrations’ of aspects of the subject-matter with which it deals.
- In practical terms it is difficult (or even impossible) to grasp the proof without making use of the diagrams, but this indispensability is psychological rather than logical.
- The diagrams play an essential role in the logical structure of the proof.

The initial wave of philosophical work done on diagrammatic reasoning
focused on Euclid’s *Elements*, partly because of the
centrality and historical importance of this work, and partly because
it is so often held up as a canonical example of the deductive method
(see, e.g., Mumma 2010). If some or all of the diagrams in the
*Elements* fall under option (iii) above, then deleting all the
diagrams will render many of the proofs invalid. This raises the
further question of whether a distinctively diagrammatic form of
reasoning can be identified and analyzed, and—if
so—whether it can be captured in a purely deductive system. One
difficulty for any proposed rigorization is the ‘generalization
problem’: how can a proof that is linked to a specific diagram
be generalized to other cases? This is intertwined with the issue of
distinguishing, in formal terms, between the essential and
coincidental features of a given diagram.

More recent work on the role of diagrams in proofs has included a defense of the position that diagrammatic proofs can sometimes be fully rigorous (Azzouni, 2013), and exploration of diagram-based reasoning in areas of mathematical practice other than geometry (de Toffoli and Giardino, 2014; de Toffoli, 2017).

### 2.2 Justifying Deduction

Even if we restrict attention to the context of justification, a deductive proof yields categorical knowledge only if it proceeds from a secure starting point and if the rules of inference are truth-preserving. Can our confidence that these two conditions obtain also be grounded purely deductively? These conditions will be considered in turn.

#### 2.2.1 Justification of Rules

In one sense, it seems quite straightforward to give a deductive
justification for some favored set of rules of inference. It can be
shown, for example, that if the premises of an application of Modus
Ponens are true then the conclusion must also be true. The problem, at
least potentially, is that such justifications typically make use of
the very rule which they seek to justify. In the above case: if MP is
applied to true premises then the conclusion is true; MP is applied to
true premises; hence the conclusion is true. Haack (1976) and others
have debated whether the circularity here is vicious or not. One
crucial consideration is whether analogous
‘justifications’ can be given for invalid rules, for
example Prior’s introduction and elimination rules for
‘tonk,’ that also have this feature of using a rule to
justify
itself.^{[5]}
(A closely related issue can be traced back to Lewis Carroll and his
classic (1895) paper.)

#### 2.2.2 The Status of Axioms

Let us assume, then, that an idealized deductive proof provides one
kind of security: the transparency of each step ensures the validity
of the argument as a whole, and hence guarantees that *if* the
premises are all true *then* the conclusion must be true. But
what of the axioms that are brought in at the beginning of the proof
process? The traditional answer to this question is to claim that the
truth of the axioms is secure because the axioms are
“self-evident”. This certainly seems to have been the
generally accepted view of the axioms of Euclidean geometry, for
example. However, this attitude is much less prevalent in contemporary
mathematics, for various reasons. Firstly, the discovery of
non-Euclidean geometry in the early 19^{th} Century showed
that apparent self-evidence, at least in the case of the Parallel
Postulate, is no guarantee of necessary truth. Secondly, the
increasing range and complexity of mathematical theories—and
their axiomatizations—made it much less plausible to claim that
each individual axiom was transparently true. Thirdly, many
mathematical subfields have become abstracted to a considerable degree
from any concrete models, and this has gone hand-in-hand with the
tendency for at least some mathematicians to adopt a formalist
attitude to the theories they develop. Rather than expressing
fundamental truths, on this view axioms serve simply to provide the
starting position for a formal game.

The slide towards this sort of formalist attitude to axioms can also
be traced through Frege’s logicism. The logicist program sought
to show that mathematics is reducible to logic, in other words that
mathematical proofs can be shown to consist of logical deductions from
logically true premises. For Frege, these logically true premises are
*definitions* of the terms which occur in them. But this again
raises the issue of what distinguishes acceptable from unacceptable
definitions. The worry here is not just whether our axioms are true
but whether they are even consistent (a pitfall which famously befell
Frege’s own system). And this is a problem once self-evidence is
abandoned as the ‘gold standard’ for axioms, whether we
move from here to a formalist view or a logicist view. In both cases,
some other bounds on the acceptability of candidate axioms must be
provided.

Is there a middle ground, then, between the high standard of self-evidence on the one hand and the ‘anything goes’ attitude on the other? One idea, a version of which can be traced back to Bertrand Russell, is to invoke a version of inference to the best explanation. Russell’s view, plausibly enough, is that the propositions of elementary arithmetic—“2 + 2 = 4”, “7 is prime”, etc.—are much more self-evident than the axioms of whatever logical or set-theoretic system one might come up with to ground them. So rather than viewing axioms as maximally self-evident we ought instead to think of them as being chosen on the basis of their (collective) capacity to systematize, derive, and explain the basic arithmetical facts. In other words, the direction of logical implication remains from axioms to arithmetical facts, but the direction of justification may go the other way, at least in the case of very simple, obvious arithmetical facts. Deriving “2 + 2 = 4” from our set-theoretic axioms does not increase our confidence in the truth of “2 + 2 = 4”, but the fact that we can derive this antecedently known fact (and not derive other propositions which we know to be false) does increase our confidence in the truth of the axioms.

The direction of justification here mirrors the direction of justification in inference to the best explanation. Once we have a measure of confidence in a particular choice of axioms then the direction of justification can also flow in the more conventional direction, in step with the deductive inferences of a proof. This will happen when the theorem proved was not one whose truth was antecedently obvious. Easwaran (2005), Mancosu (2008), and Schlimm (2013) have developed this basic account of axiom choice in different ways. For example, Mancosu argues that an analogous process may underlie the development of new mathematical theories that extend the domain of application or the ontology of previous theories. Making further progress on analyzing this process will depend on giving a satisfactory account of mathematical explanation, and this has become an area of considerable interest in the recent literature on philosophy of mathematics.

Another approach, pursued by Maddy (1988, 1997, 2001, 2011) is to look in more detail at the actual practice of mathematicians and the reasons they give for accepting or rejecting different candidate axioms. Maddy’s main focus is on axioms for set theory, and she argues that there are various theoretical virtues, with no direct link to ‘self-evidence’, which axioms may possess. What these virtues are, and how they are weighted relative to one another, may well vary across different areas of mathematics. Two core virtues which Maddy identifies for set-theoretic axioms are UNIFY (i.e. that they provide a single foundational theory for deciding set-theoretic questions) and MAXIMIZE (i.e. that they not arbitrarily restrict the range of isomorphism types). The issue of axiom choice in set theory has also been taken up in recent work by Lingamneni (2017) and by Fontanella (2019).

### 2.3 Gödel’s results

Undoubtedly the most notorious of the limitations on the deductive method in mathematics are those which stem from Gödel’s incompleteness results. Although these results apply only to mathematical theories strong enough to embed arithmetic, the centrality of the natural numbers (and their extensions into the rationals, reals, complexes, etc.) as a focus of mathematical activity means that the implications are widespread.

Nor should the precise implications of Gödel’s work be
overstated. The order of the quantifiers is important. What Gödel
showed is that, for any consistent, recursively axiomatized formal
system, F, strong enough for arithmetic, there are truths expressible
in purely arithmetical language which are not provable in F. He did
not show that there are arithmetical truths which are unprovable in
*any* formal system. Nonetheless, Gödel’s results
did hammer some significant nails into the coffin of one version of
the deductive ideal of mathematics. There cannot be a single,
recursively axiomatizable formal system for all of mathematics which
is (a) consistent, (b) purely deductive, and (c) complete. One line of
response to this predicament is to explore options for non-deductive
methods of justification in mathematics.

## 3. Alternative Non-deductive Methods

### 3.1 Experimental Mathematics

The role of non-deductive methods in empirical science is readily
apparent and relatively uncontroversial (*pace* Karl Popper).
Indeed the canonical pattern of justification in science is *a
posteriori* and inductive. What makes empirical science empirical
is the crucial role played by observation, and—in
particular—by experiment. A natural starting point, therefore,
in a survey of non-deductive methods in mathematics, is to look at the
rise of a genre known as “experimental mathematics.” The
past 15 years or so have seen the appearance of journals (e.g.,
*The Journal of Experimental Mathematics*), institutes (e.g.,
the Institute for Experimental Mathematics at the University of
Essen), colloquia (e.g., the Experimental Mathematics Colloquium at
Rutgers University), and books (e.g., Borwein and Bailey 2003 and
2004) devoted to this theme. These latter authors also argue, in
Borwein and Bailey (2015), for the significance of experimental
mathematics within mathematical practice more generally, while
Sorensen (2016) provides a broader historical and sociological
analysis of experimental mathematics.

Against the background of the traditional dichotomy between
mathematical and empirical routes to knowledge, the very term
“experimental mathematics” seems at best oxymoronic and at
worst downright paradoxical. One natural suggestion is that
experimental mathematics involves performing *mathematical
experiments*, where the term “experiment” here is
construed as literally as possible. This is the approach adopted by
van Bendegem (1998). According to van Bendegem, an experiment involves
“the manipulation of objects, … setting up processes in
the ‘real’ world and … observing possible outcomes
of these processes” (Van Bendegem 1998, 172). His suggestion is
that the natural way to get an initial grip on what a mathematical
experiment might be is to consider how an experiment in this
paradigmatic sense might have mathematical ramifications.

One example that van Bendegem cites dates back to work done by the
19^{th}-century Belgian physicist Plateau on minimal surface
area problems. By building various geometrical shapes out of wire and
dipping these wire frames into a soap solution, Plateau was able to
answer specific questions about the minimum surface bounding various
particular shapes, and—eventually—to formulate some
general principles governing the configurations of such
surfaces.^{[6]}
One way of understanding what is going on in this example is that a
physical experiment—the dipping of a wire frame into a soap
solution—is producing results that are directly relevant to a
certain class of mathematical problem. The main drawback of this way
of characterizing experimental mathematics is that it is too
restrictive. Examples of the sort van Bendegem cites are extremely
rare, hence the impact of mathematical experiments of this sort on
actual mathematical practice can only be very limited at best.
Moreover, it cannot be only this, literal sense of experiment that
mathematicians have in mind when they talk about—and
do—experimental mathematics.

So much for the most literal reading of “mathematical experiment.” A potentially more fruitful approach is to think in analogical or functional terms. In other words, perhaps “experimental mathematics” is being used to label activities which function within mathematics in a way analogous to the role of experiment in empirical science. Thus mathematical experiments may share some features with literal experiments, but not other features (Baker 2008; McEvoy 2008, 2013; Sorensen 2010; van Kerkhove 2008). Before proceeding with this line of analysis, it may be helpful to look briefly at a case study.

A nice example of current work in experimental mathematics appears in
one of the two recent books by Borwein and Bailey (1995b, Ch. 4). A
real number is said to be *normal in base n* if every sequence
of digits for base n (of any given length) occurs equally often in its
base-n expansion. A number is *absolutely normal* if it is
normal in every base. Consider the following hypothesis:

Conjecture: Every non-rational algebraic number is absolutely normal.

Borwein and Bailey used a computer to compute to 10,000 decimal digits the square roots and cube roots of the positive integers smaller than 1,000, and then they subjected these data to certain statistical tests.

There are a couple of striking features of this example that may point to a more general characterization of experimental mathematics. Firstly, the route from evidence to hypothesis is via enumerative induction. Secondly, it involves the use of computers. In what follows, these two features will be examined in turn.

### 3.2 Enumerative Induction

In a letter to Euler written in 1742, Christian Goldbach conjectured
that all even numbers greater than 2 are expressible as the sum of two
primes.^{[7]}
Over the following two and a half centuries, mathematicians have been
unable to prove Goldbach’s Conjecture. However it has been
verified for many billions of examples, and there appears to be a
consensus among mathematicians that the conjecture is most likely
true. Below is a partial list (as of October 2007) showing the order
of magnitude up to which all even numbers have been checked and shown
to conform to GC.

Bound | Date | Author |

1 × 10^{3} |
1742 | Euler |

1 × 10^{4} |
1885 | Desboves |

1 × 10^{5} |
1938 | Pipping |

1 × 10^{8} |
1965 | Stein & Stein |

2 × 10^{10} |
1989 | Granville |

1 × 10^{14} |
1998 | Deshouillers |

1 × 10^{18} |
2007 | Oliveira & Silva |

Despite this vast accumulation of individual positive instances of GC, aided since the early 1960s by the introduction—and subsequent rapid increases in speed—of the digital computer, no proof of GC has yet been found. Not only this, but few number theorists are optimistic that there is any proof in the offing. Fields medalist Alan Baker stated in a 2000 interview: “It is unlikely that we will get any further [in proving GC] without a big breakthrough. Unfortunately there is no such big idea on the horizon.” Also in 2000, publishers Faber and Faber offered a $1,000,000 prize to anyone who proved GC between March 20 2000 and March 20 2002, confident that their money was relatively safe.

What makes this situation especially interesting is that mathematicians have long been confident in the truth of GC. Hardy & Littlewood asserted, back in 1922, that “there is no reasonable doubt that the theorem is correct,” and Echeverria, in a recent survey article, writes that “the certainty of mathematicians about the truth of GC is complete” (Echeverria 1996, 42). Moreover this confidence in the truth of GC is typically linked explicitly to the inductive evidence: for instance, G.H. Hardy described the numerical evidence supporting the truth of GC as “overwhelming.” Thus it seems reasonable to conclude that the grounds for mathematicians’ belief in GC is the enumerative inductive evidence.

One distinctive feature of the mathematical case which may make a difference to the justificatory power of enumerative induction is the importance of order. The instances falling under a given mathematical hypothesis (at least in number theory) are intrinsically ordered, and furthermore position in this order can make a crucial difference to the mathematical properties involved. As Frege writes, with regard to mathematics:

[T]he ground [is] unfavorable for induction; for here there is none of that uniformity which in other fields can give the method a high degree of reliability. (Frege,Foundations of Arithmetic)

Frege then goes on to quote Leibniz, who argues that difference in magnitude leads to all sorts of other relevant differences between the numbers:

An even number can be divided into two equal parts, an odd number cannot; three and six are triangular numbers, four and nine are squares, eight is a cube, and so on. (Frege,Foundations of Arithmetic)

Frege also explicitly compares the mathematical and non-mathematical contexts for induction:

In ordinary inductions we often make good use of the proposition that every position in space and every moment in time is as good in itself as every other. … Position in the number series is not a matter of indifference like position in space. (Frege,Foundations of Arithmetic)

As Frege’s remarks suggest, one way to underpin an argument
against the use of enumerative induction in mathematics is via some
sort of *non-uniformity principle*: in the absence of proof, we
should not expect numbers (in general) to share any interesting
properties. Hence establishing that a property holds for some
particular number gives no reason to think that a second, arbitrarily
chosen number will also have that
property.^{[8]}
Rather than the Uniformity Principle which Hume suggests is the only
way to ground induction, we have almost precisely the opposite
principle! It would seem to follow from this principle that
enumerative induction is unjustified, since we should not expect
(finite) samples from the totality of natural numbers to be indicative
of universal properties.

A potentially even more serious problem, in the case of GC and in all
other cases of induction in mathematics, is that the sample we are
looking at is *biased*. Note first that *all* known
instances of GC (and indeed all instances it is possible to know)
are—in an important sense—small.

In a very real sense, there are no large numbers: Any explicit integer can be said to be “small”. Indeed, no matter how many digits or towers of exponents you write down, there are only finitely many natural numbers smaller than your candidate, and infinitely many that are larger (Crandall and Pomerance 2001, 2).

Of course, it would be wrong to simply complain that all instances of
GC are *finite*. After all, every number is finite, so if GC
holds for all finite numbers than GC holds
*simpliciter*.^{[9]}
But we can isolate a more extreme sense of smallness, which might be
termed *minuteness*.

Definition: a positive integer,n, isminutejust in casenis within the range of numbers we can write down using ordinary decimal notation, including (non-iterated) exponentiation.

Verified instances of GC to date are not just small, they are minute.
And minuteness, though admittedly rather vaguely defined, is known to
make a difference. Consider, for example, the logarithmic estimate of
prime density (i.e. the proportion of numbers less than a given
*n* that are prime) which is known to become an underestimate
for large enough *n*. Let *n*^{*} be the first
number for which the logarithmic estimate is too small. If the Riemann
Hypothesis is true, then it can be proven that an upper bound for
*n*^{*} (the first Skewes number) is 8 ×
10^{370}. Though an impressively large number, it is
nonetheless minute according to the above definition. However if the
Riemann Hypothesis is false than our best known upper bound for
*n*^{*} (the second Skewes number) is
10↑10↑10↑10↑3.^{[10]}
The necessity of inventing an ‘arrow’ notation here to
represent this number tells us that it is not minute. The second part
of this result, therefore, although admittedly conditional on a result
that is considered unlikely (viz. the falsity of RH), implies that
there is a property which holds of all minute numbers but does not
hold for all numbers. Minuteness can make a difference.

What about the seeming confidence that number theorists have in the
truth of GC? Echeverria (1996) discusses the important role played by
Cantor’s publication, in 1894, of a table of values of the
Goldbach partition function, G(*n*), for *n* = 2 to
1,000 (Echeverria 1996,29–30). The partition function measures
the number of distinct ways in which a given (even) number can be
expressed as the sum of two primes. Thus G(4) = 1, G(6) = 1, G(8) = 1,
G(10) = 2, etc. This shift of focus onto the partition function
coincided with a dramatic increase in mathematicians’ confidence
in GC. What became apparent from Cantor’s work is that
G(*n*) tends to increase as *n* increases. Note that
what GC amounts to in this context is that G(*n*) never takes
the value 0 (for any even *n* greater than 2). The overwhelming
*impression* made by data on the partition function is that it
is highly unlikely for GC to fail for some large *n*. For
example, for numbers on the order of 100,000, there is always at least
500 distinct ways to express each even number as the sum of two
primes!

However, as it stands these results are purely heuristic. The thirty
years following Cantor’s publication of his table of values
(described by Echeverria as the “2^{nd} period” of
research into GC) saw numerous attempts to find an analytic expression
for G(*n*). If this could be done then it would presumably be
comparatively straightforward to prove that this analytic function
never takes the value 0 (Echeverria 1996, 31). By around 1921,
pessimism about the chances of finding such an expression led to a
change of emphasis, and mathematicians started directing their
attention to trying to find lower bounds for G(*n*). This too
has proved unsuccessful, at least to date.

Thus consideration of the partition function has not brought a proof
of GC any closer. However it does allow us to give an interesting
twist to the argument of the previous section. The graph suggests that
the hardest test cases for GC are likely to occur among the smallest
numbers; hence the inductive sample for GC *is* biased, but it
is biased *against* the chances of GC. Mathematicians’
confidence in the truth of GC is not based purely on enumerative
induction. The values taken by the partition function indicate that
the sample of positive instances of GC is indeed biased, and biased
samples do not—as a general rule—lend much support to an
hypothesis. But in this particular case the nature of the bias makes
the evidence stronger, not weaker. So it is possible to argue that
enumerative induction is unjustified while simultaneously agreeing
that mathematicians are rational to believe GC on the basis of the
available evidence. (Note that there is a delicate balance to maintain
here because evidence for the behavior of the partition function is
itself non-deductive. However the impression that G(*n*) is
likely to be bounded below by some increasing analytic function is not
based on enumerative induction *per se*, so the
justification—while non-deductive—is not circular.)

The upshot of the above discussion, albeit based on a single case
study, is that mathematicians ought not to—and in general do
not—give weight to enumerative induction *per se* in the
justification of mathematical claims. (To what extent enumerative
induction plays a role in the discovery of new hypotheses, or in the
choice of what open problems mathematicians decide to work on, is a
separate issue which has not been addressed here.) More precisely, the
thesis is in two parts:

- Enumerative induction
**ought not**to increase confidence in universal mathematical generalizations (over an infinite domain). - Enumerative induction
**does not**(in general) lead mathematicians to be more confident in the truth of the conclusion of such generalizations.

### 3.3 Computer Proofs

A striking feature of contemporary work in experimental mathematics is
that it is done **using computers**. Is this reliance on
complex pieces of electronics what makes the field
‘experimental’? If one looks at what gets published in
contemporary journals, books, and conferences devoted to experimental
mathematics, the impression is that all the items are closely bound up
with computers. For example, there does not appear to be a single
paper published in more than a decade’s worth of issues of
*Experimental Mathematics* that does not involve the use of
computers. What about the kinds of examples which mathematicians tend
to offer as paradigms of experimental mathematics? Here the data is
less clear. On the one hand, an informal survey suggests that the
majority of such exemplars do involve the explicit use of computers.
On the other hand, it is not uncommon for mathematicians also to cite
one or more historical examples, from well before the computer age, to
illustrate the purported pedigree of the subdiscipline.

The biggest practice-based challenge to equating experimental
mathematics with computer-based mathematics comes from what
self-styled experimental mathematicians say about their nascent
discipline. For when mathematicians self-consciously reflect on the
notion of experimental mathematics, they tend to reject the claim that
computer use is a necessary feature. For example, the editors of the
journal *Experimental Mathematics*—in their
“statement of philosophy” concerning the scope and nature
of the journal—make the following remarks:

The word “experimental” is conceived broadly: many mathematical experiments these days are carried out on computers, but others are still the result of pencil-and-paper work, and there are other experimental techniques, like building physical models. (“Aims and Scope”,Experimental Mathematics—see Other Internet Resources)

And here is another passage with a similar flavor from mathematician Doron Zeilberger:

[T]raditional experimental mathematics … has been pursued by all the great, and less-great, mathematicians through the centuries, using pencil-and-paper. (Gallian and Pearson 2007, 14)

It seems fair to say that tying experimental mathematics to computer
use fits well with what contemporary experimental mathematicians do
but not so well with what they
say.^{[11]}

A second problem with the proposed characterization is more
philosophical in nature. Consider another widely-cited example of
experimental mathematics which arises in connection with
Goldbach’s Conjecture. As of April 2007, all even numbers up to
10^{18} had been verified to conform to GC, and this project
(under the direction of Oliveira e Silva) is ongoing. This massive
computation task is generally considered to be a paradigm example of
experimental mathematics. And it seems clear that computers are
playing an essential role here: no mathematician, or group of
mathematicians, could hope to duplicate 10^{18} calculations
by hand.

In the current context, the central question is not whether
computer-based mathematics is ‘experimental’ but whether
it is—at least sometimes—*non-deductive*. In one
sense, of course, all of the individual calculations performed by a
computer are deductive, or at least they are isomorphic to the
operations of a purely deductive formal system. When a computer
verifies an instance of GC, this verification is completely deductive.
We may then separate out two distinct questions. Firstly, are these
computations playing a non-deductive role in some larger mathematical
argument? And, secondly, are the beliefs we form directly from the
results of computer computations deductively grounded beliefs? The
first of these questions does not turn on anything specific to
computers, and hence collapses back to the issue discussed in Section
3(B) above on enumerative induction. The second question will be
examined below.

Philosophical discussion of the status of computer proofs was prompted
in large part by Appel and Haken’s computer-based proof of the
Four Color Theorem in 1976. In his (1979), Tymoczko
argues—controversially—that mathematical knowledge based
on computer proofs is essentially empirical in character. This is
because such proofs are not *a priori*, not certain, not
surveyable, and not checkable by human mathematicians. In all these
respects, according to Tymoczko, computer proofs are unlike
traditional ‘pencil-and-paper’ proofs. Concerning
surveyability, Tymoczko writes:

A proof is a construction that can be looked over, reviewed, verified by a rational agent. We often say that a proof must be perspicuous, or capable of being checked by hand. It is an exhibition, a derivation of the conclusion, and it needs nothing outside itself to be convincing. The Mathematiciansurveysthe proof in its entirety and thereby comes toknowthe conclusion. (Tymoczko 1979, 59)

Assume for sake of argument that the computer proof in question is
deductively correct but is also unsurveyable in the above sense. Does
our decision to rely on the output of the computer here constitute a
*non-deductive method*? One way of viewing this kind of example
is as driving a wedge between a deductive method and our non-deductive
*access* to the results of that method. Compare, for instance,
being told of a particular mathematical result by an expert
mathematician (with a good track record). Is this a
‘non-deductive
method’?^{[12]}

### 3.4 Probabilistic Proofs

There is a small, but growing, subset of mathematical methods which are essentially probabilistic in nature. In the context of justification, these methods do not deductively imply their conclusion but rather establish that there is some (often precisely specifiable) high probability that the conclusion is true. Philosophical discussion of these methods began with Fallis (1997, 2002), while Berry (2019) is a useful recent contribution to the debate.

One type of probabilistic method links back to the earlier discussion of experimental mathematics in that it involves performing experiments in a quite literal sense. The idea is to harness the processing power of DNA to effectively create a massively parallel computer for solving certain otherwise intractable combinatorial problems. The most famous of these is the ‘Traveling Salesman’ problem, which involves determining whether there is some possible route through the nodes of a graph connected by unidirectional arrows that visits each node exactly once. Adleman (1994) shows how the problem can be coded using strands of DNA which can then be spliced and recombined using different chemical reactions. The appearance of certain longer DNA strands at the end of the process corresponds to the finding of a solution path through the graph. Probabilistic considerations come in most clearly in the case where no longer DNA strands are found. This indicates that there is no path through the graph, but even if the experiment is carried out correctly the support here falls short of full certainty. For there is a small chance that there is a solution but that it fails to be coded by any DNA strand at the start of the experiment.

There are also probabilistic methods in mathematics which are not
experimental in the above sense. For example, there are properties of
composite (i.e. non-prime) numbers which can be shown to hold in
relation to about half of the numbers less than a given composite
number. If various numbers smaller than *N* are selected at
random and none of them bear this relation to *N*, then it
follows that *N* is almost certainly prime. The level of
probability here can be precisely calculated, and can be made as high
as needed by picking more ‘witness’ numbers to test.

Note that these sorts of probabilistic methods contain plenty of
purely deductive reasoning. Indeed, in the second example, the fact
that the probability of *N* being prime is .99 is established
purely deductively. Nonetheless, there is general consensus in the
mathematical community that such methods are not acceptable
substitutes for deductive proof of the conclusion. Fallis (1997, 2002)
argues that this rejection is not reasonable because any property of
probabilistic methods that can be pointed to as being problematic is
shared by some proofs that the mathematical community does accept.
Fallis’s focus is on establishing truth as the key epistemic
goal of mathematics. However it seems plausible that one major reason
for mathematicians’ dissatisfaction with probabilistic methods
is that they do not explain *why* their conclusions are true.
In addition, Easwaran argues, against Fallis, that there is a
property, which he terms ‘transferability’, that
probabilistic proofs lack and acceptable proofs have (Easwaran 2009;
Jackson 2009). Fallis (2011) is a reply to some of these
objections.

On the other hand, there may be cases where the bare truth or falsity of a claim is important even in the absence of accompanying explanation. For example, one could imagine a situation in which an important and interesting conjecture—say the Riemann Hypothesis—is being considered, and a probabilistic method is used to show that some number is very likely a counterexample to it. It is interesting to speculate what the reaction of the mathematical community might be to this situation. Would work on trying to prove RH cease? Would it continue until a rigorous deductive proof of the counterexample is constructed?

## 4. Summary / Conclusions

It is not clear why one should expect the various non-deductive
methods used in mathematics to share any substantive features other
than their non-deductiveness. Philosophers looking at the role of
non-deductive reasoning in the context of discovery have often talked
as if there is some unity to be found (for example, the subtitle to
Lakatos’s *Proofs and Refutations* is “the Logic of
Mathematical Discovery.” More likely is that the array of
non-deductive methods is diverse and heterogeneous. (Compare Stanislaw
Ulam’s remark that “the study of non-linear physics is
like the study of non-elephant biology.”)

Work by contemporary philosophers of mathematics is continuing to push the study of non-deductive mathematical methods in new directions. One area of interest is in ‘mathematical natural kinds’ and whether such a notion can be used to ground the use of analogy in mathematical reasoning (Corfield 2004 [Other Internet Resources]). Another area being investigated is the putative role of heuristic principles in mathematics. (Much of this work traces back to Pólya (1945).)

A background issue in all of these debates concerns the extent to
which each particular non-deductive method plays an *essential*
role in the justificatory practices of mathematics. This question
arises at both a local and global level. At the local level, a
particular piece of reasoning to justify a given result may be
unavoidably non-deductive, yet the result may also be established by
some other, purely deductive piece of reasoning. At the global level,
it may be that our only justification for certain mathematical claims
is non-deductive. The extent to which our use of non-deductive methods
is due to limitations in practice rather than limitations in principle
remains an issue for further investigation.

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in the
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