# Indispensability Arguments in the Philosophy of Mathematics

*First published Mon Dec 21, 1998; substantive revision Mon Mar 6, 2023*

One of the most intriguing features of mathematics is its applicability to empirical science. Every branch of science draws upon large and often diverse portions of mathematics, from the use of Hilbert spaces in quantum mechanics to the use of differential geometry in general relativity. It’s not just the physical sciences that avail themselves of the services of mathematics either. Biology, for instance, makes extensive use of difference equations and statistics. The roles mathematics plays in these theories is also varied. Not only does mathematics help with empirical predictions, it allows elegant and economical statement of many theories. Indeed, so important is the language of mathematics to science, that it is hard to imagine how theories such as quantum mechanics and general relativity could even be stated without employing a substantial amount of mathematics.

From the rather remarkable but seemingly uncontroversial fact that mathematics is indispensable to science, some philosophers have drawn serious metaphysical conclusions. In particular, Quine (1976; 1980a; 1980b; 1981a; 1981c) and Putnam (1979a; 1979b) have argued that the indispensability of mathematics to empirical science gives us good reason to believe in the existence of mathematical entities. According to this line of argument, reference to (or quantification over) mathematical entities such as sets, numbers, functions and such is indispensable to our best scientific theories, and so we ought to be committed to the existence of these mathematical entities. To do otherwise is to be guilty of what Putnam has called “intellectual dishonesty” (Putnam 1979b, p. 347). Moreover, mathematical entities are seen to be on an epistemic par with the other theoretical entities of science, since belief in the existence of the former is justified by the same evidence that confirms the theory as a whole (and hence belief in the latter). This argument is known as the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument for mathematical realism. There are other indispensability arguments, but this one is by far the most influential, and so in what follows, we’ll mostly focus on it.

In general, an indispensability argument is an argument that purports
to establish the truth of some claim based on the indispensability of
the claim in question for certain purposes (to be specified by the
particular argument). For example, if *explanation* is
specified as the purpose, then we have an explanatory indispensability
argument. Thus we see that inference to the best explanation is a
special case of an indispensability argument. See the introduction of
Field (1989, pp. 14–20) for a nice discussion of
indispensability arguments and inference to the best explanation. See
also Maddy (1992) and Resnik (1995a) for variations on the
Quine-Putnam version of the argument. We should add that although the
version of the argument presented here is generally attributed to
Quine and Putnam, it differs in a number of ways from the arguments
advanced by either Quine or
Putnam.^{[1]}

- 1. Spelling Out the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument
- 2. What is it to be Indispensable?
- 3. Naturalism and Holism
- 4. Objections
- 5. Explanatory Versions of the Argument
- 6. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Spelling Out the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument

The Quine-Putnam indispensability argument has attracted a great deal
of attention, in part because many see it as the best argument for
mathematical realism (or platonism). Thus anti-realists about
mathematical entities (or nominalists) need to identify where the
Quine-Putnam argument goes wrong. Many platonists, on the other hand,
rely very heavily on this argument to justify their belief in
mathematical entities. The argument places nominalists who wish to be
realist about other theoretical entities of science (quarks,
electrons, black holes and such) in a particularly difficult position.
For typically they accept something quite like the Quine-Putnam
argument^{[2]})
as justification for realism about quarks and black holes. (This is
what Quine (1980b, p. 45) calls holding a “double
standard” with regard to ontology.)

For future reference, we’ll state the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument in the following explicit form:

(P1) We ought to have ontological commitment to all and only the entities that are indispensable to our best scientific theories.(P2) Mathematical entities are indispensable to our best scientific theories.

(C) We ought to have ontological commitment to mathematical entities.

Thus formulated, the argument is valid. This forces the focus onto the two premises. In particular, a couple of important questions naturally arise. The first concerns how we are to understand the claim that mathematics is indispensable. We address this in the next section. The second question concerns the first premise. It is nowhere near as self-evident as the second and it clearly needs some defense. We’ll discuss its defense in the following section. We’ll then present some of the more important objections to the argument, before considering the Quine-Putnam argument’s role in the larger scheme of things — where it stands in relation to other influential arguments for and against mathematical realism.

## 2. What is it to be Indispensable?

The question of how we should understand ‘indispensability’ in the present context is crucial to the Quine-Putnam argument, and yet it has received surprisingly little attention. Quine actually speaks in terms of the entities quantified over in the canonical form of our best scientific theories rather than indispensability. Still, the debate continues in terms of indispensability, so we would be well served to clarify this term.

The first thing to note is that ‘dispensability’ is not
the same as ‘eliminability’. If this were not so,
*every* entity would be dispensable (due to a theorem of
Craig).^{[3]}
What we require for an entity to be ‘dispensable’ is for
it to be eliminable *and* that the theory resulting from the
entity’s elimination be an attractive theory. (Perhaps, even
stronger, we require that the resulting theory be *more*
attractive than the original.) We will need to spell out what counts
as an attractive theory but for this we can appeal to the standard
desiderata for good scientific theories: empirical success;
unificatory power; simplicity; explanatory power; fertility and so on.
Of course there will be debate over what desiderata are appropriate
and over their relative weightings, but such issues need to be
addressed and resolved independently of issues of indispensability.
(See Burgess (1983) and Colyvan (1999) for more on these issues.)

These issues naturally prompt the question of *how much*
mathematics is indispensable (and hence how much mathematics carries
ontological commitment). It seems that the indispensability argument
only justifies belief in enough mathematics to serve the needs of
science. Thus we find Putnam speaking of “the set theoretic
‘needs’ of physics” (Putnam 1979b, p. 346) and Quine
claiming that the higher reaches of set theory are “mathematical
recreation ... without ontological rights” (Quine 1986, p. 400)
since they do not find physical applications. One could take a less
restrictive line and claim that the higher reaches of set theory,
although without physical applications, do carry ontological
commitment by virtue of the fact that they have applications *in
other parts of mathematics.* So long as the chain of applications
eventually “bottoms out” in physical science, we could
rightfully claim that the whole chain carries ontological commitment.
Quine himself justifies some transfinite set theory along these lines
(Quine 1984, p. 788), but he sees no reason to go beyond the
constructible sets (Quine 1986, p. 400). His reasons for this
restriction, however, have little to do with the indispensability
argument and so supporters of this argument need not side with Quine
on this issue.

## 3. Naturalism and Holism

Although both premises of the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument have been questioned, it’s the first premise that is most obviously in need of support. This support comes from the doctrines of naturalism and holism.

Following Quine, naturalism is usually taken to be the philosophical
doctrine that there is no first philosophy and that the philosophical
enterprise is continuous with the scientific enterprise (Quine 1981b).
By this Quine means that philosophy is neither prior to nor privileged
over science. What is more, science, thus construed (i.e. with
philosophy as a continuous part) is taken to be the complete story of
the world. This doctrine arises out of a deep respect for scientific
methodology and an acknowledgment of the undeniable success of this
methodology as a way of answering fundamental questions about all
nature of things. As Quine suggests, its source lies in
“unregenerate realism, the robust state of mind of the natural
scientist who has never felt any qualms beyond the negotiable
uncertainties internal to science” (Quine 1981b, p. 72). For the
metaphysician this means looking to our best scientific theories to
determine what exists, or, perhaps more accurately, what we ought to
believe to exist. In short, naturalism rules out unscientific ways of
determining what exists. For example, naturalism rules out believing
in the transmigration of souls for mystical reasons. Naturalism would
not, however, rule out the transmigration of souls if our best
scientific theories were to require the truth of this
doctrine.^{[4]}

Naturalism, then, gives us a reason for believing in the entities in
our best scientific theories and no other entities. Depending on
exactly how you conceive of naturalism, it may or may not tell you
whether to believe in *all* the entities of your best
scientific theories. We take it that naturalism does give us
*some* reason to believe in all such entities, but that this is
defeasible. This is where holism comes to the fore: in particular,
confirmational holism.

Confirmational holism is the view that theories are confirmed or
disconfirmed as wholes (Quine 1980b, p. 41). So, if a theory is
*confirmed* by empirical findings, the *whole* theory is
confirmed. In particular, whatever mathematics is made use of in the
theory is also confirmed (Quine 1976, pp. 120–122). Furthermore,
it is the same evidence that is appealed to in justifying belief in
the mathematical components of the theory that is appealed to in
justifying the empirical portion of the theory (if indeed the
empirical can be separated from the mathematical at all). Naturalism
and holism taken together then justify
P1.
Roughly, naturalism gives us the “only” and holism gives
us the “all” in P1.

It is worth noting that in Quine’s writings there are at least two holist themes. The first is the confirmational holism discussed above (often called the Quine-Duhem thesis). The other is semantic holism which is the view that the unit of meaning is not the single sentence, but systems of sentences (and in some extreme cases the whole of language). This latter holism is closely related to Quine’s well-known denial of the analytic-synthetic distinction (Quine 1980b) and his equally famous indeterminacy of translation thesis (Quine 1960). Although for Quine, semantic holism and confirmational holism are closely related, there is good reason to distinguish them, since the former is generally thought to be highly controversial while the latter is considered relatively uncontroversial.

Why this is important to the present debate is that Quine explicitly invokes the controversial semantic holism in support of the indispensability argument (Quine 1980b, pp. 45–46). Most commentators, however, are of the view that only confirmational holism is required to make the indispensability argument fly (see, for example, Colyvan (1998a); Field (1989, pp. 14–20); Hellman (1999); Resnik (1995a; 1997); Maddy (1992)) and my presentation here follows that accepted wisdom. It should be kept in mind, however, that while the argument, thus construed, is Quinean in flavor it is not, strictly speaking, Quine’s argument.

## 4. Objections

There have been many objections to the indispensability argument,
including Charles Parsons’ (1980) concern that the obviousness
of basic mathematical statements is left unaccounted for by the
Quinean picture and Philip Kitcher’s (1984, pp. 104–105)
worry that the indispensability argument doesn’t explain
*why* mathematics is indispensable to science. The objections
that have received the most attention, however, are those due to
Hartry Field, Penelope Maddy and Elliott Sober. In particular,
Field’s nominalisation program has dominated recent discussions
of the ontology of mathematics.

Field (2016) presents a case for denying the second premise of the
Quine-Putnam argument. That is, he suggests that despite appearances
mathematics is not indispensable to science. There are two parts to
Field’s project. The first is to argue that mathematical
theories don’t have to be true to be useful in applications,
they need merely to be *conservative.* (This is, roughly, that
if a mathematical theory is added to a nominalist scientific theory,
no nominalist consequences follow that wouldn’t follow from the
nominalist scientific theory alone.) This explains why mathematics
*can* be used in science but it does not explain why it
*is* used. The latter is due to the fact that mathematics makes
calculation and statement of various theories much simpler. Thus, for
Field, the utility of mathematics is merely pragmatic —
mathematics is not indispensable after all.

The second part of Field’s program is to demonstrate that our
best scientific theories can be suitably nominalised. That is, he
attempts to show that we could do without quantification over
mathematical entities and that what we would be left with would be
reasonably attractive theories. To this end he is content to
nominalise a large fragment of Newtonian gravitational theory.
Although this is a far cry from showing that *all* our current
best scientific theories can be nominalised, it is certainly not
trivial. The hope is that once one sees how the elimination of
reference to mathematical entities can be achieved for a typical
physical theory, it will seem plausible that the project could be
completed for the rest of
science.^{[5]}

There has been a great deal of debate over the likelihood of the success of Field’s program but few have doubted its significance. Recently, however, Penelope Maddy, has pointed out that if P1 is false, Field’s project may turn out to be irrelevant to the realism/anti-realism debate in mathematics.

Maddy presents some serious objections to the first premise of the
indispensability argument (Maddy 1992; 1995; 1997). In particular, she
suggests that we ought not have ontological commitment to *all*
the entities indispensable to our best scientific theories. Her
objections draw attention to problems of reconciling naturalism with
confirmational holism. In particular, she points out how a holistic
view of scientific theories has problems explaining the legitimacy of
certain aspects of scientific and mathematical practices. Practices
which, presumably, ought to be legitimate given the high regard for
scientific practice that naturalism recommends. It is important to
appreciate that her objections, for the most part, are concerned with
methodological consequences of accepting the Quinean doctrines of
naturalism and holism — the doctrines used to support the first
premise. The first premise is thus called into question by undermining
its support.

Maddy’s first objection to the indispensability argument is that
the actual attitudes of working scientists towards the components of
well-confirmed theories vary from belief, through tolerance, to
outright rejection (Maddy 1992, p. 280). The point is that naturalism
counsels us to respect the methods of working scientists, and yet
holism is apparently telling us that working scientists ought not have
such differential support to the entities in their theories. Maddy
suggests that we should side with naturalism and not holism here. Thus
we should endorse the attitudes of working scientists who apparently
do not believe in *all* the entities posited by our best
theories. We should thus reject
P1.

The next problem follows from the first. Once one rejects the picture of scientific theories as homogeneous units, the question arises whether the mathematical portions of theories fall within the true elements of the confirmed theories or within the idealized elements. Maddy suggests the latter. Her reason for this is that scientists themselves do not seem to take the indispensable application of a mathematical theory to be an indication of the truth of the mathematics in question. For example, the false assumption that water is infinitely deep is often invoked in the analysis of water waves, or the assumption that matter is continuous is commonly made in fluid dynamics (Maddy 1992, pp. 281–282). Such cases indicate that scientists will invoke whatever mathematics is required to get the job done, without regard to the truth of the mathematical theory in question (Maddy 1995, p. 255). Again it seems that confirmational holism is in conflict with actual scientific practice, and hence with naturalism. And again Maddy sides with naturalism. (See also Parsons (1983) for some related worries about Quinean holism.) The point here is that if naturalism counsels us to side with the attitudes of working scientists on such matters, then it seems that we ought not take the indispensability of some mathematical theory in a physical application as an indication of the truth of the mathematical theory. Furthermore, since we have no reason to believe that the mathematical theory in question is true, we have no reason to believe that the entities posited by the (mathematical) theory are real. So once again we ought to reject P1.

Maddy’s third objection is that it is hard to make sense of what
working mathematicians are doing when they try to settle independent
questions. These are questions, that are independent of the standard
axioms of set theory — the ZFC
axioms.^{[6]}
In order to settle some of these questions, new axiom candidates have
been proposed to supplement ZFC, and arguments have been advanced in
support of these candidates. The problem is that the arguments
advanced seem to have nothing to do with applications in physical
science: they are typically intra-mathematical arguments. According to
indispensability theory, however, the new axioms should be assessed on
how well they cohere with our current best scientific theories. That
is, set theorists should be assessing the new axiom candidates with
one eye on the latest developments in physics. Given that set
theorists do not do this, confirmational holism again seems to be
advocating a revision of standard mathematical practice, and this too,
claims Maddy, is at odds with naturalism (Maddy 1992, pp.
286–289).

Although Maddy does not formulate this objection in a way that
directly conflicts with
P1
it certainly illustrates a tension between naturalism and
confirmational
holism.^{[7]}
And since both these are required to support P1, the objection
indirectly casts doubt on P1. Maddy, however, endorses naturalism and
so takes the objection to demonstrate that confirmational holism is
false. We’ll leave the discussion of the impact the rejection of
confirmational holism would have on the indispensability argument
until after we outline Sober’s objection, because Sober arrives
at much the same conclusion.

Elliott Sober’s objection is closely related to Maddy’s
second and third objections. Sober (1993) takes issue with the claim
that mathematical theories share the empirical support accrued by our
best scientific theories. In essence, he argues that mathematical
theories are not being tested in the same way as the clearly empirical
theories of science. He points out that hypotheses are confirmed
relative to competing hypotheses. Thus if mathematics is confirmed
along with our best empirical hypotheses (as indispensability theory
claims), there must be mathematics-free competitors. But Sober points
out that *all* scientific theories employ a common mathematical
core. Thus, since there are no competing hypotheses, it is a mistake
to think that mathematics receives confirmational support from
empirical evidence in the way other scientific hypotheses do.

This in itself does not constitute an objection to P1 of the indispensability argument, as Sober is quick to point out (Sober 1993, p. 53), although it does constitute an objection to Quine’s overall view that mathematics is part of empirical science. As with Maddy’s third objection, it gives us some cause to reject confirmational holism. The impact of these objections on P1 depends on how crucial you think confirmational holism is to that premise. Certainly much of the intuitive appeal of P1 is eroded if confirmational holism is rejected. In any case, to subscribe to the conclusion of the indispensability argument in the face of Sober’s or Maddy’s objections is to hold the position that it’s permissible at least to have ontological commitment to entities that receive no empirical support. This, if not outright untenable, is certainly not in the spirit of the original Quine-Putnam argument.

## 5. Explanatory Versions of the Argument

The arguments against holism from Maddy and Sober resulted in a
reevaluation of the indispensability argument. If, contra Quine,
scientists do not accept all the entities of our best scientific
theories, where does this leave us? We need criteria for when to treat
posits realistically. Here is where the debate over the
indispensability argument took an interesting turn. Scientific
realists, at least, accept those posits of our best scientific
theories that contribute to scientific explanations. According to this
line of thought, we ought to believe in electrons, say, not because
they are indispensable to our best scientific theories but because
they are indispensable in a very specific way: they are
*explanatorily* indispensable. If mathematics could be shown to
contribute to scientific explanations in this way, mathematical
realism would again be on par with scientific realism. Indeed, this is
the focus of most of the contemporary discussion on the
indispensability argument. The central question is: does mathematics
contribute to scientific explanations and if so, does it do it in the
right kind of way.

One example of how mathematics might be thought to be explanatory is found in the periodic cicada case (Yoshimura 1997 and Baker 2005). North American Magicicadas are found to have life cycles of 13 or 17 years. It is proposed by some biologists that there is an evolutionary advantage in having such prime-numbered life cycles. Prime-numbered life cycles mean that the Magicicadas avoid competition, potential predators, and hybridisation. The idea is quite simple: because prime numbers have no non-trivial factors, there are very few other life cycles that can be synchronised with a prime-numbered life cycle. The Magicicadas thus have an effective avoidance strategy that, under certain conditions, will be selected for. While the explanation being advanced involves biology (e.g. evolutionary theory, theories of competition and predation), a crucial part of the explanation comes from number theory, namely, the fundamental fact about prime numbers. Baker (2005) argues that this is a genuinely mathematical explanation of a biological fact. There are other examples of alleged mathematical explanations in the literature but this remains the most widely discussed and is something of a poster child for mathematical explanation.

Questions about this case focus on whether the mathematics is really contributing to the explanation (or whether it is merely standing in for the biological facts and it is these that really do the explaining), whether the alleged explanation is an explanation at all, and whether the mathematics in question is involved in the explanation in the right kind of way. Finally, it is worth mentioning that although the recent interest in mathematical explanation arose out of debates over the indispensability argument, the status of mathematical explanations in the empirical sciences has also attracted interest in its own right. Moreover, such explanations (sometimes called “extra-mathematical explanations”) lead one very naturally to think about explanations of mathematical facts by appeal to further mathematical facts (sometimes called “intra-mathematical explanation”). These two kinds of mathematical explanation are related, of course. If, for example, some theorem of mathematics has its explanation rest in an explanatory proof, then any applications of that theorem in the empirical realm would give rise to a prima facie case that the full explanation of the empirical phenomenon in question involves the intra-mathematical explanation of the theorem. For these and other reasons, both kinds of mathematical explanation have attracted a great deal of interest from philosophers of mathematics and philosophers of science in recent years.

## 6. Conclusion

It is not clear how damaging the above criticisms are to the
indispensability argument and whether the explanatory version of the
argument survives. Indeed, the debate is very much alive, with many
recent articles devoted to the topic. (See bibliography notes below.)
Closely related to this debate is the question of whether there are
any other decent arguments for platonism. If, as some believe, the
indispensability argument is the *only* argument for platonism
worthy of consideration, then if it fails, platonism in the philosophy
of mathematics seems bankrupt. Of relevance then is the status of
other arguments for and against mathematical realism. In any case, it
is worth noting that the indispensability argument is one of a small
number of arguments that have dominated discussions of the ontology of
mathematics. It is therefore important that this argument not be
viewed in isolation.

The two most important arguments *against* mathematical realism
are the epistemological problem for platonism — how do we come
by knowledge of causally inert mathematical entities? (Benacerraf
1983b) — and the indeterminacy problem for the reduction of
numbers to sets — if numbers are sets, which sets are they
(Benacerraf 1983a)? Apart from the indispensability argument, the
other major argument *for* mathematical realism appeals to a
desire for a uniform semantics for *all* discourse:
mathematical and non-mathematical alike (Benacerraf 1983b).
Mathematical realism, of course, meets this challenge easily, since it
explains the truth of mathematical statements in exactly the same way
as in other
domains.^{[8]}
It is not so clear, however, how nominalism can provide a uniform
semantics.

Finally, it is worth stressing that even if the indispensability
argument *is* the only good argument for platonism, the failure
of this argument does not necessarily authorize nominalism, for the
latter too may be without support. It does seem fair to say, however,
that if the objections to the indispensability argument are sustained
then one of the most important arguments for platonism is undermined.
This would leave platonism on rather shaky ground.

## Bibliography

Although the indispensability argument is to be found in many places
in Quine’s writings (including 1976; 1980a; 1980b; 1981a;
1981c), the *locus classicus* is Putnam’s short monograph
*Philosophy of Logic* (included as a chapter of the second
edition of the third volume of his collected papers (Putnam, 1979b)).
See also Putnam (1979a) and the introduction of Field (1989), which
has an excellent outline of the argument. Colyvan (2001) presents a
sustained defence of the argument.

See Chihara (1973), and Field (1989; 2016) for attacks on the second premise and Colyvan (1999; 2001), Lyon and Colyvan (2008), Maddy (1990), Malament (1982), Resnik (1985), Shapiro (1983) and Urquhart (1990) for criticisms of Field’s program. See the preface to the second edition of Field 2016 for a good retrospective on these debates. For a fairly comprehensive look at nominalist strategies in the philosophy of mathematics (including an excellent discussion of Field’s program), see Burgess and Rosen (1997), while Feferman (1993) questions the amount of mathematics required for empirical science. See Azzouni (1997; 2004; 2012), Balaguer (1996b; 1998), Bueno (2012), Leng (2002; 2010; 2012), Liggins (2012), Maddy (1992; 1995; 1997), Melia (2000; 2002), Peressini (1997), Pincock (2004), Sober (1993), Vineberg (1996) and Yablo (1998; 2005; 2012) for attacks on the first premise. Baker (2001; 2005; 2012), Bangu (2012), Colyvan (1998a; 2001; 2002; 2007; 2010; 2012), Hellman (1999) and Resnik (1995a; 1997) reply to some of these objections.

For variants of the Quinean indispensability argument see Maddy (1992) and Resnik (1995a).

There has been a great deal of recent literature on the explanatory version of the indispensability argument. Early presentations of such an argument can be found in Colyvan (1998b; 2002), and most explicitly in Baker (2005), although this work was anticipated by Steiner (1978a; 1978b) on mathematical explanation and Smart on geometric explanation (1990). Some of the key articles on the explanatory version of the argument include Baker (2005; 2009; 2012; 2017; 2021), Bangu (2008; 2013), Baron (2014), Batterman (2010), Bueno and French (2012), Colyvan (2002; 2010; 2012; 2018), Lyon (2012), Rizza (2011), Saatsi (2011; 2016) and Yablo (2012).

Arising out of this debate over the role of mathematical explanation in indispensability arguments, has been a renewed interest in mathematical explanation for its own sake. This includes work on reconciling mathematical explanations in science with other forms of scientific explanation as well as investigating explanation within mathematics itself. Some of this work includes: Baron (2016), Baron et al. (2017; 2020), Colyvan et al. (2018), Lange (2017), Mancosu (2008), and Pincock (2011).

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### Acknowledgments

The author would like to thank Hilary Putnam, Helen Regan, Angela Rosier and Edward Zalta for comments on earlier versions of this entry.