Medieval Theories of the Categories

First published Fri Apr 14, 2006; substantive revision Thu Jul 12, 2012

This entry is intended as a brief and general introduction to the development of category theory from the beginning of the Middle Ages, in the sixth century, to the Silver Age of Scholasticism, in the sixteenth. This development is fascinating but extraordinarily complex. Scholars are just beginning to take note of the major differences in the understanding of categories and of how these differences are related to the discussion of other major philosophical topics in the Middle Ages. Much work remains to be done, even regarding the views of towering figures, so necessarily we have had to restrict our discussion to only a few major figures and topics. Still, we hope that the discussion will serve as a good starting point for anyone interested in category theory and its history.

1. Issues

Philosophers speak about categories in many different ways. There is one initial, and rather substantial, difference between philosophers who allow a very large number of categories and those who allow only a very small number. The first include among categories such different things as human, green, animal, thought, and justice; the second speak only of very general things such as substance, quality, relation, and the like, as categories. Among twentieth-century authors who allow many categories is Gilbert Ryle (b. 1900, d. 1976). Roderick Chisholm (b. 1916, d. 1999) is an example of those who have only very few. Medieval authors follow Aristotle's narrow understanding.

The disagreement concerning categories in the history of philosophy does not end there. Even if we restrict the discussion to a small number of items of the sort that Aristotle regards as categories, many issues remain to be settled about them, and philosophers frequently disagree about how to settle them. These issues may be gathered into roughly ten groups.

The first group comprises what may be described roughly as extensional issues; they have to do with the number of categories. The extension of a term is comprised by the things of which the term can be truthfully predicated. Thus the extension of ‘cat’ consists of all the animals of which it is true to say that they are cats. Philosophers in general frequently disagree on how many categories there are. For example, Aristotle lists up to ten, but gives the impression that the ultimate number is not settled at all. Plotinus (204/5–270) and Baruch Spinoza (1632–77) reduce the number radically, but their views do not by any means establish themselves as definitive. In the Middle Ages the number of categories is always small (ten or less) but it nonetheless varies.

The second group is roughly intensional; they concern what categories are and the properties they have. The intension of a term is the set of properties that apply to the things of which the term is truthfully predicated and which are listed in its definition or taken to be implied by it. Thus the intension of ‘human’ is, say, rational animal, and includes living and corporeal. Again, philosophers disagree as to whether categories can be defined, and if they can be, how they are to be defined. In general, medieval authors reject the possibility of defining them for various reasons. One reason is that most of these authors conceive categories as divisions of being, and being for them is not a genus. Since a definition requires a genus (“animal” in the definition of “human” given earlier), the categories cannot be defined. Another reason is that a definition requires a difference that distinguishes what is being defined from other types of thing within the genus (“rationality” for humans, within the genus “animal”), but the categories are the highest kind of things, so there is nothing outside of them that can be used to distinguish them.

The third group is ontological; the issues here involve the place that categories occupy in the map of all things that exist or can exist. Ontology is the sub-discipline of philosophy that deals with being and what exists. The three most common questions raised in this context are: (1) Are categories extra-mental entities, such as properties, qualities, relations, structures, sets, classes, or forms? (2) Are categories intra-mental entities, such as phenomena, mental acts, mental contents, Gestalten, or mental structures? (3) Are categories linguistic entities, such as meanings, words, types, tokens, predicates, or syntactical places? Four views stand out. According to one, categories are linguistic entities–call them words–such as the words ‘quality’ and ‘relation,’ with which we speak about things. According to another, categories are mental acts–call them concepts–such as the concept of quality or the concept of relation, with which we think about things. Categories are also thought to be extra-mental features that things about which we think and speak have–call them properties–such as the properties of being a quality or of being a relation. Finally, there is an inclusive view that tries to integrate all of these three positions into one, arguing that categories are words, concepts, and properties but in different ways. These four views are not the only choices available (see Gracia 1999), but they are the most popular views considered in the Middle Ages.

The fourth group has to do with causes; they include questions about how categories are established or brought about. These issues have attracted considerable attention in recent years, particularly among post-modern philosophers, such as Michel Foucault (1926–84). In the Middle Ages the way this question is posed depends heavily on the ontological status accorded to categories, particularly on whether they are mental or extra-mental entities. The Foucauldian concern with “social construction,” however, seems to be absent from medieval discussions.

The fifth group involves epistemology; they concern primarily how we have access to categories, that is, how we get to know them and under what conditions. Although this is not a widespread topic of discussion in the Early Middle Ages, later on there are various attempts to determine the number and identity of the categories and the basis on which this determination can be carried out. These attempts, and the assumptions which guide them, are closely related to an important issue for the Middle Ages in general that becomes critical toward its end: the relation of language, thought, and reality, or as it is also put, between signifying, thinking, and being, or between words, concepts, and things. Some think the relation is isomorphic, whereas others disagree.

The sixth group concerns language; they involve the terms used to talk about categories and the way they function. These issues are particularly relevant for the view that considers categories to be linguistic entities, and therefore become central in twentieth-century Anglo-American philosophy. In the Middle Ages, they are especially important in the latter part of the period when issues of language take center stage in philosophical discussions.

The seventh group falls within the philosophy of mind; they have to do with the status of categories in the mind. Since we think about categories and through categories, it is pertinent for a philosopher to ask questions of this sort. This topic is particularly pertinent for those who think that categories are mental entities. In the Middle Ages, the questions raised about the status of categories in the mind are put generally in the context of other topics, such as the status of universals, but much of what medieval authors say about universals can be applied, mutatis mutandis, to categories.

The eighth group may be characterized as social, political, and axiological; they have to do with the value and use of categories by persons, society, and the polity. Many contemporary philosophers have found in this topic a way of undermining some traditional views of the world that they consider oppressive or inaccurate. These issues do not seem to be explicitly raised in the Middle Ages and may indicate one important difference between medieval and contemporary philosophical thought.

The ninth group is meta-disciplinary; they involve the discipline that studies categories. Obviously, how these issues are addressed depends to a great extent on the position one takes concerning the conception and ontological status of categories, as well as on how the various disciplines of learning are understood. This is a topic of concern in the Middle Ages, and is explicitly addressed by late medieval authors. They identify various disciplines as the place to study categories, ranging from grammar and logic to metaphysics.

Finally, rather than discussing categories in general, one may deal with particular categories, such as substance or relation. This is perhaps the most frequent way in which categories are discussed in the history of philosophy, including the Middle Ages.

Apart from these topics, there are others that are closely related to categories and often discussed together with them. One involves trans-categorial terms, such as ‘being,’ ‘one,’ ‘true,’ and ‘good,’ which apply to all categories and are predicable of every term that falls within the categories. In the Middle Ages, these are known as “the transcendentals” and their status becomes controversial in the thirteenth century (see Gracia 1992b).

A second topic concerns what are known as “ante-predicaments,” and are introduced by Aristotle at the beginning of Categories: univocity, equivocity, and denomination. Univocity occurs when the same term is predicated in the same sense, as ‘animal’ is of a man and an ox. Equivocity is dived into random equivocity and purposeful equivocity. The former occurs when the same term is predicated in different senses, as ‘animal’ is of a person and a picture of a person. The latter involves the broader issues of analogical predication.And denomination occurs when the predicated term is derived from another, as ‘grammarian’ is from ‘grammar’ (see Ashworth 1991).

A third topic involves the “post-predicaments,” a cluster of seemingly disparate notions treated by Aristotle in Categories after he discusses the categories proper. They include opposites (relatives, contraries, privation and possession, and affirmation and negation), priority (in time, in existence, in order, and in value) and simultaneity (in time and by nature), change (generation and corruption, increase and decrease, alteration and locomotion), and several meanings of ‘having.’

A fourth topic, also commonly discussed beginning in the thirteenth century, concerns what becomes known as “syncategorematic terms.” These are particles, such as ‘every’ and ‘and,’ which are not classifiable into any category (see William of Sherwood 1968).

A fifth topic of discussion introduced in the Middle Ages through Boethius' Commentaries on Porphyry's Isagoge involves the “predicables” (praedicabilia), which are ways in which predicates relate to subjects. Examples are “accident” (‘black’ in ‘This cat is black’), “species” (‘man’ in ‘Socrates is a man’), and “definition” (‘rational animal’ in ‘Man is a rational animal’) (see Porphyry 1975). Although these issues are originally introduced by Aristotle in the Topics, this work was not available in the Middle Ages until after the period of translations in the twelfth century.

Because of considerations of space, we shall not discuss these related topics here, nor can we refer to all the issues about categories raised by medieval authors or mentioned above. However, the conceptual framework of issues we have introduced should help in the understanding of how categories are approached in the Middle Ages and the differences between the medieval approach and those taken in other periods of the history of philosophy. We begin with the classical background of the discussion of categories in the Middle Ages. This consists primarily of Aristotle, who is responsible for the first treatise on categories ever written.

2. Classical Background (pre–500 C.E.)

The philosophical discussion of categories begins with Aristotle (B.C.E. 384–322). His view is difficult to interpret, even though the texts dealing with this topic (Categories, Topics I, and Metaphysics V) are characteristically direct in style. Still, there is some consensus among scholars that Aristotle proposes three ways of understanding categories: as realities, concepts, and linguistic terms. Much of the subsequent philosophical discussion of categories concerns the correctness of this view. Some favor a position according to which categories are realities, which are then said to be reflected in thought and language; some endorse a view of them merely as concepts, which are also said to be reflected in language; some maintain that categories are merely linguistic terms, and reject any implication that they are real entities or concepts; and still others maintain an inclusive view that contends that categories are all three: words, concepts, and extra-mental entities.

The Greek term that Aristotle uses for category means predicate (categoria) so that categories would appear to be kinds of predicates, the most general kinds of predicates. However, some commentators claim that Aristotle uses the term rather for kinds of predication and kinds of beings (for example in Topics 103b20–27, and Metaphysics 1017a22–27; see Frede 1987, 29–48). In Categories, Aristotle uses the term technically to refer to substance, quantity, quality, relation, place, time, position, state, action, and affection (9a27, 11b37, 11b7), although he also speaks of less general terms, such as ‘white,’ ‘half,’ and ‘last year,’ and trans-categorial terms such as ‘good’ and ‘unity.’ Aristotle's categories are not, strictly speaking, the predicates we use when we speak in ordinary language; rather, they are the most general kinds of predicates, or predications. Thus ‘white’ and ‘here’ do not refer to categories, but ‘quality’ and ‘place’ do. The Aristotelian categories may be taken as the most general predicates which can be predicated or, alternatively, they are the most general kinds of predication into which the predicates we use in ordinary discourse may be classified. They provide answers to direct questions such as when, where, how, what, and so on. Terms that extend to more than one category (e.g., ‘good’), or do not apply to categories (e.g., ‘and’) are treated separately.

Predicability, then, is not a sufficient condition of categoricity, but non-predicability is a sufficient disqualification. For Aristotle, the individual is not, strictly speaking, predicable, although there are places in which he speaks of the individual as predicable. Examples of individuals are this horse and a certain point of grammar present in the knower (1b5). The first is what Aristotle calls a primary substance, which he defines in Categories as that which is neither predicable of, nor present in, a subject (2a11). The second is, like a primary substance, non-predicable, but it can be present in a subject. Both are individual and neither is predicable.

That Aristotle refers to categories with the Greek term which corresponds roughly to the term ‘predicate’ in English does not mean that he understood categories to be merely linguistic terms. Indeed, ‘predicate’ itself is used in a variety of ways by philosophers. Some think of predicates as properties of some kind, some as concepts, some as words, and so on. Therefore, to say that something is a predicate does not necessarily mean that it is a linguistic term. In the case of Aristotle, there is ample evidence in Categories itself which suggests that categories are not just linguistic terms that reflect the fundamental ways in which we speak about things, but also ways in which things are. The interpretative tradition that favors a linguistic or logical understanding of the categories goes back at least to Porphyry (1887, 56), who tries to reconcile what he takes to be Aristotle's linguistic/logical position with Plato's metaphysics (Ebbesen 1990). Consider for example how Aristotle introduces the categories: “Of things said without any combination, each signifies either a substance or quantity or qualification or a relative or where or when or being-in-a-position or having or doing or being-affected” (1b25). Clearly, he is talking about language when he says, “Of things said without combination, each signifies….” for things that are said and that signify are linguistic terms (Poetics 1456b38ff; our emphasis). The linguistic emphasis is reinforced elsewhere, when he adds that “of things which are said without any combination none is either true or false…” (2a9).

At the same time, these statements do not imply that what is signified necessarily has to be linguistic. Indeed, earlier in Categories, Aristotle unabashedly mixes the language of “language” with the language of “being” when he notes: “Of things that are: some are said of a subject but are not in any subject. For example, man is said of a subject, the individual man, but is not in any subject” (1a20; our emphasis). This text begins with a reference to things that are (ta onta), but goes on to speak about things that are said (ta legomena). The same occurs in other places (2a11). In a text from Metaphysics (1017a23–25), the isomorphism between being and language is openly expressed.

Aristotle is less explicit about the understanding of categories as concepts. In Categories generally he does not speak about how things are conceived; rather, he speaks about how things are called or how they are. At the same time, from what he says elsewhere about signification and the way we think, it is not unreasonable to surmise that he also thinks of categories as concepts of some kind. For example, at the beginning of On Interpretation, he claims that “spoken sounds are symbols of affections [or concepts] in the soul, and written marks symbols of spoken sounds. And just as written marks are not the same for all men, neither are spoken sounds. But what these are in the first place sounds of–affections of the soul–are the same for all; and what these affections are likenesses of–actual things–are also the same” (16a 4–8).

None of this, however, is very clear. Indeed, Aristotle never actually says that categories are words, concepts, or realities; he only speaks of them as categories, that is, predicates. But ‘predicate’ can be used to mean realities, concepts, or linguistic terms. Aristotle does speak of categories as if they were realities or linguistic terms, and one can further infer that he could have spoken of them as if they were concepts. But this does not definitely clarify what he thinks about them. Indeed, on the basis of what he says we cannot determine for sure that he even raises the question of the ultimate ontological status of categories. The situation is further obscured because Aristotle never identifies the discipline where categories are supposed to be studied and he treats them in both logical (Categories, Topics) and metaphysical (Metaphysics) contexts.

One more point needs to be made clear. Aristotle never clearly and consistently ties the categories to sentential or propositional structure. In Categories he appears to consider them in isolation from their syntactical context, but in Topics (103b20–27) and Metaphysics (1017a23–25) he seems to tie them to predication and, thus, to consider them in relation to a syntactical context. This ambiguity gives rise to different interpretations, such as that of Frede, who considers them to be kinds of predications (1987), and that of Ryle, who views them as independent from syntactical context (1971). In short, the picture is far from clear, and this serves to separate Aristotle from authors who explicitly and exclusively view categories as reflecting syntactical contexts.

The same ambiguity with respect to the ontological status of categories that we find in Aristotle is found in many of his medieval commentators. Perhaps this can be taken as a sign that they believe categories to be realities, concepts, and linguistic terms, that is, that categories are ways in which the world is, ways in which we think about the world, and ways in which we speak about the world. However, there are some who argue for purely linguistic or conceptual ways of understanding categories. In modern philosophy, the emphasis shifts toward the language of thought, a prime example of which is Immanuel Kant (1724–1804; see Gracia 2000).

3. Early Middle Ages (ca. 500–1150)

Long before the Middle Ages, a well-defined tradition of writing commentaries on philosophical works had been established. It is perhaps natural, then, that the most common way of engaging philosophy throughout the Middle Ages consisted in writing commentaries on what were considered authoritative philosophical texts, and particularly works by Aristotle. So popular was commentary writing that thousands of Medieval Latin commentaries on Aristotle's writings are still extant, of which nearly two hundred concern the Categories (Lohr 1967, 1968, 1970, 1971, 1972, 1973). These commentaries were not always intended simply to explain texts; often, they became the means of developing the thoughts of the commentators on various philosophical topics. Moreover, commentators did not comment on Aristotle's works in isolation, but also consulted other commentaries on the same texts. In this way, they engaged and often challenged other interpretations, and developed their own insights.

At the beginning of the sixth century, we find several late Neoplatonic philosophers who continue the ancient tradition of commentary writing. They include Boethius, Philoponus, Elias, David, pseudo-Elias, Stephanus, and Simplicius. Two of these in particular deserve mention. Simplicius (490–560) is important because his Commentary was translated into Latin by William of Moerbeke in 1266 and was subsequently read by Aquinas, Duns Scotus, and Ockham, among others, though apparently not by Albertus Magnus. In addition, Simplicius attempted to prove that there are ten and only ten categories, something that became the subject of dispute in the later Middle Ages.

Boethius (ca. 480–524/5) is important because he sought to preserve Greek philosophy by translating all of the works of Plato and Aristotle into Latin. Unfortunately, his untimely death prevented him from accomplishing his ambitious goal, though he did succeed in translating Aristotle's Categories, On Interpretation, Prior Analytics, and Porphyry's Isagoge. Moreover, Boethius had hoped to write two commentaries on many of Aristotle's works: an introductory commentary for students of philosophy and an advanced commentary for philosophers. But again, his early death prevented him from producing second commentaries. Like other Neoplatonic commentaries, Boethius' work draws heavily from Porphyry and perpetuates the view of the categories which became the canonical interpretation of Aristotle's text, i.e., that it is a work about vocal signs that signify things (Boethius 1847, 160 a-b).

Due to the closure of the Academy in 529 and the dominance of the Latin language in the West to the virtual exclusion of Greek, little of the ancient commentary tradition exerted any influence on the Latin Middle Ages. Thus, in spite of the many commentaries produced in the ancient world, the main texts available to authors dealing with categories after the sixth century were Boethius' translation of and Commentary on Aristotle's Categories, the Categoriae decem (a Themistian paraphrase of Aristotle's Categories traditionally attributed to St. Augustine), and a composite translation which included the lemmata of Boethius' Commentary and some glosses. A few other works refer to categories, such as Porphyry's Isagoge, translated and commented on twice by Boethius, and Boethius' two Commentaries on On Interpretation and his treatise On the Trinity. However, the growing interest in logic that began in the ninth century and then was revived in the eleventh century made Boethius' translation and Commentary on the Categories the center of attention on this topic.

From the sixth to the ninth century, most commentaries on the Categories were written in Syriac. These include commentaries by Paul the Persian (fl. 550), Sergius of Reš‘aina (d. 536), Aba of Kashkar (fl. c. 600), Silvanus of Qardu (early seventh century), Athanasius of Balad (d. 687), Jacob of Edessa (d. 708), George of the Arabs (d. 724), Theodore bar Koni (late eighth century), David bar Paul (fl. 785), Mošē bar Kēphā (d. 903), and by Hunayn ibn Ishāq. The last Commentary, in turn, appears to be the source for the Arabic tradition (see King 2011).

Beginning in the tenth century, Islamic philosophers such as Alfarabi (ca. 870–950), Avicenna (980–1037), and Averroes (ca. 1126–98), produced commentaries, but their impact in the West was felt only after the period of translations from Arabic into Latin which began in Spain around the middle of the twelfth century. This process introduced many technical terms that came to have considerable impact on philosophical and theological discussions. Also worth mentioning are the Liber sex principiorum, an anonymous work traditionally ascribed to Gilbert of Poitiers (1085/90–1154) that sought to expand Aristotle's brief comments on the last six categories, and Peter Abelard (1079–1142), who discussed categories in his work (see Marenbon 1997).

Although commentaries on Aristotle's Categories written before 1200 tend to be expository, still they raise important philosophical questions, such as whether the categories time and place are synonymous with when and where, or whether action and passion are reducible to motion. Even more important is the lively debate between realists and nominalists concerning whether categories are words, concepts, or things (for Abelard's influence, see Marenbon 1997, 108). The position they take on it determines the discipline in which they think the categories are studied and affect the degree of isomorphism they believe holds between language (words), thought (concepts), and reality (things). If Aristotle's Categories is a book about words, then categories are studied in grammar; if it is about concepts, they are studied in logic; and if it is about extra-mental things, they are studied in metaphysics.

By the early thirteenth century, an inclusive view, according to which Aristotle's Categories is about words, concepts, and things, became standard. This view, shared by almost everyone up to Ockham (Pini, 2003, 11–18), had two important results. First, it lent support to the belief that categories are legitimately studied in three disciplines: grammar, logic, and metaphysics, but especially in logic and metaphysics. Second, it suggested a certain isomorphism between language (words), thought (concepts), and reality (things). The second point was supported by at least two passages in Aristotle's writings. In On the Soul, Aristotle claims that “in the case of objects which involve no matter… speculative knowledge and its object are identical” (430a 3–4). And in the text of On Interpretation cited earlier (16a 4–8) a similar point is made. Taken together, these texts suggest that in some ways language (words), thought (concepts), and reality (things) are like each other in important ways, a fact that explains their relations.

4. Thirteenth Century

At the beginning of the thirteenth-century, works of Aristotle and his Islamic commentators previously unknown in the Latin West became available. Among these were four works on logic–Prior and Posterior Analytics, Topics, and Sophistical Refutations–that became known as the new logic (logica nova) (Zupko 2003, 45). Their study did not displace the study of the older ones (the old logic, or logica vetus), but rather helped to intensify and expand it, and resulted in an increase in both the number and the complexity of the commentaries written about Categories. In addition, works on metaphysics and natural philosophy, such as Aristotle's Metaphysics and Physics, as well as commentaries by Islamic authors on them, circulated widely. These works introduced a new context and terminology in the discussion of categories.

For example, an important factor in the new discussions was the notion of science articulated by Aristotle in Posterior Analytics. Generally, it was thought that scientific knowledge involves three things: a definition, a list of the properties in the technical Aristotelian sense of features not contained in the definition but consequent upon it, and a causal analysis. Faced with this notion, scholastics explicitly asked whether categories are the subject of scientific knowledge, and if so, whether the scientific knowledge in question is what Aristotle regarded as a knowledge of fact (scientia quia) or a knowledge of reasoned fact (scientia propter quid). Eventually they asked whether categories could be defined and the kind of definition they could have; whether they have properties and, if so, what properties they have; and whether a causal analysis of them is possible and in what such an analysis would consist. These questions led them to question the discipline in which categories are studied–is it grammar, logic, or metaphysics?–and often forced them to modify their views of both science and the categories (Pini 2003, 189–90).

A second important factor, found in Islamic commentators, was the introduction of a distinction between first and second intentions, and the understanding that the first are studied in metaphysics and other sciences that deal with the extra-mental world, whereas the second are studied in logic (Pini 2003). There was considerable disagreement as to what these “intentions” are, but Aquinas conceived the first as concepts about things in the world (e.g., “cat” is a concept about cats) and the second as concepts about other concepts (e.g., “species” is a concept about such other concepts as cat and human). This new terminology led thirteenth century authors to ask what the concepts of category and of particular categories (e.g., substance or quality) are (first or second intentions?), and how the notions of first and second intentions ought to be understood.

A third factor, the isomorphism between language, thought, and reality inherited from ancient discussions of Aristotle's view, prompted scholastic attempts to establish (some scholars use ‘derive’ or even ‘deduce’) the exact number of categories. Most popular among these was the effort to tie the categories to different kinds of predication, but there were authors who explored other possibilities, such as derivations based on the modes of being. Although there are early hints at an attempt based on predication in Simplicius' Commentary on Aristotle's “Categories,” it was not until the middle of the thirteenth century that commentators typically raised a separate question concerning the number of categories, an issue often referred to as sufficientia praedicamentorum. Albertus Magnus (ca. 1200–1280), Simon of Faversham (ca. 1260–1306), Peter of Auvergne (d. 1304), Radulphus Brito (ca. 1270–1320), and Henry of Ghent (ca. 1217–93), among others, attempted to determine the number of categories. The most famous and influential of the authors who engaged in this exercise was Thomas Aquinas, who followed Albertus Magnus in trying to derive the categories from modes of predication. Simon of Faversham and Radulphus Brito, though, followed the tradition of deriving them from modes of being. Later thinkers, such as John Duns Scotus, doubted the possibility of such a demonstration, and William of Ockham and John Buridan (ca. 1300–1361), among others, went even further, rejecting the view that there are ten categories of reality, let alone the possibility of demonstrating that there are ten categories.

4.1 Robert Kilwardby (b. 1215, d. 1279)

Robert is responsible for one of the first Latin commentaries on Aristotle's Categories since Boethius' Commentary over six centuries earlier, even though his conception of logic is highly influenced by Boethius. He developed a doctrine of a twofold consideration of categories: categories are considered in one way in logic and they are considered in another way in metaphysics. This twofold consideration becomes important for subsequent philosophers, such as Aquinas and Scotus, who maintain that in logic, categories have one set of properties, whereas in metaphysics, they have another set of properties.

Kilwardby is also responsible for propagating, if not developing, the distinction between material and formal logic, where the former treats of propositions and its parts (namely the categories), while the latter treats the deductive structure of argumentation. (see Lewry, 1978, and Pini, 2002).

4.2 Albertus Magnus (b. 1200, d. 1280)

Although other commentaries on the categories were written shortly after Kilwardby's Commentary (such as those written by Peter of Spain, Roger Bacon, Nicholas of Paris, and Johannes Pagus), the most important commentary was by Albertus Magnus. Albertus wrote approximately seventy works, not counting his sermons and letters. A large number of these were commentaries on the extant works of Aristotle available to him at the time. Nine of these works are devoted to logic, and of these, six are commentaries on Aristotle's Organon. However, within these commentaries, there is strong inclination towards a Neo–Platonic ontology which he barely manages to keep apart from logic.

An important element in Albert's Commentary is his derivation of the ten categories, which was further developed and defended by his most famous disciple, Thomas Aquinas. Albert takes the modi praedicandi as his starting point in his division of the categories. The main division is between per se predicaments and those not per se, i.e., between substance and accidents. The accidents are in turn divided into absolute accidents and those with some sort of relation to others. Absolute accidents are in turn divided on the basis of matter (which gives rise to quantity) or form (which brings about quality). Those accidents that have a relation to another are either caused by the substance or by something extrinsic to the substance. As to the accidents caused by the substance, they are either caused by the form (which accounts for action), the matter (which accounts for passion), or the entire composite (which accounts for relation). When the relation is based on the parts to the whole, one has position. As to the accidents caused by something extrinsic, if the cause is due to proximity, there results the category of place. If the cause is due to motion, the category of time results. Finally, the category of habit results if the cause produces some addition to the substance. (For more on Albert's derivation of the categories and how it influenced Aquinas, see Bos 1998).

Albert's Commentary is significant in that it is a close paraphrase of the original Aristotelian text. (For its structure, see Ebbesen, 1981). Although there is no translation of it into English, there is a new critical edition of it.

4.3 Thomas Aquinas (b. 1224/6, d. 1274)

Unlike many of his contemporaries, Aquinas did not compose a commentary on Categories. Nevertheless, there are plenty of references to categories scattered throughout his writings. Two texts are particularly important: one from his Commentary on Aristotle's “Metaphysics,” the other from his Commentary on Aristotle's “Physics” (Met., V. lect. 9; nn. 889–91, Phys. III, lect. 5, nn. 310–20). These texts are important for understanding two aspects of Aquinas' view, the derivation of the categories from modes of predication and the isomorphism between language, thought, and reality.

The derivation of the ten categories is most originally presented in the Commentary on the “Metaphysics.” Aquinas begins by dividing being into three modes: outside the mind (extra animam), in the mind (in mente), and as divided into act and potency (per potentiam et actum). Being, considered in the first way (which is the one pertinent to the discussion here), is not divided as a genus (e.g., animal) is into species (e.g., human) by means of differences (differentiae, e.g., rational), because such differences need to be outside the genus's essence (e.g., rationality is not included in animality), and nothing lies outside being. Being, as found outside the mind, is instead divided into categories (praedicamenta) on the basis of how it is predicated (modi praedicandi). Predication occurs in three fundamental ways to indicate: (1) what a subject is (id quod est subiectum); (2) that something inheres in a subject (inest subiecto); and (3) that something does not inhere in the subject and is beyond it but nonetheless affects it (sumatur ab eo quod est extra subiectum). These three modes of predication are in turn divided and subdivided to account for the ten categories.

In the first kind of predication, the predicate expresses what a subject is. For example, in ‘Socrates is a man,’ ‘man’ indicates that Socrates is a man. Of course, one can ask further what man is, and so on until one reaches the highest term, which is substance. The same is true, mutatis mutandis, of any other individual subject, for all subjects are in the end some kind of primary substance, of which everything else is predicated. This kind of predication accounts for the first and most basic category, substance [substantia].

In the second kind of fundamental predication, the predicate indicates inherence in a subject. According to Aquinas, this kind of predication is initially divided into absolute (per se et absolute) and relative (in respectu ad aliud). In absolute predication the inherence comes from either the subject's matter or form. When it comes from the matter, then the predicate falls into the second category, quantity [quantitas]. For example, in ‘Socrates is five and a half feet tall,’ ‘five and a half feet tall’ is taken from Socrates' matter. But when the inherence comes from the form, the predicate falls into the third category, quality [qualitas]. For example, in ‘Socrates is rational,’ ‘rational’ is taken from the form of Socrates, his humanity. If the predication is relative, however, then the predicate falls into the fourth category, relation [ad aliud]. For example, in ‘Socrates is the father of philosophy,’ ‘father’ indicates the relation of Socrates to philosophy.

In the third kind of fundamental predication, the predicate indicates something that does not inhere in a subject and is beyond it, although it affects it in some manner. This kind of predication accounts for the remaining six categories. It is initially divided into two sorts: those that are completely extrinsic to the subject (omnino extra subiectum), and those that, while strictly speaking are not in the subject, are nonetheless in some way in the subject (secundum aliquid sit in subiecto).

The predications that are taken from something completely extrinsic to the subject are divided into those that do not in any way measure the subject and those that do. In the former, predicates indicate something that affects the subject without measuring it. For example, in ‘Socrates is wearing clothes,’ ‘being clothed’ expresses that Socrates is affected but does not in any way measure him. These predicates belong to the fifth category, habit [habitus] (a habit is a garment used by the religious). Predications that in some way indicate a measuring of a subject are divided into those that measure time (e.g., in ‘Socrates came yesterday,’ ‘yesterday’ tells us the pertinent time) and those that indicate place. In the first, the predicates fall into the sixth category, time [quando]. The second can in turn be divided into two kinds: predications in which the predicate signifies the parts of a subject in relation to one another and those that do not. For example, in ‘Socrates is sitting,’ ‘sitting’ indicates Socrates' position. Likewise, in the example, ‘Socrates is in the market place,’ ‘market place’ identifies Socrates' location. The first kind of predication accounts for the seventh category, position [situs], and the second for the eighth, location [ubi].

Predications indicating that something is not strictly speaking in the subject but nonetheless in it in some way can be of two sorts. One involves a cause of an action. For example, in ‘Socrates is teaching,’ ‘Socrates’ refers to the cause of the action of teaching, and therefore accounts for the ninth category, action [agere]. The other involves being affected by an action. For example, in ‘Plato is being taught,’ ‘Plato’ refers to the recipient of the action of teaching, and therefore accounts for the tenth category, passion [pati].

Fundamental to Aquinas' derivation of the categories is an isomorphism between language and reality. Only because language parallels reality in some way can Aquinas derive the ten categories of extra-mental things from the ten different kinds of predication he accepts; we know that there are ten different kinds of things based on the different ways something is “said of” or “predicated of” a subject. As John Wippel puts it, the “diverse modes of predication correspond to and reflect diverse ways in which being itself is realized, or what [Thomas] calls diverse modes of being (modi essendi). Moreover, this diversity in the order of predication follows from and depends upon diversity in the order of being” (Wippel 1987, 17).

This isomorphism holds not only between language and reality, but extends also to thought, which mediates between language and reality. Again, as Wippel notes: “The mode or way in which words signify does not immediately follow upon modes of being of such things, but only as mediated by the way in which such things are understood” (Wippel 1987, 17–18). Thus, one could say that things in the world are isomorphic with concepts, and that concepts in turn are isomorphic with words insofar as our use of language follows the way we think and this in turn follows the way the world is.

For many medieval Aristotelians, the isomorphism between language, thought, and reality does not apply only to the derivation of the ten categories. A group of thirteenth-century thinkers commonly referred to as the modistae go well beyond Aquinas in this respect. Although there is little consensus on exactly who these thinkers are, most accounts include Martin of Dacia (d. 1304), John of Dacia (d. ca. 1280), Petrus Croccus (d. 1304), Michael of Marbais (fl. ca. 1300), Radulphus Brito (ca. 1270–1320), and Thomas of Erfurt (fl. ca. 1300). They are important in particular because of their views concerning the strong isomorphism between language and reality. For many of them this isomorphism is so profound that the boundaries between grammar, logic, and metaphysics are either non-existent or fuzzy. Thus, conclusions about the nature of things (reality) can be derived from grammatical (language) or logical (thought) considerations, just as Aquinas derives the ten ultimate categories of reality from ten modes of predication. As Sten Ebbesen describes it: “The basic idea of modism is this: each constituent of reality (each res) has a number of ways or modes of being (modi essendi) which determine the number of ways in which it can be correctly conceptualized; the ways in which it can be conceptualized (modi intelligendi) in turn determine in which way it can be signified” (Ebbesen 1998, 274). Christian Kloesel adds that by “discovering the logical structure and the causes of language, a modista tried to explain the essential nature and purpose of human speech and the ways in which words have meaning. [For the modistae thought] that the structure of language mirrors the structure of reality and the operations of the human mind” (Kloesel 1981, 130).

Not every late medieval author held that one can demonstrate the number of categories, or that there is an isomorphism between language, thought, and reality. Some of them doubted the possibility of proving that there are only ten categories of reality, while some went so far as to reduce them to two (Ockham) or three (Buridan).

5. Later Middle Ages

After Aquinas' death in 1274, the number of commentaries written on Aristotle's Categories multiplied exponentially, of which, as we said before, almost 200 are still extant, although virtually all lack a critical edition and / or translation into English. That said, the most prominent commentators include Giles of Rome, (b. ca. 1245, d. 1316), Peter John Olivi (b. 1247, d. 1298), Dietrich of Freiberg (b. ca. 1250, d. 1320), Walter Burley (b. ca. 1275, d. ca. 1345), Antonius Andreae (b. ca.1280, d. 1320), Durand of St. Pourçain (b. ca., 1275, d. 1334), Hervaeus Natalis (b. ca.1260, d. 1323), Peter of Auvergne, John Buridan (b. 1295, d. 1358/61), Martin of Dacia (d. 1304), Simon of Faversham (b. 1260, d. 1306), and Radulphus Brito (b. 1270, d. 1320).

Several points are worth noting about these commentaries: First, Masters in the Arts faculty were formally forbidden from talking about theological matters in their philosophical commentaries. Notwithstanding this formal prohibition, the commentaries on the categories were crucial for subsequent theological discussions, and the thinnest of pretexts would sometimes occasion a digression into theological territory. Perhaps the most important topic was the definition of an accident and whether or not every accident actually inhered in a substance or only had the potential so to inhere in it. How one answered this question was extremely significant in discussions of the Eucharist, in which the quantity of the host, after consecration, no longer had a substance in which to inhere.

A second topic concerns the gradual shift away from exposition and toward problem solving (‘questions’, as put by Andrews 2001). Even though the vast majority of these commentaries are not in print and are difficult to obtain, the commentaries from the two most influential authors in the later Middle Ages survive and are available. John Duns Scotus' Commentary was written around 1295, and William of Ockham's around 1319.

5.1 John Duns Scotus (b. ca. 1266, d. 1308)

According to Scotus, neither the logician nor the metaphysician is capable of showing that there are ten categories. There are in fact ten categories, but any attempt to prove that there are only ten is faulty. In his Questions on the “Metaphysics,” he puts it thus: “The various ways for showing the sufficiency of the categories [so far] all seem to err in two ways” (Scotus 1997, V, q. 5–6, n. 73). The first error consists in the attempt to try to prove that there are ten and only ten categories, for such a proof does just the opposite. According to Scotus, purported demonstrations of ten categories rely upon an initial division of predication into two basic classes: predicates that indicate a “being in itself” and predicates that indicate a “being not in itself.” But this implies that there are only two ultimate genera of being, not ten. Indeed, if one were to accept that the modes of predication and the modes of being correspond to each other, as those who try to derive the number of categories from the modes of predication do, then one must conclude that there are only two categories––substance and accident, respectively––not ten. For the two most basic kinds of predication are either “being in a subject” or “not being in a subject.”

The second error, Scotus argues, is begging the question. Any attempt to demonstrate that there are only ten categories presupposes the very thing to be demonstrated, namely, that there are ten and only ten categories. “All these ways of dividing do not prove [the proposal], for one would have to prove that what is divided is thus divided, and precisely in this way, and this to the issue at hand, namely, that the dividends constitute these most general [categories]” (ibid., n. 75).

Even though Scotus does not believe that it can be demonstrated that there are only ten categories, he accepts that there are in fact only ten categories of being (Pini 2005). Clearly, for him, reality (the actual number of categories) and what we know about them (what we can demonstrate about them) do not correspond to each other. The categories, as distinct kinds of things, are diverse from each other and this diversity entails that there is nothing from which we can establish their number. As Pini notes, “[e]ven when Scotus comes to think that being is a univocal concept, he will always make clear that there is no one real mode of being corresponding to that concept from which the different categories can be derived. Metaphysically speaking, there are ten irreducible essences, even though they can be understood under a common concept” (Pini 2003, 13). Scotus' view of categories reveals that he does not accept the isomorphism between thought and reality common among medieval authors before him. For him, however, the inability to deduce the number of categories is only one of the ways in which signifying, understanding, and being are not demonstrably isomorphic.

A second difference between the order of being (reality) and the order of signifying (language) is revealed by the process known as “contraction.” In the conceptual order, a thing is contracted from its genus to its species by a differentia that distinguishes the species from other kinds within a genus. For example, the genus “animal” is contracted to the species “man” by the differentia “rational,” thus setting human beings apart from other kinds of animals. In the order of reality, however, being is not contracted to any of the ten genera, because ‘being’ does not have the same meaning when applied to every category. The ten highest genera have nothing in common with each other other than the fact that they are called ‘being’ (Pini, 2005). However, insofar as the user of the term is concerned, ‘being’ can be contracted to one of the categories, for when one says ‘being in itself,’ one intends to signify substance, even though in the order of reality no such contraction occurs. This difference between reality and thought lies at the heart of Scotus' doubt concerning the possibility of deriving the number of categories.

Another example may help clarify the difference between the two orders. Say that the word ‘John’ signifies at least two persons: John Scotus and John Eriugena. This means that when one uses the word ‘John’ to refer to these two persons, it is used equivocally, for there is nothing common to both Scotus and Eriugena that is signified by the term. Nevertheless, by adding a surname to ‘John,’ say ‘Scotus,’ the name is contracted to ‘John Scotus’ as opposed to ‘John Eriugena.’ Now, when a nature (e.g., man) is contracted in the extra-mental order to Scotus or Eriugena, the nature, as it exists, is really contracted, but when ‘John’ is contracted by the addition of ‘Scotus,’ the nature is not contracted, only the utterance is. It is in this latter way, Scotus argues, that the expressions ‘being absolute’ or ‘being per se’ contract ‘being’ to a substance in the conceptual order, for this contraction is based on the intent of the speaker, not on what is signified (i.e., not on the extra-mental order).

5.2 William of Ockham (b. ca. 1285, d. 1347)

William of Ockham goes well beyond Scotus in his rejection of any kind of isomorphism between words, concepts, and things. Ockham is well known for what is usually called “nominalism,” that is, the view that universals or natures do not have any ontological status outside the mind. Moreover, in contrast to many fourteenth-century authors who posit ten categories, Ockham argues that our experience leads us to posit only two extra-mental categories: substance and quality.

I claim that even though (I) the moderns hold that in every category there are many things ordered with respect to superiority and inferiority in such a way that, according to them, what is superior is predicated per se in the first mode and in the nominative case of each inferior … and even though (ii), in order to have such predication, they fashion abstract names from adverbs …, and even though (iii) they claim that there are ten primarily distinct “little things” that correspond in all cases to these abstract names, it nonetheless seems to me that the ancient philosophers did not posit such “little things,” nor did they claim that it is always by this sort of predication that the categories are predicated of what is contained in them. (Ockham 1991, V. q. 22, 471–72)

The “little things” to which Ockham refers in this passage are what Scotus calls “common natures,” which according to Scotus correspond to the different abstract predicates found in each of the nine accidental categories. For Scotus, such terms as ‘squareness,’ ‘horseness,’ and ‘fatherhood’ signify distinct and abstract existing entities, a view Ockham rejects.

Following the standard medieval understanding of the opening lines of Aristotle's On Interpretation, Ockham holds that written and vocal words are conventional signs of mental concepts, which are in turn natural signs of things. To a certain extent, he also admits that written and vocal words correspond to mental concepts, so that, just as there are ten kinds of predication, i.e., ten kinds of vocal utterances (the ten categories), there are also ten kinds of concepts corresponding to them (see Panaccio 1999, 55). However, Ockham argues that our natural experience gives us no reason to think that the terms we use for the categories signify ten extra-mental entities. Rather, experience supports the view that only individual substances and the accident of quality exist extramentally. Ockham uses many semantic devices to make his point (ibid., 71). For example, whereas Scotus might say that “Socrates is a father because of fatherhood,” Ockham would rather say that “Socrates is a father because he has generated a son” (Ockham 1991, V. q. 22, 472; Klima 1999, 136). In this way, instead of positing an abstract entity, viz., “fatherhood,” to account for why Socrates is a father, Ockham gives the activity of Socrates as an individual substance as the reason why Socrates is a father. However, in other contexts and for specifically theological reasons, particularly when it comes to the cases of the Trinity, the Incarnation, and the Eucharist, Ockham is willing to grant that relations are real. (see Adams 1987, 267, and Spade 1999, 104)

Ockham is equally clear concerning the discipline that studies categories. Like Buridan, among others, he held that they are studied in grammar and logic, not in metaphysics. Aristotle's Categories is concerned with words that primarily signify things, and only indirectly with things. As Ockham puts it in his early Commentary on Aristotle's text:

This is Boethius' intention, when he says: “He who deals with words that signify, also, in some fashion or other, will deal with things.” For the thing and the signification of the thing are joined together. But this discussion which is about words is more primary, whereas that which is framed with respect to the notion of things, is secondary. That is, in the second place, he treats about those things for which [the words] stand. And ignorance of Aristotle's intention in this book leads many moderns astray, [the moderns] believing that he wants many utterances to be understood for things, which really are to be understood of words alone––and by way of analogy, for the intentions and concepts in the soul. (Ockham 1978, q. 1)

The ten categories, then, are studied both in grammar and logic, albeit in different ways, but not in metaphysics. They are studied to the extent that they signify things, but we must not suppose that there is any one-to-one correspondence between words and concepts on the one hand and things on the other. There is generally a one-to-one correspondence between words and concepts, though even here this is not always true. For example, in his Summa logicae, he claims that participles and adjectives are distinct parts of speech according to grammar, even though they are not distinct according to logic (Ockham 1974, SL 3). Nevertheless, for Ockham, there are ten categories of words and concepts, but the extra-mental things that are signified by them are either individual substances or individual qualities.

Ockham employs a number of distinctions in the exposition of his account. One of these is particularly important for subsequent authors. This is the distinction between “category” taken as one of the ten highest genera (e.g., substance, quantity, quality, etc.) and “category” taken as the set of coordinated predicates contained in each of these genera. In the former sense, the term ‘category’ refers to each of the ten highest genera, whereas in the latter sense, the term refers to any set of predicates ordered to one another. The most famous example of the latter is Porphyry's tree, which starts out with “substance” at the top and includes in descending order such items as “corporeal,” “living,” “animal,” and “man.” In the Summa logicae, Ockham presents the distinction as follows:

‘[C]ategory’ has two senses. In one sense, it is used to signify the whole series of terms ordered according to greater and lesser generality. In the other sense, the word is used for the first and most general term in each such series. In the second sense of ‘category,’ every category is a simple term of first intention…. inasmuch as it signifies things which are not signs. (Ockham 1974, SL 40)

Ockham's view does not go unchallenged. Walter Burley (ca. 1275–1344/5), for example, develops his mature doctrine of categories in opposition to Ockham in his Commentary on the Old Logic (Conti 1990) and influences such later medieval realists as Robert Arlyngton (fl. 1390), John Sharpe (1360-1415), and John Wyclif (1324-1384).

6. Silver Age of Scholasticism

From about 1350 to about 1450, scholastic thought was in retreat. At least two factors seem to have contributed to this situation: first, the epidemic known as the Black Death decimated the universities of medieval Europe, where scholastic thought had flourished in the thirteenth century; second, the Italian Renaissance began moving forward at high speed with its emphasis on the discovery of the ancients and its rejection of “the age in the middle.” However, after the middle of the fifteenth century, particularly following the integration of the Iberian peninsula at the end of the century and the consolidation of the Spanish Empire, there was a resurgence of scholasticism in the Iberian and Italian peninsulas. The Counter Reformation, a movement within the Catholic Church intended to meet the challenge of the Reformation, also contributed substantially to the rebirth of scholastic thought. Among the great leaders of this movement were the Italian Thomas de Vio, also known as Cajetan (1468–1534), and the Spaniard Francis Suárez. Both had enormous influence on all subsequent scholastics and scholastically-inspired thought. Indeed, Suárez's Metaphysical Disputations (1597) became the standard textbook of metaphysics in Europe and Latin America for one hundred and fifty years after its publication, which means that what he has to say about categories is important for understanding late scholastic category theory and the discussions of the categories in Early Modern philosophy. Apart from questions of originality, Suárez is historically important because he was a bridge for metaphysical thought between the Middle Ages and the Modern period.

6.1 Francis Suárez (b. 1548, d. 1617)

Suárez deals with categories in some detail in Disputation 39 of the Metaphysical Disputations (henceforth DM), although he also makes pertinent comments about them elsewhere (for example, in DE q. 75, a. 1, d. 47, s. 1, n. 4; 1861 vol. 21, p. 45a). In Metaphysical Disputation 39, he is primarily concerned with the division of accidents into nine highest genera, and the discussion of categories is incidental and indirect, rather than deliberate and explicit. Nonetheless, it is clear that Suárez is concerned with the ontological status of categories in this text. Indeed, he explicitly adopts a certain language in order to clarify and resolve the issue.

Several aspects of Suárez's doctrine reveal his overall position. Three of these are particularly enlightening: First, the distinction between supreme genera and categories; second, the respective disciplines where these are studied; and third, the kind of distinction that obtains between categories themselves.

Medieval authors frequently use, interchangeably, the expressions ‘supreme genus’ [generalissimum] and ‘category’ (praedicamentum). The fact that these terms are interchanged indicates that those who use them regard them as equivalent at least in certain contexts. Suárez is no exception; he often uses one term in place of the other. But there is a difference, for Suárez is aware of the difference in terminology and explicitly distinguishes between the two expressions. In a revealing passage, he tells us that “a category is nothing other than the appropriate disposition of genera and species from a supreme genus to individuals” (DM 39, 1; 1861, 25:504b; our emphasis). This text makes clear that a category is not a genus insofar as categories are dispositions of genera and species. Genera are not dispositions, whereas categories are. This means that, strictly speaking, categories cannot be supreme genera. In another text Suárez is even more explicit:

[A] category is nothing other than the appropriate disposition and coordination of essential predicates, of which those which are predicated essentially of the individual are placed above it, in a direct line, going up from the lower to the higher; and this line, just as it does not begin but with the lowest, that is the individual, does not end but in a highest genus … .” (DM 39, 2, 30; 1861, 25:518; our emphasis)

Here, Suárez repeats that categories are dispositions, but he adds another important term, ‘coordination.’ A category is not properly speaking a genus, but rather the coordination or, we might say, the arrangement of genera according to a pattern of essential inclusion which goes from the lowest to the highest (see Ockham 1991, V, q. 21, for a precedent to this language). We take it that Suárez means to say that categories such as quality and quantity, for example, are not themselves genera, but ways in which genera are related. Quality tells us how color is related to red and blue on the one hand (i.e., lower species), and to texture and knowledge (i.e., other genera) on the other. Red and blue are both colors, but different from rough (a kind of texture) and knowledge of grammar (a kind of knowledge). But all these are qualities and different from three-inches wide, which is instead a quantity. Quality and quantity, then, do not function like genera, for a genus is signified by any predicate that expresses what a subject is (e.g., in the sentence, ‘Man is an animal,’ ‘animal’ is the genus of man), and categories do not function in this way. Following Porphyry's example, the highest or supreme (generalissimum) genus is substance.

This brings us to the discipline under which categories are studied. Suárez tells us that the division into nine highest genera–he is speaking of accidental genera, although what he says also applies mutatis mutandis to substance–is proposed not only by metaphysicians, but also by logicians in treatises on categories. Consequently, in one way it properly belongs to first philosophy, that is, metaphysics, rather than logic. The reason is that, whereas the metaphysician studies the ten supreme genera in order to explain their natures and essences, the logician does not have this aim in mind. Logic is directed toward the operations of the mind, rather than toward natures and essences, and its purpose is to establish rational ways of thinking. Logic deals with the concepts of the mind insofar as these concepts can be arranged in accordance with certain rules (DM 39, 1; 1861, 25:504b).

In another way, however, the categories are also studied in logic, not in metaphysics, because they are mental concepts, and logic is concerned with the proper analysis of concepts to determine their form and with the proper arrangement of concepts to determine their relations. But this is not the whole story, for Suárez also speaks of the ten supreme genera, and the study of these belongs to metaphysics. Moreover, there is also another important point, which is made explicit in the following text:

Because mental concepts are about real things, and are founded on real things, [the logician also] treats of real things, although not to explain their essences and natures, but only in order to coordinate the concepts in the mind; and in this sense he deals with the ten [supreme] genera in order to establish the ten categories. (DM 39, 1; 1861, 25:504b)

The logician treats of categories, which are ways in which concepts are appropriately arranged in the mind. However, because these concepts reflect the ways things are in reality, that is, the natures and essences of things in the world, the logician also deals, albeit only indirectly, with these natures and essences in order to be able to introduce the proper order among them in the mind. The metaphysician, on the other hand, deals directly with the ten supreme genera, not with ways of arranging concepts in the mind, for the purpose of metaphysics is to determine the essences of things.

Suárez makes an interesting aside in the discussion. He tells us that some authors mistakenly consider categories to be names, and only names. This mistake arises because they look at categories only from the point of view of the logician, and the logician, qua logician, is not concerned with an ordering on the basis of the essences of things but on the basis of the essences of names (DM 39, 1; 1861, 25:505a).

The view that categories are concepts is supported further in his discussion of the distinction among categories. Suárez, like the other scholastics who precede him, holds that categories are primarily diverse. This means that they share no common property or genus. Naturally, the question as to the source and nature of their diversity comes up, and Suárez discusses it in some detail. For us, the important point is the nature of the distinction among categories themselves. Suárez rejects two opinions with respect to this issue. According to one, a real distinction between the things contained under a genus is necessary (DM 39, 2, 19; 1861, 25: 515a). According to another opinion, the distinction between supreme genera must be modal, actual, and ex natura rei, and must precede in reality the operation of the mind (DM 39, 2, 20; 1861, 25:515b).

The view Suárez proposes holds that categories are distinguished according to “our way of conceiving, founded in reality. Some call this kind of distinction a distinction of reasoned reason, whereas others call it formal distinction” (DM 39, 2, 22; 1861, 25:516b). The distinction of reasoned reason is, according to Suárez, a conceptual distinction. Conceptual distinctions come in two varieties: One is the distinction of reasoned reason and the other the distinction of reasoning reason. The second has no basis in reality but is purely a creation of the mind; it arises out of the intellect's activity of comparing, which makes possible its infinite multiplication (DM 39, 2, 23; 1861, 25:517a). An example is the distinction between Peter and himself in order to say that he is identical to himself. The first, however, the distinction of reasoned reason, has a foundation in reality, even if the distinction itself is merely conceptual. This is the kind of distinction that we make when we think about God's attributes, for example. The foundation of this distinction in the case of categories must be sufficient to allow relations or modes of denomination of primary substance that are irreducible to one generic concept (DM 39, 2, 23; 1861, 25:517a).

This is obviously not enough to clarify the issue. The question remains: What is this foundation in reality which is the basis of the denomination? It cannot be a category itself, for categories for Suárez are concepts and the product of conception and abstraction (DM 39, 2, 23; 1861, 25:517a). And it cannot be a reality which is exactly represented by the distinction, for then the distinction would be real rather than conceptual. So what is it?

The point to consider is that a distinction of reasoned reason has some basis in reality, even though the distinction itself is a concept in the mind, resulting from some comparison or of thinking about something. Now we can go back to categories and apply what we have learned about the distinction of reasoned reason to them. Categories are ways in which humans conceive the world based on certain comparisons that the mind carries out between other concepts, but these other concepts have reference in the world. An example would help, but the one of God and His properties, which Suárez gives, is of no great use because of its uniqueness. Let us try to make up one that perhaps Suárez would accept.

Consider the category quality. For Suárez, quality is a concept which the mind develops based on the mind's consideration of the relations between certain concepts, such as red, blue, grammatical, and so on, on the one hand, and certain other concepts on the other, such as three meters long, yesterday, woman, and so on. In other words, quality tells us something about the first set of concepts and their relations to other concepts. But the concepts between which relations are established have instances in reality, outside the mind, though not qua concepts. Red, as universal, is not to be found outside the mind. Nonetheless, there are red things in the world and each of them is an individual instance of the universal red. This means that quality, in spite of being a concept based on the relation between concepts is nonetheless related, via those concepts, to the world outside the mind. And the same applies to the other concepts. So here we have the foundation in reality of the category quality.

7. Concluding Remarks

Even the cursory discussion we have presented here should make a few things clear about the development of category theory in the Middle Ages. First, Aristotle's views had an extraordinary impact throughout the period, for his Categories were ever-present in medieval discussions of categories. Second, major changes occurred in thinking about this topic depending on the availability of various sources and the impact of different philosophical traditions. In the early Middle Ages, Neoplatonic works such as the Categoriae decem were very important, whereas later the influence of these works faded and a more Aristotelian approach became dominant. Third, in spite of Aristotle's influence, medieval authors charted new courses, which often went contrary to Aristotle's explicit views; we need only think of the number of categories, for example. They also raised questions that were not explicitly posed by Aristotle, such as the way that categories are established. Fourth, there was considerable development in the way in which the general topic of categories was discussed and the tools used to deal with it; late medieval logic played an increasingly important role in discussions, the terminology became more precise, the questions raised were made explicit, and the controversies were increasingly pointed. Finally, the relevance of categories for metaphysical issues became crucial, so that it was in the context of metaphysical works, such as Aquinas' Commentary on Aristotle's “Metaphysics” and Suárez's Metaphysical Disputations that we find some of the richest discussions.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


We are grateful to Giorgio Pini, Paul Vincent Spade, and Jack Zupko for their useful comments and suggestions, and to John P. Doyle for a useful reference.

Copyright © 2012 by
Jorge Gracia
Lloyd Newton

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