Whereas epistemology is (broadly speaking) the philosophical theory of knowledge, its nature and scope, metaepistemology takes a step back from particular substantive debates in epistemology in order to inquire into the assumptions and commitments made by those who engage in these debates. This entry will focus on a selection of these assumptions and commitments, including (§1) whether (or not) there are objective epistemic facts; and how to characterize (§2) the subject matter and (§3) the methodology of epistemology.
- 1. Are there epistemic facts? Metaepistemological realism vs. anti-realism
- 2. Characterizations of epistemology
- 3. Methodology in epistemology
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1. Are there epistemic facts? Metaepistemological realism vs. anti-realism
One dividing line in metaepistemology is broadly analogous to a familiar dividing line in metaethics, between (roughly) realist and anti-realist positions. This section will discuss several prominent realist and anti-realist positions in metaepistemology and, in some cases, we will note connections between these positions and their metaethical counterparts (see also entry on metaethics).
First, however, it will be useful to clarify how we are using these terms. It is contentious what, for a given subject matter α, realism, vis-à-vis α amounts to. One generally accepted idea is that an α-realist takes α-claims to be validated by the way things stand in the world (Blackburn 1993). In the epistemic case of interest here, realism implies that attributions of, e.g., knowledge, justification, epistemic virtue and epistemic vice are validated by how things stand in the world. Compare here with the metaethical realist (e.g., Shafer-Landau 2003) who takes attributions of rightness, goodness, moral virtue and vice to be so validated. Likewise, just as the metaethical anti-realist denies that moral claims have this kind of status, the metaepistemological anti-realist will deny the same vis-à-vis epistemic claims, in at least one of two ways: either (i) by denying that there are any epistemic facts (metaepistemological non-cognitivists and error-theorists fall into this category of anti-realism). Or, alternatively, metaepistemological anti-realists might (ii) grant that there are epistemic facts while denying that the obtaining of these facts is independent of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, conceptual schemes, and so on. Here we may locate metaepistemological idealism, constructivism, subjectivism, and relativism (for discussion, see Miller 2002 ; Cuneo 2007; Carter 2016; Baghramian & Carter 2015 ).
In what follows, we’ll look first at metaepistemological realism, and then at a few versions of metaepistemological anti-realism.
1.1 Metaepistemological realism
Metaepistemological realists at the very least accept that there are epistemic facts, and that these facts are not (non-trivially) mind-dependent. Thus, this means that, for the realist, when you say that you know that Paris is the capital of France, there is a fact of the matter—either you do or you do not know this—and further, the obtaining of this fact is not simply down to, e.g., cultural consensus, approval, or what you think about what you know. Thus, for the realist, when two people disagree about who knows what, this disagreement is genuine; both parties cannot be right (cf., Kölbel 2004; MacFarlane 2011); likewise, for the realist, there will be cases where you believe you know something, and you are mistaken.
The above kind of minimal metaepistemological realism is plausibly the default presupposition of many first-order debates in mainstream epistemology, even though—as a metaepistemological position—it is not often explicitly argued for (Carter 2016: Ch. 1). There are, however, some notable exceptions in the recent literature, due to Paul Boghossian (2006) and Terence Cuneo (2007). Both Boghossian and Cuneo share a common kind of “pro-realist” argumentative strategy, which is to argue that metaepistemological anti-realism, in one or more of its forms, is implausible or incoherent, and thus, that a realist position holds up better by contrast.
Boghossian (2006), challenges specifically those strands of metaepistemological anti-realism that maintain that epistemic facts are (strongly) mind-dependent. His critical target is a doctrine he terms “Equal Validity”, which Boghossian identifies with the kind of “postmodern relativism” about knowledge that he suggests is now orthodoxy in “vast stretches of the humanities and social sciences” (2006: 2).
Equal Validity: There are many radically different, yet “equally valid” ways of knowing the world, with science being just one of them. (Boghossian 2006: 2)
Boghossian challenges Equal Validity under two guises: constructivism and relativism (see §1.2), in the service of defending a realist position he terms “absolutism”. Importantly, though, the version of metaepistemological realism that Boghossian contrasts (under the description of “absolutism”) favorably to constructivist and relativist anti-realism goes beyond the kind of minimal realist position described above. Boghossian’s absolutism involves—additionally—a package of theses about the status of epistemic principles, which he defines as “general normative propositions” that specify conditions under which a particular type of belief is justified (Boghossian 2006: 85; 2001: 38 fn. 3). Included in this package are the theses that (i) there is an objective fact of the matter as to which epistemic principles are true; (ii) there is a uniquely correct set of epistemic principles, which all rational agents are bound by; and that (iii) if there are objective facts about which epistemic principles (and which particular epistemic judgments) are true, these facts should be knowable: it ought to be possible to arrive at justified beliefs about them (2006: 77).
While a critic might resist the rationale for accepting Boghossian’s absolutist position by challenging his critical assessments of the viability of the constructivist and relativist positions that he associates with “Equal Validity” (see, e.g., MacFarlane 2008a; Wright 2008; Sosa 2008; Carter 2016: Ch. 6; Kusch 2009), a separate space for critical engagement concerns Boghossian’s characterization of the metaepistemological option space. For example, even if Equal Validity is false, Boghossian’s strong version of absolutism described should be accepted only if it also compares favorably with forms of anti-realism that (unlike constructivism and relativism) reject epistemic facts wholesale (e.g., metaepistemic error theory—see §1.2), as well as, importantly, with weaker forms of metaepistemological realism that do not sign up to Boghossian’s full package. On this latter point, for example, it has been argued that one can agree with Boghossian in rejecting constructivism and relativism (as well as other forms of anti-realism) while subscribing to a version of metaepistemological realism that maintains that epistemic principles are objective and knowable, but relative to worlds, and thus, that there is not a unique set of epistemic principles applicable across all worlds (for discussion of this kind of view, see Carter & McKenna 2021).
Whereas Boghossian’s wider objective in defending (a version of) metaepistemological realism was to press back against “postmodern” thinking in the academy, Terence Cuneo’s (2007) defense of metaepistemological realism also comes in the service of a further objective, in Cuneo’s case, a defense of metaethical realism. Cuneo’s master argument is as follows:
- If moral facts do not exist, then epistemic facts do not exist.
- Epistemic facts exist.
- So, moral facts exist.
- If moral facts exist, then moral realism is true.
- So, moral realism is true (Cuneo 2007: 6)
Because Premise (2) is his central focus, Cuneo’s case for metaethical realism largely boils down to a sustained defense of metaepistemological realism (see also here Cuneo & Shafer-Landau 2014). Also, like Boghossian, Cuneo’s case in favor of metaepistemological realism proceeds as a negative case against various forms of metaepistemological anti-realism, including especially error theory and expressivism (see §1.2 for discussion of these views).
Of special interest to Cuneo’s own version of metaepistemological realism is the sense in which it—like Boghossian’s “absolutism”—goes beyond a “minimal” realist’s commitment to countenancing mind-independent epistemic facts. For Cuneo, metaepistemological realism of the sort he takes to be “paradigmatic” (and analogous to metaethical realism) will also accept the following:
[Epistemic facts] are prescriptive … they are, imply, or indicate reasons for properly situated individuals to behave in certain ways … regardless of whether these agents care about conducting their behaviour in a rational way, whether they belong to a social group of a certain kind, or whether they have entered into social agreements with others. (Cuneo 2007: 59)
As Cuneo sees it, then, when the realist accepts that there is an epistemic fact consisting in your having an (epistemic) reason to believe that p for which evidence is compelling, then that you have this epistemic reason is “not contingent on whether [you] care about believing what is true” (2007: 59). This qualification Cuneo takes to be important for distinguishing between the particular kind of epistemic facts countenanced by the realist as such, from epistemic facts capturing mere hypothetical epistemic imperatives—e.g., “If I want to believe something true about p, then I have a reason to believe what the evidence says about p”—which epistemic error theorists (e.g., Olson 2011, 2014) can accept under the banner of metaepistemological anti-realism.
Whereas Cuneo’s and Boghossian’s respective cases for metaepistemological realism are negative in that they rest principally on challenging the credentials of various forms of anti-realism, at least two other strategies do not. One such envisioned metanormative strategy would be to (rather than as Cuneo has done) aim to establish metaethical realism on independent grounds and then argue from here to metaepistemological realism via a parity premise (for an instance of such a strategy, see Kyriacou 2018). Fourthly, we can envision a kind of pragmatic justification of metaepistemological realism, as a precondition for doing first-order epistemology. For example, as such a line of thought goes, paradigmatic first-order debates in epistemology—take for instance the decades-long debate between Richard Feldman and Alvin Goldman about whether epistemic internalism or externalism is correct in epistemology—tend to make sense only against a background presumption of metaepistemological realism. If this is right, then, as Carter (2016: Ch. 1, Ch. 9) has suggested, the presumption of metaepistemological realism is plausibly essential to pursuing typical projects that are characteristic of mainstream analytic epistemology.
1.2 Metaepistemological anti-realism
There are two central types of metaepistemological anti-realist, those that reject epistemic facts and those that accept epistemic facts but reject that the obtaining of these facts is mind-independent in the way the realist insists. Explicit defenses of anti-realist positions in metaepistemology are few and far between—at least, compared with explicit defense of versions of metaethical anti-realism—and rely typically on rationales drawn from metanormative theory and philosophy of language more so than epistemology.
Within the first broad type of anti-realism—which parts with realism by denying the existence of epistemic facts—we can locate (i) metaepistemological error theory and (i) metaepistemological non-cognitivism, the most typical version of which goes under the heading epistemic expressivism (Chrisman 2012; Ahlstrom-Vij 2013, 2018).
In the case of metaepistemological error theory, two prominent defenses are due to Jonas Olson and, with some qualifications, Bart Streumer (2008, 2013, 2017). Olson’s tack is a kind of “reverse” of Cuneo’s parity strategy; that is, Olson (2011, 2014) first takes himself to have established metaethical error theory on independent grounds, and then argues from here via a parity premise, for metaepistemological error theory. Two ways to press this rationale will be to either reject moral error theory (e.g., Finlay 2008) or to challenge Olson’s use of a parity premise (see Côté-Bouchard & Littlejohn 2018 for criticism). Streumer, by contrast, embraces metaepistemological error theory by defending, in the first instance, a kind of universal metanormative error theory (Streumer 2008, 2017) which, if correct, would imply metaepistemological error theory—including, importantly, the thesis that there are no epistemic reasons for belief. Some critics of error theory, such as Nishi Shah (2010), have challenged the stability of such an epistemic error theory by appealing to considerations to do with the alleged inescapable character of epistemic norms. A different line of criticism of epistemic error theory insists that—by the theory’s own lights—one has no reason to believe it (compare here with Putnam’s (1981: 121) critique of Protagorean relativism as a position a proponent ought to think her opponent has no reason to believe). Whether this second line of criticism against the epistemic error theorist holds water remains contentious in two ways; for one, it is contested whether, if epistemic error theory implies that there is no reason to believe the theory, this should be held as a mark against the theory (for relevant discussion see Hyun & Sampson 2014; Rowland 2012; and Streumer 2013); secondly, it is contentious whether it is possible to genuinely believe the epistemic error theory, regardless of whether, were one to believe it, one could have an epistemic reason for doing so. On this second point, see, along with Streumer (2013), Lillehammer and Möller (2015) and Olson (2016).
Along with metaepistemological error theory, another notable form of metaepistemological anti-realism that parts ways with realism by denying the very existence of epistemic facts is defended by metaepistemologicalnon-cognitivists (Field 1996, 1998; Heller 1999; Gibbard 2003; Blackburn 1996; Chrisman 2007; Ridge 2007; Ahlstrom-Vij 2013). Versions of this thesis vary in their scope and commitments. One early and influential example of epistemic non-cognitivism is Hartry Field’s non-cognitivism about a priori justification. Field holds that:
we should have a non-factualist attitude towards justification…; it is a matter of policy rather than fact,…and the question is only whether it is a good policy. It makes no sense to ask whether logic really is justifiable a priori. (Field 1996: 377, for criticism see Kvanvig 2003 and Jenkins 2008)
Likewise, for Mark Heller (1999)—a non-cognitivist about “knowledge”—“‘Knowledge’ is our word for saying that S’s epistemic condition is good enough”. What unifies metaepistemological non-cognitivist positions, according to Matthew Chrisman (2012) is a commitment to thinking that
epistemic claims express a … non-representational kind of mental state … epistemic judgments have, at least in part, a desire-like direction of fit with the world. (2012: 119)
Most forms of metaepistemological non-cognitivism go a step further to embrace the (optional) expressivist thesis that, e.g., knowledge and justification attributions express “pro” attitudes (Chrisman 2012). Proponents of general versions of metaepistemological non-cognitivism (Gibbard 2003; Blackburn 1996; Chrisman 2007; Ridge 2007) have typically availed themselves to the idea that, as Michael Ridge puts it,
arguments for metaethical expressivism carry over nicely to provide arguments for expressivism about epistemic discourse. (2007: 83)
Critics by contrast have typically focused on particular problems that appear to arise for metaepistemical non-cognitivism without assuming such problems carry over by parity to metaethical expressivism. For example, according to Jon Kvanvig (2003: 176), metaepistemological non-cognitivism is incoherent (even if metaethical expressivism is not) because a defense of the view will have to presuppose the truth of certain norms of justification and explanation. In a similar vein, Michael P. Lynch (2009) suggests that “we lack any standpoint” from which we can make the position intelligible. This is because, for Lynch, as a prerequisite of holding the non-cognitivist’s position (including a denial of epistemic value facts), one must disengage from any commitment to epistemic values, which is to take up a standpoint disengaged from epistemic values; but this, he maintains, is a standpoint we cannot take up while inquiring. In this respect, the incoherence of metaethical non-cognitivism lies in its incompatibility with inquiry. For criticisms to incoherence-style arguments against epistemic expressivism (though these critiques fall short of outright endorsement of expressivism), see, e.g., Carter & Chrisman 2012 and Kappel 2011).
While metaepistemological error theory and noncognitivism represent the most notable examples of metaepistemological views that are anti-realist in virtue of denying epistemic facts, there have been—throughout the history of epistemology—a wide variety of views that would qualify as anti-realist in virtue of maintaining that epistemic facts are mind-dependent in a way that the realist will reject. Here we will discuss two such positions: idealism and relativism.
According to idealism (e.g., of a Berkeleyan sort), anything we know we know because some mental state of affairs obtains, and this is because, for such an idealist, there is no external world; empirical reality is internal to our minds. This view of course implies that truths we might know, and indeed any epistemic facts, will be trivially mind dependent, given that part of what it is to be an idealist is to deny that there is a mind-independent objective reality. Importantly, this kind of heavyweight anti-realist position is distinct from, and not implied by, indirect realist views in the philosophy of perception (e.g., F. Jackson 1977), which maintain that that we are only indirectly aware of the object of perceptual experiences by being aware of, e.g., sense-data. Indirect realism in the philosophy of perception is compatible with metaepistemological realism, while full-fledged idealism about empirical reality is not.
Although metaepistemological idealism has not held much sway in epistemological circles (with the exception of, perhaps, with G.E. Moore who arguably attempted to refute it (for discussion see Sosa 2009: Ch. 1) metaepistemologicalrelativism has by contrast generated much more interest. Metaepistemological relativists (hereafter relativists) regard the status of (at least some kinds of) epistemological claims as, in some interesting way, relative; that is to say, relativists hold that the truths which (some kinds of) epistemological claims aspire to are relative truths (Baghramian & Carter 2015 ).
While some limited forms of metaepistemological relativism are implied by relativistic positions in the philosophy of science (Kuhn 1962; Laudan 1990; Hacking 1982) concerning the status of scientific knowledge, there are two forms of relativism that bear special relevance to epistemology and which go beyond claims about scientific knowledge specifically: these are (i) explicitly relational forms epistemic relativism (e.g., Rorty 1979), and new-age epistemic relativism—viz., relativism about the semantics of “knows”—of the sort defended by John MacFarlane (2014).
The first explicitly relational form of relativism fits the description of “the relativist” as challenged by Boghossian (2006) in Fear of Knowledge. According to Boghossian, the relativist should be understood as submitting the following “epistemic relationist” thesis:
If a person, S’s, epistemic judgments are to have any prospect of being true, we must not construe his utterances of the form “E justifies belief B” as expressing the claim E justifies belief B but rather as expressing the claim: According to the epistemic system C, that I, S, accept, information E justifies belief B. (Boghossian 2006: 84)
This characterization of relativism is called “replacement” relativism because it is effectively endorsing a replacing of unqualified epistemic claims with explicitly relational ones that make implicit epistemic standards explicit. This is precisely the kind of endorsement Boghossian thinks Richard Rorty is encouraging, in suggesting that, e.g., Galileo and Bellarmine are each right about the cosmos—Galileo about heliocentrism, Bellarmine about geocentrism—according to the different “epistemic grids” each accepts (Rorty 1979: 330).
One important feature of the above explicitly relational kind of relativism is that, once the “hidden parameter” implicit in e.g., knowledge and justification attributions is made explicit, knowledge and justification attributions then get their truth values absolutely (MacFarlane 2011); such attributions, thus, do not get their truth values relatively. For instance, such a view implies that an attribution such as “Galileo is epistemically justified in believing heliocentrism” is absolutely true, given that it is absolutely true that
Galileo is epistemically justified in believing heliocentrism, according to the scientific worldview that Galileo accepts.
But, according to John MacFarlane and Crispin Wright, once this point is appreciated—viz., that Boghossian’s characterization of epistemic relativism is one that countenances absolute truths—it is contestable whether the position is genuinely relativistic in a philosophically interesting sense. As Wright (2008) says, the construal of epistemic relativism as signing on to the absolute truth of (explicitly relational) claims about knowledge and justification
[…] is just to fail to take seriously the thesis that claims such as [sic … S is justified in believing X] can indeed be true or false, albeit, only relatively so. (2008: 383, our italics).
In a similar vein, MacFarlane takes Boghossian’s characterization of epistemic relativism to be modelled on Gilbert Harman’s (1975) moral relativism, which is (by MacFarlane’s lights) best understood as a version of epistemic contextualism (see MacFarlane 2014: 33, fn. 5).
According to “new age” relativism (MacFarlane 2005, 2008b, 2011, 2014; Richard 2004), by contrast, attributions of knowledge and justification are candidates only for relative truth values, and this is for the reason that their truth is always relative to a context in which they are being assessed, and there are potentially infinitely many such contexts, and so there will never be any “once and for all” truth value for any given knowledge ascription. In a bit more detail, for the new age relativist about knowledge ascriptions, when S asserts that “X knows there is a barn”, the proposition S expresses with this assertion gets a truth value on the relativist’s semantics for “knows” only once the epistemic standard of the assessor is specified (e.g., only once we supply an epistemic standard for an individual who is assessing S’s attribution of knowledge to X); if the assessor is enthralled in a sceptical debate or has money invested in whether X knows there is a barn, the standard for the assessor might be high, if not, perhaps it won’t. Crucially, without the specification of an assessor’s standard for S’s knowledge attribution, S’s claim that “X knows there is a barn” lacks a truth-value in much that same way as, e.g., indexical expressions such as “X is here now” do not get a truth-value independent of a specification of contextual facts about the context of use (i.e., facts about the time and location in which the utterance is made). Another point for clarification here (see entry on realism, section on new relativism for further details) is that, although the epistemic contextualist also takes knowledge attributions to be relative always to a “standards” parameter supplied by context, notice that for the contextualist, the value of this parameter will always be supplied by the context of use (which is a standard fixed, for a given attribution, once and for all), whereas the relativist takes the relevant standards parameter to be supplied completely independently of the context of use, always only by the context of assessment.
These two positions under the broad description of metaepistemological relativism—the explicitly relational kind of relativism Boghossian attributes to Rorty, and the semantically motivated “new age” relativism about knowledge attributions defended by MacFarlane—are strikingly different. Each appeals to distinctive kinds of considerations and is subject to distinctive kinds of criticisms. The former appeals, e.g., to considerations of tolerance and diversity (e.g., Rorty 1979, 1989). The latter appeals to patterns of our use of “knows” in the service of defending truth conditions for knowledge ascriptions; as such it is a semantic thesis. A point we will take up in §3.2 is the broader epistemological question of how to locate semantic theses about “knows” within epistemological theorizing.
2. Characterizations of epistemology
One thriving question in metaepistemology concerns how to characterize the subject matter of epistemology. What is epistemology about? What questions are genuine epistemological questions?
This section will discuss two dimensions to the “subject matter” question which have generated recent interest. The first (§2.1) concerns how and to what extent epistemic norms include the norms governing good inquiry, including, e.g., norms governing what inquiries to take up, and when to terminate them. The second (§2.2) concerns the respective places of belief versus credence in epistemology, and whether either should be regarded as of a more fundamental theoretical standing than the other.
2.1 Theory of knowledge, inquiry, and intellectual ethics
On one very wide conception of epistemology, epistemology is the “theory of knowledge”, including its nature (what is knowledge?) and scope (how much if any do we have?) This definition, though common, is of course inaccurate. Epistemologists are interested, for one thing, in epistemic justification, understanding, rationality, and their associated norms. For another, epistemologists—especially those working in the tradition of responsibilistvirtue epistemology (Zagzebski 1996, 2020; Baehr 2006, 2011; Tanesini 2021; Battaly 2015, 2018; Cassam 2019, 2020)—are interested in the kinds of character traits (e.g., openmindedness, intellectual honesty, intellectual courage) that put us in good positions to gain epistemically valuable goods (knowledge, justification, etc.) and which contribute to intellectual flourishing.
Is epistemology about all of these things, and if so, is there a way to characterize epistemology’s subject matter that isn’t too thin so as to apply to ethics and other areas?
One distinction within epistemology—very broadly construed—which offers a solution to this question is to distinguish between two distinct but complementary “sides” to epistemology: the side that concerns our evaluation of our constitutive attempts to gain knowledge (viz., our beliefs and our judgments about whether something is so), and the side that concerns our evaluation of which inquiries to take up, and how to sustain them given our limited resources, interests, and concerns. Ernest Sosa (2021: Ch. 2; see also 2015: Ch. 2) refers to these two sides of epistemology, broadly construed, as gnoseology and intellectual ethics, respectively.
To get a sense of this distinction, consider how we might evaluate an archer’s shot, aimed at a target. Even if this target was a poor target to have initially chosen as the object of one’s archery attempt from a practical point of view (perhaps hitting it will have bad ethical consequences, perhaps the target is too easy to be worthwhile), such a fact would be irrelevant to whether we should evaluate the shot as accurate when it in fact hits the target as intended, and for that matter, whether the shot is competent (i.e., if it issues from a skill to reliably enough hit the target in appropriate conditions), or apt (i.e., if it is accurate because competent), or fully apt (in that it aptness is attained aptly, and not just by accident or luck. In this respect, the success, competence, and aptness of a shot, as well as its full aptness, can all be appreciated as “sealed off” from many considerations—which speak well or poorly of the archer—that concern how the archer came to select that particular shot, and how else she has conducted herself in doing so. Some of the wisdom of shot selection is itself gnoseological, as when it bears importantly on whether the risk of failure it too high, the assured reliability sufficient. After all, these will bear on whether the shot will be not only apt but also fully apt, as not only its accuracy but also its aptness is aptly attained. Even so, we do care about wise rather than foolish shot selection in evaluating archery more holistically, where we import considerations that go beyond a focus on accuracy or aptness. We might admire an archer for choosing well, from a practical point of view, what targets to attempt and which to forbear from attempting, and for her resilience in continuing to pursue a worthy aim, despite obstacles.
On Sosa’s (2021) approach, what goes for the archer goes, mutatis mutandis, for the inquirer. Whereas our evaluation of the inquirer’s constitutive attempts at knowing (viz., her intellectual shots) are assessable as successful, competent, and apt—these are gnoseological or knowledge-related assessments—our evaluations of how the inquirer conducts herself as an inquirer—apart from her constitutive attempts at knowing—also matter, but some of these are best understood as part of a different normative domain of epistemology: intellectual ethics. Here we should distinguish the constitutive attempt to answer the pertinent question knowledgeably, and how that differs from the preliminary attempts to eventually answer the question knowledgeably. Once one gives one’s answer in the constitutive attempt to answer knowledgeably, that is no longer inquiry. Inquiry has a distinctive aim of its own, that of putting oneself in a position to constitutively make one’s attempt to answer knowledgeably. Once one is ready to answer, once one considers oneself to be in a position to make a proper such constitutive attempt, one ceases inquiring, and one then gives one’s answer, even if it is an answer that one gives to oneself in foro interno.
When you make a constitutive attempt to attain aptness on a question whether p, and especially when you inquire in the endeavor to put yourself in a position to make such a constitutive attempt and to do so aptly, both what you do in so inquiring, and what you do in making your constitutive attempt can be assessed either gnoseologically or in the broader way of intellectual ethics where anything goes, anything that bears on the desirability and appropriateness of such an attempt or such an endeavor. Gnoseological assessment can be of constitutive attempts to attain aptness or of endeavors to put oneself in a position to (aptly) make one’s constitutive attempt by actually answering the question aptly. Either way, the assessment is telically constrained by the gnoseological aims of attaining aptness of alethic affirmation, of correct (true) answer. Practical values are mostly irrelevant to such assessment, whether it is assessment of inquiry or assessment of constitutive attempts to answer a question knowledgeably. (But this is not to rule out that practical values might still be relevant at a deep global level. For example, they may still bear on the very norms and standards properly set by epistemic communities for when reliability is high enough to sustain long-term belief storage, beyond the time when one can be expected to retain the operative reasons for the storing of that belief.)
On Sosa’s view, drawing that distinction between gnoseology and intellectual ethics allows us to better appreciate the sense in which practical considerations bear importance in epistemology. While they do not matter for gnoseological assessment as such (with the exception noted), they are often important to intellectual ethics, viz., to the questions that one actually bothers to answer, even to those that one bothers to answer in constitutive attempts to answer aptly, and of course practical values matter also to what inquiries one takes up, and how one budgets intellectual resources. However, the distinction helps us to avoid conflating different kinds of intellectual norms, while at the same time allowing these different kinds of norms (of gnoseology and intellectual ethics) to coexist within a wider picture of intellectual life.
Sosa’s approach may be contrasted with three different kinds of approaches, due to Linda Zagzebski (1996, 2020), Christoph Kelp (2021a,b), and Jane Friedman (2020, forthcoming)—as each hold different views about how norms governing good (and bad) inquiry should be conceived of, in connection with norms governing belief, under the banner of epistemology. For Zagzebski, there can be no meaningful distinction between gnoseology and intellectual ethics because our constitutive attempts at knowing are exercises of intellectual character virtues that, themselves, reflect our motivations and values as inquirers. For example, for Zagzebski, knowledge just is gaining a true belief because of an intellectual virtue, which she construes as a
deep and enduring acquired intellectual excellence consisting of an admirable intellectual motive disposition and reliable success in reaching the truth because of the behavior to which that motive leads. (Zagzebski 2020: 103)
Thus, for Zagzebski, an evaluation of your attempt at knowing is at the same time is an evaluation of your intellectual character and motivations; there is for Zagzebski no knowledge compresent with bad intellectual motivations and thus with bad character (though see Sosa 2017: 148 and Carter forthcoming: 2 for criticisms in the case of perceptual knowledge).
A different take on these two landscapes, which lines up more closely with Sosa than with Zagzebski, is due to Christoph Kelp (2021a), who construes epistemology as the theory of inquiry. According to Kelp, we should “take inquiry (or finding out about things) as the starting point for epistemological theorizing” (Kelp 2021a: 2). Whereas Sosa takes constitutive attempts at knowing—viz., belief and judgments—to have have aims internal to them (with inquiry itself best understood a wider kind of activity within which we make these attempts), Kelp takes inquiry itself to be a kind of activity with an aim, where the particular aim of a given inquiry depends on the type of inquiry it is. For Kelp, knowledge is the constitutive aim of inquiry into specific questions (e.g., whether Frege ever met Russell) and understanding is the constitutive aim of inquiry into general phenomena (e.g., the UK’s exit from the European Union, the rise of the Roman Empire, etc.). While Kelp doesn’t attempt to analyze either knowledge or understanding reductively, he offers non-reductive “network” analyses for both knowledge and understanding which are meant to elucidate the nature of knowledge and understanding in terms of their place in inquiry.
A fourth kind of picture is developed in recent work by Jane Friedman (2020; forthcoming). Like Sosa, Friedman distinguishes between norms that govern believing and norms that govern ways of inquiring, the latter of which she terms “zetetic” norms. How are zetetic norms related to epistemic norms? Friedman’s answer is that they are often in stark tension with one another, and in ways epistemologists have often overlooked. As she puts it,
That some judgment or belief is, by our current measures, in impeccable epistemic standing is not a good guide to whether it’s an acceptable judgment to make in inquiry. (2020: 533)
The extent of the tension between these two kinds of norms, Friedman claims, raises a kind of puzzle, given the presumably close connection between the epistemic and the zetetic, viz., between aimed believing and aimed inquiring. According to Friedman,
I think following just those thoughts through calls for a revision to our standard epistemic norms, and perhaps even a significant one. The only alternative seems to me to involve insisting on a fairly radical separation of epistemology and a theory of inquiry. (2020: 533)
2.2 Belief-based and credence-based epistemology
One of the most significant divides in contemporary epistemology concerns the granularity of the target psychological phenomena of interest: some projects in epistemology (e.g., the traditional analysis of knowledge) make use primarily of belief and its cognates (e.g., disbelief, and suspended judgment)—all of which are comparatively coarse grained in comparison with credences—the target psychological phenomena of central interest to Bayesian epistemologists—which are fine-grained and precise, and which represent a thinker’s subjective probability or confidence with respect to a proposition.
A metaepistemological research question that has generated much discussion recently asks how we should understand the relationship between belief and credence within epistemology generally. Is either more fundamental to answering questions of epistemological interest than the other?
One trivial approach to resolving such questions is implied by those epistemologists who are eliminativists about either belief or credence but not the other. For example, Richard Jeffrey (1970) and more recently Richard Pettigrew (2016) affirm credences while denying that beliefs exist (or at least express sympathy to denying this, in Pettigrew’s case); by contrast, Richard Holton (2008) takes the opposite position, affirming beliefs while denying that credences exist.
These eliminativist positions are the minority (for discussion see E. Jackson 2020); more common are positions that either regard belief or credence to be more fundamental than the other, or that neither is more fundamental than the other (i.e., belief-credence dualism—see Staffel 2019; Buchak 2014; E. Jackson forthcoming; Weisberg 2020). Non-eliminativists who deny dualism typically defend either that (i) credence is a species of belief (or can be explained in terms of or otherwise reduced to belief), or that belief is a species of credence (or can be explained in terms of otherwise reduced to credence). The former kind of position is usually described as the “belief-first” position (e.g., Moon & Jackson 2020; Holton 2008; Easwaran 2016; Moon 2018; Carter, Jarvis, & Rubin 2016), the latter as the “credence-first” position (e.g., Wedgwood 2012; Greco 2015; Weatherson 2005; Lee & Silvia 2022).
While it might be tempting to think that the “belief-first” versus “credence-first” debate is a proxy for a wider debate about whether the research agenda and questions of mainstream epistemology are more fundamental than those of formal epistemology (e.g., Bayesianism), this inference would be too quick.
For example, as Scott Sturgeon (2020: 2) points out, the informal/formal distinction, ostensibly a methodological distinction, does not line up neatly with the belief/credence distinction in granularity. Although there is of course informal work in epistemology on coarse-grained attitudes (an example here is traditional work on the Gettier problem and the JTB analysis of knowledge; see entry on the analysis of knowledge), there is also informal work in epistemology on fine-grained attitudes—an example Sturgeon notes is Keith Lehrer’s work on comparative confidence. Likewise, some projects in epistemology use formal methods to explore the epistemology of belief (see, e.g., Pollock 1987) as well as, more typically, the epistemology of credence.
Putting this together, Sturgeon’s contention is that a granularity/methodology pairing in epistemology is misleading, and that more accurate is a picture that makes room for four broad kinds of project-types in epistemology, which pair combinations of formal and informal methods with combinations of coarse-grained and fine-grained attitudes, as represented in the following 2×2 matrix:
|Informal||Informal work on belief and its revision (A)||Informal work on rational confidence and its revision (B)|
|Formal||Formal work on rational belief and its revision (C)||Formal work on rational confidence and its revision (D)|
Table 1 (Sturgeon 2020: 2)
If the epistemology of belief includes both informal (A) and formal (C) approaches, and the epistemology of credence also admits of formal (D) and informal approaches (B), we can envision how this might differently frame the “credence-first” versus “belief-first” debate described above. For one thing, this wider option space would invite us to ask whether (under the credence-first slogan) we should think of cells B and D as more fundamental than work in cells A and C, or rather, just that work in cell D is more fundamental than work in cell A. Likewise, the wider option space invites us to consider whether (under the belief-first slogan) we should think of cells A and C as more fundamental than work in cells B and D, or rather, just that work in cell A is more fundamental than work in cell D.
Furthermore, we might imagine an even further expansion of our 2x2 matrix to a 3x3 matrix. Consider that the above picture, divided four ways, does not neatly make room for epistemological projects that combine coarse-grained and fine-grained attitudes. One example is Jennifer Lackey’s (2000) approach to defeaters in epistemology—in which a sufficientdegrees of confidence against the target proposition can undermine the justification one has for believing the target proposition. Another example is Sosa’s approach to suspension of judgment (2021: Ch. 4), which combines coarse-grained and fine-grained attitudes in the an evaluation of the quality of suspension of judgment. That is, for Sosa, the quality of suspended judgment is sensitive to both (i) the competence by which you align your degrees of confidence with your corresponding degrees of epistemic probability, as well as (ii) the competence by which you judge or suspend within the respective proper bounds of confidence. Finally, our table expands even more when we make room for cases of mixed methodology (formal and informal) to subject matter that includes combinations of coarse-grained, fine-grained and mixed attitudes of interest.
These complications provide a useful perspective to revisit the initial “credence-first” versus “belief-first” literature. It suggests exercising caution in moving too quickly from claims about whether credence or belief “reduce to” or “are a species of” the other, to more wide-reaching conclusions about whether one or the other—or for that matter, the kinds of methods and projects ordinarily associated with one or another—is of more fundamental epistemological interest.
3. Methodology in epistemology
This section briefly surveys four methodological issues in epistemology, each of which raise (different) and contested issues about the best ways of doing epistemology. The focus in particular will be on (§3.1) the legitimacy of assumptions we make about the nature and scope of knowledge in the course of investigating these very things; (§3.2) what kind of analyses (conceptual, semantic, metaphysical) our epistemological inquiries should be understood as seeking; and (§3.3) the place of experimental results in epistemology.
3.1 Methodism and particularism
The (very broad) characterization of epistemology as the “theory of knowledge”—even if strictly speaking an oversimplified picture—is often associated with two different questions about knowledge:
- What do we know?
- How do we know?
The answer to the first might include both specific knowledge (i.e., your knowledge that you have a hand) or types of knowledge—viz., we have knowledge of mathematics, knowledge of the past, knowledge of the qualitative character of our experiences, etc. An answer to the second kind of question would look very different. An answer to the second would give us criteria (or canons, methods, principles, or the like) that would explain how we know whatever it is that we do know (Sosa 1980: 4; cf., Cassam (2007) for a slightly different “how possible” reading of this second question).
Because these are different questions of interest—seeking different kinds of answers—epistemologists have long debated which to take up first in epistemological theorizing. This methodological question is vexed, because it may seem as though we cannot begin to answer the first question without already having an answer to the second (viz., we can’t identify instances of knowledge absent knowledge of general criteria for identifying those instances), but we can’t know what the criteria are without reference to particular cases in connection with which we could then identify such criteria. According to Roderick Chisholm, the problem of resolving this prima facie tension—the “Problem of the Criterion”—constitutes
one of the most important and one of the most difficult of all the problems of philosophy. I am tempted to say that one has not begun to philosophize until one has faced this problem and has recognized how unappealing, in the end, each possible solution is. (Chisholm 1973: 12).
The canonical non-skeptical approaches to the problem are particularism and methodism (for overviews, see Fumerton 2008; Amico 1993; McCain 2014 [Other Internet Resources]; Cling 1994; Vahid 2005). The particularist strategy (e.g., Chisholm 1977) begins with the first question and on this basis then answers the second question, albeit, in a way that would seem to assume ex ante the falsity of skepticism. The methodist makes no such initial assumption that we have any knowledge at all (i.e., no assumption about what we know) and instead first answers the more general question about what the criteria are for knowing, and then only on this basis then (with reference to such criteria) answers question (i).
The analysis of knowledge from the middle 20th century onward (see Ichikawa & Steup 2012 ) largely follows a particularist strategy, in so far as, especially following Gettier (1963), candidate criteria for knowing are tested for adequacy against paradigmatic cases of knowledge as reference points (Shope 1983). Such a strategy marks a shift from earlier influential strategies, such as by Descartes and Hume, both of whom took as a starting point—and in a way that is in principle open to skepticism—that only the obvious and what is proved deductively on its basis can possibly be known (Sosa 1980: 4). Whereas a standard objection against the particularist is that she begs the question against the skeptic, the most standard objection against the methodist starting point is not so easily captured. As Chisholm puts it, beginning (as the methodist does) with a broad generalization would
leave us completely in the dark so far as concerns what reasons he may have for adopting this particular criterion rather than some other. (Chisholm 1973: 67)
On one way of reading the objection, starting with a broad generalization is objectionably arbitrary; however, the extent of the arbitrariness here would plausibly depend on whether the methodist can adduce a reason in favor of her broad starting point which doesn’t itself involve pointing to specific instances of knowledge (see, e.g., Amico 1988).
The particularism/methodism divide connects naturally to other wider issues of interest in epistemology. First, a strong methodist starting point, such as the starting point from Descartes and Hume, implies a foundationalist approach to the structure of justified belief and knowledge. That is, Descartes and Hume opt for foundationalism by way of taking the particular methodist starting point that they do. Second, the particularism/methodism divide might well be such that other epistemological problems of interest are special cases of this problem. For example, James Van Cleve (1979) and Sosa (2009) both regard the Cartesian Circle as closely connected with the Problem of the Criterion in this way. Third, while the Problem of the Criterion in epistemology is typically formulated in connection with the project of analyzing knowledge, the philosophical problems associated with methodism or particularism (and which might be our proper starting point) apply, mutatis mutandis, to projects in epistemology that investigate other epistemic phenomena of interest, including, e.g., epistemic justification, understanding, intellectual virtues, and the like. And, as a point of philosophical method, the problem might also be appreciated as a philosophical problem about philosophical method, one that extends beyond epistemology to other kinds of philosophical analyses (for discussion see Fumerton 1995, 2008).
3.2 Analyses in epistemology: semantic, conceptual and metaphysical
The project of analyzing knowledge is often identified with the task of satisfactorily filling in the English schema “S knows that p if and only if ___ ”
In the first place, we can assess which attempts are satisfactory ((Ichikawa & Steup 2018; Shope 1983; Littlejohn & Carter 2021: Ch. 5), or whether all attempts are bound to fail (e.g., Williamson 2000, 2007). Alternatively, from a metaepistemological perspective, we may step back and ask what kind of thing we are doing when attempting to complete this schema? What is being investigated? Different answers here track different metaepistemological assumptions about the role of analyses in epistemology (Sosa 2017: 66–7). (This point applies generally to analyses in epistemology, though for illustrative purposes here, we will focus on the simple “S knows that p” analysis.)
Here is one kind of metaepistemological answer: By filling in the above English schema, we are attempting to give a semantic analysis of the linguistic expression “S knows that p”. Those engaged in this project are investigating meaning. Of course, one aim might (distally) to investigate one thing by investigating (proximately) another. And so the epistemologist might purport to investigate knowledge rather than merely meaning by means of a semantic analysis of “S knows that p”. This is, in fact, the kind of position taken by various researchers who maintain that their positions about the semantics of knowledge attributions should be understood as casting light on the nature of knowledge (e.g., Stanley 2005; DeRose 2009; MacFarlane 2005; 2008b).
One limitation to this strategy—viz., the strategy of investigating knowledge by way of investigating the meaning of knows—is that (i) when aiming to establish facts about meaning, we appeal inevitably to patterns of use; and (ii) the connection between meaning and use is (as the philosophy of language since the 1960s has shown) at most indirect (e.g., Grice 1989; Searle 1969). As John MacFarlane captures this idea:
Even if we restrict ourselves to sincere, knowledgeable informants, the most we can discern directly from their use of sentences are the conditions in which they find it reasonable to use these sentences to make assertions. And these are not the same as the truth conditions. (2008b: 783)
A metaepistemological task of epistemologists putting forward semantic analyses—as theses with import in epistemology—is to articulate how we should understand the evidential import of both (i) patterns of use (e.g., of “knows”) in supporting semantic analyses (i.e., truth conditions); and (ii) semantic analyses in establishing nature of the referents of the terms that feature in those analyses.
A second metaepistemological answer to the question of what one is doing when filling in the schema “S knows that p if and only if ___ ” is that one is illuminating something about the concept (or concepts) expressed by that schema. This answer will be a familiar one for those who view philosophy, and so epistemology, as centrally engaged in conceptual analysis (F. Jackson 1998; cf., Williamson 2018; see also for discussion Balcerak Jackson 2013). What are we investigating when inquiring about concepts? According to Jackson, filling in the “S knows that p” would—if a matter of investigating concepts—be in the service of explicating our folk theory of knowledge by way of elucidating our concepts (F. Jackson 1998: 31–33; for discussion see Beaney 2003 : §5), or perhaps we are investigating what is involved in someone’s possession and/or deployment of a given concept (Sosa 2015: Chapter 1). Such a characterization, both of philosophy and by extension of epistemology, has been subject to sustained recent criticism from Williamson (2007, 2014, 2018). One common thread of argument Williamson adverts to draws an analogy between philosophy and physics. Physicists, who also complete English schemas, are not plausibly regarded as investigating words and concepts; by parity of reasoning, it is unclear why epistemologists (or philosophers generally) should be thought to be investigating merely words and concepts (rather than knowledge) any more than physicists are investigating words and concepts.
This brings us to a third kind of analysis, metaphysical analysis. As Sosa puts it, when analyzing knowledge:
Here our focus is on an objective phenomenon that need be neither expression nor concept. Our focus is rather on a state that people host or an act that they perform. This is the phenomenon whose ontology we now wish to understand. What is the nature of such a state or act, and how is it grounded? In virtue of what is it actual when it is actual? (Sosa 2015: Chapter 1)
Given that, by ostensibly completing the English schema “S knows that p if and only if ___ ” one might take herself to be engaged in either semantic, conceptual, or metaphysical analyses, there is an important role for metaepistemology to play here, in untangling potential conflations between projects. A further metaepistemological question is—just as we may ask how semantic analyses should inform metaphysical analyses, we may also ask in what way conceptual analyses inform both semantic analyses and metaphysical analyses. For more comprehensive discussion of the place (and varieties) of analysis in analytic philosophy more generally, see the entry analysis.
3.3 Experimental epistemology
A relatively recent trend in epistemology—experimental epistemology—(Beebe 2012, 2016; Beebe & Monaghan 2018; Gerken & Beebe 2016; Turri 2016a,b, 2018; Buckwalter 2012; Colaço et al. 2014; Carter, Pritchard, & Shepherd 2019) uses the methodology of psychology, cognitive, and other sciences (e.g., digital humanities—see Alfano, Carter, & Cheong 2018) to study (typically) patterns of knowledge, justification and other epistemic attributions. Results reported have at least two kinds of potential import in epistemology: first, results may be seen as bearing on what is or is not believed intuitively by people generally, and differentially on the basis of cultural and intellectual backgrounds (e.g., Weinberg, Nichols, & Stich 2001; Colaço et al. 2014); second, and more ambitiously, such results may be taken to challenge or support the truth of epistemological positions that are generally held (Sosa 2007b: 99; see also for discussion Beebe 2016; Knobe & Nichols 2017; Horvath & Koch 2021; Turri 2016a).
Two notable examples where experimental results have been taken to stand in prima facie tension with orthodox positions in epistemology concern knowledge attributions in cases with (i) shifting stakes and (ii) unsafe beliefs. In the former case, experimental results reported in early papers in experimental epistemology surprisingly did not corroborate a key datum of use appealed to by epistemic contextualists; that is, contextualists such as Keith DeRose (1992, 2009) have relied on the thought that—in “bank” cases (1992: 913)—it is felicitous to attribute knowledge in low-stakes cases but not in high-stakes cases. Critics of contextualism had generally accepted this point about use patterns while challenging the reasoning from here to a contextualist semantics for “knows”. However, early experimental epistemology papers by Buckwalter (2010), Feltz and Zarpentine (2010), and May et al. (2010) reported that participants were similarly inclined to attribute knowledge across cases with shifting stakes, in both low- and high-stakes cases (for discussion see Knobe & Nichols 2017: §2.4).
Another kind of arguably surprising type of result from experimental epistemology concerns “Gettier cases”, and in two distinct ways: first by suggesting the Gettier “intuition” (viz., that the subject lacks knowledge in standard Gettier cases), is highly sensitive to cultural background (Weinberg, Nichols, & Stich 2001). In particular, Weinberg et al.’s (2001) study reported results indicating that laypersons with East and South Asian cultural backgrounds were inclined (more so than those with Western backgrounds) to attribute knowledge in standard Gettier cases. This paper generated debate about the philosophical import of these results, and led to further related studies. Perhaps most notably, this includes a 2017 study by Machery et al. which presented evidence that the Gettier intuition was present across four cultures speaking different languages: Brazil, India, Japan, and the USA.
Relatedly, a now well-replicated result in experimental epistemology concerns laypersons’ judgments in “fake-barn” style Gettier cases (e.g., Ginet 1975; Goldman 1976). In fake-barn cases, referred to also as “environmental luck” cases by Duncan Pritchard (2005, 2007, 2015), the unsafety of the subject’s target belief is entirely down to her being situated in an epistemically risky environment (e.g., an environment with near-by error possibilities). Whereas a common position in mainstream epistemology is that a belief falls short of knowledge provided it is unsafe—viz., if too easily the belief would have been incorrect (see, e.g., Pritchard 2005, 2007; Engel 1992; Luper-Foy 1984; Sainsbury 1997; Greco 2010; cf, however, Sosa 2007a, 2010; Hetherington 2013; Baumann 2014), studies in experimental epistemology have pressed back against this orthodoxy. For example, experiments by Colaço et al. (2014), Turri, Buckwalter, and Blouw (2015), and Turri (2016b) reported that participants were more inclined than not to attribute knowledge in fake barn cases (with a majority of 80% of participants registering this view in Turri 2016b).
Experimental results in epistemology raise metaepistemological questions. One such question concerns the extent to which facts about our patterns of using “knows” should inform epistemological theory (see §3.2). Another related metaepistemological question of relevance here asks what the role of intuition is in epistemological theorizing; this bears relevance to the extent that experimental results purport to be testing folk (and expert) intuitions about cases. A third metaepistemological question experimental results in epistemology encourage concerns the comparative weight we should give to folk judgments about cases. A well-known position on this question—viz., the expertise reply—(e.g., Williamson 2011; Ludwig 2007; Kauppinen 2007) maintains that philosophers’ judgments about cases will plausibly be more reliable than those of laypersons, given that the former’s training would lead them to be more sensitive to nuances of the cases assessed, as well as to be less likely to be less susceptible to irrelevant distorting effects (Egler & Ross 2020: 1079). For criticism of the expertise defense, see e.g., Machery (2015) and Mizrahi (2015).
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- McCain, Kevin, 2014, “Problem of the Criterion”, in Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.