Natural Properties

First published Fri Sep 13, 2019

Consider the following pairs of properties. (As is common in the literature on this topic, this entry will use the words ‘property’ and ‘relation’ interchangeably. Properties in the usual sense are distinguished as “monadic”, and relations in the usual sense as “polyadic”.)

Column 1 Column 2
being a triangle being a three-to-five sided figure none of whose sides is more than one-and-a-half times as long as any other
intersecting at an angle of 90 degrees intersecting at an angle of 87 degrees
being electrically charged being negatively charged and not part of a fish
being composed entirely of carbon dioxide molecules being a cappucino
being green being grue (Goodman 1954): either green and observed before a certain time \(t\) or blue and not observed before \(t\).
being natural numbers \(x\), \(y\), \(z\) such that \(z = x+y\). being natural numbers \(x\), \(y\), \(z\) such that \(z\) is \(x\) quus \(y\) (Kripke 1982): that is, either \(z=x+y\) and \(x+y\lt 57\), or \(z=5\) and \(x+y\ge 57\).

Table 1. Pairs of properties

It is easy to get enough of a feel for what is going on in this table to the point where one could confidently say, for many other such pairs, which would be better to put in Column 1 and which in the Column 2. This article is concerned with a semi-technical use of the word ‘natural’ which can be illustrated by these examples: in each case, the property in the Column 1 is more natural than the corresponding property in the Column 2. This use has deep historical roots (see §2), but was cemented in a seminal paper by David Lewis (1983), and has subsequently been taken up by many other authors.

Despite what the word may suggest, the claim that one property is more natural than another is not meant to entail that the latter is in any sense created or influenced by human beings to a greater extent than the former. Even when a property is highly unnatural, we may have little or no ability to influence what instantiates it, or whether it exists. (Indeed many hold that all properties exist necessarily.) For this reason it may be misleading to use ‘artificial’ as the antonym of ‘natural’. ‘Arbitrary’ is better, and ‘gerrymandered’ is popular.

Those who use ‘natural’ in the relevant way conceive naturalness to be an objective matter, at least in the following sense: if \(F\) is more natural than \(G\), \(F\) would still have been more natural than \(G\) if our interests and practices had been very different, and indeed even if intelligent life had not existed at all. Most would endorse the stronger claim that when \(F\) is more natural than \(G\), it is necessary that \(F\) is more natural than \(G\).[1]

Like most philosophical terms of art which lack official, uncontroversial definitions, the relevant use of ‘natural’ is controversial: many philosophers regard it as too unclear, or too closely tied to some false presupposition, to be helpful. Among this group, some would go so far as to deny that there is any interesting or theoretically important relation holding between the pairs of properties listed in the above table, at least if we set aside relations (like being expressible more briefly than) whose pattern of instantiation would have been different if our interests or practices had been different. On this picture, the very idea that some properties are more natural than others embodies a mistaken projection onto the world itself of differences which are in fact just a matter of the contingent concerns and purposes of human beings.

Nevertheless, the notion of a natural property has enjoyed a wide currency in recent philosophy, especially in metaphysics. Lewis develops a rich body of theory in which naturalness plays a central part, and other philosophers have built on and modified Lewis’s ideas in various ways. As we will see in §3, naturalness has been invoked in theorising about a wide range of topics, including similarity, modality, laws of nature, mental and linguistic content, ampliative inference, and epistemic value. These roles provide many different ways of getting a grip on what naturalness is supposed to be, and why it might be interesting and theoretically important.

1. Perfect naturalness and degrees of naturalness

Naturalness comes in degrees. But an important part of Lewis’s picture, also dominant in the subsequent literature, is that it has a maximal degree. Some properties are perfectly natural. They are all equally natural, and no properties are more natural than them. Lewis also calls these “fundamental” properties. And the connotations of the word ‘fundamental’ are apt. According to Lewis, there is a good sense in which one would have exhaustively described the world if one said which things (or \(n\)-tuples of things) instantiate each perfectly natural property, and in which one would have failed to exhaustively describe the world if one merely provided this information for some but not all of the perfectly natural properties. As we will see in §4.4, Lewis cashes out these thoughts in modal terms: all truths are necessitated by the truths about the distribution of all perfectly natural properties, but not by the truths about the distribution of only some of the perfectly natural properties. Others, like Sider (2011), have explored quite different ways of cashing them out.

Giving examples of perfectly natural properties is not supposed to be easy. Views that identify certain properties as perfectly natural are bold hypotheses about the fundamental structure of reality, and thus bound up with many central debates in metaphysics. According to Lewis, the methods of physics have a central role to play in the project of identifying the perfectly natural properties. Until we have the kind of final theory that many physicists are aiming for, we should not hope to be able to list the actually-instantiated perfectly natural properties.[2] But looking to physics in this way is already taking a stand on many controversial questions in philosophy. Those inclined towards dualism in the philosophy of mind (see the entries on dualism and physicalism) may hold that some mental properties—for example, consciousness, or specific phenomenal states, or relations like acquaintance, judgment or knowledge—are perfectly natural; indeed, this might with some plausibility be regarded as definitive of dualism. Similarly, those inclined towards “non-naturalist realism” in metaethics (see the entry on moral non-naturalism) may hold that some normative or evaluative properties, such as goodness, betterness, or moral permissibility, are perfectly natural.

Perfect naturalness is generally understood to be definable in terms of relative naturalness: a property is perfectly natural just in case no property is more natural than it. But Lewis also held that relative naturalness could be defined in terms of perfect naturalness: \(F\) is more natural than \(G\) just in case \(F\) has a shorter and less complex definition in terms of perfectly natural properties than \(G\) (Lewis 1986b, 61). Here, a “definition” of a property can be understood as an expression referring to that property in a formal language which only has simple predicates expressing perfectly natural properties (in addition to certain logical resources which allow complex predicates to be constructed out of these simple ones).[3] This claim has been controversial even among naturalness enthusiasts. One influential worry (raised in Sider 1995) is that many of the properties we are interested in, and between which we need to draw distinctions of naturalness (e.g. greenness and grueness), will only have infinite definitions in terms of the perfectly natural properties, so that they will all come out equally natural.[4] Nevertheless, length and complexity of definitions has been broadly accepted at least as a heuristic guide. For example, someone who held that adjacency and chargedness were perfectly natural would be expected to hold that being adjacent to something charged is more natural than being adjacent to an uncharged thing that is adjacent to something charged.

2. History

The history of philosophical theorising about properties and property-like entities (concepts, predicates, terms, forms, universals, qualities…) contains many contrasts that seem broadly similar to the contrast between more and less natural properties, or between perfectly natural properties and the rest. A few examples:

  • In a much-cited passage in the Phaedrus (265e), Plato says giving a good definition involves “dividing things… where the natural joints are, and not trying to break any part, after the manner of a bad carver”.
  • Elsewhere (Parmenides 130a–e), Plato suggests that some but not all predicates correspond to Forms: there are Forms of justice, beauty, and goodness but no Forms of hair, mud, or dirt. (See the entry on Plato’s Parmenides)
  • Aristotle (De Interpretatione 11: 20b15–22) distinguishes between terms with “unity”, like ‘white’, ‘walking’, ‘man’, ‘animal’, and ‘rational animal’, and other terms that lack unity, like ‘walking white man’. He also makes a further distinction between genuine terms (which include both those with and without unity) and ‘indefinite names’ like ‘non-walking’ and ‘non-man’.
  • In classical and medieval Indian philosophy, the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika tradition distinguishes “genuine universals” (jāti) from “imposed” or “nominal” properties (upādhi). The tenth-century logician Udayana lists six “impediments” which can be used to show that a word does not stand for a jāti: for example, no two jāti are coextensive, and if two jāti share an instance, then one is such that every instance of it is also an instance of the other. (For more details and citations, see the entry on analytic philosophy in Early Modern India.)
  • There is a long tradition (stretching back to Plato and Aristotle) according to which some properties (terms, concepts, forms,…) are simple (primitive, indefinable, unanalysable), and while the remainder are complex—some more complex than others—and in some sense “definable” from the simple ones. One author who is particularly interested in this contrast, and who conceives of it in a way that makes it clearly one of metaphysics as opposed to mere human psychology, is Leibniz. He argues that there must be absolutely simple terms for it to be possible to conceive of anything at all (Mates 1986, 58). He has no settled view as regards what these absolutely simple terms are, although he does at one point (Leibniz 1680–85) suggest a list of “simpler” terms in terms of which all others can be defined.
  • The founding figures of analytic philosophy continue this tradition. Moore (1903, §1.7) argues that ‘good’ denotes something “simple and unanalysable”, whereas ‘horse’ denotes something complex. (See the entry on G. E. Moore.) Bertrand Russell (1918, 111) claims that the “ultimate simples, out of which the world is built” include simple particulars, simple qualities, and simple relations. (See the entry on Russell’s logical atomism.) Later, Ramsey (1925) argues for eliminating all complex properties, so that most predicates will not correspond to properties at all.
  • In David Armstrong’s theory of universals (Armstrong 1978), which Lewis credits as the main inspiration for his work on naturalness, many predicates do not correspond to universals at all; moreover, some universals are more complex than others, and some may indeed be perfectly simple.

The tradition of theorising about “simple” and “complex” properties is a particularly important antecedent for the contemporary use of ‘natural’, for two reasons. First, one can ask both whether a property is more or less simple than some other property, and whether it is perfectly simple. Second, whereas it is supposed to be relatively easy to tell in many cases that a property is complex, identifying perfectly simple properties is generally not supposed to be easy: such claims need to be argued for as part of some ambitious metaphysical theory. The central difference between this traditional use of ‘simple’ and the contemporary use of ‘natural’ is that the former use is bound up with a battery of assumed analogies between properties and other kinds of entities—concrete objects, or linguistic expressions—which the latter use does not require. The claim that a property is complex is understood to entail that in some sense it has other properties as “parts”, from which it is “put together”; the perfectly simple properties are exactly those that lack parts—the analogues of letters or words in the realm of linguistic expressions. The paradigm for “parthood” is the relation between the conjunction of two properties and each of those two properties: for example, being red and being square would be taken to be parts of being red and square. Indeed, for most of the history of this tradition this seems to be the only clearly recognised form of complexity; insofar as properties like not being red and square are recognised at all, they seem to be excluded from the domain to which distinctions of simplicity are to be applied. Only relatively late, in the works of authors like Moore and Russell, do we find a picture where conjunction is merely one of several different operations for building complex properties, others including disjunction, existential quantification, etc. The contemporary use of ‘natural’ is plausibly seen as a cleaned-up version of this older tradition, purged of the additional assumptions that might be read into the mereological terminology. It is compatible with the thesis of “intensionalism”, according to which necessarily coextensive properties are identical; Lewis was in fact an influential defender of this thesis. Given intensionalism, the fact that a property can be derived from other properties by logical operations like conjunction cannot rule out its being perfectly natural, since even a perfectly natural property \(F\) will be identical to the conjunction of \(F\)-or-\(G\) with \(F\)-or-not-\(G\), for any other property \(G\). However the contemporary use is also compatible with finer-grained views about the identity of properties, and it would be natural for proponents of such views to hold that no perfectly natural property is a conjunction, disjunction, existential quantification, etc. Such generalizations will be considered further in §4.10 below.

3. Related uses of ‘natural’

‘Natural’ is sometimes used in ways that are closely related to our target use, but applied to things other than properties. This section will survey some of these uses and discuss how they might relate to the target use.

3.1 Natural classes

As part of his notorious “modal realism” (see §6 of the entry on David Lewis), Lewis identified properties with sets: for example, the property of being a talking donkey is just the set of all talking donkeys (a set which Lewis, surprisingly, held to be nonempty). Few philosophers have accepted this view. The dominant view is that distinct properties can have exactly the same instances, although distinct sets never have exactly the same members. Many are nevertheless happy to apply ‘natural’ to sets (or classes) as well as properties: for example, the class of all green things would be counted as more natural than the class of grue things.

It seems plausible that there should be some intimate connection between this notion of naturalness for classes and naturalness for properties; but it is not obvious how it should be spelled out. Since there seem to be differences in naturalness among coextensive properties—for example, being charged seems more natural than being charged and not a talking donkey—identifying a property’s degree of naturalness with that of its extension (the class of its instances) is not a promising approach. More plausibly, one might identify the degree of naturalness of a class with the maximum degree of naturalness of the properties whose extension it is, or with some kind of aggregate of the degrees of naturalness of these properties. However, this may still be too simple, since there is a case that the naturalness of other properties need to be taken into account. For example, if there is a very natural equivalence relation (reflexive, symmetric, transitive relation) with only a few equivalence classes, we might want to count those equivalence classes as highly natural even if they are not the extensions of any highly natural monadic properties.

3.2 Plural naturalness.

Especially since Boolos (1984), it is widely accepted that there is an important distinction between plural quantification (‘there are some things such that…them…’) and singular quantification over sets (‘there is a set of things such that…it…’), and between applying a predicate collectively to some things (‘these people could lift a piano’) and applying a predicate to a set (‘this set of people could lift a piano’) (see the entry on plural quantification).[5] ‘Natural’ is sometimes used as a plural predicate (Dorr 2007; Rosen 2015). It would be tendentious to equate the claim that some things are collectively natural with the claim that they form a natural class: for example, the things that are not charged seem collectively rather natural, although they presumably do not form a class (since if they did, it would have to include itself as a member). It is more plausible to go the other way, analysing ‘natural class’ as ‘class whose members are collectively natural’. The task of explaining plural naturalness in terms of the naturalness of properties raises similar difficulties to that of explaining the naturalness of classes.

3.3 Natural propositions and concepts

Once one is accustomed to comparing the naturalness of properties, it is natural to want to extend such comparisons to propositions. For example, the proposition that some things are green should count as more natural than the proposition that some things are grue. While the use of ‘natural’ to apply to propositions is rare, talk of propositions—or of proposition-like entities like hypotheses, theories, accounts, proposals, etc.—as being more or less simple is ubiquitous, in science as well as philosophy, and arguably amounts to the same thing.

A few authors identify propositions with properties: for example, Lewis (1986b, 53–4) holds that the proposition that some swans are blue is being a world containing a blue swan. Others (e.g. Bealer 1982) reject this identification, but still treat propositions as property-like: as binary relations stand to the number 2 and monadic properties stand to 1, propositions stand to 0. Given either of these views, the notion of a natural proposition should raise no new difficulties.[6]

This way of thinking of propositions is not universal, however. For many authors, a central role of propositions is to play a certain role in the theory of mental states and/or linguistic meaning (see the entry on propositions). This role is often taken to motivate an account of propositions as more “finely individuated” than properties. For example, some would distinguish the proposition that there are vixens from the proposition that there are female foxes, on the grounds that someone could believe one but not the other, while also identifying the property of being a vixen with the property of being a female fox. Many who hold such views also recognise a coarser-grained domain of entities—sometimes called ‘states of affairs’ (see the entry on states of affairs)—that stand to 0 as \(n\)-ary properties stand to \(n\). Some also recognise fine-grained entities, sometimes called concepts, that stand to positive integers as propositions stand to 0. For example, they may say that the concept being a vixen is distinct from the concept being a female fox, although they correspond to the same property. In this setting, it is less obvious how one might understand comparisons of naturalness for propositions and concepts, assuming one wants to allow for differences in naturalness between distinct propositions corresponding to the same state of affairs, or between distinct concepts corresponding to the same property. The question how such comparisons might be conceived, and whether they have anything to do with naturalness for properties, will depend on issues in the theory of mental and linguistic content that are beyond the scope of this article.

3.4 ‘Natural’ as a higher-order predicate

We have been assuming an “abundant” theory of properties, on which we can take for granted that there are such properties as being negatively charged and not part of a fish, being grue, and so on. But one can easily slip into inconsistency in talking like this. The obvious generalization is the following schema:

Naïve Comprehension
For any \(x\), \(\phi(x)\) if and only if \(x\) instantiates being an \(x\) such that \(\phi(x)\)

Unfortunately, this is inconsistent (given classical logic) because of Russell’s paradox: it entails that being an \(x\) such that \(x\) does not instantiate \(x\) instantiates itself if and only if it doesn’t instantiate itself, and hence that it both does and does not instantiate itself. So any “abundant” theory of properties needs to be crafted with care.

Lewis combined the identification of properties with classes with a standard mathematical theory of sets and classes (Lewis 1991), on which some things—such as the classes—are too numerous to form a class. His view thus provides for such properties as being grue, but provides no good candidate referents for terms like ‘being a property’, ‘being instantiated by all triangles’, ‘identity’, ‘being more natural than’, etc. Intuitive claims like ‘identity is more natural than being as tall as’ are thus hard to accommodate.

One possible reaction to this situation is to regiment ‘is perfectly natural’, ‘is more natural than’, etc. not as ordinary predicates—expressions that combine with names or ordinary variables to form sentences—but as higher-order predicates: expressions that combine directly with ordinary predicates to form sentences, just as ordinary predicates combine with names and pronouns. In such a regimentation, we can form well-formed formulae like \[x = y \land \text{AsTallAs}(x,y) \land \text{MoreNatural}(=, \text{AsTallAs}) \] where the symbols ‘=’ and ‘AsTallAs’ occur without equivocation both as predicates taking the variables ‘\(x\)’ and ‘\(y\)’ as arguments, and as the arguments of the higher-order predicate ‘MoreNatural’. In neither case are they understood as names for properties, or as names at all. And in neither case is there anything like quotation going on: \(`\text{MoreNatural}(=, \text{AsTallAs})\rsquo\) is no more about the expressions ‘=’ and ‘AsTallAs’ than ‘Every man is mortal’ is about the expressions ‘man’ and ‘is mortal’.

If one admits this as intelligible, one might also admit uses of ‘natural’ and ‘more natural than’ where they combine with meaningful expressions that are not ordinary predicates to make sentences. For example, one might allow a comparative naturalness predicate that combines with two binary sentential operators, making ‘MoreNatural(and, or)’ well-formed. Again, this is not supposed to be a claim about the words ‘and’ and ‘or’. One might pronounce it as ‘Conjunction is more natural than disjunction’, but this may be misleading, given that the English word ‘conjunction’ seems much more like a name than like a binary sentential operator.

A willingness to allow ‘natural’ to play these multifarious syntactic roles is a central development in Sider (2011). (Sider signals this by using the word ‘structural’ instead of ‘perfectly natural’.) As well as defending the intelligibility and importance of questions posed in such terms, Sider defends certain specific claims of the relevant sort: e.g. that either Structural(and) or Structural(or); that either Structural(∃) or Structural(∀); that Structural(Structural); and that it is not the case that Structural(necessarily).

Dorr and Hawthorne (2013) advocate a similar flexibility about the syntax of naturalness claims. They suggest that these claims should be regimented within in a higher-order logic, where for any syntactic categories (“types”) \(\alpha_1,\ldots ,\alpha_n\), there is a type \(\langle\alpha_1,\ldots ,\alpha_n\rangle\), expressions of which can combine with expressions of types \(\alpha_1,\ldots ,\alpha_n\) to form sentences. Using \(e\) for the type of names, an ordinary monadic predicate is of type \(\langle e\rangle\), so a higher-order predicate taking such a predicate as an argument is of type \(\langle\langle e\rangle\rangle\). Sentences (or, more generally, formulas) can be identified with expressions of type \(\langle\rangle\); so binary operators like \(\wedge\) (‘and’) and \(\vee\) (‘or’) are of type \(\langle\langle\rangle,\langle\rangle\rangle\). The proposal is to introduce, for each type \(\alpha\), expressions ‘PerfectlyNatural\(_\alpha\)’ of type \(\langle\alpha\rangle\), ‘MoreNatural\(_\alpha\)’ of type \(\langle\alpha ,\alpha\rangle\), and so on. We can thus formulate questions like ‘Is it the case that MoreNatural \(_{\langle\langle\rangle,\langle\rangle\rangle}(\text{and}, \text{or})\)?’ Standard higher order languages also admit variables and quantifiers of all types, so we can also say things like ‘\(\neg\exists x^{\langle\langle \rangle ,\langle\rangle\rangle}\text{MoreNatural}_{\langle\langle\rangle,\langle\rangle\rangle}(x,\wedge)?\)’—‘No binary operation is more natural than conjunction’.

There are some differences between Sider’s approach and this higher-order approach. One is that Sider does not think of ‘Structural’ as ambiguous, despite its ability to occupy different syntactic roles. One upshot is that for him there is just a single question ‘Structural(Structural)?’ where a higher-order approach would distinguish infinitely many: ‘Structural\(_{\langle\langle e\rangle\rangle}\)(Structural\(_{\langle e\rangle})\)?’, ‘Structural\(_{\langle\langle\langle e\rangle\rangle\rangle}\)(Structural\(_{\langle\langle e\rangle\rangle})\)?’, and so on. Another is that Sider allows ‘Structural’ to combine with linguistic items that would not, on the higher-order approach, be meaningful units at all, such as variable-binders.[7] Indeed Sider suggests that we can make sense of attributions of structuralness where the argument of ‘Structural’ is something like a grammatical category rather than a linguistic expression.[8] Most importantly, Sider does not have higher order quantification, so his regimentation of ‘Conjunction is perfectly natural’ does not extend to claims like ‘Conjunction is the only perfectly natural binary operator’.

3.5 Natural magnitudes

There are many properties that have to do with how massive things are: they include determinate mass properties like being 17 grams in mass; more general properties like having mass; relations between objects like being more massive than; relations among properties like being a greater mass than; and many more. But what about mass itself? Is it one of the aforementioned properties? Some authors have suggested that the answer is no: things like mass and density—and perhaps also shape, athletic ability, etc.—belong to a sui generis ontological category of “quantities” or “magnitudes”. Each of these items is associated with certain values or degrees, e.g. three grams or three grams per cubic centimeter; these may belong to some further sui generis category. An object can “have” a magnitude “to” a degree. But the magnitude mass is not the binary relation object \(x\) has mass to degree \(y\).

Given this picture, it is natural to apply ‘natural’ to magnitudes as well as properties. For example one might propose that mass is more natural than density. In a late paper, Lewis (2009) talks like this (calling magnitudes ‘properties that come in degrees’), although he leaves it open whether they are identical to properties in our sense. Weatherson (2006), taking it for granted that magnitudes are not properties, argues that some magnitudes are perfectly natural, and suggests that there may not be any perfectly natural properties.[9]

However, the background theory of magnitudes as sui generis entities remains quite underdeveloped. For example, it is unclear what entities can be the “values” of a magnitude; whether there are analogues for magnitudes of logical operations like conjunction and quantification in the realm of quantities; and whether there are analogues for magnitudes of the comprehension principles characteristic of “abundant” conceptions of properties. It is thus not yet clear how much of a difference moving to a magnitude-based framework would require in theorising about naturalness.

3.6 Natural kinds

Another category whose relation to classes, properties, and concepts is contested is that of kinds. To judge by how we talk, kinds seem more “concrete” than properties: compare ‘I used to drive that kind of car’ versus ‘I used to drive that property’ (see Carlson 1977). Further complicating the relationship is the fact that the notion ‘natural kind’ is the topic of a body of literature large enough to be the topic of a separate entry (natural kinds). This literature, which traces back at least to the discussion of “Kinds” by Mill (1843), is guided by a set of paradigms rather different from those that guide the literature on natural properties. For example, following Mill, it is widely denied that there is a natural kind to which all and only white things belong, on the grounds that they have nothing else important in common other than their color. So even if one identified kinds with properties, there would be a case for distinguishing the senses of ‘natural’ in ‘natural property’ and ‘natural kind’ (see Tobin 2013). Of course this does not rule out analysing one of the notions in terms of the other: for example, being a very natural kind might require being coextensive with several different sufficiently natural properties that are probabilistically correlated given the actual laws of nature, but not necessarily equivalent (c.f. Boyd 1991).

4. Naturalness and other notions

Lewis (1983) argues for the theoretical utility of the notion of naturalness by proposing an array of generalizations linking naturalness to other topics, including similarity, intrinsicness, materialism, laws of nature, and meaning. Subsequent authors have offered competing or complementary proposals. Many proposals, like Lewis’s, purport to “analyse”, or provide necessary and sufficient conditions for, some other property partly in terms of naturalness; some purport to analyse naturalness in terms of other properties; others involve other kinds of generalizations. This section will attempt a survey.

4.1 Similarity

Introductions to our topic often emphasise a connection to similarity. Whereas any two objects, no matter how similar or dissimilar, share infinitely many properties and are divided by infinitely many properties, sharing of natural properties “makes for similarity” (Lewis 1983, 347; 1986b, 60), while division by natural properties “makes for dissimilarity”. These vague generalizations suggest two projects: that of analysing naturalness in terms of similarity, and that of analysing similarity in terms of naturalness.

The former project has important historical antecedents. Starting with a two-place predicate intended to express a specific notion of similarity (between total experiential states), Carnap (1928) defines a “quality circle”—roughly, a natural class—as a class any two members of which are similar, which is not contained in any other such class. Goodman (1951) influentially objected to some consequences of this definition (see the entry on Nelson Goodman, §4.2): for example, it implies that whenever \(A\), \(B\), and \(C\) are quality circles, \((A\cap B)\cup(B\cap C)\cup(C\cap A)\) is contained in some quality circle (the “difficulty of imperfect community”). This does not seem plausibly necessarily true, equating ‘quality circle’ with ‘perfectly natural class’.

Subsequent attempts to explain naturalness in terms of resemblance have used richer inputs. For example, Rodriguez-Pereyra (2002) defines ‘property class’ in terms of a three-place predicate ‘\(x\) resembles \(y\) to degree \(n\)’. Here \(n\) is, surprisingly, a natural number—the intention is that the degree of resemblance between two objects should turn out to equal the total number of “property classes” that contain both.[10] Rodriguez-Pereyra’s conception of degrees of resemblance is unusual, since it conflicts with the intuitive thought that everything resembles itself at least as strongly as anything could resemble anything else. On a more popular approach, the degree of dissimilarity between two objects \(x\) and \(y\) is represented by a non-negative real number \(d(x,y)\) satisfying the following “pseudometric space” axioms:

\[\begin{align} \tag{i} d(x,x) &= 0 \\ \tag{ii} d(x,y) &= d(y,x) \\ \tag{iii} d(x,z) &\le d(x,y)+d(y,z). \end{align}\]

This suggests several possible strategies for defining a notion of naturalness for classes. One could take into account facts about the “shape” of a class: for example, whether it is spherical (such that for some \(x\) and \(y\), \(z\) belongs to it just in case \(d(x,z)\le d(x,y)\)), or convex (such that whenever \(x\) and \(z\) belong to it and \(d(x,z)=d(x,y)+d(y,z)\), \(y\) belongs to it).[11] One could also consider facts about its “size”, e.g. the maximum degree of dissimilarity between any two of its members.[12] Or one could consider the extent of the gulf between a class and its complement: the minimum degree of dissimilarity between any member and any non-member.

If one is willing to help oneself to some notion like ‘the degree of dissimilarity between \(x\) as it is at world \(w\) and \(y\) as it is at world \(w'\)’, one could use similar strategies to analyse naturalness for properties. However, this notion of “transworld resemblance” seems to cry out for further explanation. It is also worth noting that this kind of analysis looks inhospitable to the idea that the description of the world in terms of perfectly natural properties is in any sense “complete” (see §4.4.1 below): indeed, it would be rather surprising for multiple properties to be exactly tied for first place on any similarity-based measure of naturalness.

The opposite project, of analysing similarity in terms of naturalness, could be carried out in several ways. Assuming we are concerned with a relatively intuitive notion of similarity on which everything is maximally similar to itself, and on which objects can be more or less similar without sharing any perfectly natural properties, the prospects are best if we invoke a numerical measure of naturalness. Given such a measure, one might propose the following analysis:

Division
The degree of dissimilarity between \(x\) and \(y\) is the sum of the degrees of naturalness of all the properties that divide \(x\) and \(y\) (i.e., are instantiated by \(x\) but not by \(y\) or by \(y\) but not by \(x\)).[13]

A nice feature of Division is that it automatically validates the pseudometric space axioms (i)–(iii) above. (By contrast, if we measured the degree of similarity of \(x\) and \(y\) by summing the degrees of naturalness of the properties shared by \(x\) and \(y\), we would have to allow some objects—namely, those that instantiate many natural properties—to be more similar to themselves than others.) But the approach also faces several problems:

  1. It is not obvious that there is a reasonable numerical measure of naturalness on which the relevant sums are well-defined.[14]

  2. It is not obvious how to reconcile Division with the evident vagueness and context-sensitivity of expressions like ‘more similar than’. It seems implausible that all of this variation can be traced back to vagueness and context-sensitivity in ‘more natural than’ in such a way that Division comes out true in all contexts. One might appeal here to quantifier domain restriction: perhaps, in contexts where only psychological similarity matters, Division is true so long as the universal quantifier over properties is understood as restricted to psychological properties. However we may need more flexibility than this to allow both for contexts where psychological similarity matters a lot but bodily similarity matters a little and for contexts where bodily similarity matters a lot and psychological similarity matters a little.

  3. Division makes it hard to connect similarity to quantitative differences in the ways one might expect. Consider three triangles A, B, C, where A is equilateral with side length 1m; B is isosceles with side lengths 1m, 1m, 1.01m; and C is isosceles with side lengths 1m, 1m, 1.1m. The paradigms we began with (and the simplicity-of-definition idea, and the connections to mental and linguistic content discussed §4.7 below) suggest that for most values of \(x\) other than 1, being isosceles with one side \(x\) times as long as the other two is much less natural than being equilateral. Given this, it looks like A and B, being divided by being equilateral, may be counted by Division as more dissimilar than triangles B and C are. This contrasts with a more familiar conception of similarity in this domain, on which the degree of dissimilarity between a 1,1,1 triangle and a 1,1,\(x\) triangle approaches 0 as \(x\) approaches 1.

  4. Problems arise even with continua of properties where there is no independent reason to posit different degrees of naturalness. Consider mass. If we assign all mass-interval properties like having a mass between 100 and 105 kg positive naturalness scores, we will get the disastrous result that any two objects that differ in mass are dissimilar to the same, infinite, degree. But if we assign them all a score of zero, it seems impossible to recover the intuitive judgment that objects whose masses differed by only 1% could resemble more closely than any objects whose mass differed by 10% possibly could. We might hope to thread the needle by saying that most mass-interval properties score zero but a few (countably many) are natural enough to get positive scores. But this seems to require invidiously privileging some units for mass over others, and will still make for counterintuitive discontinuities in the similarity measure as discussed under (c).[15]

Problem (a) is fairly specific to Division, but (b)–(d) seem potentially challenging for other ways of cashing out the vague slogan “natural properties make for similarity”.

4.2 Duplication and intrinsicness

One theoretically important kind of similarity is duplication, or perfect intrinsic qualitative similarity: the relation that would hold between two peas in a pod if it weren’t for all the microscopic differences in the arrangement of their molecules, and perhaps holds in fact between certain pairs of hydrogen atoms or spacetime points. Lewis (1986b) proposes essentially the following definition:

Duplication
\(x\) is a duplicate of \(y\) if and only if there is a bijective function \(f\) from the parts of \(x\) to the parts of \(y\), such that for any any perfectly natural \(n\)-ary property \(R\) and any sequence \(x_1,\ldots,x_n\) of parts of \(x\), \(x_1,\ldots,x_n\) instantiate \(R\) just in case \(f(x_1),\ldots,f(x_n)\) instantiate \(R\).[16]

Those who deny that there are any perfectly natural properties (e.g. on the grounds that for every property we can find a more natural one, or on the grounds that some magnitudes (§3.5) are more natural than any properties) will presumably reject the right-to-left direction of Duplication, to avoid the absurd result that any two objects with equally many parts are duplicates. This need not, however, put paid to the program of defining duplication in terms of naturalness. For example, Langton and Lewis (1998) suggest a quite different definition in terms of ‘more natural’: for details, see §3.3 in the entry on intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties.[17]

One worry about the left-to-right direction of Duplication is based on the fact that, under plausible assumptions, it entails that duplicate objects must always have exactly the same perfectly natural properties.[18] This is in tension with certain unorthodox views about perfect naturalness, e.g. that specific location properties (e.g. being here) or vector properties (e.g. moving in this direction) are perfectly natural.[19] Proponents of such views might consider modifying Duplication to allow certain nontrivial permutations of perfectly natural properties.

Duplication is a useful relation to have a grip on. Lewis uses it in defining several other things, such as determinism (a deterministic proposition is one that never divides possible worlds with duplicate initial temporal segments; determinism is the proposition that the conjunction of the laws of nature is deterministic) and intrinsicness (a property is intrinsic just in case it never divides duplicates).

Note that defining intrinsic properties as those that do not divide duplicates is hopeless unless it is combined with something like Lewis’s modal realism. Being a dog-owner is not intrinsic; but unless there are vast numbers of people, it is unlikely that any dog-owner is a duplicate of a non-dog-owner. It will not help to define the intrinsic properties as those that could not divide duplicates, since being a duplicate of a dog-owner is also not intrinsic. A better idea is to replace the binary relation of duplication with a four-place relation between two objects and two possible worlds, in which case we can say that property \(F\) is intrinsic if and only if, whenever \(x\) as it is at \(w\) is a duplicate of \(y\) as it is at \(w'\), \(x\) has \(F\) at \(w\) just in case \(y\) has \(F\) at \(w'\). Duplication can be modified to turn it into an analysis of this four-place relation:

Cross-world Duplication
\(x\) as it is at \(w\) is a duplicate of \(y\) as it is at \(w'\) if and only if there is a one-to-one function \(f\) whose domain includes everything that is part of \(x\) at \(w\), and whose range includes everything that is part of \(y\) at \(w'\), such that for any sequence \(x_1,\ldots,x_n\) of objects that are parts of \(x\) at \(w'\) and perfectly natural \(n\)-ary relation \(R\), \(x_1,\ldots,x_n\) instantiate \(R\) at \(w\) if and only if \(f(x_1),\ldots,f(x_n)\) instantiate \(R\) at \(w'\).[20]

One objection to this package concerns non-qualitative properties: properties like being identical to Obama and having Obama as a part are not counted as intrinsic. Francescotti (1999), Eddon (2011), and others argue that this is wrong.[21] Another objection is that the analysis does not allow an intrinsic property to be necessarily coextensive with an extrinsic one. Those who hold that there are distinct but necessarily extensive qualitative properties may prefer a more discriminating account of intrinsicness on which, for example, being spherical is intrinsic while being spherical and either a home-owner or not a home-owner is not.[22]

4.3 Qualitative indiscernibility and qualitativeness

Another theoretically important specialised similarity relation is qualitative indiscernibility. Qualitative indiscernibility is more demanding than duplication: whereas duplicates can differ extrinsically, qualitatively indiscernible objects must also match in their relations to their environments, so that in a non-symmetric universe, no two things are qualitatively indiscernible.

Duplication can be turned into an analysis of qualitative indiscernibility by including all objects, not just the parts of the relevant objects \(x\) and \(y\), in the domain of the function \(f\):

Indiscernibility
\(x\) is qualitatively indiscernible from \(y\) if and only if there is a one-to-one, onto function \(f\) whose domain and range include all objects, such that \(f(x)=y\), and for any sequence \(x_1,\ldots ,x_n\) of objects and any perfectly natural \(n\)-ary property \(R\), \(x_1,\ldots ,x_n\) instantiate \(R\) just in case \(f(x_1),\ldots ,f(x_n)\) instantiate \(R\).

One immediate worry about the left-to-right direction of Indiscernibility is that according to standard set theory there are no functions whose domain and range include all objects (assuming sets count as “objects”).[23] There are various possible ways around this problem. For example, one might replace the quantifier over “functions” with a plural quantifier over ordered pairs, or a higher-order quantifier binding a variable in dyadic predicate position.[24]

One significant worry about the right-to-left direction of Indiscernibility arises for those who posit higher-order perfectly natural properties, whose instances are properties or propositions rather than objects. For example, someone who posited that thinking was a perfectly natural relation between people and propositions, modally independent of the perfectly natural properties instantiated only by objects, one would likely want to rule out the possibility that there are qualitatively indiscernible people \(x\) and \(y\) such that \(x\) thinks that \(x\) is hungry, \(y\) does not think that \(y\) is hungry. Indiscernibility does not obviously do this.

Lewis (1986b) briefly suggests a quite different analysis of qualitative indiscernibility: \(x\) is qualitatively indiscernible from \(y\) just in case \(x\) and \(y\) share the same “somewhat natural” properties.[25] If we take the “somewhat natural” properties to be those with finite definitions in terms of perfectly natural properties, sharing of these properties will follow from indiscernibility as defined by Indiscernibility; however the converse implication can fail when there are infinitely many objects.

Once we have the notion of qualitative indiscernibility, we can use it to analyse the notion of a qualitative property. Intuitively, a qualitative property is one that is not “about” any individual: admiring a famous philosopher is qualitative, while admiring David Lewis is not. For Lewis, a monadic property \(F\) is qualitative if and only if whenever \(x\) is qualitatively indiscernible from \(y\), \(x\) has \(F\) just in case \(y\) has \(F\). As in the case of duplication, this analysis is tenable only given a super-abundant ontology like Lewis’s. Non-modal realists may, however, adapt the idea by using a world-relativised relation of qualitative indiscernibility, whose definition stands to Indiscernibility as Cross-World Duplication stands to Duplication.[26]

Like the definition of intrinsicness in terms of duplication, the definition of qualitativeness in terms of qualitative indiscernibility fits most naturally with a view where necessarily equivalent properties are always identical, since it will not allow us to say, e.g., that being red is qualitative but being red and either admiring or not admiring Lewis is non-qualitative. For proponents of finer-grained theories of properties who want to make such distinctions, the strategy of analysing qualitativeness in terms of qualitative indiscernibility seems unpromising. But the project of analysing qualitativeness in terms of perfect naturalness remains on the table. For example, invoking the notion of “full definability” discussed in §4.10 below, one might define a qualitative property as one fully definable from perfectly natural properties.[27]

These analyses have noteworthy consequences that could be maintained even if the project of analysing ‘qualitative’ were given up. One is that all perfectly natural properties are qualitative. Another is that all qualitative properties supervene on the perfectly natural properties, in the following sense:

Qualitative Supervenience
If \(f\) is a bijection from the objects existing at \(w\) to the objects existing at \(w'\) such that for every perfectly natural \(n\)-ary property \(R\) and objects \(x_1,\ldots ,x_n\), \(x_1,\ldots ,x_n\) instantiate \(R\) at \(w_1\) iff \(f(x_1),\ldots ,f(x_n)\) instantiate \(R\) at \(w_2\), then for every qualitative \(m\)-ary property \(S\) and objects \(y_1,\ldots ,y_m\), \(y_1,\ldots ,y_m\) instantiate \(S\) at \(w_1\) iff \(f(y_1),\ldots ,f(y_m)\) instantiate \(S\) at \(w_2\).[28]

Qualitative Supervenience will of course not be acceptable to those who deny that there are any perfectly natural properties. Some specific putative counterexamples to Qualitative Supervenience have also been offered. For example, Dasgupta (2013) suggests that is possible for the same objects to instantiate the same fundamental properties even while everything is twice as massive as it in fact is. Since Dasgupta also seems to assume that properties like being one kilogram in mass to be qualitative, these possibilities seem to involve a failure of Qualitative Supervenience.[29]

4.4 Modality

4.4.1 Completeness

Lewis took it as axiomatic that “truth is supervenient on being”, and explained this slogan—borrowed from Bigelow (1988)—as follows:

If two possible worlds are discernible in any way at all, it must be because they differ in what things there are in them, or in how those things are. And "how things are" is fully given by the fundamental, perfectly natural, properties and relations that those things instantiate.

Spelling this out, we get:

TSB
For any possible worlds \(w\) and \(w'\), if \(w\) and \(w'\) agree as regards what things there are, and for any \(n\), any perfectly natural \(n\)-ary property \(R\), and any \(n\) objects \(x_1,\ldots,x_n\) that exist at \(w\) and \(w'\), the proposition that \(R(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is true at \(w\) if and only if it is true at \(w'\), then exactly the same propositions are true at \(w\) and \(w'\).[30]

We can get across the same idea without mentioning possible worlds:

Necessarily, every true proposition is metaphysically necessitated by some collection of true propositions each of which is either (a) the proposition that \(R(x_1,\ldots ,x_n)\) or \(¬R(x_1,\ldots ,x_n)\), for some perfectly natural \(R\) and objects \(x_1,\ldots ,x_n\) are any objects; (b) the proposition that \(\exists y(y=x)\), for some object \(x\), or (c) the proposition that every object is one of \(xx\), where \(xx\) are all the objects there are.[31]

TSB follows from Qualitative Supervenience (see §4.3) together with a less controversial principle we might dub ‘Truth Supervenes on the Qualitative’, derived from TSB by replacing ‘perfectly natural’ with ‘qualitative’. It is thus unsurprising that putative counterexamples to Qualitative Supervenience extend to TSB. For example, if one took being left-handed to be a qualitative property that need not be preserved by bijections that preserve perfectly natural properties, one might plausibly think that worlds could agree on which objects there are and which perfectly natural properties they instantiate without agreeing on which ones are left-handed. Similarly, if one posits higher-order perfectly natural properties which do not supervene on the first-order ones, one should have doubts about TSB, assuming one interprets TSB’s talk of “objects” in a way that does not include objects. However in that case one might hold on to a variant of TSB that gives the same status to all propositions \(R(X_1,\ldots,X_n)\) where \(R\) is perfectly natural (of whatever type) and \(X_1,\ldots,X_n\) are of the right types to be arguments to \(R\).

TSB can be understood as an attempt to pin down the inchoate thought that the description of the world in terms of perfectly natural properties is “complete” or “exhaustive”. Sider (2011) argues that TSB fails to capture the intuitive idea of completeness, primarily on the grounds that ‘it imposes no meaningful requirement of completeness for necessary truths’. §4.10 and §4.11 below will consider some different strategies for capturing the thought, which are plausibly taken to be stronger than TSB. Sider’s own preference is to cash out the thought in a metalinguistic way, as the thesis that “every sentence that contains expressions that do not carve at the joints has a metaphysical semantics”. Unfortunately there is no space to explain the novel conception of “metaphysical semantics” Sider is appealing to; however it is worth mentioning that Sider does not take his thesis about metaphysical semantics to imply TSB.

4.4.2 Independence

According to Lewis (1986b: 60), “there are only just enough [perfectly natural properties] to characterise things completely and without redundancy”. This remark suggests that the perfectly natural properties constitute a minimal supervenience base for all truths: if \(R\) is a perfectly natural property, the result of replacing ‘perfectly natural property’ with ‘perfectly natural property distinct from \(R\)’ in TSB and/or Qualitative Supervenience is false.[32] Of course one way for this to be true would be for TSB/Qualitative Supervenience to already be false. But there is an idea in the vicinity that is logically independent of TSB and Qualitative Supervenience, namely that no perfectly natural property supervenes on all the rest. If we take the relevant sense of ‘supervene’ to be the one in play in Qualitative Supervenience, this amounts to:

Minimality
For each perfectly natural \(n\)-ary property \(R\), there are possible worlds \(w\) and \(w'\), objects \(x_1,\ldots,x_n\) existing at \(w\), and a bijection \(f\) from objects existing at \(w\) to objects existing at \(w'\) such that \(R(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) at \(w\), not \(R(f(x_1),\ldots,f(x_n))\) at \(w'\), and for every perfectly natural \(m\)-ary property \(S\) distinct from \(R\) and objects \(y_1,\ldots,y_m\) existing at \(w\), \(S(y_1,\ldots,y_m)\) at \(w\) if and only if \(S(f(y_1),\ldots,f(y_m))\) at \(w'\).

If we take the relevant sense of ‘supervene’ to be the one in play in TSB, we get something a bit stronger, where the worlds \(w\) and \(w'\) are required to be ones at which the same objects exist and the function \(f\) is required to map every object to itself.

Minimality entails that if a binary relation \(R\) is perfectly natural, its converse—being an \(x\) and \(y\) such that \(R(y,x)\)—is not also perfectly natural. This seems oddly arbitrary: it is tempting to think that, instead, converse relations are always equally natural. One could avoid this objection by weakening Minimality, replacing ‘distinct from \(R\)’ with ‘distinct from \(R\) and its converse’, or more generally ‘distinct from all of the permutations of \(R\)’. More ambitiously, one could develop a theory of “neutral” relations (Fine 2000), understood as entities for which distinctions like the one between a relation and its converse does not arise, and treat ‘perfectly natural’ as a predicate of neutral relations.

Minimality also implies that the negation of a perfectly natural property is never perfectly natural. This does not so obviously raise worries about arbitrariness. Nevertheless, the relation between a relation and its negation is structurally quite similar to the relation between a relation and its converse—both seem to involve a kind of “interdefinability”—so there are some attractions to saying that the negation of a perfectly natural property is always perfectly natural, and more generally that the negation of any property is equal to it in naturalness. This has been suggested by Plate (2016) and Dorr (2016).[33]

A different kind of putative counterexample to Minimality involves perfectly natural properties which are “rigid” in the sense that whatever instantiates or fails to instantiate them does so necessarily. If TSB is true and \(F\) is rigid, TSB remains true when ‘perfectly natural property’ is replaced by ‘perfectly natural property distinct from \(F\)’. For example, if one held that every electron is necessarily an electron (if it exists) and that every non-electron is necessarily not an electron (if it exists), minimality would rule out claiming that being an electron is perfectly natural. Eddon (2013) argues that certain rigid relations among properties are perfectly natural, and thus make trouble for minimality: one of her examples is the three-place being the sum of relation that holds, for example, between the determinate mass properties being exactly 5kg in mass, being exactly 7kg in mass, and being exactly 12kg in mass.

Finally, some have argued against Minimality on the grounds that certain “higher-level” properties are perfectly natural, despite supervening on perfectly natural “lower-level” properties. For example, Bennett (2017) argues that the property of being a “schmoton”—a certain kind of complex particle—might be perfectly natural, despite supervening on other perfectly natural properties: her argument is based on a list of criteria she takes to be jointly sufficient for perfect naturalness, including “figuring in fundamental laws” and being such that any two of one’s instances are duplicates.[34]

Minimality allows for a wide variety of interesting modal connections within the class of perfectly natural properties, so long as they do not take the specific form of a supervenience claim. Many authors have been attracted towards much more sweeping claims of modal independence, often inspired by the Humean slogan “no necessary connections between distinct existences”. Lewis (1986b) defends a “principle of recombination” (see the entry on possible worlds), which entails, for example, that any two possibly-instantiated conjunctions of perfectly natural properties are possibly instantiated in the same world. Depending on how the principle is precisified, it may also entail that for any two possibly-instantiated conjunctions of perfectly natural monadic properties \(F\) and \(G\) and any perfectly natural binary relation \(R\) it is possible that an instance of \(F\) bears \(R\) to an instance of \(G\).[35] Some particularly far-reaching claims of this sort go by the name of “combinatorialism”: the idea is that all logically possible patterns in which any properties might be distributed are possibly instantiated by any given perfectly natural properties.[36] For example, since it is logically possible for there to be a monadic property with exactly seven instances and a binary relation that holds between any two of those instances, each perfectly natural property \(F\) and perfectly natural binary relation \(R\) are such that it is metaphysically possible for \(F\) to have exactly seven instances and \(R\) to hold between any two of them.[37]

If some kind of combinatorialism is true, it could be a powerful tool for figuring out whether properties are perfectly natural, since many collections of properties that might otherwise seem good candidates to be perfectly natural seem to be involved in the kinds of necessary connections which, according to combinatorialism, never obtain among perfectly natural properties. The worry for those who want to use arguments like this to eliminate certain candidate collections of perfectly natural properties is that all the otherwise acceptable candidate collections might turn out to involved in such apparent necessary connections. If so we will face a choice between giving up combinatorialism and rejecting the relevant prima facie modal judgments. To illustrate the difficulties, we can return to the example of mass. Insofar as one takes physics as a guide to the perfectly natural, there is pressure to think that some perfectly natural properties have to do with mass. There are a great many possible candidates, including:

  1. Maximally specific monadic mass properties of objects, like having a mass of 3.12 grams[38]
  2. Less specific monadic mass properties of objects, like having a mass between 3.12 and 4.03 grams, or just having mass (Wilson 2012)
  3. Binary relations between objects and real numbers, like being the mass in grams of or being the mass in kilograms of
  4. More-than-two place relations between objects and numbers, like the “mass ratio” relation, \(x\) is \(n\) times as massive as \(y\)
  5. Binary relations among objects, like being the same mass as, being greater in mass than, being 3.12 times as massive as, or being between 3.12 and 4.03 times as massive as.
  6. More-than-two place relations among objects, like \(z\) is as massive as \(x\) and \(y\) put together, \(z\) is intermediate between \(x\) and \(y\) in mass, or \(w\) and \(z\) stand in the same mass-ratio as \(x\) and \(y\)
  7. Relations among properties, like F is a maximally specific mass property that is the sum of maximally specific mass properties G and H (see Mundy 1987, Eddon 2013).
  8. Relations linking mass to other scales, like the mass of \(x\) equals the distance between \(y\) and \(z\) in units where the speed of light and Newton’s gravitational constant are both 1.[39]

Within each of the candidate families, one can formulate certain laws that might plausibly be claimed to be metaphysically necessary. For example, it is tempting to suppose that it would be metaphysically (rather than merely nomically) impossible for an object to be both one gram in mass and two grams in mass, or for one object to be both equal in mass to another and twice as massive as it. But if we combine all these judgments with combinatorialism, we will have to deny that any of the families we have considered consists entirely of perfectly natural properties.[40] This is not out of the question: one can imagine many ways in which mass-theoretic properties might supervene on perfectly natural properties we do not yet have words for, in a manner consistent with the relevant modal judgments. However, precisely because there are so many ways this might be achieved, this response threatens to lead to a sort of scepticism about our ability to know what the perfectly natural properties are, or how the properties we have words for supervene on them. Combinatorialists thus have reason to be open to the idea that some of the relevant laws might turn out, surprisingly, to be metaphysically contingent (though they may still be nomologcally necessary).

4.5 Universals and tropes

Armstrong (1978) developed an influential theory of “universals” (a category he subdivides into properties and relations) which was distinctive for its emphasis on the idea that universals are “sparse” by comparison with predicates: for example, Armstrong refuses to posit disjunctions of universals. Lewis (1999, 1) credits Armstrong with convincing him that the concept of naturalness is “commonsensical and serviceable”. Lewis is open to a view that posits Armstrong-style universals in addition to properties and relations conceived of as “abundant”, and analyses ‘perfectly natural property’ as ‘property corresponding to some universal’, i.e. as ‘property that is the property of instantiating \(u\) for some universal \(u\)’.

This analysis has some surprising consequences when combined with certain other commitments of Armstrong’s view. For example, Armstrong holds that any two universals have a conjunction, which he identifies with their mereological fusion. Given the proposed analysis, this entails that the conjunction of any two perfectly natural properties is itself perfectly natural.[41] This conflicts with the claim that no perfectly natural property supervenes on all the rest. If one wanted to hold on to that claim, one might instead analyse ‘perfectly natural property’ as ‘property corresponding to some mereologically simple universal’.[42] Note however that for Armstrong it is an open question whether there are any mereologically simple universals, and thus whether the properties corresponding to mereologically simple universals form a supervenience base for everything.

Armstrong also posits a wide array of “structural” universals: for example, given any universal property \(u_1\) and binary universal relation \(u_2\), Armstrong would hold that if there are any fusions of two non-overlapping objects individually instantiating \(u_1\) and jointly instantiating \(u_2\), there is a universal \(u_3\) that is necessarily instantiated by all and only such fusions. If the perfectly natural properties are those that correspond to universals, this view will lead to a great profusion of perfectly natural properties. This fits poorly with intuitive judgments of relative naturalness like those elicited by our initial examples, and threatens to disrupt several of the theoretical roles for naturalness (Sider 1995, 3). Lewis (1986a) argues (not on those grounds) that theorists of universals should not posit structural universals.

Lewis was also open to the program of analysing naturalness in terms of tropes—“particularised property instances” like Socrates’ paleness or Antony’s love of Cleopatra (see the entry on tropes). Lewis suggests that given a “sparse” theory of tropes (which would deny the existence of tropes like Socrates’s being either pale or flushed) and a modal realist ontology, one could define a perfectly natural property as one such that, for some maximal set of duplicate tropes, its instances are exactly the things that instantiate some member of that set (in the sense of ‘instantiate’ on which Socrates instantiates Socrates’ paleness). To avoid circularity, ‘duplicate’ here had better not be analysed in terms of sharing of perfectly natural properties. By contrast with the case of universals, it is not so easy for opponents of Lewisian modal realism to take over this account. The most straightforward approach would replace the dyadic ‘duplicate’ with a four-place predicate ‘\(t_1\) in \(w_1\) is a duplicate of \(t_2\) in \(w_2\)’; but treating this as primitive seems even more unsatisfactory than treating the dyadic ‘duplicate’ as primitive.

4.6 Laws of nature

One of Lewis’s signature applications of the notion of naturalness is in the analysis of the notion of a law of nature, a notion of great importance for the philosophy of science and for the theory of causation and counterfactuals. In brief, Lewis’s proposal is that it is a law of nature that \(P\) just in case the proposition that \(P\) belongs to every “best system”, where a system is a set of true propositions closed under necessitation, and the “goodness” of a system is a combination of two factors: simplicity and strength.[43] The relevant notion of simplicity can, according to Lewis, be understood in terms of naturalness.[44] The idea is that the simplicity of a system is a matter of the syntactic simplicity of the its simplest axiomatisation, where an axiomatisation of a system is a set of sentences which express propositions which jointly entail exactly the propositions in the system, on some interpretation where their non-logical constants all stand for perfectly natural properties.[45]

Note that, given that Lewis also analyses relative naturalness in terms of perfect naturalness and syntactic simplicity, he could just as well have identified the degree of simplicity of a system with the degree of naturalness of the strongest proposition in the system (i.e. the conjunction of all the elements of the system). This version of the account may be preferable to those who reject the program of analysing relative naturalness in terms of perfect naturalness.

For discussion of the motivations for this “best system” analysis and its discontents, see the entry on laws of nature. Especially noteworthy here are objections which specifically target the role of naturalness in the analysis. The most prominent such objection (van Fraassen 1989; Loewer (2007); Cohen and Callender 2009) is that the account will make it impossible to know what the laws are, because it will allow for the possibility that even scientists who arrive at true theories by impeccable reasoning nevertheless go wrong in taking the axioms of these theories to be laws, because they are mistaken in thinking that the properties expressed by the basic predicates of these theories are highly natural. This is a hard objection to make stick, since the form of inference involved — from the possibility of error about some question to the conclusion that we are not in a position to know the answer to that question — leads, when generalized, to a rampant scepticism. Non-sceptical epistemologists tend to think that possibilities of error need to meet some further condition of “closeness” or “relevance” in order to undermine knowledge; but it is unclear why one would think that this condition is met in the present case. As we will see in §4.7 below, natural properties are widely held to be easier to refer to, ceteris paribus. So, arguably, a situation where people ended up with true scientific theories stated in a language whose basic predicates were too unnatural for the axioms to meet the bar for lawhood would have to be quite remote and unusual.

If one rejects not just the details but the general program of analysing lawhood in terms of naturalness, one might instead consider an analysis of naturalness in terms of lawhood: “natural properties are the ones that figure in laws of nature” (Lewis 1983, 344). (If one is analysing perfect naturalness, one might want to specify that the laws should be “basic” rather than “derived”.) A central challenge for working out this program is to explain what ‘figure in’ means. To get anything like the desired extension for ‘natural’, we need an extremely fine-grained theory of propositions. For example, unless we are comfortable with the consequence that being either non-\(F\) or \(G\) is perfectly natural whenever the proposition that everything \(F\) is \(G\) is a law, we will need to deny that that property “figures in” that proposition. This will plausibly require denying that the property is identical to the proposition that everything is either non-\(F\) or \(G\), and denying that the latter proposition is a law despite its necessary equivalence to the former. As we will see in §4.10 below, there are formidable obstacles to developing a consistent theory of properties and propositions that is fine-grained in the needed ways.[46] The thesis that only perfectly natural properties “figure in” (basic) laws of nature also faces other objections. For example, Hicks and Schaffer (2017) argue against it on the grounds that, for example, acceleration figures in a basic law, namely \(F=ma\), but is not perfectly natural.[47]

4.7 Mental and linguistic content

Perhaps the most distinctive of the roles naturalness plays for Lewis is the theory of mental and linguistic content. This role is sometimes gestured at by saying that natural properties are “reference magnets” (an expression borrowed from Hodes 1984): the more natural a property it is, the easier it is for thinkers to end up referring to it (or expressing it or thinking about it). Reference to natural properties is something that happens “by default”; the less natural a property is, the more specific and finely-tuned the conditions required to refer to it.

The most widely-discussed way of fleshing out this picture takes the form of a theory of linguistic meaning which Lewis (1983, 1984) presents as a sort of toy theory, not really true but close enough to the truth for certain dialectical purposes. This theory takes the form of an account of what it is for an interpretation function to be admissible (“correct”, “intended”) for a given population. An interpretation function is a mapping from linguistic expressions to semantic values of appropriate kinds (e.g. mapping predicates to properties and sentences to propositions, or to functions from contexts to propositions). According to the account, an interpretation function is admissible for a population just in case it achieves the best overall balance of “use” and “eligibility”. An interpretation function’s “use” (or “charity”) score is higher the more it maps sentences that members of that population are strongly and stably disposed to assert to true propositions. An interpretation function’s “eligibility” score is higher the more natural the semantic values it assigns to words (and the simpler its rules for assigning semantic values to complex expressions). Sometimes there will be ties for first place, so that multiple interpretation functions will be admissible for a population. In such cases—and perhaps also in cases of near-ties—the population’s language contains semantic indeterminacy.[48]

Lewis’s reason for focusing on this toy theory involves a debate with Putnam (1980). Putnam had argued that the only admissible interpretations of a population in possession of an “empirically ideal” theory are interpretations under which that theory is true (see entry challenges to metaphysical realism, §3.5). As Lewis reconstructs Putnam’s argument, his premise is a theory similar to the toy theory except that “use” is the only admissibility-determining factor. Lewis offers the use-plus-eligibility theory as a minimal fix, and as an illustration of the way in which the concept of naturalness can be a helpful resource in formulating reductive theories of content which avoid strange consequences.[49]

Lewis’s actual theory of content is more complex, and has to be reconstructed from several sources. It has three stages, in each of which naturalness plays some role. The first is an account of what it is for a person to have certain beliefs and desires, or to be more exact, a certain credence function (mapping properties to real numbers in the unit interval) and valuation function (mapping maximally specific properties to real numbers).[50] The second is an account of what it is for a certain “Language” (function from sentences to propositions) to be “used by” (admissible for) a given population. The third stage extends the second stage to interpretation-functions that map arbitrary expressions (not just sentences) to semantic values of the appropriate type. At each stage, the resources employed include those analysed at the previous stage.

Lewis (1983) presents the following account of the first stage: for \(C\) and \(V\) to be, respectively, the prior credence and value function of a certain agent \(a\) is for \(C\) to be a function from properties to real numbers in the unit interval, and \(V\) to be a function from maximally specific properties to real numbers, which together achieve an optimal balance of fit—being such that \(a\) is disposed, given evidence \(E\), to perform some action with a maximal expected value of \(V\) in \(C(\bullet\mid E)\)—and certain other desiderata. One of these other desiderata (and the only one Lewis mentions) is eligibility: “the properties the subject supposedly believes or desires or intends himself to have” should not be too severely unnatural (1992: 375). A difficulty with this formulation is that it is not obvious how to extract “the properties the subject supposedly believes or desires or intends himself to have” from a given \(C\) and \(V\). After all, any \(C\) that obeys the axioms of the probability calculus will have to assign values close to 1 to properties expressed by arbitrarily long formulae (Dorr and Hawthorne 2013, 28; Schwarz 2014, 25). Also, insofar as “fit” is just a matter of the subject’s behavioural dispositions, the account requires revision in the light of the anti-behaviourist views expressed in Lewis’s other writings on the philosophy of mind, for example Lewis 1980.[51]

At the second stage (sentence-level linguistic meaning), Lewis (1969; 1975) had developed an analysis on which a Language is used by a population just in case certain conventions prevail in that population, for example a convention not to utter a sentence unless one believes the proposition to which it is mapped by that Language; semantic indeterminacy arises when the conventions are less than fully specific. Claims about conventions were in turn analysed in terms of patterns of credences and preferences among the members of the population. At the third stage (subsentential meaning), Lewis (1975) proposed that an interpretation function (or “grammar”) is admissible for a population just in case it is a “best” interpretation whose restriction to sentences is a Language the population uses. This paper suggests that the relevant notion of “bestness” may be lacking in clarity and objectivity, and that there will typically be many different best grammars, with the result that semantic indeterminacy at the subsentential level is pervasive. After embracing naturalness in Lewis 1983, Lewis would presumably have cashed out the “bestness” relevant for the third stage in naturalness-theoretic terms, and consequently been less pessimistic about this part of the program, although he never spells this out explicitly. Lewis (1992) also modifies his account of the second stage, appealing to naturalness to address a worry raised by Hawthorne (1990). The worry was that the original theory would assign incorrect interpretations to certain sentences where—e.g. because they are too long—hearing someone assert them would not tend to increase hearers’ confidence in the proposition that is in fact the correct interpretation. The fix gives some admissibility-constituting weight to eligibility (naturalness), to allow for extrapolation from the core cases covered by the convention-constituting pattern of credences and preferences.[52]

The final package at stages two and three is thus structurally similar to the toy “charity plus eligibility” theory, in that admissibility of an interpretation for a population is a matter of achieving the best overall score on several factors, one of which is eligibility; the key difference is that the other factor is a matter not of mapping sentences people are disposed to accept to truths, but rather of mapping all sentences, accepted or not, to propositions for which the appropriate conventions prevail. The final package also plausibly yields many of the characteristic predictions of the toy theory, e.g. that we should expect widespread semantic indeterminacy in domains where no candidate meaning is much more natural than the rest (see, e.g., Sider 2001).[53] On the other hand, some prominent objections to the toy theory do not carry over to the final package. For example, Hawthorne (2007), picking up on a case due to Williams (2007a), points out that the toy theory entails that it would be very easy for an Earth-bound population to end up speaking a language all of whose names denote things on some distant planet, since if the planet was a sufficiently good match for Earth as we take it to be, such an interpretation could do better on the score of charity than an Earth-centric one, without any sacrifice in eligibility. But in the final package, the shifted interpretation can easily be rejected on the grounds that we do not use the Language it determines, since we do not have, or expect one another to have, specific beliefs about how things are on distant planets. This is true in turn because some relations we bear to \(\langle C,V\rangle\) pairs where \(C\) is opinionated about how things are nearby and \(V\) cares about such things are more natural than any relations we bear to pairs that are unopinionated and indifferent about nearby matters but opinionated and concerned about distant planets.

The rich body of theory just described has been highly controversial, both in detail and in its overall architecture.[54] However, the general thought that more natural properties are, ceteris paribus, easier to refer to than less natural properties can be considered separately from any program for analysing the notions of mental or linguistic content. Looking for a relatively noncommittal thesis in this vicinity, Dorr and Hawthorne (2013) suggest cashing out ‘easy to refer to’ in terms of a physical measure over nomic possibilities, of the sort that features in sciences like statistical mechanics (for more details see Dorr and Hawthorne 2014). The thought is that ceteris paribus, the more natural a property is, the greater the measure of the set of nomically possible worlds where it is referred to (or where it is determinately referred to, or thought about, or something like that). For example: if there are intelligent beings elsewhere in the universe, there is a far greater chance that they have a word that means triangle than that they have a word that means three-to-five sided figure none of whose sides is more than one and half times as long as any other. This generalization is not tied up with any general theory of mental or linguistic content, although it does rest on the assumption that mental and semantic facts nomically supervene on physical facts.[55]

4.8 Ampliative inference

Goodman (1954) noticed an epistemologically interesting contrast between the proposition that all emeralds are green and the proposition that all emeralds are grue (where ‘grue’ was defined to mean ‘either green and observed before \(t\) or blue and not observed before \(t\)’, for some fixed time \(t\)). Although Goodman himself does not speak in these terms, one apparent contrast relates to rationality: if one gathered many emeralds before \(t\) and observed all to be green (and therefore also grue), it would be rational to become confident that all emeralds are green, whereas it would not be rational in the same circumstances to become confident that all emeralds are grue.[56] Philosophers who talk about naturalness have generally seen some connection between this contrast and the fact that greenness is more natural than grueness. However, there has been little consensus about how this connection should be worked out.

Following Goodman, the contrast is often summarised by saying that ‘green’ or greenness is “projectible”, and ‘grue’ or grueness is not. Projectibility is also thought of as coming in degrees, the idea perhaps being that a generalization about a more projectible property requires less evidence to make a given level of confidence rational than the corresponding generalization about a less projectible property. The difficulty of making this adequately precise, let alone of working backwards from an assignment of degrees of projectibility to a description of the rational response(s) to some given evidence, should not be underestimated (see Earman 1985 for some distinctions). But insofar as we are willing to theorise in terms of both projectibility and naturalness, we can consider the simple proposal that a property’s degree of projectibility is equal to its degree of naturalness. One worry about this (see Weatherson 2013) is that one might want to say for other reasons that being green is much less natural than, say, being electrically charged, whereas there is no obvious sense in which it would take less evidence to be rationally convinced that all emeralds are electrically charged than that all emeralds are green.

Another approach links Goodman’s contrast to the venerable idea that simpler hypotheses are preferable to more complex hypotheses. Induction can be understood (Harman 1973; White 2005), as a special case of “inference to the best explanation”, where being “best” is partly a matter of simplicity: the suggestion is that the hypothesis (i.e. the proposition) that all emeralds are green is simpler than the hypothesis that all emeralds are grue. The degree of simplicity of a proposition might simply be identified with its degree of naturalness (see §3.3 above).[57]

On a third approach, inductive inferences are reconstructed as episodes of Bayesian conditionalisation (see the entry on Bayesian epistemology), so that the grue-green contrast is traced back to the fact that some prior credence functions are more rational than others. In this setting, the most straightforward way to bring in naturalness would be to simplify identify the ideally rational prior credence functions with the maximally natural functions (within the class of functions meeting certain formal constraints, such as the axioms of probability theory).[58] One might also take naturalness to be merely one of several factors contributing to rationality. Or one could appeal to it in some other way: for example, Dorr and Hawthorne (2013) suggest that reasonable prior credence functions might be weighted averages of all sufficiently natural probability functions, in which more natural probability functions receive higher weights.

One difficulty for all these ways of invoking naturalness in the theory of rationality is that, given the popular doctrine of externalism about the content of belief, according to which duplicate thinkers in different environments can believe different propositions (see the entry on externalism about mental content), they lead to the much less popular doctrine of externalism about rationality, according to which duplicate thinkers can differ as regards the rationality of the inductive inferences they are engaging in. (For some arguments against externalism about rationality, see Wedgwood 2002). For example, the discovery (by nineteenth-century mineralologist Alexis Damour) that the term ‘jade’ applies to two different minerals, jadeite and nephrite, suggests that being jade is a less natural property than, say, being turquoise. The idea that naturalness is connected to the rationality of induction threatens to imply that even before Damour’s discovery, rationality required less confidence in universal generalizations about jade (e.g. that all jade can be polished with bamboo) than it would have required for duplicate believers in worlds where all the nephrite in the actual world had been replaced by jadeite, so that the word ‘jade’ expressed the property being jadeite. Indeed, even those who embrace externalism about rationality on other grounds might not be happy with this particular instance of it: there seems to be something irrational about someone who, without the benefit of any special observations like those of Damour, is simply disposed to be more cautious in endorsing generalizations about jade than in endorsing corresponding generalizations about turquoise.

To avoid this result without giving up on externalism about mental content, one might say that what matters in the theory of rationality the naturalness of concepts rather than properties, and say that concepts jade and turquoise are equally natural despite the fact that the properties they correspond to are not. But for this to be illuminating, one will need to provide some picture of what concepts are, and how naturalness for them relates to naturalness for properties (see §3.3).

Weatherson (2013; see Other Internet Resources) has a related objection to the claim that naturalness, understood as playing certain other roles we have already discussed (e.g. in the analysis of duplication) also makes for projectibility: he argues that being green is highly projectible whereas being an electron is not highly projectible, since merely finding that all observed electrons have a certain mass does not strongly support the conclusion that all electrons have that mass, unless one acquires further evidence which supports the hypothesis that being an electron is very natural. Opponents of externalism about mental content, such as Lewis (1981), might respond that their theory of induction is in the first instance about rationality in the formation of narrow beliefs and credences, and propositions like all electrons have mass \(m\) are not narrowly believed (see the entry on narrow mental content). But externalists about content will also need to be cautious about embracing Weatherson’s argument, since if they want to speak of “degrees of projectibility” at all, there is pressure for them to say that a single property can be denoted by different concepts with different degrees of projectibility.

4.9 Epistemic value

Knowledge tends to have good effects, at least when combined with benevolence. Similarly, true belief tends to have good effects, while false belief tends to have bad effects. But some also hold that knowledge or belief or high confidence in true propositions is non-instrumentally good (good for its own sake), and perhaps also that belief or high confidence in false propositions is non-instrumentally bad (see the entry on the value of knowledge). These evaluative claims sometimes go hand in hand with slogans like ‘belief aims at the truth’ and ‘belief aims at knowledge’, the thought being that the goodness of things that have an aim or function consists in their achieving those aims or fulfilling those functions.

Once this starting point is granted, the question arises whether all truths are equally non-instrumentally good to believe, and all falsehoods equally bad. There is reason to think not: it would be a warped kind of concern for the truth that led someone to memorise phone books rather than doing science, on the grounds that this is more efficiently generates epistemic value. The concept of naturalness seems potentially useful in explaining which truths are most valuable to believe. Indeed, if we are willing to apply ‘natural’ to propositions as well as properties, the following simple generalization looks tenable: the more natural a proposition is, the better it is to know it or believe it or have high confidence in it if it is true, and (one might add) the worse it is to believe it or have high confidence in it if it is false.

Sider (2011) gives pride of place to evaluative considerations in his discussion of naturalness: according to him, the fact that “it’s better to think and speak in joint-carving terms” unifies many of the other roles for naturalness. He characterises naturalness as a second “aim of belief”, on a par with truth. He furthermore holds that merely using words or concepts that stand for unnatural properties is (non-instruementally) bad, even when there is no difference in the propositions believed. His thought is that simply using such words or concepts, no matter what beliefs one forms, involves ‘carving the world up incorrectly’.[59] Dorr and Hawthorne (2013) argue against Sider’s picture of naturalness as a value independent of truth, on the grounds that believing a false natural proposition is worse than believing a false unnatural one, whereas on Sider’s account it should be better. For example, a pill that induces many false beliefs about phone numbers should be preferred to one that will induce a single false belief about whether neutrinos have mass. They also claim that the value or disvalue in using certain words or concepts is merely instrumental, flowing entirely from their tendencies to promote or hinder belief.

The idea that naturalness matters to epistemic value strikes some as mysterious. Dasgupta (2018) doubts that there is any more non-instrumental value in learning about the distribution of natural properties than in learning about the distribution of unnatural ones, on the grounds that there would need to be some deeper explanation for such value-theoretic facts, and no adequate explanation is available. His strategy is to consider some other feature of properties he calls “graturalness”, which grueness is stipulated to have to a higher degree than greenness. When the opponent attempts to explain the evaluative importance of naturalness by appealing to some feature which naturalness necessarily has and graturalness necessarily lacks (e.g. making for similarity), Dasgupta will respond by introducing a corresponding “grueified” feature which graturalness necessarily has and naturalness necessarily lacks (e.g. making for “grimilarity”), and complain that the explanatory challenge has merely been pushed back rather than met, since we now need an explanation for the claim that the feature the opponent pointed to has an evaluative significance that its grueified counterpart lacks. This strategy is extremely general: indeed, it is unclear whether any claim of non-instrumental value could be explained in a way that would satisfy Dasgupta’s criteria for adequate explanation.

Those who take naturalness to correlate with epistemic value might consider trying to define naturalness in value-theoretic terms. McDaniel (2017b) attempts something like this, although he appeals to the concept of obligation rather than value. He proposes that for a property to be “fundamental” (i.e. natural) is for there to be a prima facie obligation to form true beliefs about it. One challenge facing views along these lines is that belief is an attitude to propositions, whereas naturalness applies also to properties and relations. McDaniel addresses this challenge using a theory of propositions as structured entities: for being F to be more natural (to a certain degree) than being G is for it to be the case that whenever \(p\) and \(q\) are two true propositions differing only in that being F appears in a position in the structure of \(p\) where being G appears in the structure of \(q\), there is a stronger (by a certain degree) prima facie obligation to believe \(p\) than to believe \(q\). Note that if this scheme worked, it could also used to recover naturalness comparisons for properties and relations from naturalness comparisons for propositions, independent of the connection to obligation. But it is certainly not uncontroversial than this can be done, even setting aside concerns about the consistency of the required fine-grained theory of propositions. One might think that the naturalness of a proposition turns on factors like the diversity of its “constituents” as well as the sum of their individual degrees of naturalness, so that substituting a less natural constituent for a more natural one might sometimes increase the naturalness of a proposition by decreasing its diversity. For example, the proposition that every grue gemstone is surrounded by grue rock is not obviously less natural, or less valuable to believe if true, than the proposition that every grue gemstone is surrounded by green rock.

4.10 Definability

There are various logical operations which map some properties to others. One property can be the negation of another, or the conjunction or disjunction of two or more others. A monadic property can be the reflexivization of a binary relation; its existential or universal quantification in one or other of its argument places, or the result of saturating one or other of its argument places with an object: given the relation of loving, reflexivization yields loving oneself; quantification yields loving something, loving everything, being loved by something, and being loved by everything; while saturation yields, for example, loving Socrates and being loved by Socrates. In each of these cases, let us say that the output property is “definable from” the input properties and objects (taken collectively), and “partly definable from” each of the input properties (individually). Let us also assume that partial definability is transitive.

These examples do not amount to definitions of ‘definable’ and ‘partly definable’. Nevertheless, the notions seem clear enough for our present purpose, which is to consider how definability might relate to naturalness. Here are several generalizations one might find tempting:

  1. If \(p\) is partly definable from \(q\), \(p\) is less natural than \(q\).
  2. If \(p\) is partly definable from \(q\), \(p\) is not perfectly natural.
  3. If \(p\) is not partly definable from any \(q\), \(p\) is perfectly natural.

A worry about these proposals is that on some accounts, every property will count as partly definable from itself. Then (1) will be inconsistent, (2) will entail that no property is perfectly natural, and (3) will be vacuously true. The claim that partial definability is reflexive might, for example, be motivated by the claim that every property is the negation of its negation. It might also be motivated, at least as far as relations are concerned, by the especially plausible claim that every binary relation is the converse of its converse, together with the claim that the the converse of any relation is partially definable from it.[60]

These worries do not apply to the corresponding generalizations about strict partial definability, where \(p\) is strictly partially definable from \(q\) just in case \(p\) is partially definable from \(q\) and \(q\) is not partially definable from \(p\):

  1. If \(p\) is strictly partly definable from \(q\), \(p\) is less natural than \(q\).
  2. If \(p\) is strictly partly definable from \(q\), \(p\) is not perfectly natural.
  3. If \(p\) is not strictly partly definable from any \(q\), \(p\) is perfectly natural.

And here are two other weakenings of (1) and (2) which are also not trivialised even if partial definability is reflexive:

  1. If \(p\) is partly definable from \(q\), \(p\) is not more natural than \(q\).
  2. If \(p\) is partly definable from \(q\) and \(p\) is perfectly natural, \(q\) is perfectly natural.[61]

Generalizations like 1–8 are interesting only against the background of a sufficiently fine-grained theory of properties. All are trivialised by intensionalism, the thesis that necessarily coextensive properties are always identical. Consider the following consequence of intensionalism:

(D) being \(F\) is identical to being either \(F\) and \(G\) or \(F\) and not \(G\).[62]

Since the conjunction and conjunction and disjunction of any two properties count as partially definable out of each of those properties and partial definability is transitive, (D) implies that every \(n\)-ary property is partially definable from every other: being \(F\) is partly definable from being \(F\) and \(G\), which is in turn partly definable from being \(G\). This makes (1) inconsistent; makes (2) imply that no property is perfectly natural; makes (3) and (6) imply that every property is perfectly natural; makes (4) and (5) vacuously true; makes (7) imply that all properties are equally natural; and makes (8) imply that every property is perfectly natural if any are.

Intensionalism is controversial, so the fact that it conflicts with our generalizations linking naturalness to definability is not by itself a big problem for the generalizations. But once intensionalism is denied, there is an urgent need for a systematic theory of properties to replace it. For example: given that (D) is false for some \(F\) and \(G\), it would be good to know whether it is false for all of them. If so, are there more general principles which explain this? If not, what marks the difference between the \(F\), \(G\) pairs for which (D) is true and those for which it is false? Without a background theory to provide some guidance with these questions, generalizations linking partial definability to naturalness will be of little use: we can still know in many cases that \(p\) is partially definable from \(q\), by knowing of some particular operations that can be applied to \(q\) to get \(p\), but it will be unclear how to argue for any claim of strict partial definability. The task of coming up with a consistent non-intensionalist theory strong enough to answer answer such questions is by no means straightforward. The most popular fine-grained picture holds that properties (and propositions) are “structured”, where this is taken to imply that, for example, bearing \(R\) to \(a\) is identical to bearing \(S\) to \(b\) only if \(R\) and \(S\) are identical, and \(a\) and \(b\) are identical. Unfortunately, when principles of this sort are spelled out in the higher-order logic mentioned in §3.4 above, and generalized in the obvious way, they lead to an inconsistency: the “Russell-Myhill paradox”, first identified in Russell 1903 (appendix B), and subsequently rediscovered by Myhill (1958): see Goodman 2017 and Dorr 2018 (§6). But this certainly is not the end of the story, even within the higher order framework. For example, Dorr (2016) develops a consistent non-intensionalist theory that entails that (D) is false for every \(F\) and \(G\).[63]

Of course, even if one has a fine-grained view that makes partial definability discriminating enough to be interesting, one may have other reasons for rejecting generalizations like (1–8). Lewis (1970a; 1986b, 56–9), Creswell (1985), and Soames (2002, ch. 11) propose theories on which there are both “unstructured” and “structured” properties and propositions, with the former conforming to intensionalism, and the latter being in some sense “constructed” (e.g. set-theoretically) out of the former. The notion of “construction”, or its transitive closure, can provide an non-trivial interpretation of partial definability in these theories. But a hallmark of this kind of theory is that every structured property is necessarily coextensive with an unstructured one. Given this, generalisation 6 would imply that every property is necessarily coextensive with a perfectly natural property, a claim that is in obvious tension with the proposals we have considered linking naturalness to similarity, duplication, qualitativeness, modality, lawhood, and mental and linguistic content.

The concept of full definability also has some notable possible applications in the theory of naturalness. We could appeal to it to provide an alternative articulation of the intuitive thought about the “completeness” of the perfectly natural properties, which Lewis captured using TSB:

Definability
Every property is fully definable out of some perfectly natural properties and some objects.[64]

Setting aside doubts about the intelligibility of Definability, it would seem to be at least as strong as TSB.[65] At least in the paradigm cases where a proposition is fully definable out of some properties and objects, the complete truth about which objects there are and which ones instantiate each of those properties will either necessitate that proposition or necessitate its negation. By contrast, the inference from TSB to Definability is quite controversial. There are arguments which purport to show that whenever a property supervenes on some properties, it is definable in terms of them (Jackson 1998; Stalnaker 1996); but these arguments rely on an intensionalist theory of properties, and raise difficult issues even in that setting (Leuenberger 2018).

Assuming that TSB is weaker than Definability, it is arguably too weak to capture the intuitive idea that a description of the world in terms of perfectly natural properties should be a “complete” description. Indeed, the claim that properties that not perfectly natural are definable in terms of perfectly natural properties seems to be required for the simplicity-of-definition criterion to yield sensible results. Moreover, many of those who see a gulf between definability and mere supervenience have also felt that there is something metaphysically suspect about infinite descending chains of definability. If we can find a way to spell out a ban on such chains, it will plausibly imply that every property is fully definable out of indefinable properties (and objects); and this claim will in turn Definability if we take indefinability to imply perfect naturalness, as in (3) or (6) above.

On the other hand, Definability also faces objections that TSB avoids. For example, many philosophers follow Moore (1903) in denying that moral properties are definable from physical properties while still affirming that they supervene on physical properties; some such philosophers might be reluctant to say that any moral properties are perfectly natural, perhaps because they are attracted to modal independence principles.

4.11 Grounding

Most of the present section has focused on generalisations linking naturalness with relatively familiar, easy-to-grasp notions. We have not yet discussed possible links between naturalness and many other “heavy duty” metaphysical notions — notions whose good standing and theoretical utility is as controversial as that of naturalness itself. Among the notions for which such connections might be worth investigating are: essence (Fine 1994); ontological dependence (see the entry on ontological dependence); truthmaking (see the entry on truthmakers); substance (see the entry on substance); reality and factuality (Fine 2001); modes of being (explained in terms of naturalness in McDaniel 2017b, ch. 1); and degrees of being (McDaniel 2017b, ch. 7). Space precludes a discussion of these topics. But to convey a sense of the possibilities, let us briefly consider some possible connections to grounding, a notion that has been especially prominent in the recent metaphysics literature (for background, see the entry on metaphysical grounding).

Especially given the widespread use of ‘fundamental’ as equivalent to ‘ungrounded’, it seems plausible that there might be some intimate link between naturalness and grounding. So far, however, most discussions of naturalness and grounding tend to treat the notions as being in some sense rivals (see, e.g., Sider 2011, ch. 8), so there have been few attempts at systematic theorising using both together. Here are some generalizations that seem worth considering:

  1. If the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is partly grounded by the fact that \(G(y_1,\ldots,y_m)\), then \(F\) is less natural than \(G\).
  2. If the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is partly grounded by the fact that \(G(y_1,\ldots,y_m)\), then \(F\) is not more natural than \(G\).
  3. If the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is partly grounded by some fact, then \(F\) is not perfectly natural.
  4. If the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is partly grounded by the fact that \(G(y_1,\ldots,y_m)\), and \(F\) is perfectly natural, then \(G\) is perfectly natural.
  5. If the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is not partly grounded by any fact, then \(F\) is perfectly natural.

Note that (1) implies (2) and (3), which each imply (4); (5) is independent of (1–4). The notion of partial ground might in turn be defined in terms of full ground, which relates a plurality of facts (e.g. the fact that snow is white and the fact that grass is green) to a single fact (e.g. the fact that snow is white and grass is green): one fact partially grounds another just in case it belongs to some plurality of facts that fully grounds it.[66]

These suggestions are all quite tendentious. (1) is especially problematic since it rules out cases where the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is grounded by the fact that \(F(y_1,\ldots,y_n)\): for example, one might want to say that the fact that Central Park is in New York City is partially grounded by the fact that Central Park is in Manhattan. While (2) avoids this problem, it is still hard to square with a thesis endorsed by most grounding theorists: that an existential generalization is partially grounded by each of its instances (Fine 2012, 59; Rosen 2010, 117). Consider a blob of clay \(x\) with a certain very specific shape-property \(S\). The thesis about existential generalizations entails that the fact that \(x\) has some shape or other is partially grounded by the fact that \(x\) has \(S\). But the idea that \(S\) is more natural than having some shape or other fits poorly with many other parts of the naturalness role, such as the connections to similarity, content, laws, and ampliative reasoning. A worry about (3) is that it might make it too hard for a property to count as perfectly natural. One might think that whenever the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is ungrounded, there are also some other objects \(y_1,\ldots,y_n\) such that the fact that \(F(y_1,\ldots,y_n)\) is grounded: perhaps, for example, the ungrounded facts are all predications of mereologically simple objects of properties which are also instantiated by certain mereologically complex objects. Several of the generalizations also run into trouble if we assume a moderately coarse-grained conception of facts, on which (for example) the fact that Cleopatra loves Cleopatra is identical to the fact that Cleopatra is a self-lover. For example, under this assumption, (5) will have the surprising consequence that if the fact that \(R(x,x)\) is ungrounded, not only the binary relation \(R\), but also the monadic property bearing \(R\) to oneself is perfectly natural.[67] (Grounding-theorists often assume a fine-grained account of facts which would avoid this kind of problem; but there are worries about the consistency of such accounts similar to the worries about fine-grained theories of properties discussed in §4.10.)

More ambitiously, one might attempt to provide necessary and sufficient conditions for perfect naturalness in grounding-theoretic terms, by strengthening (5) to (6), or (3) to (7):

  1. \(F\) is perfectly natural if and only if it is possible for there to be some \(x_1,\ldots, x_n\) such that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) and the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is ungrounded.
  2. \(F\) is perfectly natural if and only if it is possible for there to be some \(x_1,\ldots,x_n\) such that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\), and it is necessary that for any \(x_1,\ldots,x_n\) such that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\), the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is ungrounded.

(6) and (7) are compatible, but their conjunction has a controversial purely grounding-theoretic consequence, namely that whenever \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) and the fact that \(F(y_1,\ldots,y_n)\) is ungrounded, the fact that \(F(x_1,\ldots,x_n)\) is also ungrounded.

One could also consider trying to define grounding in terms of naturalness. Here is a simple proposal, using the notion of naturalness for propositions (see §3.3), and assuming that facts are equated with true propositions:

  1. \(p\) is fully grounded by \(qq\) if and only if (a) each of \(qq\) is true; (b) it is necessary that if all of \(qq\) are true then \(p\) is true, and (c) each of \(qq\) is more natural than \(p\).[68]

Grounding theorists (who have generally been pessimistic about attempts to define grounding in other terms) will likely object that (8) wrongly entails that whenever \(p\) is fully grounded by \(qq\), and \(r\) is both true and more natural than \(p\) obtains, \(p\) is also fully grounded by \(qq\) together with \(r\) (even if \(r\) is intuitively completely irrelevant to \(p\)). One might try to refine (8) to avoid this objection by adding some further “relevance” condition, also explained in terms of naturalness; but it is not obvious how this should go.

One further possible application of the ideology of grounding worth considering is in making precise the idea about the “completeness” of the description of the world in terms of perfectly natural properties which Lewis cashed out as TSB. An obvious idea is simply to replace the notion of metaphysical necessitation in TSB with that of grounding:

Grounding Completeness
Necessarily, every fact is either fully grounded by, or a member of, some collection of facts each of which is either (a) the fact that \(R(x_1,\ldots ,x_n)\) or \(\neg R(x_1,\ldots ,x_n)\), for some perfectly natural \(R\) and objects \(x_1,\ldots ,x_n\); (b) the fact that \(\exists y(y=x)\), for some object \(x\), or (c) the fact that every object is one of \(xx\), where \(xx\) are all the objects there are.

Given the standard assumption that full grounding entails necessitation, this will be at least as strong as TSB, while arguably not being as strong as Definability (see §4.10).

5. Doubts about naturalness

The question whether to admit distinctions of naturalness among properties is often treated as a major choice point for theorising in metaphysics. Lewis presents his various proposals involving naturalness as part of an overarching argument for the good standing of the notion of naturalness, based on its theoretical utility. Meanwhile, the rejection of distinctions of naturalness is often (e.g. by Taylor 1993) thought of as bound up with the denial of “metaphysical” or “full-blooded” realism, and associated with controversial claims about mind-dependence or perspective-relativity.

But it is not obvious what is at issue in such disagreements. If “rejecting” naturalness means holding that ‘natural’ is literally unintelligible (on the relevant use), it seems misguided. So long as we take understanding a word to be a matter of induction into a practice rather than some dubious “magical grasp” (Sider 2011, §2.1), it is hard to imagine some plausibly attainable standard for intelligibility that the practice of using ‘natural’ in the relevant way fails to meet. A more promising idea is simply to equate “rejection” of naturalness with the claim that no property is more natural than any other. (Similarly, atheists will do better claiming that nothing is more holy than anything else than claiming that the word ‘holy’ is unintelligible.) Unfortunately, if we try to structure a debate around the question ‘Are some properties more natural than others?’, we will run a serious risk of equivocation. One participant may treat it as definitional that if there are any distinctions of naturalness, naturalness plays a certain wide array of the roles that Lewis and others have claimed for it in the theories of similarity, lawhood, reference, epistemic value, etc.; such a philosopher will treat any argument that no single ranking of properties plays all of these roles as an argument that no property is more natural than any other. Another participant might give pride of place to (say) the connection between naturalness and similarity, treating as obvious that some properties are more natural than others (since some things are more similar to one another than others), while treating it as an open question whether naturalness has any interesting connection to lawhood, reference, etc. Such philosophers need not disagree over anything important.

Dorr and Hawthorne (2013) argue that ‘Are some properties more natural than others?’ is too sensitive to unimportant disagreements about how philosophical terms of art get their meanings to be a useful question.[69] Inspired by Lewis’s work on theoretical terms (Lewis 1970b), they suggest that the central debates in this vicinity should focus, instead, on the question which collections of the roles that naturalness has been held to play in the literature are such that there is some ranking of properties that plays all the roles in the collection. “Naturalness enthusiasts” will hold that there is a single ranking of properties playing all or most of the roles; “naturalness sceptics”, meanwhile, will hold that different roles impose incompatible constraints, so that no ranking satisfies more than a few of them. (For example, one might think that there is no family of properties on which all others supervene and which are also such that properties with short, simple definitions terms of this family tend to be easier to refer to than properties with only long, complex definitions.) Dorr and Hawthorne give a long list of collections of roles whose co-satisfiability is non-obvious. They also discuss one separate axis of disagreement: some will think that ‘natural’, or at least ‘perfectly natural’, is precise, or can readily be made so, while others will regard it as vague, perhaps to a high degree.[70]

On this picture, the impression of a single choice point between “admitting” and “rejecting” naturalness is misleading: the true theoretical landscape is quite intricate. Moreover, even the most “sceptical” positions do not seem to have much of an anti-realist flavour. There is no obvious way to argue from the claim that there are extensive failures of co-satisfiability between the various alleged roles for naturalness, or from the claim that ‘natural’ and ‘perfectly natural’ are highly vague, to some controversial claim of mind-dependence or relativity. Theories about naturalness provide ways of sharpening and fleshing out what Lewis (1984, 228) calls “the traditional realism that recognises objective sameness and difference, joints in the world, discriminatory classifications not of our own making”. But the ideas discussed in this article do not seem particularly helpful for making any nontrivial sense of the competing vision, on which questions of similarity and classification are in some systematic way “subjective” or “up to us”.

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