#### Supplement to Neo-Kantianism

## Philosophy of Mathematics in the Marburg School

The distinctive Marburg philosophy of mathematics has its origins in
Cohen’s *Kant’s Theory of Experience* (1885, esp.
Ch.5 and Ch.12, §I), where Cohen gives a response to
Helmholtz’s philosophy of geometry. Helmholtz (1868, 1878) had
argued that, though the representation of space is a priori, the
axioms of Euclidean geometry are not, since (he argued) empirical
research on the human sensory system shows that we always process
sensations spatially, but that it is possible for us to experience a
non-Euclidean world. Space is innate, but the axiom of parallels is
not. Cohen argued that Helmholtz was operating with a faulty
conception of the a priori. On his preferred
“transcendental” conception of the a priori (see
section 2.1),
the axioms of geometry are in fact a priori, since they are necessary
premises in mathematical natural science; whether or not they are
psychologically necessary is simply irrelevant (Cohen 1885:
226–238). (Of course, mathematical physics could be revised over
time, and then we would no longer hold that Euclid’s axioms are
a priori, but this only illustrates the revisability of the a priori,
and is not unique to geometry.) Helmholtz had sought to analyze the
representation of space as it arises in perceptual psychology, which
he took to be prior to and independent of the representation of space
in physics. Cohen argues that this is a mistake. Since geometry
concerns determinate magnitudes in space, it requires not only the
pure form of space, but also the categories, which have to be
schematized in time. Geometry thus requires time, and so uses the very
same concept of space that is utilized in physics (i.e., in
kinematics). The upshot of this is that (*pace* Helmholtz and
others), there cannot be a clean distinction between pure and applied
mathematics:

by means of this explicit and repeated emphasis on the necessity of producing space in successive synthesis, the dialectical opposition between applied and pure mathematics is now, from a transcendental point of view, dissolved. (1885 [NKR: 114 =420 in 1885 edition] Ch.12, §I)

To argue otherwise is to fall into “dogmatic realism”, where mathematics is true of platonic objects independent of the empirical world.

Cohen’s philosophy of mathematics is presented systematically in
his *Principle of the Infinitesimal Method* (1883). The topic
of the book is the old problem of the conceptual foundations of the
calculus. Cohen advocates for infinitesimal methods over limit
methods, despite the widespread philosophical view that infinitesimals
are incoherent. Through a detailed history of the development of the
calculus from Leibniz to the present day, Cohen argues that the
calculus originated in problems from physics, not in problems in pure
mathematics. Finite spatial magnitudes (which, in Kantian terminology,
he calls “extensive magnitudes”) are generated from
infinitesimals (which in Kantian terminology he calls “intensive
magnitudes”). Echoing Kant’s “Anticipations of
Perception”, Cohen argues that infinitesimals are the
“real”, which he interprets as the feature of empirical
objects that corresponds to sensation. Because infinitesimals are the
real, and they generate all finite magnitudes, he also calls them the
“origin”.

Cohen’s defense of infinitesimals was wildly unpopular with philosophers and mathematicians, both because it defends infinitesimals at exactly the time when a consensus of mathematicians was forming for limit methods, and because of its unusual mix of highly abstract philosophical argumentation and history of mathematics. But it is important to see the real philosophical advantages that Cohen derived from it. First, his historical argument that infinitesimals arose as a response to problems in physics prevents a clean distinction between pure and applied calculus, and since he argues that all magnitudes are generated through infinitesimals, he can extend this argument against the pure/applied mathematics distinction more generally. Second, since a differential is like a “law” from which one can generate a curve, Cohen is reinforcing the distinctly Marburg view that objecthood depends on laws (section 2.2) when he argues that the differential is the real from which all magnitudes are generated. Third, the apparently paradoxical nature of infinitesimals—how they seem to violate our everyday conception of magnitudes, how far they differ from our ordinary conception of physical things—simply reinforces Cohen’s idealism by showing the necessity of “ideal” elements in experience. Fourth, the claim that the real that corresponds to sensation is itself “ideal” and that finite magnitudes are “generated” from these “ideal” elements, accords with the Marburg rejection of the given. If anything were given in experience, it would be the real—the simple elements that correspond to sensation. But if even infinitesimals are more “intellectual” than “sensible”, this surely undercuts the idea that there is a kind of content derived from sensibility independently of the understanding.

The style of argumentation of *Principle of the Infinitesimal
Method*—with its mix of detailed history of mathematics,
analysis of contemporary mathematics, and abstract philosophical
argumentation—became the paradigm for the Marburg School. But
its defense of infinitesimals did not. Both Natorp and Cassirer gave
detailed and sustained defenses of a philosophy of mathematics that
they felt was truer to the contemporary mathematical work of
Weiserstrass, Dedekind, Cantor, Frege, and Russell: logicism. In fact,
in Cassirer’s review (1907b) of Russell’s *Principles
of Mathematics* (1903), he argued that logicism was now simply a
proven mathematical fact. Given the widespread philosophical view that
logicism and Kantianism are opposed philosophies of mathematics, it is
surprising that Marburg Neo-Kantians endorsed logicism. However, as
Natorp (1910: Ch.1) argued, logicism is what Kant’s philosophy
of mathematics becomes when one rejects (i) the distinction between
thinking and intuiting, understanding and sensibility
(section 2.2),
and (ii) the distinction between formal and transcendental logic (see
the supplement,
Philosophy of Logic in the Marburg School).
Since mathematics is necessary for formulating the laws of nature,
which (on the Marburg view) make objective validity possible, the
concepts and principles of mathematics are part of (transcendental,
but not formal) logic.

For Natorp and Cassirer, number is purely intellectual and independent
of space and time (Natorp 1910: Ch.3). In particular, Cassirer and
Natorp applauded Frege’s *Foundations of Arithmetic*
(1884) for decisively refuting empiricist, psychologist, and formalist
philosophies of mathematics. But they disagreed with Frege and Russell
in a few key respects. First, they did not think that Frege and
Russell had an acceptable philosophy of logic (see the supplement,
Philosophy of Logic in the Marburg School),
and for this reason they felt that Frege and Russell lapsed into an
unacceptable “metaphysical” platonism, which left an
unbridgeable gap between the empirical world and pure mathematics.
Second, they did not believe that logicism required grounding
arithmetic in set theory. In general, they believed that the appeal of
set theory derived from a faulty view of knowledge. Sets are formed
from concepts, and so presuppose the ability to subsume particulars
under concepts. But, on the Marburg view, the application of concepts
to particulars objectifies the representation of the particulars, and
so set theory presupposes (but does not explain) the capacity for
objective validity. Objective validity is derived from the subsumption
of phenomena under laws, and laws are mathematical. So any attempt to
found mathematics in set theory is epistemologically circular,
presupposing the possibility of objective validity that it is supposed
to explain. Natorp’s alternative logicism about number started
with the idea that thinking is fundamentally *relating:*
relating phenomena to one another into that unity under laws that
makes objective validity possible. Numbers are then expressions of
relations, and their function in knowledge is to order phenomena. The
“structuralist” flavor of this position was developed
self-consciously and systematically in Cassirer 1910, which argues
that all mathematical objects are purely structural, in the sense that
all of their properties are relational properties to other
mathematical objects. (As Cassirer recognized, this kind of logicism
is closer to Dedekind’s than Frege’s or
Russell’s.)